School of Names

First published Tue Oct 25, 2005; substantive revision Mon Oct 5, 2020

The “School of Names” (ming jia) is the traditional Chinese label for a diverse group of Warring States (479–221 B.C.E.) thinkers who shared an interest in language, disputation, and metaphysics. They were notorious for logic-chopping, purportedly idle conceptual puzzles, and paradoxes such as “Today go to Yue but arrive yesterday” and “A white horse is not a horse.” Because reflection on language in ancient China centered on “names” (ming, words) and their relation to “stuff” (shi, objects, events, situations), 2nd-century B.C.E. Han dynasty archivists dubbed these thinkers the “School of Names,” one of six recognized philosophical movements. The “school” is a taxonomical fiction, however. The varied figures assigned to it—Deng Xi, Yin Wen, Hui Shi, and Gongsun Long, among others—never formed a distinct circle or movement devoted to any particular doctrine or way of life, and their intellectual interests overlapped extensively with those of the later Mohists, Zhuangzi, and Xunzi. Several of these men were active politically: Hui Shi was a government minister, Yin Wen and Gongsun Long political advisors and peace activists. Still, in the eyes of Han historians, they devoted themselves to no signature ethical or political doctrines. Hence they became known primarily for their interest in language and disputation and on that basis were deemed a “school.”

Before the Han dynasty, the social group of which these thinkers were a part was known as the bian zhe—“disputers” or “dialecticians”—because they spent much of their time in “disputation” (bian, also “discrimination” or “distinction drawing”), a form of dialectical persuasion and inquiry aimed fundamentally at “distinguishing” the proper semantic relations between names and the things or kinds of things to which they refer. “Disputers” is thus probably a more appropriate English label for Hui Shi, Gongsun Long, and the others than is the “School of Names,” though it refers not specifically to these figures but to the broader class of scholars to which they belonged. (“Name-distinguishers” or “distinction-disputers” would be even more accurate, though these terms are too clumsy to adopt as English equivalents.) The disputers flourished for about a century and a half as wandering political advisors, counseling rulers throughout pre-unification China. They disappeared with the onset of the Qin dynasty (221 B.C.E.), partly because the political and intellectual climate of the new empire was hostile to their purely theoretical, occasionally flippant inquiries, and partly because with unification their political services became obsolete.

1. Background and Overview

Han dynasty archivists associated seven figures with the “School of Names”: Deng Xi, Yin Wen, Hui Shi, Gongsun Long, Cheng-gong Sheng, Huang Gong, and Mao Gong (Han History 30, “Bibliographical Treatise”). To these we can add one further figure, Huan Tuan, whom China’s earliest history of thought, “Under Heaven,” Book 33 of the Zhuangzi, pairs with Gongsun Long. About the last four of these men virtually nothing is known.[1] About the first four, we know more, but not much. There is little first-hand evidence about what they thought, since nearly none of the writings attributed to them by Han bibliographers survive. With the exception of a few brief texts attributed to Gongsun Long, everything we know comes from quotations or anecdotes in other texts, including the Zhuangzi, Xunzi, Annals of Lü Buwei, Hanfeizi, and several Han dynasty anthologies. These second-hand accounts typically date from long after the lifetime of the figures they describe, and they may be embellished or dramatized, warped to fit their writers’ agenda, or even fictional.

Contemporary studies sometimes treat these disputers together with the later Mohists. Topics associated with them are addressed in Mohist texts, and “Under Heaven” depicts sects of Mohists engaged in “disputes about the hard and white and the same and different,” two central themes of the disputers. The later Mohists probably respected the individuals identified with the School of Names but were critical of them. Numerous passages in the Mohist Dialectics appear to be either rebuttals of their ideas or defenses of Mohist doctrines against their arguments. On the other hand, insofar as ‘the School of Names’ is simply a label for early thinkers interested in language and dialectics, the later Mohists themselves largely fit under this label.

Hui Shi, Gongsun Long, and the others have been described as Chinese “sophists,” and there are indeed superficial similarities between them and the Greek sophists, at least as the two groups were characterized by their respective enemies. Their social role and the subject matter of their inquiries were generally quite different.[2] But both were interested in language and philosophical issues inspired by reflection on language. Both taught rhetoric and argued lawsuits. Both were attacked for arguing purely to win, for being willing to argue either side of any issue, and for propounding paradoxes, all without regard for the facts. Their inquiries led a few thinkers in each tradition toward relativism. At least some members of both groups were itinerant, the Greeks moving from place to place giving public exhibitions and offering instruction, the Chinese typically seeking to win the ear of rulers and influence political policy.

The disputers’ focal activity appears to have been a form of public debate or persuasion called “disputation” or “distinction drawing” (bian), which often took place in the court of a regional lord or a state sovereign. Disputation appears to have been rooted partly in the practice of litigation, partly in the rhetoric used by court advisors in the “explanations” (shuo, also “persuasions”) through which they tried to influence political policy. Primarily a type of analogical argumentation, disputation, like much legal rhetoric, often took the form of citing a precedent, analogy, or model (fa, also “law”) and explaining why the case at hand should be treated similarly or not.[3]

Disputation could be pursued for a variety of ends, some extolled by ancient writers, some condemned. Constructively, it could be a means of clarifying and defending the right way (dao). Through it, one could lead others to distinguish shi/fei (this/not-this, right/wrong) correctly and thus obtain knowledge. Of disputation in this sense, Xunzi says that “the gentleman must engage in disputation” and The Annals of Lü Buwei remarks that in the course of study, one must occasionally engage in “disputation and persuasion” (bian shuo) in order to expound the Way (dao).[4] This would also be the sense in which Mencius explains that he has no choice but to engage in disputation, since as a follower of the sages he must attempt to rectify people’s hearts and refute the pernicious sayings of Yang Zhu and Mo Di (Mencius, 3B:9).[5]

But disputation could also degenerate into a superficial game of trying to outtalk the opponent, an idle contest of wits aimed at defending sophistries, or even a simple quarrel. This side of disputation explains Mencius’s chagrined response when told he has a reputation for being “fond of disputation” (3B:9). Early texts are uniformly disparaging about such empty or flippant disputation. The Annals of Lü Buwei complains that “Those in the world who study engage in much disputation. Their sayings are facile and expressions are upside-down. They don’t seek the facts (shi, the actual things, what is real). They strive to demolish each other, with victory as their [sole] purpose” (15.8/368). “Under Heaven” says that disputers “exaggerate others’ hearts and change others’ intentions. They can defeat others’ mouths, but cannot persuade their hearts.” As to Hui Shi, “He took opposing others as the substance of his activity and desired to make a name for himself by defeating others; that’s why he couldn’t get along with people” (cf. Graham 1981: 284–85). Sima Qian, the Han historian who may have coined the label “School of Names,” says in his account of the six schools that the disputers “determine things only by names and neglect people’s feelings.” They twist words so “people cannot get back to the thought” they were trying to express (Shi Ji, Book 130). Practitioners of this sort of antagonistic or frivolous disputation cared only for victory, even at the cost of distorting the opponent’s point, and they defended bizarre claims without regard for the facts.

For further discussion of disputation in the context of early Chinese philosophy, see the supplementary document.

Disputation in Context

The next section will briefly explore the general themes that early texts associate with the disputers. We will then look more closely at the doctrines of the four known figures the Han History assigns to the School of Names.

2. Main Themes

Early texts regularly associate the disputers with four themes. “The same and different” (tong yi) and “hard and white” (jian bai) are mentioned almost invariably. “Deeming so the not-so, admissible the inadmissible” (ran bu ran, ke bu ke) and “the dimensionless” (wu hou) appear slightly less often. A good example is this excerpt from “Autumn Waters,” Book 17 of the Daoist anthology Zhuangzi, in which Gongsun Long himself is depicted mentioning three of these themes:

When young, I studied the way of the former kings. When I grew up, I understood the practice of benevolence and righteousness. I united the same and different, separated hard from white, made so the not-so and admissible the inadmissible. I confounded the wits of the hundred schools and exhausted the eloquence of countless speakers. I took myself to have achieved the ultimate. (cf. Graham 1981: 154)

What are “uniting the same and different,” “separating hard from white,” and “making so the not-so and admissible the inadmissible”? Given the limited evidence, we cannot be completely sure what these phrases—along with “the dimensionless”—allude to. But most likely they denote types of sophisms or paradoxes, not specific statements or doctrines.[6] And early texts, especially the Mohist Dialectics, do give us enough information to make reasonable conjectures about the general issues they involve. (See the entry on the Mohist Canons.)

2.1 Same and Different

As we saw above, “same” (tong) and “different” (yi) are central concepts in ancient Chinese theories of language, knowledge, and disputation, as represented by the Mohists and Xunzi. According to the Mohists, “sameness” can refer to at least four types of relations: identity; part-whole relations; being grouped together or co-located; and having some intrinsic similarity and thus being part of the same “kind”. This last variety of “sameness” is probably most important for our purposes here. Names names for “kinds” (lei)—one type of general term— are regarded as denoting all things or stuff (shi) that is “the same” in one or more respects, such as all horses, which share the same shape (xing) and appearance (mao). Speakers can use language to communicate because they are familiar with the kinds of similar things that words refer to, and thus upon hearing a word know what the thing referred to “is like.” The relations of “same” and “different” determine what counts as correct matching of names and stuff and thus what knowledge is. Disputation is fundamentally a process of debating whether the thing in question is “this” (shi) or “not-this” (fei), the same as or different from some model, paradigm, or analogy. The issue of how to distinguish “same” from “different” is thus pivotal to Chinese philosophy of language, epistemology, and disputation.

Some references to the disputers’ interest in “the same and different,” then, may allude to legitimate, if widely misunderstood, inquiries into the foundations of language and knowledge. Gongsun Long’s “uniting the same and different,” on the other hand, probably refers to manipulating standards for distinguishing different kinds in order to produce sophisms. The disputer could cite features of different kinds of things by which they could be treated as the same or features of things of the same kind by which they could be treated as different. (This strategy is suggested by the fifth thesis of Hui Shi, to be discussed below.) Such shifting of criteria for distinguishing sameness from difference is illustrated by many of the disputers’ sophisms. Among other examples, Hui Shi’s “The sky is as low as earth, mountains are level with marshes” deems different things similar; some of the arguments for Gongsun Long’s “A white horse is not a horse” treat things of the same kind—horses and white horses—as different, playing largely on the ambiguity between “same” in the sense of being of the same kind and “same” in the sense of identity.

Manipulating the same and the different alters the distinctions that ground our use of words and thus our standards of knowledge. (In the most extreme case, uniting everything into a “Great One” would leave us unable to communicate linguistically and eliminate all conceptual or propositional knowledge.) The notion that we can realign the boundaries of the same and different without limit signals a radical skepticism about the existence of natural kinds. Indeed, it threatens to leave us without any knowledge at all, since the standards by which to judge whether one knows something are never fixed. It also provides an approach to winning any disputation: instead of seeking objective criteria that fix the correct distinctions between things, disputers just redraw the distinctions between things or kinds in whatever way needed to establish their claim.

2.2 Hard and White

In later Mohist thought, “hard-white” or “as hard to white” (jian bai) is a technical term for the relation between two things or two features of a thing that are inseparable and “mutually pervasive”—that is, they completely coincide throughout the same spatial location.[7] The paradigm of such features is the hardness and whiteness of a completely white stone. Another example is the length and breadth of an object (B4). Features that are “as hard to white” “fill” or “pervade” each other (B15). Thus they are in a sense “two,” but unlike a pair of shoes, one cannot be taken away from the other (B4). The relation of “as hard to white” contrasts with that between two measured lengths, which cannot everywhere overlap without merging to form only a single length, instead of the original two, and with that between any two mutually exclusive features, such as being an ox and being a horse. No single object can be both an ox and a horse, but an object can be both hard and white.

“Separating hard and white,” then, is treating mutually pervasive features as if they were separable or detachable, like two spatially distinct objects or two removable physical parts of a whole. (As Graham points out (2003: 173), in contexts where “hard and white” is mentioned alone, with no reference to “separating” the two, the phrase may simply be a metaphor for logic-chopping or hair-splitting debate in general.) A plausible example of “separating hard and white” is Gongsun Long’s treating the color of a white horse as a thing separable from the shape, as when the text reads, “The white is not the horse. A white horse is a horse together with white” (“White Horse Discourse”).

2.3 So and Not-So

“So” (ran) is frequently used to indicate that a predicate is true of a thing. It can also mean “the case” or “how things are.” According to Mohist Canon A71, something is “so” when its features are similar to a model for a certain kind of thing. “Admissible” (ke) refers to statements that are semantically or logically “possible”—that is, free of logical or pragmatic contradiction. In contexts concerning action, “admissible” refers to what is permissible by moral, social, prudential, or other standards. So “making so the not-so, admissible the inadmissible” refers to collapsing or reversing conventional distinctions governing language use, judgment, morality, and courtesy. The practical upshot is roughly the same as that of “uniting same and different,” but the latter refers to kind relations between objects, “making so the not-so” to speech and action. “Making admissible the inadmissible” was the trademark of Deng Xi, the earliest figure associated with the School of Names, who became famous for his doctrine of “both sides admissible” (liang ke).

Preventing the “not-so” from being treated as “so” is precisely the point of “correcting names”:

If names are correct, order obtains; if names are misplaced, disorder. What cause names to be misplaced are dissolute explanations (shuo, also “persuasions” or “arguments”). If explanations are dissolute, then the inadmissible is deemed admissible and the not-so so, the not-right is deemed right and not-wrong wrong. (The Annals of Lü Buwei, 16.8/400)

Collapsing the distinction between so and not-so, admissible and inadmissible is a prominent topic in the famous “Discourse on Equalizing Things,” Book 2 of the Zhuangzi. Though generally critical of the disputers (among whom its author may nevertheless once have numbered), the text agrees that such distinctions can be collapsed or reversed, depending on what standards of judgment we choose to adopt. It is thus firmly opposed to the orthodoxy, represented by Analects (see the entry on the Confucius), the Mohists, Xunzi, and Lü Buwei, that clear, fixed public standards must be set for the use of names, since without them, patterns of use will vary and social chaos is likely to ensue. The Zhuangzi suggests that disorder does not invariably follow from “linguistic liberalism,” and indeed that fixed standards are unattainable and unnecessary for communication.

2.4 The Dimensionless

The fourth theme, the dimensionless (wu hou, literally “lacking thickness”), is more obscure, mentioned only once in the Xunzi and once in the Annals of Lü Buwei. The dimensionless probably refers to a geometric point. According to the Mohists, the dimensionless does not “fill” anything (A65). A starting point (duan) is the dimensionless tip of a solid object (A61). Allusions to the disputers sometimes contrast the dimensionless with “the dimensioned” (you hou, “having thickness”), which the Mohists explain as having something it is bigger than (A55). The dimensionless is probably associated with the disputers because of Hui Shi’s paradox that “The dimensionless cannot be accumulated, yet its size is a thousand miles.” (Points cannot be accumulated, yet a great girth or length is the sum of the points that constitute it.) In passages referring to the disputers and their sophistries, “the dimensionless” probably alludes to any paradox arising from the concept of a geometric point or an infinitesimal.

3. Deng Xi

Deng Xi (d. 501 B.C.E.) was China’s earliest renowned lawyer and rhetorician. He has been called the “founding father of the Chinese logical tradition” (Harbsmeier 1998: 286), though this is probably an overstatement, since we lack evidence that he undertook any explicit study of argumentation or that he influenced the theories of the Mohists or Xunzi. As Harbsmeier (287) rightly points out, however, Deng Xi epitomizes the roots of Chinese disputation in legal rhetoric. He establishes a link between disputation and litigation that continues throughout the classical period. Indeed, his reputation as a legal and political gadfly may have contributed to later authoritarian thinkers’ attitude that litigators disrupt social order and should be banned.

All of our very limited information about Deng Xi is second-hand, comprising a one-line entry in the Zuo Commentary, curt attacks on him in the Xunzi, three anecdotes in The Annals of Lü Buwei, and a few stories in texts of later date.[8] According to the Han History, he was the author of two scrolls (pian) of writings, neither of which survives. The Zuo Commentary (Duke Ding, Year 9), the earliest and most reliable of our sources, reports that he composed a penal code on bamboo strips, perhaps drawn up as an alternative to the official code of his home state of Zheng. By the time of the Han dynasty, however, the code had been lost.

Xunzi alludes to Deng Xi’s thought in three places, each time pairing him with Hui Shi, though the men were from different states and lived about 200 years apart. This incongruity suggests that the pair are being used iconically to represent a certain general intellectual style or orientation. Thus the sophistries Xunzi ascribes to them may not be their invention, or at least not Deng Xi’s. Xunzi describes them as “fond of dealing with strange doctrines and playing with bizarre expressions” (6.6), of which he gives these examples (3.1):

  1. Mountains and abysses are level.
  2. Heaven and earth are alongside each other.
  3. Qi [on the east coast] and Qin [in the far west] are adjacent.
  4. Enter through the ear.
  5. Exit through the mouth.
  6. Hooks have whiskers.
  7. Eggs have feathers.

The first two of these are similar to paradoxes attributed to Hui Shi in “Under Heaven” (Zhuangzi, Book 33); we will discuss them in the section on Hui Shi. The seventh is also listed in “Under Heaven,” but not attributed to Hui Shi there. This suggests that the list of paradoxes associated with him was still fluid at the time of Xunzi’s writing. The third is similar to the spatial paradoxes of Hui Shi, also to be discussed below. The sixth is obscure; some commentators emend “hooks” to a similar graph for “old women.” The fourth and fifth are puzzling, since they are not obviously paradoxes or sophisms. Commentators often combine them into a single sentence, but in the text all seven seem to be independent, three-word sentences.

Xunzi’s fundamental complaint about Hui Shi and Deng Xi is that their “frivolous investigations” do not conform to traditional ritual propriety and righteousness (3.1), an unsurprising criticism given the Confucian’s commitment to ritual training—and thus conventional standards for the correct use of names—along with his general disdain for science and intellectual curiosity (12.3). They are “incisive” and “clever,” but their ideas are “useless,” yield few concrete results, and have no application to government (6.6). They have “no regard for the facts about right and wrong, so and not-so” (8.3). In the eyes of a 3rd-century B.C.E. Confucian traditionalist, then, the 6th-century Deng Xi was emblematic of a bright, talented person who wastes his energy on pointless intellectual games and sophistry, perhaps with a deliberate disregard for the truth, instead of earnestly committing himself to moral training and political administration.

For an account of Deng Xi’s legal and political career, see this supplementary document:

Deng Xi’s Exploits

4. Yin Wen

Little is known of Yin Wen (fl. late 4th century B.C.E.), and it is unclear why the Han History classifies him with the “School of Names.” Perhaps the one scroll of writings by him mentioned in the “Bibliographical Treatise” was about language. What little information we have about him comes mainly from two sources, the “Under Heaven” essay and The Annals of Lü Buwei, both of which are considerably later than his lifetime and thus must be taken mainly to be reporting legend. Neither text attributes to him views on language or disputation. “Under Heaven” links him to Song Xing, his teacher or colleague, and the pair were among the many scholars who gathered at Jixia in Qi under the patronage of King Xuan (r. 319–301 B.C.E.).[9] Xunzi rebuts several of Song Xing’s doctrines at length but does not mention Yin Wen.

“Under Heaven” portrays Yin Wen and Song Xing as tireless crusaders devoted to saving the world by advocating non-aggression, a life of few, easily satisfied desires, and a tolerant, unbiased frame of mind. To promote these doctrines, they “traveled the world, persuading the high and instructing the low.” In relations with others, to save people from fighting they taught that “to be insulted is no disgrace,” and to save the world from war, they taught “forbid aggression and put troops to rest.” (As the name suggests, the Warring States era was marked by frequent, catastrophic wars.) Concerning the self, they held that the inherent desires are few and shallow, a doctrine that, if true, would remove many potential reasons for conflict. “Their starting point in dealing with things was avoiding enclosures,” or psychological barriers due to prejudice or dogmatic commitment which tend to result in biased or one-sided judgments. Such “enclosures” are frequently also a source of conflict, since they may prevent one from appreciating all relevant features of a situation or understanding others’ point of view. Yin Wen and Song Xing emphasized that the heart itself has a kind of “conduct,” independent of external conduct. In their anti-war stance and emphasis on benefit, they display affinities with Mohist thought: “If something was of no advantage to the world, understanding it was not as good as abandoning it.” But the doctrines of tolerance and avoiding bias are genuinely novel, and are probably the reason Song Xing is singled out for praise in the Zhuangzi (Book 1).

The Annals of Lü Buwei depicts Yin Wen in an audience with King Min of Qi (r. 300–284 B.C.E.), defending the doctrine that to be insulted is not disgraceful. (Again, we should keep in mind that the details of the story may be mostly later invention.) The anecdote vividly illustrates several of the main techniques by which the disputers conducted their craft. Yin Wen identifies distinguishing features for calling things by a certain name and employs models and analogies to persuade the king. The context of the passage is a discussion of “correcting names.” Because he failed to correct his own use of names, King Min knew enough to be fond of “officers” but not how to distinguish the sort of people properly referred to as “officers.” (Shi, “officer,” was a social rank similar to “knight,” but by this era it had lost most of its martial connotation.) Yin Wen proposes that “officers” are distinguished by four types of conduct: they are filial in serving their parents, loyal in serving their ruler, trustworthy toward friends, and brotherly toward neighbors. The king agrees, indicating also that this is just the sort of person he would appoint as a government official. Yin Wen asks whether the king would still appoint such a person supposing that, on being insulted in public, he did not fight. The king replies that to be insulted is a disgrace; he would not appoint a disgraced person.

Yin Wen said: “Though when insulted he does not fight, he has not strayed from the four types of conduct. Not straying from the four types of conduct, this is not losing that by which he is an officer. If, not losing that by which he is an officer, in the one case the King would appoint him an official, in the other case not, then is what we earlier called an ‘officer’ indeed an ‘officer’?”

The King had no response.

Yin Wen said, “Suppose there is a man here, when governing his state, if people do wrong he condemns them, if people do no wrong he condemns them; if people commit a crime he punishes them, if people commit no crime he punishes them. Then would it be admissible for him to despise the people for being hard to govern?”

The King said, “Not admissible.”

Yin Wen said, “…The King’s command says: ‘One who kills another dies, one who injures another is maimed.’ The people, fearing the King’s command, dare not fight even when deeply insulted; this is fulfilling the King’s command. Yet the King says, ‘Not daring to fight when insulted, this is a disgrace.’ Now to call it a disgrace, it’s this that’s called ‘condemning it’. In the one case to appoint a person as an official, in the other not, this is deeming it a crime. This is the King punishing someone when he has committed no crime.”

The King had no response. (16.8/402)

King Min is presented as an example of someone whose use of names, such as ‘officer’, is incorrect: name and form do not “fit.” As a result, “those he calls worthy are unworthy, what he calls good is depraved, and what he calls admissible is perverse.” Interestingly, the text employs terminology that dovetails with later Mohist semantic theory and epistemology. It explains that the King did not know the “reason” or “basis” for deeming people “officers,” using the same term as the Mohists—gu—and alludes to his poor ability to classify or “sort” (lun) things into kinds, which in later Mohist epistemology is the mark of understanding. Though the Annals story does not make this point explicitly, we can link the King’s erroneous “sorting” to Yin Wen’s doctrine of “avoiding enclosures.” The King’s judgments about officers are “enclosed” by his dogmatic conviction that to be insulted is a disgrace and that an officer must answer challenges to his honor with violence.

5. Hui Shi

Hui Shi (fl. 313 B.C.E.) is a complex figure, familiar and indistinct by turns. He is mentioned in at least eight early texts. Only two, the Xunzi and the Zhuangzi “Under Heaven” essay, give any information about his philosophical views, and they merely attribute a series of theses to him without recording his arguments. For a review of biographical information about him, see the supplementary document.

Life of Hui Shi

We have no direct evidence of Hui Shi’s views on language and meaning. But as Graham points out (1989: 81), a story preserved in a Han dynasty text suggests that he may have held a view similar to that of the Mohists (Canon B70) (see the entries on Mohism and the Mohist Canons). Language enables us to communicate by indicating that the objects referred to are similar to things we already know, the kinds of objects conventionally denoted by those words.

A client said to the King of Liang, “In talking about things, Hui Shi is fond of using analogies. If you don’t let him use analogies, he won’t be able to speak.” The King said, “Agreed.” The next day he saw Hui Shi and said, “I wish that when you speak about things, you speak directly, without using analogies.” Hui Shi said, “Suppose there’s a man here who doesn’t know what a dan is. If he says, ‘What are the features of a dan like?’ and we answer, saying, ‘The features of a dan are like a dan,’ then would that communicate it?” The King said, “It would not.” “Then if we instead answered, ‘The features of a dan are like a bow, but with a bamboo string,’ then would he know?” The King said, “It can be known.” Hui Shi said, “Explanations are inherently a matter of using what a person knows to communicate what he doesn’t know, thereby causing him to know it. Now if you say, ‘No analogies,’ that’s inadmissible.” The King said, “Good!” (Shuo Yuan, Ch. 11; cf. Graham 1989: 81)

As we would expect from mainstream Chinese theories of language and disputation, Hui Shi is accustomed to explaining things by appeal to analogies. Indeed, his answer to the king is itself an analogy, or at least an illustrative example (the Chinese word for “analogy,” pi, refers to both). We can also notice from the story that in seeking to learn about something unknown, one does not ask for a definition of the object, but for a description of what its features “are like.” The standard response is to cite a familiar analogue and then point out the differences between the unknown object and the familiar one. Communication proceeds not by knowing “meanings,” but by knowing how to distinguish similar from different kinds of things.[10]

“Under Heaven” is overwhelmingly critical of Hui Shi:

Hui Shi daily applied his wits in disputation with the others, but only in comparison with the disputers of the world was he exceptional, that’s the bottom of it.…Weak in virtue, strong on external things, his path was crooked. Viewed from the perspective of the Way (dao) of Heaven and Earth, Hui Shi’s abilities were like the labors of a mosquito or gnat. Even with respect to external things, what use were they? (cf. Graham 1981: 285)

The text concludes that he wasted his talents “chasing after the myriad things,” in his many directions of inquiry, instead of concentrating on a single path. As a result, he only “ended with a name for being good at disputation.” This dismissal is less an objective evaluation of Hui Shi’s inquiries than an expression of the intellectual orientation of the essay’s Han dynasty author, who values only moral cultivation and commitment to an ethical and political dao (way), not inquiry for inquiry’s sake. It seems likely that we would have considered Hui Shi’s explanations of “the myriad things” to be of great interest.

5.1 The Ten Theses

Our only detailed information about Hui Shi’s doctrines comes from two sources: the seven statements attributed jointly to him and Deng Xi in the Xunzi (3.1), which we looked at briefly above, and the “Under Heaven” essay, which attributes ten theses to him, some paradoxical. “Under Heaven” was probably written long after Hui Shi’s death, and only one of its ten theses appears in the much earlier Xunzi list. Hence we cannot be sure the ten theses were indeed Hui Shi’s; some or all may have been the work of anonymous followers who adopted him as their figurehead. Fortunately, this historical issue is irrelevant to their philosophical interest. Either way, the theses are intriguing ideas formulated by one or more Chinese thinkers probably sometime during the late 4th or the 3rd century B.C.E. The arguments for the theses have been lost, and as a result some are extremely obscure. But others are reasonably clear or at least open to educated conjecture.

The ten theses revolve around the theme that distinctions are not inherently fixed, but relative to a perspective, and thus can be redrawn or collapsed as we like simply by shifting perspectives. Several of the paradoxes focus on negating commonsense distinctions, in particular spatial and temporal ones, partly by appeal to the relativity of comparisons and partly by appeal to indexicals (Hansen 1992: 262). (A high mountain is not high when seen from space; if I walk southward, a spot that is south of me now will in seconds be north of me.) The fifth thesis, on “the same” and “different,” seems to provide a key to several, perhaps all of the others. It indicates that on some scale or another, anything can be deemed “the same” or “different.”

The theses are presented in “Under Heaven” as follows:

Hui Shi had many directions (fang, also “methods”). His books filled five carts; his dao (way) was contrary; his sayings did not hit the mark. Intending to tabulate things, he said:
  1. The ultimately great has no outside, call it the Great One. The ultimately small has no inside, call it the Small One.
  2. The dimensionless cannot be accumulated, its size is a thousand miles.
  3. Heaven is as low as earth, mountains are level with marshes.
  4. Just as the sun is at noon, it is declining. Just as things are alive, they are dying.
  5. The same on a large scale but different from what is the same on a small scale, this is called “same and different on a small scale.” The myriad things all being the same or all being different, this is called “same and different on a large scale.”
  6. The south has no limit yet has a limit.
  7. Today go to Yue but arrive yesterday.
  8. Linked rings can be disconnected.
  9. I know the center of the world. It is north of Yan [the northernmost state] and south of Yue [the southernmost].
  10. Universally care for the myriad things. Heaven and earth are one unit.

Hui Shi took these to be of great significance. He displayed them to the world to let the disputers know of them, and the disputers of the world enjoyed them with him.

It is unclear whether the order of the sequence is deliberate, but this seems unlikely, since the temporal paradoxes are not placed together, and it is hard to see how thesis 8, about the rings, fits into a deliberate, argumentative sequence. On the other hand, the last thesis, the only one with ethical import, reads like a grand conclusion and so probably belongs in the final position. The first forms a natural opening, with the “Great One” portending the “one unit” of the tenth, and the second may about one of the notions introduced in the first, the “Small One” or infinitesimal. The fifth is among the clearest and is probably the basis for several of the others. Some scholars have suggested that the list breaks into two parts, with the fifth thesis summarizing the first half, but this interpretation seems forced. The first, fifth, and tenth are of course neither paradoxes nor sophistries, but relatively straightforward philosophical theses. Thesis 3 is a variant of the first two paradoxes attributed to Hui Shi and Deng Xi in Xunzi (3.1), listed above in the section on Deng Xi. With those two exceptions, the paradoxes attributed to Hui Shi here are considerably more interesting philosophically than those Xunzi mentions.

The theses are obscure enough that, especially without knowing Hui Shi’s original arguments, any close interpretation must be partly speculative. Different readers are bound to arrive at different conclusions. With the possible exception of theses 1, 5, and 10, there is simply not enough contextual information to offer an authoritative argument for any interpretation, though at least some readings can be ruled out for failing to cohere with any recognized issues or theories in early Chinese philosophical discourse. Here we will offer a tentative explanation of each thesis grounded in the philosophical context sketched in “Background and Overview” above.[11] The theses divide fairly naturally into four groups, which we will discuss one by one.

Group 1: Basic Principles

The first group comprises theses 1, 5, and 10, which state philosophical doctrines about ontology and ethics, not paradoxes, and which are relatively easy to understand. All three deal with the plurality of possible ways to distinguish things, either as “the same” or “different” or as parts of a whole, ranging from the smallest possible part—the infinitesimal—to the largest possible whole, the “Great One,” which includes everything in the cosmos. How we distinguish things is relative to the scale or perspective we adopt. Thesis 5 is slightly obscure, but it seems to describe the relative or perspectival nature of relations of similarity and difference. Two things can be the same on a large scale, or in some general respect, while at the same time being different on a smaller scale, or in some more specific respect. For example, two animals can be the same in being of the kind horse, yet be different in color. Anything can be similar or different on some scale or other. If we distinguish finely, every individual horse is different, while if we distinguish coarsely, horses are no different from other animals, or even from all other things. There seems to be an unlimited range of levels on which we can distinguish relations of sameness and difference, including deeming every individual different or the myriad kinds of things the same.

Because the same/different relation comprises both kind relations and part-whole relations, Thesis 5 can also be taken to include part-whole relations. Deeming all things “the same” is deeming them all parts of the same whole. Deeming them “different” can be understood as separating them off as individual parts of that whole. To the extent that the other theses are based on relations of sameness versus difference and part versus whole, then, thesis 5 may explain them all.

Thesis 1 is nearly self-explanatory. How we distinguish things—in this case, how we even count “1”—is relative to some standard of division. The thesis concerns summing and dividing. The whole cosmos can be summed into a whole to form the Great One. Or it can be divided down to the smallest possible unit, the Small One, probably a geometric point.

Thesis 10 presents an ethical principle tied together with an ontological one, which presumably is meant to justify it. Since everything can be summed into a whole—the Great One—heaven and earth and the myriad things contained therein can be considered a single “body” or “unit.”[12] (In classical texts, the expression ‘heaven and earth’ refers to the cosmos, including not only the sky and earth but the entire natural world.) The ethical principle follows intuitively. If everything is one unit, then any care (ai, also “love”) we have for ourselves should also be directed at all of the other myriad things (wu, “things,” or, perhaps more specifically, “creatures”), since fundamentally we are all parts of the same vast “unit” or “body.” This ethical stance takes the ideal of impartiality even farther than the Mohists. Their position is that we must care inclusively for every person in the world. Thesis 10 advocates caring for every thing as well.

Group 2: Infinitesimals and Part-whole

The second group concerns infinitesimals and part-whole relations. Like all seven of the remaining theses, these are paradoxes. Thesis 2 is fairly clear. Geometrical points are dimensionless. The sum of two points is still a point; hence points cannot be added one to another to form an object with thickness or length. Yet anything with dimensions is somehow constituted by points and divisible into them.[13]

In this group we can also include thesis 8, though with much less confidence, as it is the most obscure of the ten. We will tentatively suppose—following Harbsmeier (1998: 296) and Graham (1989: 79)—that this thesis too is based on infinitesimals. The paradox might then be explained in one of two ways. First, if the linked rings are thought of as circles, formed by points on a plane, then they have no thickness. They appear linked when viewed from above, but on the surface of the plane nothing blocks them from being pulled apart. The second explanation extends the same idea to three dimensions. If, as thesis 2 suggests, two three-dimensional rings are constituted by dimensionless points, then they can be pulled apart: since each point takes up no space, there is nothing preventing the rings from passing through each other. These interpretations are highly speculative, however. Without further contextual information, even if this sort of explanation makes sense of the paradox, we have no particular reason to believe it is correct.

Group 3: Spatial Relations

The third group are based on spatial relations, including comparisons of size. Thesis 3, the only one also attributed to Hui Shi in the Xunzi, can be taken to illustrate the idea that things deemed different on one scale can be deemed the same on another. By some perspective or standard, such as that of the infinitely vast Great One, the difference between the height of the sky and the earth or mountains and marshes may be insignificant. From that perspective, the differences between mountains and marshes may be only what thesis 5 calls “differences on a small scale,” while the two count as “the same” on a large scale. Thesis 6 is especially obscure. Thematically, we can point out that like several of the other theses, it attempts to collapse a distinction, in this case between the finite and infinite. As Hansen (1992: 262) points out, thesis 6, along with 7 and 9, all focus on indexicals. Since the referents of indexicals shift from context to context, they are a vivid example of the fluidity of the language-world relation and the distinction between “this” (shi) and “not” (fei). This suggests at least two ways to understand the thesis, both too speculative to be considered justified, but perhaps at least roughly indicative of its point. One is that if a particular direction is to be south, it must have a limit, or else the four directions all merge into one and south is no longer south, since it is not distinguished from the other three. Another possibility is that since the directions of the compass are all indexical, relative to our point of reference, south always has a limit: the point at which we stand.

Thesis 9 is another of those involving indexicals, in this case “center,” and is also very obscure. The thesis claims that the center of the world is north of the northernmost state and south of the southernmost. Possibly the thesis is a variant of thesis 3, that the sky is as low as the earth. The point there was that from the perspective of the infinitely vast whole, the difference between the height of the sky and earth may be insignificant. Thesis 9 could be making the analogous point that the distance between Yan and Yue is insignificant. Another possibility is that if space is infinitely large, then every standpoint can count as the center (Graham 1989: 79, after the 3rd-century Sima Biao). Possibly this thesis is a variant of the same idea as the third thesis in the Xunzi list, which was that the far west and far east are “adjacent.”

Group 4: Temporal Relations

The fourth group deal with temporal relations. Thesis 4 is paradoxical but easily intelligible. Just as from one perspective the sun is at its highest, from another perspective it is beginning to set. Just as things are living and growing, they are also coming closer to death. Again, the plurality of perspectives threatens to collapse the distinction between two apparent opposites, living and dying. In comparison with thesis 4, thesis 7 is extremely obscure. Clearly, it attempts to collapse the difference between today and yesterday or present and past. Interestingly, this paradox combines spatial and temporal relations, since in addition to the distinction between today and yesterday, there is the spatial movement from here to Yue (a state in the south). Hence Harbsmeier (298) and Graham (79) both propose to interpret the paradox in terms of the infinite divisibility of space and time, suggesting that if I cross the border into Yue precisely at the instant when today turns into tomorrow, the result is that I am simultaneously leaving one state today and arriving in the other tomorrow. Another possibility is to point out that xi, the word rendered “yesterday,” is also commonly used to mean simply “the past” or “previously.” So thesis 7 can be restated, “Today I go to Yue, but I arrive in the past.” The import of the paradox could be that all “arriving” is always in the past: whenever we arrive somewhere, our journey is completed, or “past.”

General Theme

Are the ten theses merely a loose collection, or are they intended to support a particular conclusion? Clearly, several of them can be taken to follow from thesis 5, about the relativity of sameness and difference. Thesis 5 can thus be treated as a premise or guiding principle and might be the main theme. Another possibility is that the ten are intended to culminate in the final thesis, the only one with moral import, which is not relativistic. It states that heaven and earth—all of the natural world—form a monistic unit, and so our moral caring should extend to all things. The question of the overall significance of the set in effect boils down to the question of whether, given the overall context, thesis 10 has a privileged status over thesis 5 and the others. From Hu Shih (1922) on, many interpreters have suggested it does.[14] Clearly, the textual evidence is so sparse that there is no question of deciding the issue conclusively. However, there are at least three good reasons for favoring the monistic interpretation. First, the placement of thesis 10 at the end makes it natural to read it as the conclusion or main theme. Second, not only is thesis 10 placed last, it is the only thesis with ethical significance. A plausible explanation is that whoever arranged the ten theses saw the ethical view as emerging out of the others. Third, and most important, unlike theses 1 and 5, thesis 10 seems to make an absolutist claim. If it were parallel to theses 1 and 5, we might expect it to present a perspectival claim, such as that heaven and earth are in one respect one body and in another respect many. But instead it simply asserts that they are one.

Tentatively adopting the monistic interpretation, then, we can reconstruct the basic “Hui Shi view” roughly as follows:

  1. The relations of sameness and difference that underlie all use of language can be redrawn in indefinitely many ways, all of which may be justified relative to one standard or another.
  2. So no single way of drawing distinctions is fixed by nature itself.
  3. Hence the world in itself draws no distinctions at all. Distinctions are established by human convention, in which we establish norms for distinguishing the same and different one way or another. Apart from these norms, there are no absolute, privileged natural kinds or distinctions.
  4. Therefore, in itself, all of nature forms a single whole. (And as parts of this whole, we should care for all things.)

Several comments about this view are in order. First, the thrust of the view is not that distinctions are “unreal,” in the sense of being illusory, false, or merely an aspect of appearance, not underlying reality. It is just the opposite: countless different schemes of distinctions are all real, with the result that none are privileged. Since no scheme is privileged, the “neutral” or “default” view—that of the world in itself—is monistic, drawing no distinctions at all. On the other hand, another way of understanding “real” is as meaning “fixed by nature itself.” If we take “real” this way, we can agree with Hansen (262) that the Hui Shi position adopts a “non-realist” attitude toward distinctions: it holds that no single scheme of distinctions is fixed by the world. However, if the monistic interpretation is correct, then the Hui Shi position is realist in this sense with respect to the “one unit” or “Great One,” the “null scheme” consisting of the absence of any distinctions. That scheme is fixed by nature itself.

Second, the Hui Shi view does not hold that, as Graham proposes, “Since division leads to contradiction don’t divide at all” (1989: 79). Far from regarding contradictions as a problem, it embraces them. It explains them by appeal to constantly shifting perspectives or standards for distinguishing same and different.

Since Hui Shi’s monism might recall that of the Eleatics (cf. Hu 1922, Graham 1989), it is worth clarifying the similarities and differences between the two. The similarities are superficial: both develop a form of absolute monism grounded in reflection about language or thought and its relation to reality. But the arguments for and consequences of the two views are fundamentally different. The starting point for Parmenides’s monism is reflection on the concept of ‘being’ or ‘the real’, specifically the claim that what is real must necessarily be. From this he draws the conclusion that what is real must be ungenerable, imperishable, indivisible, and unchanging. Thus, in contrast to the eternal, unchanging world intelligible through reason, the inconstant, changing world of everyday perceptual experience is in some sense not “real.” By contrast, the Hui Shi view starts from a kind of radical perspectivalism about distinctions. It argues that since no standard for drawing distinctions has a privileged, absolute status, the only way to draw distinctions given by reality itself is not to draw any at all. Reality is not regarded as indivisible and unchanging, nor is the changing world of sense experience in any sense “unreal.” Rather, reality is divisible in indefinitely many ways. All of the resulting distinctions are “real” in the sense that the features of things on which they are based indeed exist. The distinctions are not delusory. The problem is that neither are they privileged or fixed: they can be replaced by alternative schemes of distinctions. The only privileged scheme is monism, drawing no distinctions at all.[15]

Is this move from perspectivalism about distinctions to a kind of monism justified? Hansen argues that it is not. His interpretation of the argument is that it moves from the claim that we cannot know what distinctions are ultimately real to the conclusion that no distinctions are real (262). The move is via the hidden, verificationist premise that a distinction exists only if we can know that it does. Hence Hansen suggests that the Hui Shi view is based on a form of “verification fallacy,” which confuses what we can know with what is real (263).

Hansen is probably right to hold that monism does not follow validly from Hui Shi’s premises. All that follows is that no one scheme for drawing distinctions can be justified absolutely: Justification must always be contextual. But it seems unlikely that the text commits the fallacy he describes. The ten theses do not mention epistemic issues. Certainly there is no explicit skeptical claim that we cannot know which distinctions are ultimately real. Rather, there is only the suggestion, in thesis 5, that there may be uncountably many ways of drawing distinctions, set alongside a series of examples that collapse conventional distinctions. So, rather than committing a verificationist fallacy, it may be that the Hui Shi view is simply inconsistent. On the basis of thesis 5, Hui Shi should hold any scheme of distinctions may be deemed “admissible” or “inadmissible,” by reference to some standard or other, yet no scheme is privileged, including the scheme that consists in drawing no distinctions at all. Instead, if the monistic interpretation is correct, he mistakenly takes the “Great One” or “one unit” view to be an exception to this rule.[16] The mistake is understandable, since drawing no distinctions at all might seem to be a way of circumventing the perspectival nature of distinctions. It is not, however, since strictly speaking it remains one among other ways of drawing distinctions.

“Under Heaven” lists 21 more paradoxes, which “the disputers used to respond to Hui Shi without end for their whole lives.” All lack explanations, making some impenetrably obscure. For interpretations of a handful of the relatively tractable ones, along with speculations about a few of the others, see the following supplementary document:

Miscellaneous Paradoxes

Despite their obscurity, at least some of the theses attributed to Hui Shi and a few of the other paradoxes and sophistries collected in “Under Heaven” probably grow out of legitimate theoretical issues and are of genuine philosophical interest. By contrast, when we turn to Gongsun Long, we encounter a disputer who may have been devoted to sophistry purely for sophistry’s sake. We cannot be sure of this, of course, but what we can say is that Gongsun Long won fame by advocating a claim that any competent speaker of his language would have judged obviously false, namely that “a white horse is not a horse.”

6. Gongsun Long

Gongsun Long (c. 320–250 B.C.E.) was a retainer to the Lord of Pingyuan (d. 252 B.C.E.) in the northern state of Zhao. Anecdotes about him are found in the Zhuangzi and The Annals of Lü Buwei, in which he is depicted advising King Hui of Zhao (r. 298–266 B.C.E.) against war (18.1, 18.7) and in disputation with Kong Chuan, a descendent of Confucius, at the home of the Lord of Pingyuan (18.5). He is mentioned in “Under Heaven” as a leading disputer and in the Han dynasty Records of the Grand Historian (Book 74) as undertaking disputation about the hard and white and the same and different. Intriguingly, the Annals depicts him citing the Mohist principle of “all-inclusive care” (jian ai) to King Hui. Together with his anti-war stance, this suggests that he was influenced by and may once have numbered among the Mohists. The Xunzi does not criticize him by name but does cite a version of his white horse sophism in a list of incorrect uses of names (22.3).

In one anecdote, Gongsun Long is shown applying his cleverness to help rescue a state from attack. Zhao, his state, had formed a treaty with Qin to assist each other in anything either wished to do. Qin proceeded to attack Wei, Zhao’s neighbor. Zhao wished to rescue Wei, but Qin sent an envoy to the king of Zhao to complain.

The King of Qin was displeased and sent an envoy to reproach the King of Zhao, saying, “The treaty says, ‘Whatever Qin wishes to do, Zhao will assist it; whatever Zhao wishes to do, Qin will assist it.’ Now Qin wishes to attack Wei, yet Zhao wishes to rescue it. This is not what we agreed on.” The King of Zhao told the Lord of Pingyuan about it. The Lord of Pingyuan told Gongsun Long about it. Gongsun Long said, “We too can dispatch an envoy to reproach the King of Qin, saying, ‘Zhao wishes to rescue Wei, but now the King of Qin alone does not assist Zhao. This is not what we agreed on.’” (The Annals of Lü Buwei, 18.5/457)

Another anecdote is valuable for what it suggests about the nature of Gongsun Long’s disputations. Gongsun Long debates with an opponent, Kong Chuan, at the residence of the Lord of Pingyuan. With great cleverness, he argues for the claim that “John Doe has three ears.” (In Chinese, plurals are unmarked, so the sophist can assert of any normal two-eared person, such as John Doe, that he “has ear(s),” and also that he has a left ear and a right ear. Therefore he has “three ears.”) Eventually, Kong Chuan is unable to reply.

The next day, Kong Chuan came to court. The Lord of Pingyuan said to him, “Yesterday, Gongsun Long’s speech was extremely clever.” Kong Chuan said, “That’s so. He was nearly able to make John Doe have three ears. Although he could do so, it’s a difficult claim to accept. May I ask a question of you, your Lordship? Claiming that John Doe has three ears is extremely difficult and in reality is wrong. Claiming that John Doe has two ears is extremely easy and in reality is right. I wonder whether your Lordship will follow what is easy and right, or what is difficult and wrong?” (Annals, 18.5/457)

Gongsun Long’s disputation is perceived as plainly not fitting “reality” (shi, also the “stuff” spoken of). It is an exercise in cleverness, a kind of trick performance in which the disputer attempts to make a case for a claim that everyone knows does not fit its object. Harbsmeier has rightly emphasized this point in arguing that further attention to Gongsun Long’s social and historical context is needed if we are to understand the white horse sophism properly (1998: 300–301). He suggests that Gongsun Long probably belonged to a class of entertainers at Chinese courts who performed various skills or tricks. His was to prove, over any and all objections, that a white horse is not a horse. His sophistries may have been intended primarily as a kind of light entertainment, not as expressions of a principled philosophical position. They touch on philosophical issues, such as discriminating the same and different, but there is no reason to expect them to demonstrate cogent reasoning based on a coherent semantic or logical theory. The truth may be just the opposite: They could have been intended to be whimsical and amusing, even comical. The “White Horse” dialogue may be a record of the sort of arguments Gongsun Long would offer in his performances.

The Han History lists Gongsun Long as the author of fourteen scrolls of writings. The extant text called Gongsun Longzi comprises only five short dialogues and an introduction, which is obviously of relatively late date. A. C. Graham argued persuasively that three of the dialogues are not Warring States texts, but much later forgeries pieced together partly from misunderstood bits of the Mohist Dialectics. Probably only the “White Horse,” the essay “Indicating Things,” and a bit of another dialogue are genuine pre-Han texts.[17] We will look at the first of these below (the second is treated in a supplement at the end of this section).

The Gongsun Longzi has inspired a vast exegetical literature in both Asian and European languages, with no consensus in sight as to the significance and theoretical basis of its arguments. The interpretation proposed here must be considered only one of several potentially defensible approaches (others are noted below). In the case of the “White Horse” dialogue, the text is generally clear enough. (“Indicating Things,” on the other hand, appears to be intentionally obscure.) The scholarly controversy concerns what theory and implicit premises to ascribe to the text so that the arguments come out as cogent defenses of a reasonable position. As Graham says, the interpretive obstacle is “the difficulty of finding an angle of approach from which the arguments will make sense.…The arguments are clear, yet the first seems an obvious non sequitur…and the rest seem to assume an elementary confusion of identity and class membership” (1989: 82). Introducing his own interpretation, he says, “No one has yet proposed a reading of the dialogue as a consecutive demonstration which does not turn it into an improbable medley of gross fallacies and logical subtleties” (1990: 193). Building on Harbsmeier’s insight that the historical context of Gongsun Long’s disputations has been insufficiently appreciated, we may suspect Graham’s remarks signal interpretive charity gone too far. Given what information we have about Gongsun Long—Harbsmeier’s considerations, the general reputation of the disputers for flippant wordplay, the denunciation of Gongsun Long in the “Under Heaven” essay, and most important, the fact that his contemporaries took his most famous claim to be patently false—we should expect the text to be a “medley of gross fallacies and logical subtleties,” roughly a Chinese analogue to the subtle, fallacious, and deeply amusing arguments of Lewis Carroll.

None of this means that interpreting “White Horse” is pointless. We can learn about the serious practice of disputation by studying what is in effect a spoof of disputation, just as an anthropologist can learn about a culture by studying its humor. But we should not expect the Gongsun Longzi to present rigorous arguments or defend well-developed theses of philosophical substance. In this case, interpretive charity may direct us to look not for true claims supported by sound reasoning, but for whimsical claims defended by bewildering, even madcap arguments.

6.1 “White Horse is Not Horse”

The “White Horse Discourse” has spawned nearly as many interpretations as there are interpreters. One early, influential interpretation took its theme to be denying the identity of the universals ‘horse’ and ‘white horse’ (Fung 1958, Cheng 1983). There is now a fairly broad consensus, at least among European and American scholars, that the text is unlikely to concern universals, since no ancient Chinese philosopher held a realist doctrine of universals. Other interpretations have taken it to deal with kind and identity relations (Cikoski 1975, Harbsmeier 1998), part-whole relations (Hansen 1983, Graham 1989), how the extensions of phrases vary from those of their constituent terms (Hansen 1992), and even the use/mention distinction (Thompson 1995). For examples of other recent approaches, see Indraccolo (2017), Fung (2020b), Jiang (2020), and Zhou (2020).

A satisfactory interpretation must fit into the discursive context established by the Mohists, Xunzi, and The Annals of Lü Buwei, cohere with the concerns we identified in discussing the background (Section 1) and main themes (Section 2) of the disputers’ inquiries, and take into account what other early texts tell us about Gongsun Long. Since we know he was an intellectual prankster, we cannot assume the texts will present cogent arguments for a well-reasoned philosophical position. If we find them presenting plainly intelligible but specious arguments, we should take these at face value, rather than seek esoteric explanations. Given the context of pre-Han thought, we should expect the text to toy with the problem of distinguishing “same” from “different,” potentially touching on identity, part-whole, and kind relations. And given the disputers’ association with the theme of “hard and white,” we should expect that the text might attempt to treat inseparable features of things as if they were separable parts. A number of interpretations have the potential to meet these requirements, including interpretations involving part-whole relations, scope ambiguity, kind relations, and identity relations. To decide between them, then, we need to look at the details of the text. “White Horse” contains five arguments for its thesis that “White horse is not horse.” We may find that some interpretive approaches work better for some of the five, some for others.

One further anecdote about Gongsun Long—found in two texts from later eras, the introductory chapter of the Gongsun Longzi and the Kong Congzi—provides useful context for the dialogue. In response to a request from Kong Chuan that he abandon his thesis that a white horse is not a horse, Gongsun Long defends it by claiming that Confucius himself accepted the same thesis. He cites a version of a story also found in The Annals of Lü Buwei (1.4), in which the King of Chu loses his bow.

The King’s attendants asked to look for it, but the King said, “Stop. The King of Chu lost a bow. A Chu person will find it. Why bother to look for it?” Confucius heard about it and said: “The King of Chu is benevolent and righteous but hasn’t yet reached the ultimate. He should simply have said, ‘A person lost a bow, a person will find it,’ that’s all. Why must it be ‘Chu’?” In this way, Confucius took Chu people to be different from what’s called “people.” Now to approve of Confucius’s taking Chu people to be different from what’s called “people” but disapprove of my taking white horse to be different from what’s called “horse” is contradictory. (Gongsun Longzi, Book 1)[18]

In one version of the story, Kong Chuan replies that when Confucius omits the ‘Chu’, he is broadening the scope of the referent, not claiming that Chu people are not people.

Whenever we say “person,” we refer to persons in general, just as whenever we say “horse,” we refer to horses in general. ‘Chu’ by itself is the state; ‘white’ by itself is the color. Wishing to broaden the referent of ‘person’, it’s appropriate to omit the ‘Chu’; wishing to fix the name of the color, it’s not appropriate to omit the ‘white’. (Kong Congzi, Book 11; cf. Graham 1989: 84)

As Harbsmeier points out (302), since this story appears in the introduction to the Gongsun Longzi, it suggests that the book’s ancient editors themselves took the theme to be how the scope of the extension of a noun such as ‘person’ or ‘horse’ varies when modified by an adjective such as ‘Chu’ or ‘white’. The main theme is unlikely to be part-whole relations, since it is unlikely that the noun phrase ‘Chu person’ was construed as referring to a whole comprising two parts, the state of Chu and a person.

This preparatory discussion in hand, let’s look at the arguments in the “White Horse Discourse.” The text consists of a series of exchanges between a sophist and an objector, who defends the commonsense view that white horses are horses. For brevity, we will translate and discuss only the sophist’s arguments, not the objector’s. To capture the flavor of the Chinese, we will render certain phrases in pidgin English, omitting articles and plurals. So we will translate the main thesis as “White horse is not horse,” variously interpretable as “a white horse is not a horse,” “white horses are not horses,” “a white horse is not an exemplar of the kind horse,” or “the kind white horse is not identical with the kind horse.”[19]

Argument 1.
‘Horse’ is that by which we name the shape. ‘White’ is that by which we name the color. Naming the color is not naming the shape. So white horse is not horse.

At first glance, it is not at all clear how the premises are expected to support the conclusion. Here we should recall that the argument is probably intended to be perplexing and open to various interpretations, the better to confuse and mystify the audience. With this caveat in mind, one plausible reading is that ‘white horse’ names both the color and the shape of white horses, not only the shape. So ‘white horse’ names something different from what ‘horse’ names. Hence white horse, the extension of ‘white horse’, is not the same as (identical to) horse, the extension of ‘horse’.

This argument can also be understood as “separating hard and white,” in that the shape and color of white horses, which are in fact inseparable, are treated as two separate things. If we grant the sophist that naming the color isn’t naming the shape, we have already allowed him to separate shape from color. Referring to the color is of course different from referring to the shape. But naming the object with the color is just naming the object with the shape. Hence we should reject the third premise and insist that naming the color is naming the shape.[20]

Argument 2.
If someone seeks a horse, then it’s admissible to deliver a brown or a black horse. If someone seeks a white horse, then it’s inadmissible to deliver a brown or a black horse. Suppose white horse were indeed horse. In that case, what the person seeks in those two cases would be one and the same. What he seeks being one and the same is the white one not being different from horse. If what he seeks is not different, then how is it that the brown or black horse are in the one case admissible and in the other inadmissible? Admissible and inadmissible, that they contradict each other is clear. So brown and black horses are one and the same in being able to answer to “having horse” but not to “having white horse.” This confirms that white horse is not horse.

This argument is fairly clearly not about part-whole relations, nor about separating hard from white. The sophist plainly construes “white horse is horse” as “white horse is identical to horse.” In Chinese as in English, the sentence ‘White horses are horses’ can be interpreted as predicating ‘horse’ of white horses, making the true claim that the things picked out by ‘white horse’ are all among those picked out by ‘horse’, or it can be interpreted as expressing an identity, making the false claim that exactly the same things are picked out by ‘white horse’ as by ‘horse’. The argument trades on this ambiguity. Because we know that modifying a noun narrows the scope of its extension, when we hear “white horses are horses,” we naturally apply the principle of charity, assume the speaker is not saying something obviously false, and take the relation in question to be predication, not identity. But the sophist insists on interpreting the sentence as an identity. Notice that the sophist implicitly applies a principle roughly like Leibniz’s law of indiscernibility of identicals. He assumes that if two things are identical, they will share all their features, and one can be substituted for the other in any context. Since what can be “delivered” in answer to a request for “white horse” is different from what can be “delivered” for “horse,” white horse is not horse.[21]

Argument 3.
Horses indeed have color; thus there are white horses. Supposing horses had no color, and there were simply horses and that’s all, how could we pick out the white horses? So white is not horse. White horse is horse combined with white. Is horse combined with white the same as horse?[22] So I say: White horse is not horse.

“White” is not “horse” because ‘horse’ alone doesn’t pick out the white ones; only ‘white’ does. The sophist takes it as obvious that “horse” combined with “white” is not simply “horse.” Here he is “separating hard and white,” in that he explicitly treats “white” and “horse” (that is, the shape of the animal) as two things that are combined to form something more than, and different from, a horse. The argument again turns on construing “White horse is horse” as the claim that the kind white horse is identical to the kind horse.

Argument 4.
“Since you take having white horse to be having horse, we can say having horse is having brown horse, is that admissible?” “Not admissible.” “Taking having horse to be different from having brown horse, this is taking brown horse to be different from horse. Taking brown horse to be different from horse, this is taking brown horse to be not horse. Taking brown horse to be not horse while taking white horse to be having horse, this is flying things entering a pond, inner and outer coffins in different places. These are the most contradictory sayings and confused expressions in the world.”

Here again the argument is based on construing “White/brown horse is horse” as an identity claim. Recall that in early Chinese thought the same/different relation may refer to either identity or kind relations. Moreover, in classical Chinese, both types of relations are expressed in the same syntactic form, the Chinese analogue of ‘A is (not) B’. So when the context is unambiguous, it is perfectly legitimate to express the fact that A is different from B by saying “A is not B.” Taking advantage of this grammatical feature, the sophist can move legitimately from the uncontroversial claim that having a horse is different from (that is, not identical to) having a brown horse to the intermediate claim that brown horse is different from (not identical to) horse and then not so legitimately to the conclusion that brown horse is not horse. The conclusion indeed follows, but only if we allow the sophist to construe “is not” as “is not identical to.” Notice that this argument seems to involve neither part-whole relations nor separating hard from white (that is, shape from color). Analogy plays a central role, however, as the argument is based on the analogy between brown and white horses.

The rhetorical flourish at the end of the argument is typical of Warring States disputation. To emphasize that a claim is inconsistent or contradictory, disputers would habitually cite contradictory or impossible things as analogies (Leslie 1964).

Argument 5.
“White” does not fix what is white.… As to “white horse,” saying it fixes what is white. What fixes what is white is not white. “Horse” selects or excludes none of the colors, so brown or black horses can all answer. “White horse” selects some color and excludes others; brown and black horses are all excluded on the basis of color, and so only white horse alone can answer. Excluding none is not excluding some. Therefore white horse is not horse.

The sophist first “separates hard and white,” establishing that the shape “horse” is not the same thing as the color “white.” The color alone does not specify the location that is white; saying “white horse” does. Therefore horse, the shape, is not white, the color. Indeed, horse specifies no color at all. White horse, on the other hand, does specify a color. So again the sophist has shown that white horse and horse have distinct features. Thus white horse is not (identical to) horse.

To sum up, the most natural way to read the text is as repeatedly equivocating between a statement of identity and one that predicates a more general term of the objects denoted by a less general term. The sophist refuses to distinguish the true statement that “[the kind] white horse is not [identical to the kind] horse” from the false “white horse is not [of the kind] horse.” The natural way to interpret “White horse is horse” is as the latter, but the sophist insists on interpreting it as the former. In a few places, the sophist distinguishes the shape of the horse from the color in a way that probably corresponds to “separating hard and white.”

A related explanation of the sophist’s view is that he confuses terms that refer at different levels of generality, or, equivalently, simply refuses to recognize that terms can refer at different levels of generality. Xunzi, whose career largely overlapped with Gongsun Long’s, introduced the concept of a “common name” (gong ming), or general term, which may refer to things at different levels of generality (22.2f). Xunzi pointed out that sometimes we refer to things by a single name, such as ‘horse’, and sometimes, to communicate more precisely, we use a “compound” name (what we would think of as a noun phrase), such as ‘white horse’. Provided one of these two kinds of names is more general, we can use both without their interfering with each other. This is roughly the same point Kong Chuan made in insisting that ‘horse’ always refers to all horses and that adding ‘white’ to it merely narrows its reference by specifying the horses’ color. In each case, the animals denoted by ‘horse’ are still horses. “White Horse” deliberately ignores this point.

Hansen (1983, 1992) has proposed an interesting account of the philosophical significance of the “White Horse” dialogue. The simplest early Chinese model of the language-world relation was “one name, one thing,” according to which all names refer at the same level of generality. Given the Chinese concern with “correcting names,” so that communication can proceed effectively and language can guide action reliably, a natural view would be that ideally each name or phrase should consistently denote one and only one sort of thing. But as the Mohists noticed, when names are joined to form phrases, their reference may shift in unexpected ways. In Chinese, the phrases ‘oxen-and-horses’ (niu ma) and ‘white horse’ (bai ma) appear to have the same syntax. But in compounds of the first type, the extension of the component nouns remains exactly the same as when the nouns are used singly: the extension of ‘oxen-and-horses’ is simply the sum of the extensions of ‘oxen’ and ‘horses’. In compounds of the second type—the “as hard to white” type—on the other hand, the extension of the component words changes. The extension of ‘white horse’ is the intersection, not the sum, of white things and horses. The extension of the words ‘white’ and ‘horse’ as used in the compound is thus different from what it is when they are used alone. This raises a serious problem for the one-name-one-thing view. The Mohists discovered the problem and took steps toward a solution. Xunzi finally solved it by explicitly rejecting the one-name-one-thing principle and recognizing that terms refer at different levels of generality. The approach implied by “White Horse,” Hansen suggests, would address the problem by retaining the one-name-one-thing principle and reforming our language use, so that all names pick out exactly the same portion of reality in all contexts, whether used singly or compounded into phrases. Since the extension of names changes when they are combined to form compounds of the “as hard to white” type, a proponent of this view must insist that the objects denoted by such compounds be treated as distinct from the objects denoted by either of their constituent names: white horses are neither white nor horse, but a distinct sort of thing. This “solution” is absurd, of course. But moving beyond the one-name-one-thing model and explaining exactly why this is absurd was a legitimate philosophical puzzle at the time.[23]

The other complete, genuine essay attributed to Gongsun Long is the near-impenetrable “Discourse on Indicating Things.” For a discussion of this text, see the supplementary document:

Indicating and Things

7. A Daoist Critique

Among Warring States texts, only two show any familiarity with the details of Hui Shi’s and Gongsun Long’s theses. (The “Under Heaven” book of the Zhuangzi, the major source for our discussion of Hui Shi, dates probably from the first few decades of the Han dynasty.) One is the Xunzi, which as we saw ascribes a list of seven paradoxes to Hui Shi and Deng Xi, as well as alluding elsewhere (22.3) to the white horse sophism. The other is the famous “Discourse on Equalizing Things,” Book 2 of the Zhuangzi, though the text does not attribute the theses to Hui Shi or Gongsun Long by name. “Equalizing Things” is critical of the disputers’ ideas and in one passage explicitly criticizes Hui Shi.[24] But it also praises his intelligence and is not downright hostile toward him, as Xunzi is.

“Equalizing Things” alludes to versions of at least four of Hui Shi’s theses and to both the white horse and the “indicating” sophisms. “Today go to Yue and arrive yesterday” is cited as an analogy for something impossible or contradictory. “Just as it is alive, it is dying” is used for rhetorical effect to support the point that judgments of what is “this” (shi) and “not this” (fei) arise together, are relative to each other, and can be reversed or shifted. After arguing that anything can be deemed “this” or “not this,” the text critiques Gongsun Long:

Using indicating to show that indicating is not indicating is not as good as using not-indicating to show that to indicating is not indicating. Using a horse to show that a horse is not a horse is not as good as using what is not a horse to show that a horse is not a horse. Heaven and earth are one “indicated”; the myriad things are one horse. (cf. Graham 1981: 53)

Instead of using a white horse as an example to show that it’s possible to treat some horses as not of the kind horse, it would be simpler and clearer to use something of another kind, such as an ox, and show that some horses can be treated as “the same” as that thing and different from other horses. For instance, draft horses could be deemed “the same” as oxen, grouped together with them as draft animals, and distinguished as different from riding horses or racehorses. For that matter, anything and everything can be summed into a whole and deemed a single “indicated” or “horse.” The text’s point is to trivialize Gongsun Long’s theses. For some purpose or other, by some standard or other, white horse can indeed be considered different from horse. But in light of the pragmatic stance adopted by “Equalizing Things,” there is nothing puzzling or remarkable about this.

These allusions place “Equalizing Things” firmly within the intellectual milieu of the disputers. Indeed, the text argues explicitly for a view closely related to one of their signature themes—“deeming so the not-so, admissible the inadmissible.”

Admissible? Admissible. Inadmissible? Inadmissible. A dao (way) is formed by walking it, things are made so by calling them so. How are they so? They are so in respects where they are so. How are they not so? They are not so in respects where they are not so. Things inherently have respects in which they are so; things inherently have respects in which they are admissible. No thing is not so; no thing is not admissible. (cf. Graham 1981: 53)

Still, the text’s stance is fundamentally critical of Hui Shi and Gongsun Long. In a trenchant critique, the writer mocks several Hui Shi-style theses, including spatial and temporal paradoxes and a version of the “one unit” view:

“In the world, nothing is bigger than the tip of an autumn hair, yet Mount Tai is small; nothing outlives a dead child, yet Pengzu [the Chinese Methulesah] died young. Heaven and earth were born together with me, and the myriad things and I are one.”

Having already become one, can you still say anything? Having already called it “one,” can you succeed in not saying anything? One and the saying make two; two and the one make three. Going on from here, even an expert calculator can’t get to the end of it, much less an ordinary person! So in moving from nothing to something, we arrive at three; how much worse in moving from something to something! Better not to move any particular way at all, but simply adapt what we deem shi (right) to the particular situation. (cf. Graham 1981: 56)

The text questions the coherence of the “everything is one” view. To treat the myriad things and oneself as “one” is already to distinguish them from nothing, on the one hand, and from what is not one, on the other. Indeed, the proponent of the “one unit” view cannot even state his position consistently. Merely to say that everything is “one” is to recognize something else besides the one, namely our statement pointing it out. The one and the name we give it or what we say about it already make two. And as soon as we notice that we’ve got two, we’ve already got three—the one, what we said about it, and the “two” comprising the one and what we said. The playful mockery has an underlying point. The “all is one” view is not more “real” or more justified than other schemes of distinctions, and it is useless as a solution to the problem of what scheme of distinctions to adopt in guiding life and action. It yields no normative guidance—not even Hui Shi’s “comprehensively care for all things.” Instead of attempting to find the “absolute” or “real” scheme of action-guiding distinctions, our energy would be better spent simply by guiding and justifying our actions contextually, responding to the needs of each particular situation as it arises.

Like Hui Shi, then, the writer of “Equalizing Things” agrees that distinctions can be drawn in indefinitely many ways. It is also true that if no distinctions are drawn, things in themselves “connect into one.” Yet focusing one’s attention either on establishing some particular scheme of distinctions or on the “one” shows an equal lack of insight. Disputation—whether in defense of Confucian ritual, Mohist inclusive care, the Great One, or sophistical paradoxes—is beside the point. Issues addressed in disputation cannot and need not be settled in order to live well. In fact, they may even interfere with the conduct of a good life. When we perform activities at which we genuinely excel—those whose performance engenders the deeply satisfying experience of feeling fully at home in the world—what guides us is not knowledge of fixed, explicit standards of shi/fei, nor identification with the “one.” It is a combination of skill and a kind of uncodifiable knack for adapting to the particular situation.

So in deeming things “this” (shi), whether you bring up a stalk or a pillar, a hag or a beauty, the odd or bizarre, Dao (the Way) connects them as one.…Only one who has arrived knows to connect things as one. Deeming things “this” he does not use; instead he accommodates things in the ordinary. He adapts his “this” to the situation, that’s all. Adapting without knowing things are so is called “Dao.” (cf. Graham 53)

By contrast, wearing out one’s wits deliberately deeming things one, as Hui Shi does, instead of simply seeing and making use of the innumerable ways they can be taken to be the “same,” is like forcefully affirming that seven equals four plus three without also allowing that it equals three plus four (cf. Graham 54). It is a way of grasping part of the right view, but darkly, without insight.

As for Hui Shi, “Equalizing Things” concludes, “His know-how almost reached the pinnacle, so his reputation carried on until later years. It was only in that he was good at it [disputation] that he was different from other people. Because he was good at it, he desired to clarify it. It was not the sort of thing that can be clarified, yet he tried to clarify it. Thus he spent his whole life in the obscurity of hard and white.”[25]


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