Notes to School of Names

1. According to the Han History, Cheng-gong Sheng was the author of five scrolls (pian) of writings, presumably focusing on names. Liu Xiang (79–8 B.C.) thought that he lived at the same as the son of Li Si, prime minister to the Qin emperor. His contemporary Huang Gong, who wrote four scrolls, was a scholar of Qin known for his songwriting. Mao Gong, author of nine scrolls, was from the state of Zhao and served with Gongsun Long as a retainer to the Lord of Pingyuan. Of Huan Tuan nothing is known. None of the writings of these men have survived.

2. On the similarities and dissimilarities between the School of Names and the sophists, see Reding (1985) and Graham (1989).

3. Antonio Cua (1985) was among the first to point out the similarities between Chinese disputation and legal reasoning. See also Garrett (1993) and Harbsmeier (1998: 286–87).

4. All citations to Xunzi will be by section numbers in Knoblock’s three-volume translation (1988, 1990, 1994). Citations to The Annals of Lü Buwei will be by section number, appending the page number in Knoblock and Riegel (2000). All translations from these and other texts are my own and are usually slightly different from those in the English editions cited for comparison. The passages referred to here are at Xunzi 5.6 and 5.9 and The Annals of Lü Buwei 4.3/123.

5. Yang Zhu represented a form of ethical egoism. About Yang Zhu himself we know little. He wrote no recorded texts, though he is mentioned in a variety of sources and is said to have had an audience with King Hui of Liang (370-319 B.C.). Mencius identifies him with the doctrine of acting “for oneself,” so that to benefit the world he would not sacrifice even a single hair from his body (7A:26). The Huainanzi, a Han dynasty anthology, summarizes Yang’s doctrines as “Keep the natural dispositions whole, protect the genuine, do not get tangled up with things” (Book 13, “Fan Lun Xun”).

6. Graham seems to have been the first to argue explicitly for this explanation (2003/1978: 172–173).

7. See Graham 2003, Canons A66–67, B15. The explanation of jian bai presented here is based on Graham (2003: 170-76). Graham’s account of the theoretical role of jian bai is one of the many significant breakthroughs in his work on the later Mohists. For an alternative account of the jian bai sophism, see Makeham (1989), but compare Graham (2003: 176).

8. There is an extant text called the Dengxizi, comprising two very short books. However, as Chinese scholars recognized as early as the Ming dynasty (1368–1644 C.E.), it is a later forgery, an incoherent jumble of ideas and phrases plucked from a variety of sources. It concerns mainly political and social issues, having little relation to the reputed concerns of the disputers or to themes associated with Deng Xi in genuine Warring States texts. Of the early sources on Deng Xi, probably only the Zuo Commentary can be considered reliable, since the text treats him as a minor figure toward whom it has no axe to grind. The one-line entry on him was probably written long after his lifetime, however.

9. The short extant text in two books attributed to Yin Wen is a later forgery, probably from the 3rd century C.E. See the detailed study by Daor (1974) and the discussion in Harbsmeier (1998).

10. Graham rightly points out that Hui Shi explains what a dan is by citing analogue and differentia, not genus and differentia (1989: 81). But he characterizes Hui Shi’s example as a “definition,” when in fact a fascinating aspect of the story is how the Chinese theoretical scheme employs no notion of (intensional) definition. (By our lights, Hui Shi’s response can of course considered a nominal or extensional definition.) The questioner simply asks what the features of X are like, and the informant offers an analogy to show “what X is like.”

11. This account is inevitably indebted to Hansen (1992), Graham (1989), and a range of Chinese commentators cited in the Qing dynasty Zhuangzi Jishi of Guo Qingfan and the modern editions edited by Chen Guying, Zhuangzi Jinzhu Jinyi, rev. ed. (Taipei: Commercial Press, 2000), and Wang Shumin, Zhuangzi Jiaoquan (Taipei: Academia Sinica, 1988). I have not attempted to credit these sources one by one except for places where my own view was influenced very directly by another writer’s. The monistic interpretation of the ten theses defended below was first proposed by Hu Shih (1922).

12. The word translated here as “unit,” ti, is also the Mohist technical term for a part of a whole (Canon A2). “Units” can in turn be treated as wholes, from which we can separate out further parts.

13. The paradox is distinct from a sorites paradox, which is based on reiteration of minute, insignificant changes, not infinitesimals. But there is a rough similarity between them. In both cases, a sum of basic units, no matter how many, is insufficient to produce a significant difference. Yet a significant difference exists and somehow must be constituted by the basic units.

14. Hansen (1992: 262–63) and Graham (1989: 79) both follow Hu. Reding (1985) defends a different interpretation.

15. Hui Shi’s “one unit” monism does not imply that the differentiated world of perceptual experience is delusory, nor that individual things are all formless blobs of protoplasm that can fuse together. It arises from thinking of the cosmos according to the model of a whole and its parts. Because distinctions between the parts can be drawn in innumerably many ways, it seems that arbitrary human convention is the only basis for distinguishing the parts one way rather than another—for instance, for distinguishing different kinds (lei) of things or “stuff” (shi) one way rather than another. Without our cognitive activity, individual things in themselves belong to neither one kind nor another, nor are they even “things” (wu). Rather, they are simply parts of a whole constituted by the cosmos and everything in it.

As an analogy, consider how we conceive of the human body. We can recognize distinctions between the various parts of the body, such as the arms, legs, and torso, or we can treat the body as a single whole, forgetting for the moment any distinctions between its parts. Someone could argue that arms, legs, and so on are distinct from each other and from the body only in the sense that for some purposes we isolate them conceptually. In reality, they are all just (parts of) the body. The “Great One” or “one unit” idea is that in an analogous way, the entire cosmos is a whole constituted by its myriad parts, and the parts exist as various individuals and kinds only because our cognitive activity divides them off from the whole.

Of course, we can distinguish different types of criteria for identifying parts. Consider, for instance, the differences between these sorts of parts: (a) a discrete individual part that is detached from anything else, such as my body, which is unconnected to other bodies; (b) an intuitively distinct part of my body, such as my right index finger; (c) a random chunk of my body, such as a square centimeter of flesh near the center of my left calve; (d) the part of my body consisting of the fusion of my left ring finger, right eye, and spleen. The principles by which we might classify such different sorts of parts are a matter of discussion and controversy in contemporary metaphysics (see the entry on mereology). They obviously have an important bearing on the grounds for Hui Shi’s monism, since it may well be the case that arbitrary human convention is not the only basis for drawing distinctions between things and kinds of things.

16. An alternative interpretation of the text that avoids this inconsistency would be that thesis 10 does not assert that the “one unit” view is exclusively or absolutely correct, but merely recommends it as an ethical stance.

17. Graham’s conclusions, first published in 1957 and reprinted in his (1990), have been widely accepted by European and American scholars but almost completely ignored by scholars writing in Chinese. His arguments are not unassailable. In philology knockdown arguments are rare, and he perhaps overstates the force of some of his evidence. But the parallels between the dubious parts of the Gongsun Longzi and the Mohist Canons and Explanations are extensive. They incorporate even phrases with scribal errors that presumably had not yet occurred during the lifetime of the historical Gongsun Long, since the later Mohist texts should be roughly contemporaneous with him. Given the parallels, it would be a miraculous coincidence if these parts of the Gongsun Longzi had not been assembled from bits of the Canons. When we then consider the nonsensical, banal content of the three questionable dialogues, by far the best explanation of Graham’s observations is that they are forgeries. For a range of other views on the text, see the essays collected in Suter, Indraccolo, and Behr, eds. (2020). For an intriguing development of Graham’s view, along with that of the Chinese scholar Shen Youding, see Suter (2020).

18. In the version of the story found in the Annals (1.4), Confucius is one-upped by Laozi, who alone demonstrates the highest level of impartiality. A Chu man loses his bow and says, “A Chu person lost it, a Chu person will find it. Why bother looking for it?” Confucius comments, “Omit the ‘Chu’ and it’ll be admissible.” Laozi rejoins, “Omit the ‘person’ and it’ll be admissible.”

19. We will follow the traditional order of the text. Many interpreters transpose and reconstruct parts of the text in response to suspected textual corruption. The translation that follows is indebted in places to both Graham (1989) and Harbsmeier (1998).

20. This argument can also be read as treating white and horse as two parts of a whole, as Graham suggests (1989). But doing so does not really enhance the explanatory value of our interpretation, nor make the argument more cogent. If we say that white horse is a whole with two parts, one named by ‘white’ and one by ‘horse’, it’s not clear how that helps us get from ‘naming the color is not naming the shape’ to ‘white horse not horse’. The natural thing for the text to say, on a part-whole reading, would be that ‘white’ is not ‘horse’.

21. Harbsmeier also points out that by using the example of seeking a horse, instead of having a horse, the sophist has created an intensional context, making it that much easier to show that “white horse” and “horse” are not intersubstitutable and thus not identical (1998: 306).

22. Following Wu Feibai and Harbsmeier (1998: 307, n2).

23. Noting that Gongsun Long cites Confucius in the anecdote about the King of Chu, Hansen (1992) suggests that he is proposing a language reform as a defense of the Confucian theory of “correcting names.” This strikes me as far-fetched, given that Gongsun was notorious for twisting people’s words and that his ethical sympathies seem to have lain more with the Mohists than the Confucians. Probably he cites Confucius as an authority in the anecdote because Kong Chuan was a descendant of Confucius.

24. Though the text mentions Hui Shi, it does not associate the paradoxes with him, leaving it unclear whether the writer attributes them to him specifically. Another point to note is that the text’s awareness of Gongsun Long’s sophisms suggests that it is contemporaneous with him. We cannot be sure of Gongsun Long’s dates, so this observation supports no firm conclusions about chronology. But it seems likely that Gongsun Long was active mainly in the first half of the 3rd century B.C., in which case “Equalizing Things” may not be from the hand of the historical Zhuang Zhou, who is supposed to have lived during the 4th century. Graham notes the chronological difficulty but does not consider the possibility that “Equalizing Things” may not be the work of Zhuang Zhou (1989: 179).

25. The author thanks Chad Hansen for insightful comments on an earlier draft of this article, many of which have been incorporated into the present version.

Notes to Supplement: Disputation in Context

26. According to the Bie Lu, by Liu Xiang, this is a comment by Zou Yan (ca. 250 B.C.) in reaction to Gongsun Long’s frivolous disputation that “a white horse is not a horse.” (See Shi Ji, Book 76.) Versions of the passage are also found in the 2nd-century B.C. Hanshi Waizhuan and in the Dengxizi, a text of later, uncertain date that contains a hodgepodge of material from various sources. The close parallels between the three versions suggest that all are borrowing from a widely circulated source of earlier date, probably 3rd century B.C. For an alternative version of the passage, see Graham (2003), 20-21.

27. A “starting point” (duan) is the basis for a distinct way of using a general term. As Xunzi explains, ‘honor’ has two “starting points,” honor with respect to moral standing and honor with respect to social status. So a person can be morally honorable while having low social status or socially honored while being morally disgraceful. See John Knoblock, Xunzi: A Translation and Study of the Complete Works, Vol. 3 (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1994), section 18.9.

28. Different groups of thinkers developed different answers to these questions. The Mohists advocated a form of realism. Things are already divided into different “kinds” (lei) by the natural world itself, independent of human activity. Whether different objects (shi) are similar or different is determined by whether they are inherently similar, and thus “of the same kind.” Xunzi developed a nuanced pragmatic view. Some kind distinctions are determined by how features of the natural world interact causally with human sense organs. Because we all have similar sense organs, we naturally tend to distinguish things similarly, allowing us to agree on how to use names in consistent ways. Other distinctions are determined by social conventions established by political leaders. These are justified by their utility in bringing about a stable, flourishing society. Some passages in the Zhuangzi go further toward pragmatism, implying that there is no need to correct names in the first place, and attempting to do so is pointless, since the task is impracticable anyway. Attempts to implement such rigid standardization will only lead to worthless squabbling and interfere with our ability to cope with change, perform practical tasks successfully, and live a carefree, happy life.

Notes to Supplement: Life of Hui Shi

29. See Brooks (1996). Brooks’s is probably the most informative historical study of Hui Shi, and I have benefited from many of his observations.

Copyright © 2020 by
Chris Fraser <>

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