Schopenhauer’s Aesthetics

First published Wed May 9, 2012; substantive revision Thu Jun 14, 2018

The focus of this entry is on Schopenhauer’s aesthetic theory, which forms part of his organic philosophical system, but which can be appreciated and assessed to some extent on its own terms (for ways in which his aesthetic insights may be detached from his metaphysics see Shapshay, 2012b). The theory is found predominantly in Book 3 of the World as Will and Representation (WWR I) and in the elaboratory essays concerning Book 3 in the second volume (WWR II), and it is on these texts that I will concentrate here. This entry offers a brief background on Schopenhauer’s metaphysics before addressing Schopenhauer’s methodology in aesthetics, his account of the subjective and objective sides of aesthetic experience (both of the beautiful and the sublime), his hierarchy of the arts and rationale for this hierarchy, his view of artistic genius, the exceptional status of music among the fine arts, and the relationships he theorized between aesthetics and ethics.

1. Brief Background

By the 1870s, Arthur Schopenhauer’s philosophy had gained, in Nietzsche’s words “ascendency in Europe” (GM III, §5). Indeed, late-19th and early-20th century philosophers, writers, composers and artists such as Nietzsche, Wagner, Brahms, Freud, Wittgenstein, Horkheimer, Hardy, Mann, Rilke, Proust, Tolstoy, Borges, Mahler, Langer and Schönberg were influenced by Schopenhauer’s thought. Recognition came late in his life, however, starting only in 1853 with the publication of a review article by J. Oxenford. Until then, Schopenhauer labored in relative obscurity, despite the publication of numerous works such as: On the Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (his doctoral dissertation published in 1813, revised 1847), On Vision and Colors (1816), his magnum opus The World as Will and Representation (1818/9; second, revised edition with a second volume of essays 1844), On the Will in Nature (1836), On the Freedom of the Will (which won a prize from the Royal Norwegian Society of Sciences in 1839), On the Basis of Morals (which did not win the prize from the Danish Royal Society of Sciences despite its being the only entry for the competition), and two volumes of Parerga and Paralipomena (1851).

What many luminaries of European culture found gripping in Schopenhauer’s thought was his doctrine of the world as having two aspects related to each other as two sides of the same coin: (1) an ultimate foundation as “will”—a blind, purposeless urge or striving akin to energy—which he identified with the Kantian thing in itself (for competing interpretations of the argument for this identification see: Atwell 1995; Janaway 1989, 1999a; Young, 1987; DeCian & Segala 2002; Cartwright 2001; Jacquette 2007; Shapshay 2008; and Wicks 2008); and (2) a world of representation, i.e., the will qua thing in itself as it “objectifies” itself and appears to human beings through their shared mode of cognitive conditioning.

Schopenhauer held that the character of the will qua thing in itself—blind urge—expresses itself in the perpetual strivings of living creatures and in the forces of inorganic matter. Grounding his proto-Darwinian philosophy of nature in his metaphysics and the empirical sciences of his day, Schopenhauer viewed nature as an arena where living beings compete to survive and procreate, where species adapt to environmental conditions, and, most emphasized by Schopenhauer, where sentient beings suffer as virtual slaves to their will to life [Wille zum Leben].

Schopenhauer’s metaphysics and philosophy of nature led him to the doctrine of pessimism: the view that sentient beings, with few exceptions, are bound to strive and suffer greatly, all without any ultimate purpose or justification and thus life is not really worth living. This is a view that has seldom been defended in the history of Western thought and became a potent philosophical problem for Nietzsche and atheist existentialists.

Mitigating his pessimism somewhat, Schopenhauer does see a salutary role for the intellect in human life. He identifies three main ways in which the intellect breaks free to some degree from the servitude to the will and its attendant egoism: (1) in aesthetic experience and artistic production, (2) in compassionate attitudes and actions, and (3) in ascetic resignation from embodied existence. In each of these three ways of being in the world, a subject exercises varying degrees of freedom from the will to life, a freedom which is inextricably bound up with a degree of “intuitive knowledge” of the world, or, as Wittgenstein would later put it, of “seeing the world aright.” Thus, the mode of being of the aesthetic perceiver, the artist, the compassionate agent, and the ascetic saint each has moral value in virtue of their possessing a degree of true understanding of the world, which enables the attainment of a degree of freedom from ordinary egoism, and which leads them to not add to—or possibly to diminish—the amount of suffering in the world.

2. Schopenhauer’s Methodology in Aesthetics

As with his philosophy as a whole, Schopenhauer takes his point of departure in aesthetics from Kant, praising him for deepening the subjective turn in philosophical aesthetics and thereby putting it on the right path (WWR I, Appendix, 560–61. Note: page references to vol. I refer to the Cambridge edition translation; references to vol. II to the Payne transl.). Like Kant, he held that the phenomenon of beauty would only be illuminated through a careful scrutiny of its effects on the subject, rather than by proceeding in the pre-Kantian objectivist fashion, searching out the properties of objects—such as smoothness, delicacy and smallness—which putatively give rise to the feeling of the beautiful. But the subjective turn is as far as Kant’s aesthetic-methodological merit extends, according to Schopenhauer: it is too indirect, due to Kant’s primary method in philosophy, the transcendental argument.

Applied to the phenomenon of beauty in the Critique of the Power of Judgment, Kant starts from an analysis of the judgments that the subject makes about the objects of experience, e.g., “this rose is beautiful.” After offering an analysis of the logic of such aesthetic judgments—that they are based on feeling, more particularly on a feeling of disinterested pleasure, but that they also claim universal subjective validity—Kant then searches for the a priori conditions for the possibility of making judgments that have this logical form.

By contrast, Schopenhauer does not believe that the aesthetician should start from the aesthetic judgment, but rather from immediate aesthetic experience, before the subject attempts to formulate judgments about that experience (WWR I, 530–531). The advocacy of this focus, rather than Kant’s focus on judgments, has to do with the ways in which Schopenhauer departs from Kant’s epistemology. Very briefly, the key issue has to do with the status of non-conceptual knowledge. As Kant famously held, “[t]houghts without content are empty, intuitions without concepts are blind” (A50–51/B74–75). Schopenhauer adheres to the first clause, but holds that there is indeed what today philosophers might call “non-conceptual content,” and what he referred to variously as “intuitive cognition” [intuitive Erkenntniß], “knowledge of perception” [anschauliche Erkenntniß] or “feeling” [das Gefühl]. This cognition allows us—and many non-human animals—to navigate and operate in the world to a great extent without concepts. Furthermore, for Schopenhauer, this is the kind of knowledge we gain, par excellence, through aesthetic experiences of nature and art; but this knowledge is not or at least not-yet conceptual, though it is a knowledge of the “Platonic Ideas” or essential features of the phenomenal world (more on the Ideas at section 3.2).

In order to preserve for ourselves or to communicate “intuitive knowledge” to others, we may try to show it or say it. If one is an artist, one might show such knowledge by attempting to embody it in a work of art. But for non-artists, trying to ‘say’ this knowledge means attempting to capture it propositionally, and in so doing, for Schopenhauer, we translate intuitive into conceptual knowledge by a process of abstraction. Unfortunately, something is inevitably lost in the translation. Thus, Schopenhauer concludes, Kant’s starting point—the aesthetic judgment—is already at one remove from true aesthetic experience. And since this remove is not innocuous, insofar as the judgment does not faithfully transmit the richness of the experience, the aesthetic judgment constitutes the wrong focus for aesthetic theorizing.

Fundamentally, however, the gap between aesthetic experience and aesthetic judgments yields an essential difficulty for aesthetic theories since these are necessarily formulated propositionally, and therefore cannot entirely capture the richness of immediate, first-personal aesthetic experience. To his credit, Schopenhauer is quite frank about the methodological limits of aesthetic theorizing, especially in the case of music (WWR I, section 52; see also Goehr 1998; and section 5.2.5 below). Nonetheless, he ventures forth to offer just such a theory in the hopes that through it he may convince the reader of the “importance and high value of art (which are seldom sufficiently recognized)” (WWR I, 294) and to help the reader enter a psychological space where she herself can gain the deep insights afforded by nature and the fine arts.

3. Aesthetic Experience

Aesthetic experience comes in two main varieties for Schopenhauer, the beautiful and the sublime, and can be had through perception of both nature and art. Although 18th century aesthetics also included the “picturesque,” this drops out as a separate category in both Kant and Schopenhauer’s aesthetic theories.

Nearly all human beings, he holds, are capable of aesthetic experience, otherwise they would be “absolutely insensitive to beauty and sublimity—in fact these words would be meaningless for them” (WWR I, 218). Notwithstanding this nearly universally shared capacity for aesthetic experience, Schopenhauer remarks that it is enjoyed only occasionally by the majority of people and is enjoyed in a very sustained manner and to a high degree only by the genius. There are two jointly necessary and sufficient conditions for any properly aesthetic experience, one subjective and one objective.

3.1 Subjective side

Ordinary cognition, according to Schopenhauer, is bound up with the individual’s will, that is to say, with one’s generally egoistic strivings, and is subordinate to the four forms of the “principle of sufficient reason” (PSR), the principle which holds that nothing is without a reason for why it is (FR, §5). The PSR is Schopenhauer’s formulation of the ways in which human beings cognitively condition the world of representation. It includes space, time and causality, as well as psychological, logical and mathematical forms of explanation.

By contrast, aesthetic experience consists in the subject’s achieving will-less [willenlos] perception of the world. In order for the subject to attain such perception, her intellect must cease viewing things in the ordinary way—relationally and ultimately in relation to one’s will—she must “stop considering the Where, When, Why and Wherefore of things but simply and exclusively consider the What” (WWR I, 201). In other words, will-less perception is perception of objects simply for the understanding of what they are essentially, in and for themselves, and without regard to the actual or possible relationships those phenomenal objects have to the striving self.

Schopenhauer characterizes the subject who has aesthetic experience as the “pure subject of cognition.” It is “pure” in the sense that the subject’s intellect is not operating in the service of the will to life during aesthetic experience, though this subject is still embodied—for without embodiment, without the senses, a subject would not perceive at all (WWR I, 198). Thus, while the pure subject of cognition is free temporarily from the service of the individual will, it is nonetheless still identical with the embodied subject of willing. The freedom of the intellect from the service to the individual will constitutes a sort of acting ‘out of character’. Exactly how the intellect can cease to serve the individual will remains murky, however. (More on this at 4.5; for a detailed account of role of freedom in Schopenhauer’s aesthetic theory, see Neill and Shapshay 2012.)

Similar to the notion of disinterested pleasure in Kant, in Schopenhauer’s aesthetics the subjective side of aesthetic experience involves the will-less pleasure of tranquility. The experience of aesthetic tranquility stands in stark contrast with ordinary willing. All willing, according to Schopenhauer, involves suffering, insofar as it originates from need and deficiency. Satisfaction, when it is achieved affords a fleeting joy and yields fairly quickly to painful boredom, which is tantamount to a deficiency, and which starts the entire process anew. Given this grim account of willing, it is not surprising that Schopenhauer describes aesthetic experience in truly rapturous terms as “the painless state that Epicurus prized as the highest good and the state of the gods,” and as “the Sabbath of the penal servitude of willing” when the “wheel of Ixion stands still” (WWR I, 220).

3.2 Objective side

The objective side of aesthetic experience is necessarily correlated and occurs simultaneously with aesthetic will-lessness: It is the perception of what Schopenhauer terms the “Platonic Ideas.” The will qua thing in itself, on Schopenhauer’s metaphysics, objectifies itself at particular grades; the Ideas correspond to these grades of objectification. The Idea in each particular thing is that which is enduring and essential in it (WWR I, 206) and can only be intuited in aesthetic experience of nature and art (WWR I, 182).

The ontological status and the coherence of the Ideas within Schopenhauer’s metaphysics has been a bone of contention for commentators (see Hamlyn 1980, Chapter 6; Young 1987, 2005; Atwell 1995). The problem is this: On Schopenhauer’s account there are only two aspects of the world, first, the world as will (the thing in itself or “will”); and, second, the world as representation. The Ideas, however, fit neatly into neither aspect. On the one hand, the Ideas seem to belong to the world as will: In virtue of their being the “immediate and therefore adequate objecthood of the thing in itself” (WWR I, 197) the Ideas are independent of the cognitive conditions of time, space and causality (WWR I, 204). Yet, unlike the will qua thing in itself, the Ideas may be directly perceived by a subject, and thus are more akin to representations. In contrast to ordinary representations, however, the Ideas revealed in the phenomenal object have not yet entered into the particularlizing forms of the PSR (most notably, space, time and causality), they are rather universals.

A further difficulty for the tenability of the Ideas in Schopenhauer’s system is the fact that he often refers to Ideas in the plural. For Schopenhauer, space and time are the principium individuationis; but since the Ideas are independent of space and time, it is not clear how they can be individuated at all. One option for understanding the place of the Ideas in his system would be to see them as playing the role of an epistemic rather than metaphysical bridge between the one will and the many phenomena. This helps to explain their individuated status as follows: In a suggestive metaphor, Schopenhauer likens the Ideas to “steps on the ladder of the objectivation of that one will, of the true thing in itself” (WWR I, 198); if one understands the “ladder”—the ensemble of Ideas—as part of the world as representation, then each Idea—each “step” on the ladder—is a universal perceived in various particular spatiotemporal objects. The Ideas then are the essential features of objects or states of affairs that human beings may perceive when their attention is focussed squarely on the ‘what’ rather than on the ‘why’ or ‘wherefore’ of phenomena. It should be noted, however, that the Ideas are not abstracted by the subject as are concepts on Schopenhauer’s view, but are, rather, perceived directly in them. In sum, the Ideas seem to make the most sense within his system as “abstract objects”—objects that are not spatiotemporal, which do not stand in causal relationship with anything, and which have not been abstracted like a concept, but rather, are the real, objective, essential aspects of the world as representation as perceived by a will-less subject (WWR I, 234, 236). The crucial role that they play in Schopenhauer’s system is that they are the objects of all aesthetic experience—both of the artist and spectator—and their perception constitutes insight into the essential nature of the phenomenal world.

4. The Beautiful and the Sublime

4.1 The Beautiful

When the subject’s transition to the tranquil, will-less state of aesthetic contemplation occurs easily, that is, when the objects “meet that state halfway,” becoming “representatives of their Ideas by virtue of their intricate and at the same time clear and determinate form” (WWR I, 225), then the subject experiences the beautiful. Natural objects, especially flora, accommodate themselves most easily to the experience of the beautiful.

However, objects can be resistant to aesthetic contemplation in two main ways: either they may be stimulating to the bodily appetites or they may be hostile in some way to the human will to life.

4.2 The Stimulating

The first category of contemplation-resistant objects, Schopenhauer terms, “the stimulating” or the “charming”. These may be positively or negatively stimulating. On the positive side, he gives as examples, “prepared and table-ready dishes, oysters, herring, lobster, bread and butter, beer, wine, etc.” (WWR I, 232). Since he holds that these necessarily stir the appetite, they inevitably resist aesthetic contemplation and are therefore unsuitable to be presented in works of art such as still-life paintings.

Along the same lines, a calculatedly-arousing treatment of nudes—what we might today put on a spectrum of pornography—for Schopenhauer, prevents aesthetic contemplation because it inevitably excites lust and thus runs counter to the proper goals of art. Schopenhauer may have room in his aesthetic theory for erotic art, but this is not a topic which he explicitly addresses.

On the negatively stimulating side fall objects which are disgusting. For reasons parallel to those offered with respect to the positively stimulating, disgusting objects should also be banished from art, because they necessarily arouse intense negative willing or “repugnance”. Ugliness, however, is not identical to the disgusting, need not lead to repugnance and has, for Schopenhauer, a legitimate place in art. Curiously, it seems that for both the positively and negatively stimulating Schopenhauer does not believe that we may intellectually detach ourselves from our attraction, lust or repugnance in order to contemplate these aesthetically. But the grounds on which he holds this view remain somewhat obscure (for more on this topic see Neill 2015).

4.3 The Sublime

The other class of contemplation-resistant “objects” or phenomena are those that bear a hostile relationship to the human will insofar as they are so vast or powerful that they threaten to overwhelm the human individual or reduce his existence on this planet to a mere speck. Schopenhauer gives as examples desert landscapes, cascades, and the starry night sky, among many others. Unlike the case of the stimulating, however, Schopenhauer does believe that aesthetic contemplation of these phenomena is possible, and when it transpires the experience is that of the sublime.

Following Kant’s distinction, Schopenhauer identifies two varieties of the sublime, the dynamical and the mathematical. They are distinguished by the nature of the threat posed to human willing in general: if physical, then, for Schopenhauer, it is a case of the dynamical sublime; if psychological, then it is a case of the mathematical sublime. Although the sublime may be experienced with works of art—notably with tragedy—most of Schopenhauer’s examples come from nature and include a variety of landscapes and natural phenomena ranging from a frozen winter landscape which affords very little warmth and light to a violent storm at sea. He arrays them in terms of degrees of the sublime feeling they are likely to afford. The higher the magnitude of the threat posed, the higher the degree of sublime feeling.

Schopenhauer offers a phenomenologically-complex account of how we may take aesthetic pleasure in such fearsome or overwhelming scenes. In order to contemplate the Ideas in hostile objects aesthetically, the subject must first acknowledge the fearsomeness or the sheer vastness of the object, but then “consciously turn away” from the threat, “violently wrenching himself free from his will” (WWR I, 226). If the subject can do this, and achieves will-less contemplation of the Ideas which express themselves in these threatening things, then the subject experiences a “state of elevation”—this is the feeling of the sublime.

Although Schopenhauer is not terribly explicit on the phenomenological differences between the beautiful and the sublime, two emerge from his account: (1) the beautiful is characterized by a loss of self-consciousness whereas the sublime is characterized by two moments of self-consciousness; (2) the beautiful is wholly pleasurable, but the sublime is mixed with pain.

While Schopenhauer refers to a kind of self-consciousness that remains in the experience of the beautiful, the fact that (1) one is somehow freeing one’s intellect from the service of the will, and (2) one’s perception is no longer in the service of the individual’s will are not themselves present to mind in his account of the beautiful. However, in experience of the sublime, these two additional elements of self-consciousness—consciousness of liberating oneself and consciousness of having been liberated from the will and its cares—are present, and these instances of second-order consciousness are accompanied by the feeling of “exaltation” [Erhebung] above the will [über den Willen] (WWR I, 233). The pleasure of exaltation is thus tied to the felt recognition of the subject’s power to detach from the pressures of his or her individual will, and is resonant of the Kantian account of the sublime, with its felt recognition of one’s rational-moral vocation and freedom (for a fuller account of this interpretation see Shapshay 2012; for competing accounts of the Schopenhauerian sublime see Neill, 2003 & 2011; Vandenabeele 2003 & 2015; Janaway 1996; Young 1987; Wicks 2008; Vasalou 2013).

The sublime plays a significant role in Schopenhauer’s theory of tragedy and his solution to the ‘rationality problem’ of tragedy, namely, how can we rationally take pleasure in witnessing terrible scenes and feeling the painful emotions of fear and pity that are integral to an experience of tragic drama? In addition to the high cognitive value of this genre, Schopenhauer regards the pleasure of tragedy as the highest degree of the feeling of the dynamically sublime (WWR II: 433). These two facets of Schopenhauer’s account of tragedy help explain the rationality of engaging with tragic drama as well as the often-noted ethical significance of the genre (see section 5.2.4 for more on tragedy).

4.4 Varieties of aesthetic pleasure

Pleasure in aesthetic experience comes from three main sources in Schopenhauer’s aesthetic theory. First, there is the tranquility of will-lessness (this is the predominant pleasure of the beautiful); second, is the pleasure of self-conscious exaltation over the will to life, a pleasure akin to Kantian pride or respect for one’s rational-moral vocation (though Schopenhauer repudiates Kant’s view of pure practical reason); and a third kind of pleasure derives from the perception of Ideas, but is distinct from tranquility.

Schopenhauer holds that the pleasure will come sometimes more from the subjective and other times more from the objective side of aesthetic experience. When the Ideas perceived objectify lower grades of the will qua thing in itself, the pleasure will derive more from the experience of will-less tranquility, as the Ideas are not too significant. However, when the Ideas objectify higher grades of the will—meaning more complex and complete objectifications of the will—then the pleasure will derive more from the cognitive significance of these Ideas. The hierarchy in the gradations of the will’s objectification has far-reaching implications for Schopenhauer’s philosophy of art and for the hierarchy he posits among art forms and genres.

4.5 Aesthetic freedom

A thorny interpretive issue arises from Schopenhauer’s account of aesthetic experience thus far, namely, how is it even possible in his system (see Hamlyn 1980, Neymeyr 1995, and Neill 2008)? The problem is that aesthetic experience seems to require the breaking free of the intellect from its service to the will to life. But according to Schopenhauer, the intellect comes into being originally as a tool for and, as a rule, serves the needs of the will to life. He holds further that nature does nothing in vain. So it would seem that the intellect cannot actually break from the will, but if this is so, then aesthetic experience would not be possible. Ultimately, this issue is bound up with the possibility of human freedom more generally in Schopenhauer’s thought.

In his prize-winning essay “On the Freedom of the Will,” Schopenhauer follows Kant in espousing a kind of compatibilism. Nature is deterministic but the possibility of freedom is guaranteed by the “in itself” of the world which is independent of the PSR and is in that way undetermined (see Shapshay, 2011 for an account of Schopenhauer’s fuller argument for this claim). In all of his works after the 1813 dissertation, however, Schopenhauer parts ways with Kant’s view of “causality through freedom” through a noumenal self. The possibility of aesthetic freedom is nonetheless vouchsafed by the transcendental-idealist doctrine of the distinction between the empirical and intelligible character. By virtue of the ‘two-sidedness’ of the individual’s character, the individual can have transcendental/moral freedom, for Schopenhauer views the intelligible character as the act of the free will qua thing in itself [Willensakt]

whose appearance, when developed and drawn out in time, space and all of the forms of the principle of sufficient reason, is the empirical character…. (WWR I, section 55, 316)

Exactly how the intellect may detach from the interests of the individual will—the empirical character— by virtue of the intelligible character is difficult, perhaps impossible, to say, though Schopenhauer is clear that the operation of transcendental freedom should not be understood as causal since causality applies only within the empirical realm.

Nonetheless, in cases of aesthetic experience (especially the sublime) the intellect does manage to free itself from the servitude of the will. Further, in cases of ascetic “salvation” from embodied existence, a person may even will to resign herself from willing altogether. Clearly there are actual moments of human freedom in his view, the possibility of which is vouchsafed through the intelligible character and its near identity to the will qua thing in itself; but exactly how freedom ‘enters into’ the empirical realm in these cases remains, in Schopenhauer’s terms, quoting Malebranche, “a mystery” (WWR I, section 70, 431; see also FW epigraph).

5. The Fine Arts

5.1 Genius

As in Kant’s aesthetics, genuine art on Schopenhauer’s view is the product of a genius or someone who has been “momentarily inspired to the point of genius” (WWR I, 261). But he construes the creative process of the genius rather differently from Kant. For all of the fine arts save for music—which constitutes an important exception treated below—the genius produces art first by contemplating an Idea in nature or from human affairs. Sometimes the genius is aided by her imagination which allows her to perceive Ideas in possible as well as in actual experience. Then, with technical skill she embodies the Ideas she has perceived into a form (be it in marble, paint or words on the printed page) that enables the Ideas to be perceived by others. In this way, the genius lends her superlative ability to perceive Ideas in actual or imagined things to the ordinary person, who can less readily perceive Ideas from the phenomenal world.

Schopenhauer sees a relationship between genius and madness. He believes that “every increase in intellect beyond the ordinary measure is an abnormality that disposes one to madness” (WWR I, 215); since the genius is distinctive for her superfluity of intellect (WWR I, 211), which allows her to withdraw from mundane concerns more often and more sustainedly in order to perceive the Ideas in things and in the patterns of human life, she is thus disposed to madness. Also, geniuses resemble madmen insofar as they are often so engrossed in perceiving the essential in life that they pay little attention to particulars, and are generally terrible in practical affairs. But the real distinguishing factor between the “madman” and the genius has to do with memory. From his “frequent visits to madhouses” and his reflections on the symptoms of these real inmates as well as on those of characters in literature who have gone insane (e.g., Ophelia, King Lear, Ajax), Schopenhauer hypothesizes that the mad lack reliable interconnections between past and present events, and in many cases this is due to some traumatic event they have suffered in their past. By contrast, the genius has a memory that functions normally.

5.2 Hierarchy among the fine arts

The differences among the fine arts (again, apart from music) have to do with the medium in which Ideas are copied and through which they may be perceived by other subjects and thus transmitted. But the fine arts also differ and admit of a hierarchy based on the hierarchical “ladder” of the Ideas that those art forms (and within art forms, genres) are suited to express. Climbing the ladder of the will’s objectification in Ideas from lowest to highest is a matter of the increasing complexity and completeness in the will’s phenomenal expression. And so, the same holds for the fine arts—again, with the exception of music—whose sole aim, for Schopenhauer, is to copy the Ideas and thus for the genius to make them intuitively perceptible to others.

5.2.1 Architecture and Artistic Fountainry

On the lowest rung of the fine-arts ladder, Schopenhauer places architecture which

make[s] the objectivation of the will clear at the lowest level of its visibility, where it shows itself as the dull striving of mass, conforming to law but with no cognition. (WWR I, 283)

The Ideas embodied in architecture are mass, gravity, rigidity, light, and the Ideas of the materials utilized such as stone or wood. On the same rung Schopenhauer places artistic fountainry, the aim of which is to reveal the objectivation of the will in fluid substances; this art form embodies the Ideas of fluidity, formlessness, transparency, and the like.

5.2.2 Landscape gardening

Moving up the ladder, Schopenhauer treats landscape gardening which “performs the same service for the higher levels of vegetable nature” that architecture and fountainry perform for non-living nature (WWR I, 243). The aim of this fine art is to promote the scenic beauty of an area by cultivating a variety of species in a juxtaposition and combination that allows the essential in each type of plant to emerge distinctly. Schopenhauer remarks, however, that the landscape gardener exerts less control over her materials than does the architect, and thus, the real beauty of this art form is due more to nature herself than to the artist.

5.2.3 Sculpture and Painting

Arriving at the art forms which portray sentient, living nature, Schopenhauer places paintings and sculptures of non-human animals on equal footing. These fine arts also treat the human form and enable the perception of the Idea of humanity including the individuality of the sitter or subject, in the case of portraiture and sculpture. Capturing the individuality of human beings is important for the expression of the Idea of humanity “because to a certain extent, the human individual as such has the dignity of an Idea of his own” (WWR I, 251).

Within painting, Schopenhauer follows for the most part the hierarchy of genres set out by Academic painting at the time, classing still-life and landscape painting below historical and genre painting. This ranking is due to the lower grades of the will’s objectification in the usual subjects of still-life and landscape painting: fruits, flowers, animal carcasses, natural vistas and the like. But he departs from the traditional hierarchy of Academic painting in his claim that the commoners and mundane scenes of genre paintings are in no way inferior to grand historical figures and events as subjects of painting,

because what is genuinely significant in historical subjects is not in fact what is individual, not the particular event as such, but rather what is universal in it, the aspect of the Idea of humanity that expresses itself through it. (WWR I, 257)

Thus, portrayals of peasants in a tavern arguing over cards and dice is apt to be just as significant as portrayals of ministers in a palace arguing over maps and countries (WWR I, 256). In fact, he believes an artist would do very well solely to concentrate on the scenes, events, struggles and joys of the masses in order to unfold the multifarious Idea of humanity in painting, sculpture or poetry.

5.2.4 Poetry

The aim of poetry, in which Schopenhauer includes all forms of literature and drama, is to reveal and communicate the Ideas through the medium of abstract concepts communicated by means of words.

Schopenhauer uses an analogy from chemistry to describe the aim of the true poet. Just as the chemist combines various liquids in order to distill out precisely the solid precipitates she wants, the aim of the poet is to use abstract concepts but to restrict the generality of these concepts (by the use of epithets and other vivid descriptors) to “precipitate” out precise images in the minds of her readers, listeners, or spectators (WWR I, 269). The generality of its material—the concept—allows poetry to express a vast number of Ideas. It can range over all of nature, but is especially apt to express the Idea of humanity in their actions, thoughts, and feelings. And in expressing this Idea in its multiplicity, poetry has a distinct advantage over history, according to Schopenhauer (here following Aristotle), for poetry is not beholden to actual events and people, but rather to what is possible or probable and thus may better capture what is truly significant in human existence. (For a comparison between Schopenhauer and Early German Romantic thinkers on poetry, see Millán 2017).

The various genres of poetry express different facets of the Idea of humanity: lyric poetry (including song) expresses the interior thoughts and feelings of humanity as a whole; the novel, epic and drama are more “objective” types of literature which express the Idea of humanity through the portrayal of significant characters in significant situations. On the top rung of poetic art, for Schopenhauer, lies tragedy, whose goal is the “portrayal of the terrible aspect of life” where “the unspeakable pain, the misery of humanity, the triumph of wickedness, the scornful domination of chance, and the hopeless fall of the righteous and the innocent are brought before us” (WWR I, 280).

Schopenhauer sees great cognitive as well as ethical significance in the Ideas expressed in tragedy, for this genre offers “significant intimation as to the nature of the world and of existence” and shakes a person’s natural tendency toward optimism. The one constant in tragedy is the “portrayal of a great misfortune” (WWR I, 281), but this may be brought about, on his account, in three main ways: (1) through the exceptional wickedness of certain characters (he gives as examples of this type Shakespeare’s Richard III, Othello, and The Merchant of Venice, as well as Sophocles’ Antigone among others); (2) through blind fate (e.g., Sophocles’ Oedipus Tyrannus, “most of the tragedies of the ancients,” Shakespeare’s Romeo and Juliet, Voltaire’s Tancred and Schiller’s The Bride of Messina); (3) through morally ordinary characters in their typical relationships with each other. This last type of tragedy is the most valuable, for Schopenhauer,

because it shows us the greatest misfortune not as an exception, not as something brought about by rare circumstances or monstrous characters, but rather as something that develops effortlessly and spontaneously out of people’s deeds and characters, almost as if it were essential, thereby bringing it terribly close to us. (WWR I, 282)

Tragedies of this type are more rare and more difficult to execute. Good specimens of this type include Goethe’s Clavigo and Faust, Shakespeare’s Hamlet in Hamlet’s relationship with Laertes and Ophelia. Although Schopenhauer obviously did not live to see them, it is probable that he would have approved of Arthur Miller’s modern tragedies such as All My Sons and Death of a Salesman which seem to fall entirely into this type (for more on Schopenhauer’s theory of tragedy and his solution to the problems of tragedy see Tanner 1998; Neill 2003; Young 1987 & 1992; and Shapshay 2012b).

5.2.5 Music

No wonder that Schopenhauer was the darling of composers in the 19th and 20th centuries, for he argued that music has a truly exceptional status among the arts and uniquely reveals the essence of the “in itself” of the world. Music that affords such insight—the only music he deems worthy of the name—is Classical/Romantic, non-programmatic music without a text, or what was termed late in the 19th century, “absolute music.” Unlike all of the other arts, which express or copy the Ideas (the essential features of the phenomenal world), Schopenhauer affirmed that music expresses or copies the will qua thing in itself, bypassing the Ideas altogether. This puts music and the Ideas on a par in terms of the directness of their expression of the thing in itself (WWR I, 285). In order to understand Schopenhauer’s reasoning for this rather stunning view of the cognitive significance of music, one needs to pay attention to the role of feeling in Schopenhauer’s epistemology, and especially to the feeling of embodiment that a subject can experience by attending to ordinary acts of volition.

It is the feeling of embodiment—the intuitive, immediate knowledge that one wills when, for instance, one wills to raise one’s arm—that is monumentally significant for Schopenhauer in his identification of the Kantian thing in itself with will. First-personal knowledge that one wills is immediate, rather than inferred from observation, according to Schopenhauer, and is shorn of all of the forms of the PSR (including space, causality, and even being-an-object-for-a-subject) with one exception, the form of time.

Similarly, Schopenhauer holds that the experience of “absolute” music (music that does not seek to imitate the phenomenal world and is unaccompanied by narrative or text), occurs in time, but does not involve any of the other cognitive conditions on experience. Thus, like the feeling of embodiment, Schopenhauer believes the experience of music brings us epistemically closer to the essence of the world as will—it is as direct an experience of the will qua thing in itself as is possible for a human being to have. Absolutely direct experience of the will is impossible, because it will always be mediated by time, but in first-personal experience of volition and the experience of music the thing in itself is no longer veiled by our other forms of cognitive conditioning. Thus, these experiences are epistemically distinctive and metaphysically significant.

Since the will expresses itself in Ideas as well as in music, Schopenhauer reasons that there must be analogies between them. Indeed, he draws out many such structural analogies: between the bass notes of harmony and the lower grades of objectification of the will in inorganic nature; between melody and the human being’s “most secret story,” that is, “every emotion, every striving, every movement of the will, everything that reason collects under the broad and negative concept of feeling” (WWR I, 287); rhythms such as those of dance music are analogous to easy, common happiness, while the allegro maestoso corresponds to grand, noble strivings after distant goals; the “inexhaustibility” of possible melodies is analogous to the “inexhaustibility of nature in the variety of individuals, physiognomies and life histories.” (WWR I, 288).

Notwithstanding these and many other analogies Schopenhauer draws between music and the Ideas, he underscores the notion that music does not imitate appearances, but rather expresses the will as directly as possible. It does this predominantly by expressing universal feelings:

it does not express this or that individual or particular joy, this or that sorrow or pain or horror or exaltation or cheerfulness or peace of mind, but rather joy, sorrow, pain, horror, exaltation, cheerfulness and peace of mind as such in themselves, abstractly…, (WWR I, 289)

He supports this account of music first as an inference to the best explanation. By the third book of his main work, Schopenhauer takes for granted that the reader has been at least somewhat convinced by the metaphysics for which he has argued. In addition, Schopenhauer holds that people often feel that music is the most powerful of all the arts, affording a “profound pleasure with which we see the deepest recesses of our nature find expression.” And he draws our attention to what today we might call, ‘the soundtrack effect,’ i.e.,

p the fact that, when music suitable to any scene, action, event, or environment is played, it seems to disclose to us its most secret meaning, and appears to be the most accurate and distinct commentary on it. (WWR I, 262)

Finally, for Schopenhauer, “to the man who gives himself up entirely to the impression of a symphony, it is as if he saw all the possible events of life and of the world passing by within himself” yet without being able to pinpoint any likeness of events in life to the music he has experienced. Given all of this, Schopenhauer believes his explanation—music is a copy of the will qua thing in itself—is justified as an inference to the best explanation of the experience, power and significance of music in the lives of serious listeners. He believes that his metaphysics of music finally does justice to the profound pleasure and significance that the musically sensitive experience when listening to truly great music. (On tensions between this rather joyful description of the experience of music and Schopenhauer’s pessimism, see Norman 2017.)

In addition to this inference to the best explanation, Schopenhauer also appeals to readers of his theory to check it against their own experiences of music. And it is with respect to this second way of supporting his account of music that, with admirable frankness, he confronts the limits of his theorizing:

I recognize, however, that it is essentially impossible to demonstrate this explanation [Aufschluß], for it assumes and establishes a relation of music as a representation to that which of its essence can never be representation, and claims to regard music as the copy of an original that can itself never be directly represented. Therefore, I can do no more than state here at the end of this third book, devoted mainly to a consideration of the arts, this explanation of the wonderful art of tones which is sufficient for me. I must leave the acceptance or denial of my view to the effect that both music and the whole thought communicated in this work have on each reader. Moreover, I regard it as necessary, in order that a man may assent with genuine conviction to the explanation of the significance of music here to be given, that he should often listen to music with constant reflection on this; and this again requires that he should be already very familiar with the whole thought I expound. (WWR I, 257)

If a serious and sensitive listener heeds Schopenhauer’s advice and listens often to music with Schopenhauer’s philosophy firmly in mind, and this listener is still not convinced by his theory, what then? Schopenhauer concedes that in this case there is nothing more he can say.

Apparently, however, many serious and sensitive listeners and composers have been somewhat swayed by his account of music (for his influence on music theorist Heinrich Schenker, see Cubero 2017). Of all of the facets of Schopenhauer’s aesthetics, none has exerted a greater influence. The theory had a deep influence on Brahms, Wagner, Mahler and Schönberg (see Goehr 1998, and Magee 1997, chapter 17), and is echoed in Susanne Langer’s theory of musical symbolism (Langer 1953; see also Alperson 1981). Analogizing Schopenhauer’s influence on musical aesthetics to Beethoven’s influence in classical music itself, Goehr avers that Schopenhauer became “a central reference point” in the most important debates in the history of musical aesthetics (Goehr, 1996: 200).

6. Connections between aesthetic experience and ethics

6.1 Ethics and understanding

There are a number of connections that Schopenhauer explicitly (but more often inexplicitly) drew between aesthetic experience and both his ethics of compassion and salvation. In a strange but revelatory passage at the end of section 35 of Book III, Schopenhauer puts these words into the mouth of the ‘spirit of the earth’ [der Erdgeist]:

True loss is just as impossible as true gain in this world of appearance. Only the will exists: it, the thing in itself, is the source of all those appearances. Its self-knowledge and its consequent decision to affirm or to negate is the only event in itself. (WWR I, 207)

If one interprets this passage as espousing the view that the only really free choice an individual has is to affirm or negate the will to live after one has gained self-knowledge, then one can see a great ethical significance for art and aesthetic experience in its cognitive dimension in this thought, for it is only by way of aesthetic experience that one gains intuitive knowledge of the Ideas, or, in the case of music, of the nature of the will itself. Music especially involves feeling universal emotions, emotions shorn of particular context, motive or individual. In so far as we feel connected to all others on the level of feeling, then music has a direct connection with Schopenhauer’s ethics of compassion, for the feeling that we are indeed not ultimately separate individuals but are rather unified in the in-itself of the world constitutes the basic intuitive knowledge at the root of the ethical attitude of compassion.

Since aesthetic experience is the only way to gain true understanding of the world and existence in all its multiplicity, this means that aesthetic experience is a necessary pre-condition for making the ethical choice as outlined in the quote above, to affirm or deny the will, the “only event in itself”. Thus the unique cognitive significance of art and aesthetic experience in general turns out to have crucial ethical importance.

6.2 The experience of negative and positive freedom

A second way in which aesthetic experience has ethical importance for Schopenhauer is as an experience of negative freedom—freedom from the servitude to the will to life. In the case of the beautiful, one gains an experiential insight into a will-less state, one in which the subject perceives the world in a non-egoistic manner. Schopenhauer’s ethics is based on taking a compassionate stance on and acting for the benefit of others. So the experience of aesthetic will-lessness affords some felt recognition of a necessary first step on that path to compassion, namely, a non-egoistic attitude.

Arguably, the experience of the sublime affords a felt recognition not only of a subject’s negative but also of her positive freedom, that is, a freedom to release herself from the service of the will to life. Thus, the self-consciousness involved in sublime experience affords a felt recognition of one’s ability to change one’s attitudes and behavior—actively to turn one’s attention away from one’s egoistic strivings for a time.

The ethical relevance of the sublime is most apparent in Schopenhauer’s treatment of tragedy. In tragedy—the highest degree of dynamically sublime feeling—one is both confronted by terrible truths about the world and existence and elevated by the sense that one is not utterly powerless in the face of it. One comes to the felt recognition that one has the power to do something in the face of the tragic nature of the world. Schopenhauer recommends resignation (extreme denial of the will to life) but his ethical theory admits of degrees of negation—by acting in a less egoistic fashion or further in a truly compassionate manner.

There is, of course, the other option: Affirmation of the will to life in light of self-knowledge. This must be a genuine option, for Schopenhauer, otherwise the choice to affirm or negate would not constitute a true choice. Interestingly, Schopenhauer spends little time exploring this option. Perhaps he thought that anyone with true self-knowledge would experience an anagnorisis or moment of tragic recognition, and, ashamed and horrified at the will to life within him, would generally choose negation over affirmation. It was left to Nietzsche and his grappling with tragedy and pessimism, to question whether affirmation might yet be a defensible option.


Primary Works

In German

  • Arthur Schopenhauers sämtliche Werke, 16 volumes, Paul Deussen (ed.), München: R. Piper & Co., 1911–1941.
  • Sämtliche Werke, 7 volumes, Arthur Hübscher (ed.), Leipzig: F.A. Brockhaus, 1988.

In English Translation

  • On the Basis of Morality (OBM), E.F.J. Payne (trans.), Providence: Berghahn Books, 1995.
  • On the Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (FR), E.F.J. Payne (trans.), La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1974.
  • Prize Essay on the Freedom of the Will (FW), Günter Zöller (ed.), E. F. J. Payne (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • The World as Will and Representation (WWR I), volume I, Judith Norman, Alistair Welchman, and Christopher Janaway (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2011 [translation from the 3rd edition].
  • The World as Will and Representation (WWR II), E.F.J. Payne (trans.), 3rd edition, 2 volumes. Dover: New York, 1966.

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  • –––, 2011, “Did Schopenhauer Neglect the ‘Neglected Alternative’ Objection?” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 93(3): 321–348.
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Other Internet Resources

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