Heinrich Scholz

First published Wed Aug 29, 2018

Heinrich Scholz (1884–1956) was a German Protestant theologian, philosopher, and logician who supported the neo-positivistic scientific world view, applying it, however, to a scientific metaphysics as well. He helped to establish the academic field “Mathematical Logic and Foundations”, claiming the priority of language construction and semantics in order to solve foundational problems even outside mathematics. He was also the driving force for the institutionalization of Mathematical Logic in Germany and a pioneer in the historiography of logic.

1. Introduction

Heinrich Scholz (1884–1956), German Protestant theologian, philosopher, and logician, began his academic career as a Protestant systematic theologian at the University of Breslau. He then moved to the University of Kiel and in 1928 to the University of Münster in Westphalia. His Religionsphilosophie (Scholz 1921) became particularly influential in Protestant Theology. Inspired by Alfred North Whitehead’s and Bertrand Russell’s Principia Mathematica (Whitehead and Russell 1910–1913) he changed his research area to Mathematical Logic and Foundations. He was successful in establishing the “Schule von Münster” (“Münster School”) of logicians and in founding the first academic department for Mathematical Logic in Germany, the “Institut für Mathematische Logik und Grundlagenforschung” (“Institute for Mathematical Logic and Foundational Research”) in Münster, still in existence today. Scholz combined research on logical calculi with an epistemological Platonism and openness for metaphysical approaches. Nevertheless, he felt close to the scientific world view of Logical Empiricism. Furthermore, with his Geschichte der Logik (Scholz 1931a) Heinrich Scholz was a pioneer in the historiography of logic.

2. Life

2.1 Academic Career

Heinrich Scholz was born on December 17, 1884 in Berlin. His father was a Protestant parson (on Scholz’s biography and his work cf. Elstrodt and Schmitz 2013; Hermes 1958; Meschkowski 1984; Molendijk 1991; Molendijk 2005; Peckhaus 2008; Ritter, Hermes and Kambartel 1961; Wernick 1944). He studied Protestant Theology and Philosophy in Berlin. Among his teachers were the Prussian Protestant theologian Adolf von Harnack (1851–1930), the neo-Kantian philosopher Alois Riehl (1844–1924) and the neo-idealist philosopher Friedrich Paulsen (1846–1908). In 1911 he completed his Habilitation in the Philosophy of Religion and Systematic Theology. He obtained an additional doctoral degree in Philosophy at the University of Erlangen in 1913. In 1917 he was appointed to a full professorship in the Philosophy of Religion and Systematic Theology at the University of Breslau in Silesia, today Wrocław, Poland. He also received an honorary doctorate from the Theological Faculty of the University of Berlin. Four years later, in 1921, he was appointed to the chair for Philosophy in Kiel, before finally accepting the offer of a professorial chair at the University of Münster in 1928. There he first served as professor of Philosophy. He developed a close relationship with Karl Barth, one of the main representatives of Kerygmatic and Dialectic Theology, who taught Protestant Theology in Münster from 1925 on (cf. Molendijk 1991, ch. 3). Scholz changed his main research area to Mathematical Logic and Foundations, and officially taught the subject from 1936 on. In 1943 the denomination of his chair was changed to Mathematical Logic and Foundations. The institute of this name was founded in 1950. Scholz retired in 1952. He died in Münster on December 30, 1956.

2.2 Institute for Mathematical Logic and Foundations

The “Memorandum about the New Mathematical Logic and Foundations” written for the Reichs- und Preußischen Minister für Wissenschaft, Erziehung und Volksbildung (Imperial and Prussian Secretary for Science, Education and National Instruction) on January 15, 1938 (Scholz 1938) shows that for Scholz this new subject went beyond symbolic or mathematical logic, but included applications of logical analysis to foundational problems in general. According to Scholz, the new subject was prepared by Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646–1716), created by Gottlob Frege (1848–1925), and taken up by David Hilbert (1862–1943) who, adopting Bertrand Russell’s (1872–1970) elaboration of Frege’s creation, made it the subject of deep investigations aiming, e.g., “at a consistency proof for classical logic”, and with this, of classical mathematics (presupposing the logicist reduction of mathematics to logic). This new approach was, according to Scholz, directed against Kant’s opinion that “foundational questions of any kind in principle cannot be treated with mathematical methods and with mathematical means of construction and research questions”. Its task was a deepening and clarifying of foundations by combining structural investigations and the analysis of the context of application.

From the beginning Scholz taught in Münster to a large extent on logic, in particular “logistic” logic, as the new, i.e., formal, symbolic, algebraic, algorithmic or mathematical logic was called since the Second International Congress for Philosophy at Geneva in 1904 (cf. Couturat 1904; Scholz 1931a, 57). In April 1936 he received an official extension of his philosophical appointment to “Logistic Logic and Foundations”. In the same year the “Section B” (consisting of Scholz’s chair and the academic and non-academic staff attached to it) of the Philosophical Seminar was renamed “Logistic Section”. The next step was taken in 1938 when the “section” became a “seminar” of its own. The denomination of Scholz’s chair was changed to “Philosophy of Mathematics and Science with Special Consideration of the New Logic and Foundations”. In 1943 the denomination was changed again to “Mathematical Logic and Foundations”. The “Logistic Seminar” was renamed “Seminar for Mathematical Logic and Foundations” in 1946, and finally, in 1950, it was renamed again, and elevated in organizational status, to “Institute for Mathematical Logic and Foundations” (cf. Schmidt am Busch & Wehmeier 2005a).

Scholz was also politically effective in promoting his field. He assembled the “Gruppe von Münster” (later “Schule von Münster”) and encouraged a number of his students to undertake studies in logic and foundations, placing some of them in academic positions. They obtained important results in the theory of the predicate calculus, the theory of axiomatic systems, metamathematics, semantics and abstraction theory. Among them were Friedrich Bachmann (1909–1982), Albrecht Becker (1907–?), Gisbert Hasenjaeger (1919–2006), Hans Hermes (1912–2003), Walter Kinder (1909–?), Karl Schröter (1905–1977), and Hermann Schweitzer (1909–?). For the publication of the results of his school and related investigations Scholz founded the series Forschungen zur Logik und zur Grundlegung der exakten Wissenschaften (eight issues 1937–1943, n.s. reprinted as Scholz, ed. 1970), among them the outstanding book by Heinrich Scholz and Hermann Schweitzer Die sogenannten Definitionen durch Abstraktion with its elaboration of modern abstraction theory using equivalence classes (Scholz and Schweitzer 1935).

In trying to establish a world-leading center of logic at Münster, he was able to obtain Frege’s Nachlass for his Münster chair in 1935. Later he added to this collection the papers of the German algebraist of logic, Ernst Schröder (1841–1902), which he had obtained from the library of the Technical University of Karlsruhe. It is one of the tragic events of World War II that Frege’s and Schröder’s papers are lost, perhaps destroyed during the bomb attacks on Münster in March 1945 (cf. Peckhaus 1993; Wehmeier and Schmidt am Busch 2000). Scholz had intended to publish a three volume edition of Frege’s posthumous work and correspondence. Most of the typewritten copies Scholz had made of the original material were saved (on the Frege papers cf. Scholz and Bachmann 1936).

In the beginning of the 1930s Münster still stood in the shadow of Göttingen and Berlin as a center of research on logic. Nevertheless, Scholz tried to establish a world center for research on logic and foundations. After the National Socialists' seizure of power, most of German language logicians lost their positions and were forced into emigration. Only Münster survived as a place where research on logic and foundations could be done. Scholz was successful in resisting the attacks from the side of the so-called “Deutsche Mathematik”, a National-Socialist racist movement emphasizing the mathematical work of German “national comrades” (Volksgenossen). The Munich mathematician Max Steck (1907–1971) was particularly hostile. Steck's book, Das Hauptproblem der Mathematik (1942), is directed against logicism, the axiomatic method and metamathematics, as proposed by logicians and mathematicians close to Hilbert and his school. Steck labeled David Hilbert’s formalism as a “simply catastrophic” mental one-sidedness, a “decadence” from the perspective of intellectual history (Steck 1942, p. 205). In several places Scholz is attacked as Hilbert’s spokesman. Steck calls Scholz’s Münster School a “transplantation of the earlier so-called Vienna Circle to Münster in Westphalia” (p. 176).

During the Third Reich Scholz served as a kind of information broker, mediating contacts between émigrés and those who stayed behind. He was able to support his Polish friends, helping, e.g., to rescue Jan Salamucha (1903–1944) from the concentration camp in Sachsenhausen in 1940 (an action for which German authorities threatened him with removal from his professorial chair). He supported Alfred Tarski (1901–1983) who had emigrated to the U.S.A., by maintaining contact with his wife and his two children, who still lived in Warsaw. He supported Jan Łukasiewicz (1878–1956) and his wife financially and was eventually able to help them to leave Poland and to hide in Germany. They feared for their lives in case the Red Army would conquer Poland (cf. Bolewski and Pierzchała 1989, Schreiber 1999, Peckhaus 1998–1999, Schmidt am Busch and Wehmeier 2005b).

2.3 Logical Empiricism

Scholz and his followers adopted the scientific world view as advocated by the philosophers of the neo-positivistic movement, in particular of the Vienna Circle and the Berlin Society for Scientific Philosophy. But contrary to this movement, he applied the scientific world view even to metaphysics. This was observed with reservations. Otto Neurath, e.g., mentioned Scholz and the Münster Group as having contributed much of value, but Scholz “represents nevertheless a full blown metaphysics” (Neurath 1937, reprint Neurath 1981, pp. 804–805) which has to be rejected. The relation between Neurath and Scholz remained ambivalent. They at least met at the First International Congress for Unity of Science at Paris in September 1935. The congress saw the establishment of a committee for the standardization of logical symbolism with members of the Vienna Circle, the Hilbert School and the Münster Group. The initiative had come from Scholz and his school. The results of the committee’s negotiations were presented at the Forth International Congress for the Unity of Science at Cambridge (England) in July 1938 (cf. Peckhaus 2008, pp. 78–80; Behman et al. 1937/38).

3. Work

3.1 Philosophy of Religion

Scholz dedicated his Religionsphilosophie (1921) to his teachers Adolf von Harnack and Alois Riehl (on Scholz’s philosophy of religion cf. Molendijk 1991, Ratschow 1958, Stock 1987, Wimmer 2005). According to Scholz, philosophy of religion does not deal with religion as such, but with its possibility, based on the fact of its reality in the sense of Kant’s critical philosophy (p. VIII). Religion becomes, thus, a philosophical problem. Scholz defines philosophy of religion in the widest sense as the application of philosophical means and presupposition of reasoning to the fact of religion (pp. 1–2). Religion is understood as part of culture being the epitome of creations of the human mind, the existence of which is preferred to their non-existence (p. 14). The object of analysis is empirical religion, i.e. religion as it is practiced in real life or as it is tangible. With this he deviates from constructive types of the philosophy of religion as they can be found, e.g., in the work of Immanuel Kant. In conclusion he determines that philosophy of religion has an integrating function in a philosophy of cultural values. It consists in philosophical reflection on tangible (erlebbare) religion as it is practiced and, in particular, in reflection on expressions of religious consciousness whose truth is subject to reason. So religion never ceased to be a philosophical problem.

3.2 Logic and Foundations

The year 1921 marks a big change in Scholz’s focus of philosophical research. He himself tells the story that he discovered his love for mathematical logic by accidentally coming across Whitehead’s and Russell’s Principia Mathematica (Whitehead and Russell 1910–13, cf. Peckhaus 2005) in the library of the University of Kiel. This work convinced Scholz of the significance of mathematics, although he had at that time no deeper knowledge of this subject. As a full professor of Philosophy he decided to begin formal university studies of Mathematics and Theoretical Physics. After having moved to Münster, Scholz focused his research on Mathematical Logic and Foundations.

He worked particularly on the borderline between Mathematics and Philosophy, motivated by the problem of distinguishing logical calculi from general calculi. He supported David Hilbert’s foundational program having led to Metamathematics and Proof Theory, but focused on language and semantics. Language is necessary to present logical systems. He suggests a formalized language with a degree of exactness even exceeding the exactness of mathematical languages. He calls this language “Leibniz language” L (cf. Scholz 1944). Leibniz languages are symbolic languages with exactly defined means of expression. Each expression is a finite string of characters using a given symbolism according to well-determined rules. If the means of expression are restricted in such a way that (1) these expressions always have sense, and (2) it is decidable whether the produced expressions are true in all possible worlds (universally valid, allgemeingültig), then L is called a “Universal Leibniz Language”. A universally valid fundamental expression is called a Leibniz Theorem. A logic calculus is defined as a set of truths presentable by a Leibniz theorem over L.

The close relation between logic and metaphysics is the topic of Scholz’s book Metaphysik als strenge Wissenschaft (Scholz 1941). In this book metaphysics is dealt with as an ontology in the sense of a theory comprising the entirety of truths. It can be linguistically expressed and it deals with things which can be understood as individuals. These truths are not restricted to particular domains, but are valid for all non-empty domains in all possible worlds (pp. 13–14). Metaphysics as a rigorous science implies the construction of a formalized “precision language”. In this book Scholz uses the language of first order predicate calculus with identity. A central notion is “universal validity” (Allgemeingültigkeit), understood as a metaphysical notion (validity in all possible worlds). This notion is applied to an axiomatized theory of identity and difference.

Scholz analyzed classical metaphysical doctrines with his logical tool of a predicate calculus with identity. His considerations are based on a special variation of a Platonic ontology combined with Leibniz’s notion of possible worlds, the Frege-Russell mathematical logic, Hilbert’s axiomatic method and Tarski’s semantics. This approach found its final expression in the influential textbook Grundzüge der mathematischen Logik which was elaborated, co-authored, and published by Gisbert Hasenjaeger after Scholz’s death (Scholz and Hasenjaeger 1961). Hasenjaeger later called its philosophical background “discrete ontology”, a realistic position: “The world of concrete (or also abstract) things consists just of things which have some features and do not have others; between them some relations are given, others not” (Hasenjaeger 1962, pp. 30–31).

In 1952 Scholz published together with Hans Hermes the section “Mathematische Logik” in the Enzyklopädie der Mathematischen Wissenschaften (Hermes and Scholz 1952), a comprehensive survey of classical, bivalent and decidable logic. They focused on sentential logic based on the notion of universal validity (Allgemeingültigkeit). They argued for the priority of semantical over syntactical considerations.

3.3 Historiography of Logic

Scholz’s most important contributions to the development of logic can be seen in his contributions to the historiography of logic. He stressed the value of the contributions of Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646–1716) and Bernard Bolzano (1781–1848) for the emergence of modern logic. He applied the method of logical analysis to classical philosophical texts, reconsidering, e. g., Anselm’s proof of the existence of God (Scholz 1950/51), Descartes’s cogito argument (Scholz 1931b), and Kant’s transcendental deduction (Scholz 1943/44). He devoted considerable efforts to the study of Gottlob Frege’s work (cf. Sundholm 2005) and promoted David Hilbert’s metamathematics (Scholz 1942). With his Geschichte der Logik (1931a), Heinrich Scholz was a pioneer in the historiography of modern logic. Scholz restricted his presentation to formal logic or logistics. He reconstructs its development starting with Aristotle’s logic, discussing the Stoic modifications, medieval and early modern variations, arriving at Franz Brentano’s (1838–1917) contributions, whom he called the “only original figure among the German formal logicians [in philosophy] of the 19th century after Bolzano and prior to Husserl” (pp. 46–47). For Scholz, the modern shape of logic starts with Leibniz: “We speak of a sunrise mentioning the great name of Leibniz. With him a new life of Aristotelian logic begins, which finds its most beautiful manifestation in our days in the modern exact logic in the form of logistics” (p. 48). He highlighted Gottlob Frege as “the greatest genius of the new logic in the 19th century” (p. 57). According to Scholz, he did more than any other logician for the interpretation of fundamental mathematical concepts with the help of fundamental concepts of logic operating on the basis of exactly defined principles. With this he raised the logical calculus to a level which made the Leibnizian “game with signs” possible.

4. Conclusions

Heinrich Scholz was important as an integrating figure in the development of logic in the first half of the 20th century. He kept Mathematical Logic in touch with Philosophy. With his focus on semantics he set the agenda for the development after World War II. Important academics of German postwar logic, including Gisbert Hasenjaeger and Hans Hermes, were his students.

Bibliography

Primary Literature

  • Hermes, H., and Scholz, H. 1952, Mathematische Logik, Leipzig: Teubner (Enzyklopädie der mathematischen Wissenschaften, 2nd edition, Volume 1, Part 1, Number 1).
  • Scholz, H., 1921, Religionsphilosophie, Berlin: Reuther & Reichard; 2nd revised edition 1922.
  • –––, 1931a, Geschichte der Logik, Berlin: Junker und Dünnhaupt; 2nd unaltered edition as Abriß der Geschichte der Logik, Alber: Freiburg i.Br., 3rd edition 1967.
  • –––, 1931b, “Über das Cogito, ergo sum,” Kantstudien 36, 126–147; reprinted in Scholz 1961, 75–94.
  • –––, 1938, “Memorandum about the New Mathematical Logic and Foundations” written for the Reichs- und Preußischen Minister für Wissenschaft, Erziehung und Volksbildung on January 15, 1938, copy in the Behmann papers, Staatsbibliothek zu Berlin. Preußischer Kulturbesitz, Nachl. 335.
  • –––, 1941, Metaphysik als strenge Wissenschaft, Köln: Staufen-Verlag.
  • –––, 1942, “David Hilbert. Der Altmeister der mathematischen Grundlagenforschung”, Kölnische Zeitung No. 32, Jan. 18, 1932; enlarged version in Scholz 1961, 279–290.
  • –––, 1943/44, “Einführung in die Kantische Philosophie,” lecture notes, reprinted in Scholz 1961, 152–218.
  • –––, 1944, “Logik, Grammatik, Metaphysik”, Archiv für Rechts- und Sozialphilosophie 36 (1943/44), 393–493; reprinted in Scholz 1961, 399–436.
  • –––, 1950/51, “Der Anselmische Gottesbeweis,” part 1 of the lecture course Einführung in die Philosophie, reprinted in Scholz 1961, 62–74.
  • –––, 1961, Mathesis Universalis. Abhandlungen zur Philosophie als strenger Wissenschaft, ed. by H. Hermes, F. Kambartel, and J. Ritter, Basel and Stuttgart: Benno Schwabe & Co.
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Secondary Literature

  • Behman, H., P. Bernays, and H. Scholz, 1937/38, “Bericht des Komitees zur Vereinheitlichung der logischen Symbolik”, Erkenntnis, 7(1): 386–390.
  • Bolewski, A., and Pierzchała, H., 1989, Losy polskich pracowników nauki w latach 1939–1945. Straty osobowe, Wrocław: Zakład narodowy imienia ossolińskich wydawnictwo.
  • Couturat, L., 1904, “Logique et philosophie des sciences”, Revue de Métaphysique et de Morale 12, 1037–1077.
  • Elstrodt, J., and Schmitz, N., 2013, “Prof. Dr. theol. Dr. phil. Dr. theol. h.c. Heinrich Scholz (1884–1956)” in Geschichte [developing history of mathematics at the University of Münster], Ch. 5.2, pp. 111–118 (link).
  • Hasenjaeger, G., 1962, Einführung in die Grundbegriffe und Probleme der modernen Logik, Freiburg/München: Alber.
  • Hermes, H., 1958, “Heinrich Scholz. Die Persönlichkeit und sein Werk als Logiker,” in Heinrich Scholz. Drei Vorträge gehalten bei der Gedächtnisfeier der Math.-Naturw. Fakultät der Universität Münster am 20. Dezember 1957, Münster: Aschendorff, 25–45.
  • Meschkowski, H., 1984, “Heinrich Scholz. Zum 100. Geburtstag des Grundlagenforschers,” Humanismus und Technik. Jahrbuch 27, 28–52.
  • Molendijk, A.L., 1991, Aus dem Dunklen ins Helle. Wissenschaft und Theologie im Denken von Heinrich Scholz. Mit unveröffentlichten Thesenreihen von Heinrich Scholz und Karl Barth, Amsterdam/Atlanta: Rodopi (Amsterdam Studies in Theology; 8).
  • –––, 2005, “Ein standfester Mensch. Bemerkungen zum Werdegang von Heinrich Scholz,” in Schmidt am Busch and Wehmeier (eds.) 2005, 13–45.
  • Neurath, O., 1937, “Die neue Enzyklopädie des wissenschaftlichen Empirismus”, Scientia (Milan), Dec. 1937, 309–320, reprinted in Neurath 1981, 801–811.
  • –––, 1981, Gesammelte philosophische und methodologische
  • Schriften, Vol. 2, ed. by R. Haller and H. Rutte, Vienna: Hölder-Pichler-Tempsky.
  • Peckhaus, V., 1993, Review of Molendijk 1991, History and Philosophy of Logic 14, 101–107.
  • –––, 1998/99, “Moral Integrity During a Difficult Period: Beth and Scholz”, Philosophia Scientiae 3, No. 4, 151–173.
  • –––, 2005, “Heinrich Scholz als Metaphysiker,” in Schmidt am Busch and Wehmeier (eds.) 2005, 69–83.
  • –––, 2008, “Logic and Metaphysics: Heinrich Scholz and the Scientific World View,” Philosophia Mathematica (III) 16, 78–99.
  • Ratschow, C.H., 1958, “Heinrich Scholz der Theologe und der Christ,” in Heinrich Scholz. Drei Vorträge gehalten bei der Gedächtnisfeier der Math.-Naturw. Fakultät der Universität Münster am 20. Dezember 1957, Münster: Aschendorff, 10–24.
  • Ritter, J., Hermes, H., and Kambartel, F., 1961, “Vorwort,” in Scholz 1961, 7–23.
  • Schmidt am Busch, H.-C., and Wehmeier, K.F., 2005a, “‘Es ist die einzige Spur, die ich hinterlasse’ – Dokumente zur Entstehungsgeschichte des Instituts für Mathematische Logik und Grundlagenforschung”, in Schmidt am Busch and Wehmeier (eds.) 2005, 93–101.
  • Schmidt am Busch, H.-C., and Wehmeier, K.F., 2005b, “Heinrich Scholz und Jan Łukasiewicz”, in Schmidt am Busch and Wehmeier (eds.) 2005, 119–131; English version as “On the relations between Heinrich Scholz and Jan Łukasiewicz,” in History and Philosophy of Logic 28 (2007), 67–81.
  • Schmidt am Busch, H.-C., and Wehmeier, K.F. (eds.), 2005, Heinrich Scholz. Logiker, Philosoph, Theologe, Paderborn: mentis.
  • Schreiber, P., 1999, “Über Beziehungen zwischen Heinrich Scholz und polnischen Logikern”, History and Philosophy of Logic 20, 97–109.
  • Stock, E., 1987, Die Konzeption einer Metaphysik im Denken von Heinrich Scholz, Berlin and New York: de Gruyter (Theologische Bibliothek Töpelmann; 44).
  • Steck, M., 1942, Das Hauptproblem der Mathematik, Berlin: Dr. Georg Lüttke Verlag.
  • Sundholm, G., 2005, “Heinrich Scholz between Frege and Hilbert”, in Schmidt am Busch and Wehmeier (eds.) 2005, 103–117.
  • Wehmeier, K.F. and Schmidt am Busch, H.-C., 2000, “Auf der Suche nach Freges Nachlaß,” in Gottfried Gabriel and Uwe Dathe (eds.), Gottlob Frege. Werk und Wirkung. Mit den unveröffentlichten Vorschlägen für ein Wahlgesetz von Gottlob Frege, Paderborn: Mentis, 267–281. English version as “The Quest for Frege’s Nachlass,” in M. Beaney and E. Reck (eds.), Critical Assessments of Leading Philosophers: Gottlob Frege, vol. I, London: Routledge 2005, 54–67.
  • Wernick, G., 1944, “Heinrich Scholz als Philosoph. Eine entwicklungsgeschichtliche Studie,” Archiv für Rechts- und Sozialphilosophie 37, 1–12.
  • Whitehead, A.N., and Russell, B., 1910–1913, Principia Mathematica, 3 volumes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press; 2nd edition, 1925–1927.
  • Wimmer, R., 2005, “Die Religionsphilosophie von Heinrich Scholz,” in Schmidt am Busch and Wehmeier (eds.) 2005, 47–68.

Other Internet Resources

Acknowledgments

The editors would like to thank Kai Wehmeier for his efforts as an external referee and an editor of this entry.

Copyright © 2018 by
Volker Peckhaus <volker.peckhaus@t-online.de>

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