First published Tue Jun 29, 2021

Killing and harming others are paradigmatic wrongs. And yet there is at least one intuitive exception to this prohibition—namely, killing or harming in self-defense, or in defense of others. Consider:

Murder: Attacker is culpably trying to kill Victim because he is jealous of Victim’s success. Victim can save his own life only by lethally throwing a grenade at Attacker.

With the exception of strict pacifists, there is broad consensus in morality and law that defensive harm can be permissible in cases like this. However, as we shall see, it is surprisingly difficult to explain the grounds and limits of this permission.

1. Liability Justifications

1.1 Liability vs. Lesser-Evil Justifications

On a standard view, the moral wrongness of killing and injuring is grounded in persons’ having stringent moral rights against such treatment. If defensive harming is at least sometimes morally permissible, it needs to be explained how the use of force can be consistent with these rights. Two broad types of justification are common in the literature.

The first holds that a person’s right against harm, though weighty, is not absolute and may be permissibly infringed if necessary to achieve a sufficiently important good. This is known as a lesser-evil justification. To illustrate, consider Trolley:

Trolley: A runaway trolley is lethally heading towards five innocent people. A bystander, Engineer, can divert the trolley away from the five down a side-track. The diverted trolley will kill Workman. (Thomson 1985. Based on a case in Foot 1967)

Although they are sensitive to outcomes, lesser-evil justifications are not straightforward consequentialist permissions. Crucially, the harmed party retains their right not to be killed, and this exerts significant normative force. It explains why the justification obtains only when there is a substantial disparity between the harm caused and good achieved, and not simply when harming is overall net beneficial. The persistence of the right also accounts for the widespread intuition that those who are harmed on lesser-evil grounds are owed compensation. More controversially, some argue that those subjected to lesser-evil harms are permitted to forcibly resist in defense of their rights (we return to this question in §5)

By contrast, in cases like Murder a second type of justification obtains. The permission to kill Attacker cannot be explained by his right’s being overridden by the greater good, since killing him does not save more lives. Moreover, Attacker has no standing to complain about being harmed, nor a claim to compensation ex post (and he certainly does not have a permission to fight back.) Instead, the permission to kill Attacker is explained by his lack of a right not to be killed in the circumstances. This is known as a liability justification for harming.

There is disagreement about precisely what it means to be liable to a harm. Some theorists understand liability as involving the forfeiture of one’s usual rights. Others argue that our rights are already specified in such a way as to accommodate liability: Attacker does not forfeit his right when he attacks Victim; rather, he never had a right not to be killed under those circumstances (Draper 2016: 92). We might also think that liability is not limited to cases of forfeited rights, but rather identifies costs that we lack rights against bearing quite generally. A person’s being liable to pay her taxes, for example, does not seem to depend on her having forfeited her usual right to keep all of her income (Tadros 2016a: 110–118). On this broader view, one is liable to a harm insofar as one has a duty to bear it, irrespective of how that duty arose (for additional discussions of the nature of liability, see Dempsey 2016; Renzo 2017; Lang 2014, 2017; Ferzan 2016).

1.2 Grounds of Liability

One of the key questions in the literature on defensive harm concerns the conditions under which a person is liable. It is helpful to distinguish two areas of debate. The first focuses on the relevance (if any) of facts about individuals’ agency, such as their beliefs, evidence, intentions, culpability, and degree of moral responsibility. The second focuses on the relevance (if any) of causal relations between an individual and a threat of harm. In this sub-section, we will canvass some of the main positions on the agential conditions of liability. For ease of exposition, we will focus on causally straightforward cases, in which an individual poses a direct threat to others. We will consider the causation debate in §1.3.

1.2.1 The culpability account

The culpability account holds that a person is liable for posing an unjust threat only if they are blameworthy (or are otherwise open to moral criticism) for doing so (Ferzan 2005, 2012). This account gets the intuitively correct result in Murder: Attacker is liable to defensive harm since he acts on the basis of a culpable intention to kill Victim. However, other cases yield more controversial results:

Conscientious Driver: Driver, who always drives carefully and keeps her car well-maintained, faultlessly loses control of her car. She will hit and kill Victim unless Victim blows up the car, and Driver, with a grenade (McMahan 2005a: 393–394). (Driver is usually described as a (minimally) morally responsible threatener.)

Ray Gun: Falling Person is helplessly blown by the wind down a well, at the bottom of which Victim is trapped. Falling Person will crush Victim to death unless Victim vaporizes her with his ray gun. If he does not vaporize her, Falling Person will survive her fall (Nozick 1974: 34). (Falling Person is typically described as an innocent or non-responsible threatener.)

According to the culpability account, Driver is not liable because she acts permissibly given her evidence, despite the risk she poses, and so is not culpable. Falling Person is not liable because she is not acting, and thus cannot be acting culpably. Yet many find it implausibly restrictive that Victim may not kill in self-defense in these cases. On the assumption that killing one person in defense of another is permissible only if the former is liable, a more permissive account of liability seems called for (we consider challenges to this assumption in §2).

1.2.2 The causal account

The causal account of liability is most closely associated with Judith Jarvis Thomson. It holds that there is a single explanation of the permissibility of harming both culpable threateners, such as Attacker, and innocent threateners, such as Falling Person—namely, that each will violate Victim’s right not to be harmed unless Victim harms them (Thomson 1991). While most people grant that Attacker threatens to violate Victim’s right, the claim that Falling Person also threatens to violate Victim’s right is controversial.

Thomson argues that this follows from the fact that Falling Person in Ray Gun lacks a right to kill Victim. According to Thomson, this entails that Falling Person is under a duty not to kill Victim. Falling Person will fail in this duty—and thereby violate Victim’s right—just in case she does kill Victim. Since she is threatening to violate Victim’s right not to be killed, Falling Person lacks a right not to be killed. Hence, Victim may kill Falling Person to save his own life, even granting that Falling Person is morally innocent.

The causal account captures the intuitive permissibility of using defensive force against Falling Person in Ray Gun. It also permits killing morally responsible (but non-culpable) threateners such as Driver. But this broader scope of defensive permissions is secured, at least on Thomson’s construction, by endorsing the controversial view that one need not exercise agency in order to violate a right. Merely causing Victim’s death, when one lacks a right to do so, suffices. It also holds that one can be under a duty to refrain from doing something even if one is unable to refrain. Several commentators argue that Thomson’s view entails, implausibly, that falling stones can violate rights (McMahan 1994: 276, 2005a: 388; Otsuka 1994: 80; Zohar 1993: 608; Rodin 2002: 85–87). Stones lack rights to kill. Thus (it seems) Thomson must think stones under a duty not to kill. If so, they too must fail in this duty, and therefore violate rights, when they kill.

There seems to be at least some scope for Thomson to resist this move (Kamm 1992: 47). Those who believe that Falling Person has a right not to be killed must believe that, unlike a stone, Falling Person is a moral agent, assuming that only moral agents have rights. Restricted to moral agents, Thomson’s view avoids labelling stones rights-violators. Moreover, it is plausible that one can fail in a duty without exercising one’s agency, and also plausible that one can fail in a duty even if one is unable to fulfill that duty. For example, if I forget to meet you for lunch, despite promising to do so, I fail in my duty to keep my promise even if my forgetting is not a result of my agency, and I have no control over my forgetting.

However, Thomson’s reliance on causal roles makes it hard for her to prohibit harming at least some innocent people whom she herself considers it impermissible to harm. Plausibly, someone who maliciously blocks Victim’s escape from a fire is liable to defensive harm. If Thomson grants this, she must also grant the permissibility of harming a person who innocently blocks one’s escape (Frowe 2014a: 25–26). If the malicious obstructor plays the right kind of causal role to violate Victim’s rights, and violating rights does not require agency, then both innocent and malicious obstructors must be liable to defensive harm. Yet Thomson, in line with most people’s intuitions, explicitly rejects the permissibility of defensively harming innocent obstructors (Thomson 1991: 290).

1.2.3 The responsibility account

The responsibility account holds that a person is liable for posing an unjust threat only if they are morally responsible for doing so (McMahan 1994, 2005a; Otsuka 1994; 2016). Michael Otsuka suggests that a threatener is morally responsible if she is

(1) of sound mind, (2) in control of her actions, and (3) aware of the dangerousness of what she is doing. (Otsuka 2016: 52)

A person can be morally responsible for a threat without being culpable. For example, consider cases of mistaken defense:

Mistake: Homeowner sees on the news that a dangerous murderer has escaped from the local prison. Victim, the murderer’s innocent identical twin, breaks down in his car near Homeowner’s house. Unaware of his brother’s escape, Victim rings the doorbell, intending to ask to use the phone. Homeowner mistakes Victim for his murderous brother, and takes aim at Victim with her shotgun. (McMahan 2005a: 387)

Victim has done nothing to forfeit his rights against being harmed: He poses no threat to Homeowner and lacks any intention to appear threatening. However, Homeowner’s evidence is that Victim poses a lethal threat to her. Victim is epistemically indistinguishable from a genuine threatener. Given this, Homeowner is not culpable or blameworthy for the fact that she threatens Victim. Nonetheless, it seems plausible that Homeowner is morally responsible for an objectively unjust threat to Victim. Defenders of the responsibility account hold that this renders Homeowner liable to defensive harm, which explains why Victim (or a third-party) is permitted to defensively kill her.

More controversially, Jeff McMahan argues that Driver in Conscientious Driver is morally responsible, though not culpable, for the threat she poses to Victim. Driver knows that driving is a risky activity and nonetheless chose to engage in it. Although driving is permissible relative to her evidence—she has no reason to think that she will lose control of the car—it is nonetheless impermissible relative to the facts, given that driving on this occasion will endanger Victim’s life. McMahan argues that Driver’s knowledge of the riskiness of driving, combined with the wrongness of this instance of driving, makes her liable to defensive harm. (McMahan 2005a: 394).

Proponents of the responsibility account often ground these verdicts in a particular conception of distributive justice, according to which fairness requires individuals to bear the costs of their own risk-imposing activities (McMahan 2005a; Otsuka 1994; see also Montague 1981; Draper 2009, 2016; Gordon-Solmon 2018). On this view, we should treat agents like Driver and Homeowner as engaging in moral gambles. If a gamble turns out badly and the agent ends up threatening harm to an innocent person, it is fairer that the gambler suffer harm, rather than the victims, because they are responsible for the fact that a harm now has to be borne by somebody (even if taking the gamble was justified according to the agent’s evidence). Hence, the agent who took the gamble forfeits her right not to be harmed for the sake of her victim. McMahan also argues that if two or more people bear responsibility for a threat of unjust harm, it is fair to make the most responsible person bear the full costs of preventing that harm, if defensive costs cannot be divided between them. On this view, liability has an important comparative dimension, and slight differences in responsibility can make a decisive difference to liability (McMahan 2011a: 551).

In contrast to agents like Homeowner and Driver, Falling Person is not plausibly morally responsible for the threat she poses, since she has been helplessly blown down the well by the wind. Despite her obvious causal connection to the threat to Victim’s life, the responsibility account holds that she is not liable to be defensively killed by Victim. Michael Otsuka supports this conclusion, arguing that since Falling Person is no more morally responsible for the fact that Victim’s life is in danger than a bystander, she has the same moral status as an innocent bystander. If killing bystanders is impermissible, then killing Falling Person is also impermissible (Otsuka 1994). The responsibility account yields a similarly restrictive verdict in the case of individuals who threaten as a result of temporary delusions or mental illness. Insofar as threateners are not morally responsible for their actions, they retain their usual rights against being harmed, even if they will otherwise kill other innocent people. The responsibility account thus permits killing a narrower range of threateners than the causal account, but a broader range than the culpability account.

We now turn to some worries for the responsibility account. One challenge is posed by cases such as Cell Phone:

Cell Phone: Unbeknown to Caller, a terrorist has rigged Caller’s cell phone such that when Caller next makes a phone call, he will detonate a bomb that will kill Victim.

McMahan argues that Caller is not liable to be killed because, unlike Driver, Caller has no reason at all to suspect that using his activity will endanger an innocent person. Since Caller does not knowingly risk harming Victim he is not morally responsible for posing a threat. But, despite McMahan’s suggestion that there is a difference in kind between cases like Driver and Caller, it seems more like a difference in degree (McMahan 2005a: 397). It is, clearly, not impossible that the phone is rigged. The difference is rather that, on Caller’s evidence, the chances of its being rigged are tiny, whereas Driver’s evidence suggests that she has a somewhat greater (but still very small) chance of harming an innocent person. McMahan’s account of moral responsibility thus depends on the idea that small differences in foreseeability are very morally significant. Driver is liable to be killed to save Victim; Caller is not.

More generally, some worry that the responsibility account rests on too thin a notion of moral responsibility. According to this objection, merely engaging in a foreseeably risky activity, and having bizarre bad luck, is not morally significant enough to defeat the weighty constraint on killing (Lazar 2009; see also, Burri 2020). This point seems especially forceful in cases in which a person’s evidence is that she is required, rather than merely permitted, to use force (Christie 2015: 75; Tadros 2011: 232–234). To illustrate, consider a variation on Mistake in which Victim’s twin is a notorious child-killer, and thus Homeowner’s evidence is that Victim will murder her child unless she uses force. Parents are plausibly required to defend their children against prospective murderers. Of course, Victim is not, in fact, a child-killer. But in this case, it is not obvious that we can point to Homeowner’s moral gamble to explain why it is fair that she forfeits her right not to be harmed. Gambles are typically optional: it is the fact that gamblers choose to engage in them, even though they could have done otherwise, that makes it fair for gamblers to bear the costs when their gambles turn out badly. By contrast, it seems unfair that Homeowner forfeits her rights by doing what her evidence tells her she is morally required to do (for a contrary view, see Quong 2020: 52–54).

One might also dispute the particular verdicts that proponents of the responsibility account believe help to vindicate their account. The claim that Driver is liable has proved particularly contentious. One objection holds that there is no obvious asymmetry between Driver and Victim in terms of responsibility and fairness. Rather, both agents bear moral responsibility for the fact that a lethal cost must be borne by someone, assuming that Pedestrian could foresee that she might be threatened by an out-of-control car whilst walking by the road. Given this, why should we conclude that Driver ought to bear the full cost rather than, say, toss a coin? (Lazar 2009: 715; see also, Ferzan 2012: 676–683). A different objection holds that Driver is not liable because he does not in fact threaten Victim’s rights. Jonathan Quong argues that we should distinguish between cases like Driver and Homeowner. Though each case involves an agent who acts permissibly relative to their evidence, there is an important moral difference between them. Quong argues that, given the overall benefits of permitting people to prudently drive, the practice of prudent driving is morally justified despite the risks it imposes. This assessment shapes our moral rights, such that we lack rights that other people refrain from prudent driving. Thus, the evidence-relative permissibility of Driver’s action does not depend on her mistaken assumption that Victim lacks a right not to be endangered by her. By contrast, Quong argues, the evidence-relative permissibility of Homeowner’s endangering Victim does depend on her mistaken assumption that Victim is liable to be killed. Homeowner treats Victim as if he lacks a right that he in fact possesses, and thereby fails to accord Victim the moral concern he is owned. Quong argues that it is this fact about how Homeowner treats Victim that grounds Homeowner’s liability to defensive harm (Quong 2012: 68; 2020: Chs. 2&6).

As these various challenges show, it is possible to accept the responsibility account’s central tenet that liability is grounded in moral responsibility for unjust threats, while nonetheless disagreeing about the correct account of moral responsibility, whether liability to defensive harm is a matter of distributive fairness, and/or the scope of our moral rights against harm.

1.3 Liability and Causation

1.3.1 The scope of liability

One question is whether an agent can be liable only to harms that avert threats to which she causally contributes (the “local view”), or if her liability can instead extend to (at least some) harms that avert threats independently posed by others (the “global” view).

The local view tracks the idea that individuals should only be liable for threats that they are (in some sense) responsible for. But there are cases that cast doubt on this intuition. Consider:

Simultaneous Hit Men: Evelyn hires a hit man to kill Wayne. Fred has also hired a hit man to kill Wayne. Both hit men arrive at the same time. Because of where they are standing, Wayne’s only means of defense is to use Fred as a shield against Evelyn’s hit man (killing Fred) and Evelyn as a shield against Fred’s hit man (killing Evelyn). (Adapted from Tadros 2011: 192.)

The local view implies that Wayne’s use of defensive forces is impermissible, because he lethally uses Evelyn and Fred to prevent threats that neither are causally responsible for. But this seems very counter-intuitive, supporting a more global view (Tadros 2011: Ch.12)

However, an important challenge for the global view is whether it can impose a principled limit on the range of threats for which an individual can be liable. In Simultaneous Hit Men, the two threats are concurrent and qualitatively similar. But if we reject the idea that agents can be liable only to avert threats to which they causally contribute, then it is hard to see why agents are not potentially liable with respect to all manner of threats that are distant in space and time (McMahan 2005a: 763. For a defense of this implication, see Øverland 2011). Intuitively, it looks like we want a view that is global, but not too global, but a middle position might not be tenable.

1.3.2 Causal location

Sometimes an agent does not pose a direct threat themselves, but instead contributes to threats posed by others. To what extent is an agent’s position in the causal chain morally relevant to liability, holding other factors equal?

One possibility appeals to the idea that there is a morally significant difference between doing harm and enabling others to cause harm. Applied to the question of defensive harm, one suggestion is that liability (or at least liability to being killed) attaches only to direct threateners and does not transmit “down the chain” to contributors (Rodin 2008: 50, n.14; Haque 2017: 71–72). But this view seems quite restrictive:

Arrows: Andy is firing lethal poisoned arrows at Victim. Annabel makes the arrows and passes them to Annika. Annika dips the arrows in poison and passes them to Andy. Victim can only defend herself by lethally shooting Annika or Annabel (Based on a case in Frowe 2014a: 167)

If liability (or liability to be killed) only attaches to direct threateners, then it looks like Annika and Annabel are not liable and so Victim is not permitted to defend herself. But this looks counter-intuitive: Annika and Annabel seem to be morally on a par with Andy. To deal with this kind of case, defenders of the “no transmission” idea need to add an exemption. For example, they might stipulate that liability transmits only if the causally remote agents are (in some sense) working together with the causally proximate agents to pose a threat (Rodin 2011b: 449; Haque 2017: 66). However, it is a matter of ongoing debate whether these modifications are successful (see Frowe 2014a: 167–172; 2019, forthcoming; Haque 2019).

A more modest view holds that both indirect and direct threateners can be similarly liable, but that the conditions of liability are more demanding in the case of indirect threateners. One defense of this asymmetry appeals to the idea that doing harm is harder to justify than enabling others to cause harm (Draper 2016: 143–144; Hosein 2019: 193–195). To illustrate, consider:

Gun 1: Bad Guy threatens to kill Victim unless Victim shoots and kills an innocent person.

Gun 2: Bad Guy’s gun is locked in a safe. Bad Guy threatens to kill Victim unless Victim gives Bad Guy the code for the safe. If Victim gives up the code, Bad Guy will use the gun to kill an innocent person. (Based on a case in Draper 2016: 143).

Many find it intuitive that it is impermissible for Victim to cause the death of an innocent person in the first case, but permissible in the second (or, at very least, that there is a significant moral difference between the two) (Draper 2016: 143–144). If we combine this putative asymmetry with the assumption that agents who are justified in causing harm are immune from liability (we discuss this assumption in §5), then it follows that there are cases in which an indirect threatener is not liable for enabling a threat, though she would have been liable had she posed that threat directly. (Note that this asymmetry is compatible with the view that enablers and direct threateners who lack justifications are equally liable [Frowe 2019: 629]). Of course, this view depends on the plausibility of the underlying claim that there is a relevant moral asymmetry between doing and enabling harm (for discussion, see Rickless 2011; Hanna 2015; Tadros 2018; Barry & Øverland 2016: Chs.5–6; Hurka 2005: 47–50).

If we think that the distinction between direct and indirect threateners marks a morally significant point in the causal chain, this raises the further question of whether we can also draw morally relevant distinction within the class of indirect threateners. For example, one possibility is that the liability of indirect threateners is sensitive to the degree of their remoteness from the threat (for discussion, see Tadros 2016a: 126–130).

1.3.3 Causal contributions

A further issue is whether the size or degree of an individual’s causal contribution to a threat affects their liability. An affirmative answer seems quite intuitive. For example, several writers argue that civilian contributions to unjust wars are too causally insignificant to generate liability (or at least liability to defensive killing) (Fabre 2009a: 60–61; McMahan 2009: 225) More precisely, the idea here is that (i) individuals can causally contribute to threats to a greater or lesser degree, and (ii) that the harm to which an individual is liable is sensitive to the degree of contribution.

Much of the debate takes (i) for granted and focuses on the plausibility of (ii). Some authors have challenged (ii) by highlighting cases in which killing intuitively “small-scale” contributors is intuitively permissible (Frowe 2014a: 78, 175). For example:

Bathtub: Bad Guy wants to drown Victim in the bathtub and offers a $20 reward for helpers. Bad Guy holds Victim down, while 110 Helpers each pour one liter of water into the bath. 100 liters are sufficient to kill Victim. (For a similar case, see Draper 2016: 82)

Each Helper contributes a tiny portion of the water that kills Victim, and each Helper’s contribution makes no difference to whether Victim is killed (the threat is overdetermined.) Yet it seems plausible that Victim is permitted to kill (at least) one Helper if doing so is necessary for escape.

More recently, attention has turned to whether (i) is defensible. The challenge here is two-fold. First, we might doubt the coherence of the view that causal contributions come in degrees (Sartorio 2020). Second, even if we can identify a metaphysically respectable account of scalar causal contribution, it is not clear that it will possess the kind of moral significance capable of determining liability (Tadros 2018; Beebee & Kaiserman 2020). However, work on the metaphysics of scalar causation is undergoing something of a renaissance. So perhaps we should not be overly skeptical about the prospects for vindicating the intuition that moral responsibility and liability are (in some way) sensitive to causal thresholds (for discussion, see Kaiserman 2017, 2018; Beebee & Kaiserman 2020; Bernstein 2017).

1.3.4 Liability without causation?

The preceding debates concern different ways in which causal connections might be relevant to liability. But, more radically, we might challenge the assumption that any causal connection to a threat is necessary for liability. Call this assumption the causal requirement. Here we set out three challenges to this requirement.

The first is the case of futile attempters. Consider the following case:

Firing Squad: Victim is a prisoner of war about to be wrongfully executed by a five riflemen execution squad. Only one of the rifles has real bullets, but none of the riflemen know which this is. Unbeknownst to them, Victim has a gun. Pre-emptively killing any of the riflemen will scare off the rest and allow Victim to escape. (Adapted from Christie 2020: 380)

If causation is necessary for liability, only the rifleman with real bullets can be liable. But this seems counter-intuitive. If Victim can escape only by killing one of the causally ineffective riflemen, it seems hard to believe that this would be much harder to justify than killing the causally effective rifleman (Christie 2020: 382). This suggests that merely attempting to pose a threat may be enough for liability to harm, at least if the attempter is culpable (Tadros 2016a: 121–124).

The second challenge to the causal requirement concerns omissions. Consider:

River: Jimmy accidentally falls into the river and will soon drown. Sally can easily pull Jimmy to safety, but she refrains because she doesn’t want to get her shoes wet. Jimmy can throw a rock at Sally, causing her to fall into the water and allowing Jimmy to drag himself to safety using Sally’s body. If he does this, one of Sally’s fingers will be eaten by piranhas.

Let’s assume that Sally is not initially required to rescue Jimmy at the cost of one of her fingers. However, some writers argue that Sally’s failure to discharge her duty to rescue Jimmy at a low cost to herself renders her morally responsible for his current predicament. This responsibility renders her liable to bear considerably greater costs for Jimmy’s sake (such as the loss of a finger), and Jimmy (as well as third-parties) may impose the costs of rescue on her (Barry & Øverland 2016: Ch.3; Barry 2018: 649; Tadros 2014a: 365. For the contrary view, that liability for failing to discharge a duty is restricted to the cost required by the initial duty, see Haque 2017: 70–71).

A third family of challenges to the causal requirement focus on the moral significance of certain relationships between causal and non-causal agents (Bazargan 2013; Tadros 2014b). One view holds that non-causal complicity can render an agent liable. Consider:

Redundant Lookout: A gang carry out a bank robbery. One gang member—Bob—is tasked with acting as a lookout (though the gang would still have proceeded with the robbery in the absence of a lookout). However, Bob falls asleep immediately. During the robbery, the gang threaten to kill Witness. Passer-By spots the situation and realizes that the only way to save Witness is to shoot Bob, which will cause the robbers to flee. (Adapted from Bazargan 2013: 182–183)

Though Bob does not causally contribute to the threat to Witness, he nonetheless seems a legitimate target of defense. As Saba Bazargan argues (drawing on Kutz 2000), Bob is morally connected to the threat to Witness because Bob shares participatory intentions with the other gang members: an intention to “do his part” in the cooperative act of robbing the bank. On this view, an agent can be liable to harm to prevent threats posed by other members of a cooperative project in which she intentionally participates, even if her participation is not causally efficacious (Bazargan 2013: 184.)

One noteworthy implication of non-causal cases is that they can be appropriated in support of a version of the culpability account of liability (see §1.2.1). As we saw, the chief complaint against the culpability account is that it is too restrictive, rendering too many threateners non-liable. This objection suggests that culpability is not necessary for liability. However, the cases of attempters, omitters, and conspirators might be taken as evidence that culpability can be sufficient for liability (for related discussion, see Ferzan 2005, 2012: 689–696; McMahan 2005b: 751–768).

2. Agent-Relative Justifications

As the foregoing makes clear, no account of liability to is likely to match all our pre-theoretical intuitions about when we may use defensive force. Of course, we must sometimes revise our intuitions to fit the best theory. But some theorists suggest that we can resolve misalignments by positing an additional justification for defensive harm. On this view, the fact that a person is not liable to defensive harm (and harming them is not the lesser evil) does not entail that it is impermissible to harm them. Instead, defensive force may be permissible in virtue of the defender’s having an agent-relative prerogative to prefer their own interests (or the interests of others to whom they are specially related).

The notion of an agent-relative prerogative has traditionally been employed to explain why individuals are permitted to refrain from aiding others when it is costly to do so, rather than the permissibility of harming others (Scheffler 1982: 23). Yet, as critics point out, it is hard to see how the claim that one may attribute one’s own interests extra weight can be restricted in this way (Kagan 1989: 20). Of course, if causing harm is morally worse than allowing harm, this will make it harder to justify harming compared to failing to save. But this does not support the view that prerogatives are relevant to failing to aid, but irrelevant to harming.

Whilst originally conceived as an objection to the idea of prerogatives, several theorists of defensive harm embrace this conclusion, arguing that prerogatives (or the related notion of associative duties), play an important role in explaining the scope of permissible self- and other-defense (Levine 1984; Davis 1984; Quong 2009; 2020: Ch. 3; Fabre 2009b; 2012: 61; Lazar 2013). According to these writers, the extra weight that we may attach to our own interests, or the interests of special others, permits us to infringe others’ rights not to be harmed. Jonathan Quong argues that prerogatives provide an independent justification for harming, in addition to liability and lesser-evil justifications (Quong 2009; 2020: 70). Seth Lazar, in contrast, argues that the additional weight we must ascribe to the interests of special others, in light of our associative duties to them, affects what counts as the lesser-evil when acting in other-defense (Lazar 2013).

One important payoff of these views is that they can account for the permissibility of harming threateners such as Falling Person, Driver, and Caller without relying on the claim they are liable to be killed. Importantly, since we each have these prerogatives, it is permissible for non-liable threateners to employ counter-defense against defenders. For example, Falling Person and Victim have symmetrical defensive permissions on this view. Moreover, those who are permissibly harmed on the basis of an agent-relative prerogative or associative duty may also be owed compensation.

However, the main challenge for these views is to impose moral limits on the permission to harm the non-liable. Why, for example, does my personal prerogative not permit me to eat a baby if necessary to avoid starvation, or lethally trample over innocent obstructors? If one may kill a non-liable person to save oneself it looks as if many innocent bystanders will be rendered legitimate targets, alongside innocent threateners. Proponents of agent-relative permissions have defended additional principles that restrict the range of non-liable persons who may be permissible harmed (Quong 2009; 2016; 2020: 80–92; Lazar 2015). But their verdicts are nonetheless revisionary in many cases.

3. Proportionality

Even when an aggressor is liable to defensive harm, there are still important constraints on what may be done to them. Consider:

Slap: Angela is angry with Victoria for spilling tomato juice on Angela’s carpet and is about to slap her. The only way Victoria can defend herself is to kill Angela with her flamethrower.

Angela culpably poses an unjustified threat to Victoria, but it would obviously be morally wrong for Victoria to defend herself. Using the flamethrower would be disproportionate. The proportionality constraint holds that the bad effects of a defensive action must not be excessive in relation to the good achieved. Though seemingly simple and intuitive, things quickly become complex once we try to identify the factors relevant to proportionality judgments.

3.1 Narrow and Wide Proportionality

Whether the use of defensive force is proportionate depends on the status of the person it is imposed on. Consider:

Grenade: Andy attacks Victor. Victor can defend himself by throwing a grenade that will cause harm to both Andy and an innocent bystander, Billy.

In order to assess the proportionality of Victor’s defensive action, we cannot simply compare the magnitude of the threat Victor faces with the total amount of harm that Victor will cause. Proportionality also crucially depends on how the harm is allocated between Andy and Billy. As McMahan has influentially proposed, the permissibility of Victor’s use of force depends on two distinct proportionality assessments. Narrow proportionality assesses harms imposed on persons who, like Andy, are liable to some harm. The idea is that persons are not liable to harm simpliciter, but to a certain amount of harm. Narrow proportionality thus considers the upper limit on an individual’s forfeiture of their right against harm. By contrast, wide proportionality assesses harms imposed on non-liable persons like Billy. Here, the focus is on whether the good achieved by defense is sufficient to justify overriding an individual’s right against harm. Wide proportionality thus sets an upper limit to a lesser-evil justification for harm (McMahan 2009: 19–20).

Since narrowly disproportionate harms are those that exceed an individual’s liability, several writers have argued that harms to liable persons should be subject to both a narrow and wide proportionality assessment. On this view, there may be “combined justifications” for harming an individual, in which a portion of the harm inflicted justified in terms of their liability (and so is narrowly proportionate), while the remaining portion is justified as the lesser evil (and so is widely proportionate) (McMahan 2014a: 438–442; Bazargan 2014; Tadros 2011: Ch.11. For skepticism, see Steinhoff 2019).

Because narrow and wide proportionality assessments track very different kinds of justification for harm (liability and lesser-evil), the two assessments differ dramatically in their permissiveness. For example, it seems intuitive that it would be proportionate for Victor to inflict more harm on Andy than Andy threatens to impose on Victor. By contrast, in order to render harming Billy proportionate, the good that Victor thereby achieves would have to considerably exceed the harm done. A similar asymmetry applies when we consider proportionality and the numbers of persons defensively harmed. For example, killing one innocent person seems (widely) proportionate only if doing so saves a considerably larger number of innocent lives (recall Trolley from §1.1). By contrast, if one innocent person is being lethally attacked by a gang, it seems (narrowly) proportionate to kill a large (perhaps very large) number of attackers in order to protect the victim.

This last intuition has attracted considerable attention. While it seems intuitively proportionate to kill several culpable lethal attackers, many find it unacceptable that there is no limit on the number that may be killed. This implication seems particularly hard to swallow in the case of attackers who, though liable, are not fully culpable. But there is considerable theoretical difficulty in justifying such a limit. If, considered in isolation, each of the multiple attackers meets the conditions for liability to be killed, then it is hard to see how defensive killings that are each (narrowly) proportionate can somehow become disproportionate when aggregated. As Frances Kamm puts it:

One compares the wrong to be avoided with what would have to be done to each wrongdoer one at a time, and if there is no violation of proportionality in any individual comparison then there is no violation tout court. (Kamm 2011: 133–134)

This problem has generated a number of creative and complex solutions (for a rich discussion, see Tomlin 2020). One strategy holds that liability justifications for killing multiple aggressors can be overridden by the badness of killing (Rodin 2011a: 99; 2017). Related views appeal to the idea that the killing of liable persons leaves a 'residual injustice' (McMahan 2011b: 155–156) or to the notion of combined justifications (see above) to resolve the puzzle (Bazargan 2014). A more radical approach denies that each of the multiple aggressors is in fact liable (Gordon-Solmon 2017) or posits a sui generis proportionality constraint (McMahan 2017).

3.2 Proportionality and Culpability

Several theorists argue that narrow proportionality judgments should be sensitive to the culpability of the liable individual (McMahan 2005a: 394; Bazargan 2014; Rodin 2011a: 82–84). On this view, an individual may be liable to a certain amount of defensive harm for posing a threat if they do so fully culpably, but to some lesser amount of harm to the extent that they possess a valid excuse. For example, duress or intoxication may provide an agent with a partial excuse for posing a threat, while an agent who threatens on the basis of false, but reasonable, beliefs may be fully non-culpable.

However, Jonathan Quong has recently argued that this view generates counter-intuitive results. Consider:

Muggings: Dave decides to violently mug another person and has no responsibility-diminishing excuse for doing so. Eric threatens to do exactly the same thing to a different person, but is partially excused as a result of some mild coercion by others.

Assaults: As a prank, Frank’s friends gave him three alcoholic drinks that Frank believed were non-alcoholic. Frank is now mildly drunk. He threatens to wrongfully assault a man at the bar. Gary is sober, but he threatens to wrongfully assault a man at the bar with the same degree of force as Frank. (Quong 2020: 116)

Quong argues that it is counter-intuitive to think that there is some amount of harm that it is would be proportionate to inflict on Dave but not Eric, or on Gary but not Frank. Instead, a person’s degree of liability is set by the importance of the right they threaten, and not their level of culpability.

3.3 Proportionality and Modes of Agency

In addition to the questions of who is harmed and how much, it has also been suggested that proportionality judgments are sensitive to also the way in which harm is brought about (the “mode of agency”). For example, non-consequentialists typically endorse at least some of the following claims:

  • Causing harm is harder to justify than allowing harm to occur.
  • Intentionally causing harm is harder to justify than causing harm as an unintended side-effect.
  • Harming a person in a way that uses that person as a means is harder to justify than harming a person in way that does not use them as a means.
  • Directly causing harm is harder to justify than enabling other people to cause harm.
  • Causing harm is harder to justify than preventing harm from being prevented.

If any of these moral asymmetries are plausible, then it seems natural to weight them in proportionality assessments (Rodin, 2011; McMahan 2014b). On this view, it may be proportionate to cause harm via one mode of agency, but disproportionate to cause an identical level of harm to the same person(s) via a different mode.

One interesting question is whether modes of agency apply differently in assessments of narrow and wide proportionality. For example, one might hold that if a person is liable to a harm, then it is morally irrelevant how that harm is brought about. Alternatively, we might think that narrow proportionality assessments should be sensitive to at least some of these moral distinctions. For example, it might be argued that an agent is liable to a certain level of harm that prevents them from posing a threat, but is liable to a lesser harm that involves using her as a means (McMahan 2009: 219–221). On this view, persons are not liable simply to a certain level of harm, but rather to a certain level of harm brought about in a certain way (Gordon-Solmon 2019).

3.4 The Goods of Proportionality

Here we consider some questions about the relevant good effects of defensive action that are relevant to proportionality assessments.

3.4.1 Opportunity costs

In typical cases, the relevant good effects seem obvious: preventing (or mitigating) the threat of harm to the victim(s). But other cases suggest that additional goods might be admissible. Consider:

Interrupted Rescue: Valerie is about to rescue Billy when she is wrongfully attacked by Amanda. Amanda’s attack will break Valerie’s finger, which will prevent Valerie from rescuing Billy. Valerie can stop Amanda’s attack only by imposing serious harm on her (for a similar case, see Draper 2016: 110)

Valerie’s use of defensive force has two good effects. It prevents the threat to her finger and prevents the opportunity cost of not saving Billy (on opportunity costs and defensive harm, see McMahan 2014: 4–6; Draper 2016: 109–115; Oberman 2019: 199–202). It seems plausible that preventing the opportunity cost can contribute to rendering harming Amanda proportionate: Valerie may impose more harm on Amanda than she would if only her finger were at stake. The difficult question is how much additional harm. Is Amanda liable to lethal harm, given that her attack endangers Billy’s life? This will depend on, among other things, whether there are differences between liability for causing harm and liability for preventing people from being saved.

3.4.2 Harms and wrongs

A victim of unjust attack suffers two distinct bads: the harm caused and the wrong done (Kamm 2014: 75–76). The first is grounded in the victim’s wellbeing, the second in their moral status. One suggestion is that that the value of avoiding wrongs should feature in proportionality assessments (Uniacke 2011: 260). For example, perhaps it is permissible to cause more harm to innocents in the course of rescuing victims of a fire that has been started by an arsonist, compared to a fire started by lightning strike.

Even if we are skeptical that avoiding wrongs permits causing additional harm on innocents, one might nonetheless argue that it is permissible to impose greater harm on liable persons who threaten more serious wrongs, but equal harm. (Quong 2020:107–114) To illustrate, consider:

Negligent Side-Effect: Anthony is hiking and negligently causes rocks to fall towards innocent Violet below, which will harm her to degree H.

Negligent Useful: Anish negligently forms the false belief that Vania has unjustifiably pushed a boulder towards an innocent person. Vania in fact poses no threat to anybody. Anish pushes Vania in front of the boulder in an effort to stop (what he believes to be) her unjust threat, which will harm Vania to degree H. (Based on similar cases in Quong 2020: 98–99)

Both Anish and Anthony threaten an identical quantity of harm to an innocent person. But if we are sympathetic to the idea that usefully harming an innocent person is a graver wrong than unintentionally harming an innocent person as a side-effect, then we might also conclude that Anish is liable to more defensive harm than Anthony.

The gravity of a rights violations might also be sensitive to the existence of special relationships. For example, it seems a greater wrong to be harmed by someone who has a special duty to protect us (such as one’s parent, or a police officer), compared to someone who lacks that duty (Gardner 2013: 105–108). If so, this additional wrongfulness may support a more permissive narrow proportionality judgment.

4. Necessity

Even when the use of force satisfies the proportionality requirement, it may nonetheless be morally impermissible. For example, if Victim can avert a lethal threat only by either killing Attacker or breaking Attacker’s arm, it would be wrong to kill Attacker. Though proportionate, killing would be unnecessary in this case. As standardly understood, the necessity constraint requires defenders to compare the available means of averting a threat, rank them according to some relevant moral criteria, and use only the means that is favored by that ranking.

By what criteria should we rank the available means of defense? One intuitive suggestion is the we should rank defensive options according to their harmfulness. On this view, necessity requires defenders to use the least harmful means of averting a threat. However, this proposal requires modification. Consider Ledge:

Ledge: Victim can save his own life by either (a) pushing his culpable attacker, Villain, off a ledge, breaking Villain’s leg, or (b) jumping off the ledge himself, breaking his own arm.

If it is permissible for Victim to break Villain’s leg, and only necessary defense is permissible, breaking Villain’s leg must be necessary. But (we assume) a broken leg is more harmful than a broken arm. How, then, can pushing Villain be necessary for saving Victim’s life, given Victim’s available alternative of jumping at the cost of breaking his own arm? One influential proposal (which we touched on in §3.1), is that harms to which a person is liable count for less than harms to which a person is not liable. Since Villain is liable to defensive harm, we can discount Villain’s interests relative to Victim’s interests (as well as the interests of any bystanders) (Lazar 2012:7; McMahan 2016:185). On this view, necessity requires defenders to use the defensive option which causes the least morally-discounted harm.

To be plausible, the necessity constraint must be limited to comparing alternatives that are genuinely available to the defender. Even if an expertly-delivered karate chop could harmlessly render Villain unconscious, this does not make harming Villain unnecessary if Victim is not an expert in karate, even if it is, in some sense, physically possible for Victim to deliver such a blow. It also seems plausible that “availability” should be understood in terms of the defender’s evidence. A hidden trapdoor might offer Victim a means of escaping Attacker without using defensive force. But if Victim has no evidence of this trapdoor, the presence of this less harmful means cannot render force unnecessary (for discussion, see Steinhoff 2019: 174–181).

Necessity is also sensitive to the different probabilities of success of various defensive options. Imagine that in Murder, Victim can either kill Attacker, which has a .9 chance of saving Victim’s life, or break Attacker’s arm, which has a .1 chance of saving Victim’s life. We are likely to think that killing Attacker counts as necessary despite the chance that a much smaller harm could also save Victim’s life. But our intuitions might change as we increase the chances of success of the lesser harm. If breaking Attacker’s arm has a .7 chance of saving Victim’s life, perhaps killing Attacker does not satisfy the necessity constraint.

4.1 Liability and Necessity

The relationship between necessity and liability is contested. Consider Jump and Poison:

Jump: Gunman is shooting at Victim, trying to kill him. He chases Victim to the edge of a cliff. Unbeknown to Gunman, Victim has a parachute he can use to jump to safety at little risk to himself. Victim also has a gun that he can use to shoot Gunman.

Poison: Adversary has been slowly poisoning Victim over several weeks. Victim has already consumed a lethal dose of the poison (for which there is no antidote) and will certainly die no matter what.

Internalists argue that a person can be liable only to the least harmful means of averting a threat. On this view, liability has an internal necessity constraint (McMahan 2009: 9). Since Victim can avoid harm by using the parachute in Jump, harming Gunman is unnecessary for averting the threat Gunman poses. Thus, Gunman is not liable to defensive harm. In Poison, harming Adversary is unnecessary because it is pointless. Nothing can be done to avert Adversary’s threat to Victim, and so Adversary cannot be liable to defensive harm.

An advantage of internalism is that it captures the intuitive wrongness of unnecessary force. A disadvantage is that it implies that even culpable attackers may harm their victims in counter-defense, should their victims use unnecessary force against them. If Gunman in Jump is not liable to defensive harm, then any harm he suffers is unjust. It is Victim, then, who seems to be liable to be harmed, should he defend himself rather than jump.

Jeff McMahan and Kaila Draper each argue that internalism can avoid this conclusion because Gunman is more morally responsible than Victim for the fact that someone—either he or Victim—must suffer a harm (McMahan 2011a: 551; Draper 2016: 108). But it is unclear why Gunman is more responsible for this fact, since it is Victim’s responsible choice that makes harm unavoidable. Gunman may be more blameworthy for trying to kill Victim than Victim is for trying to kill Gunman. But this does not entail that Gunman is more responsible than Victim for the threat that Victim poses to Gunman. Another possibility is to distinguish between one’s liability to harm, and one’s right to defend oneself. We might think that Gunman has a right not to be killed, since killing him is unnecessary, but that his responsibility for the initial threat to Victim makes it impermissible for him to harmfully defend himself if Victim forcefully responds to that threat. (For more on this separation, see McMahan 2013; Frowe 2015.)

The standard externalist view holds that a person’s liability is determined by facts about her and what she has done, and not any facts about the defensive options available to defenders. Since both Gunman and Adversary culpably pose unjust threats to Victim, each is liable to defensive force. This suggests that Victim does not wrong either by killing them, and that neither may kill Victim in self-defense.

Proportionate means externalism, in contrast, distinguishes between Gunman and Adversary (Frowe 2014a: 105). On this view, one can be liable to harm that is not the least harmful means of averting a threat, provided that the harm is a means of averting the threat and proportionate to the good secured. Killing Gunman is a means of averting the threat he poses, and is proportionate to saving Victim’s life. Gunman is thus liable to defensive harm on this view. In contrast, since harming Adversary cannot avert the threat she poses, she is not liable to harm.

Externalist views struggle to capture the intuition that even liable people are wronged by being knowingly unnecessarily harmed. Externalists can grant only that unnecessary force is impersonally wrong, and that harming Gunman is all-things-considered impermissible in light of this impersonal wrong. This implication looks especially worrying when it comes to unnecessarily harming non-culpable threateners, such as Homeowner in Mistake, who threatens Victim only because she reasonably believes that Victim poses a lethal unjust threat to her. If Victim can save his own life simply by stepping aside, rather than killing Homeowner, he seems to wrong Homeowner if he instead decides to kill Homeowner as a means of saving his own life. Homeowner seems to have a legitimate complaint against Victim. We might also think that she (or her beneficiaries) are entitled to compensation.

The partialist account responds to this challenge by combining an externalist view of when a person forfeits her usual right not to be harmed with a claim about our humanitarian rights (Firth and Quong 2012; Quong 2020: 145–149). According to this account, people responsible for unjust threats only partially forfeit their rights against being harmed. Even culpable threateners retain a humanitarian right not to be seriously harmed when others can avoid harming them at low cost to themselves. This humanitarian right is grounded in our urgent needs and cannot be forfeited. Thus, on this view, Gunman and Adversary are only partially liable to harm, since Victim can avoid harming each at little or no cost to herself. The fact that harming them will violate their humanitarian rights explains why such unnecessary harm wrongs them.

4.2 The Scope of Necessity

The necessity requirement involves comparing and ranking options. But what range of options should be compared? A standard assumption is that the necessity requirement adjudicates between available means of saving particular victims from particular threats (McMahan 2013: 2). This assumption has been recently challenged (Oberman 2020; Tadros 2016b; Frowe forthcoming: 8). Consider Trolley Choice and Choice:

Trolley Choice: Trolley A is lethally heading towards five people, and can be lethally diverted towards Workman. Trolley B is lethally heading towards five different people, and can be diverted down an empty side-track. Bystander has time to divert only one trolley. (Frowe forthcoming: 8)

Choice: Attacker is trying to unjustly kill Alice. Defender can prevent this only by killing Attacker. Villain is trying to kill Vicky. Defender can prevent this by making a loud noise that will deter Villain. Defender has time to save either Alice or Vicky, but not both. (For discussion of similar cases, see Oberman 2020)

It is intuitively impermissible for Bystander to divert Trolley A in Trolley Choice, killing Workman. And this impermissibility seems to be grounded in the fact that harming Workman is unnecessary for securing the good of saving five lives. If so, the standard view of the scope of necessity is mistaken. Necessity does not adjudicate only between means of achieving precisely the same end, but is also sensitive to options to achieve morally equivalent or better ends (Oberman 2020). This, in turn, gives us reason to doubt the permissibility of killing Attacker in Choice. Killing Attacker is necessary for saving Alice. But it is not necessary for saving a life.

4.3 Distributing Harms Amongst the Liable

Consider Multiple Threats:

Multiple Threats: Victim is simultaneously, but independently, attacked by Attacker and Villain, who are equally culpable. Each is trying to kill Victim. Victim can disable Attacker by inflicting 10 units of harm on him. This will also deter Villain. Victim can also disable Villain by inflicting 20 units of harm on him. This will also deter Attacker. (Adapted from Tomlin 2020: 356)

As we saw in §3.1 it is common to treat liability as a one-to-one relationship between a threatener and her victim (McMahan 2017: 5; Rodin 2011a: 99; Kamm 2011: 134–135). On this approach, we ask whether Attacker, rather than Victim, ought to suffer harm, and then, separately, whether Villain, rather than Victim, ought to suffer harm. This assumes that we can judge the necessity of harming Attacker independently of the necessity of harming Villain, and vice versa. But in Multiple Threats, Victim needs to harm only Attacker or Villain to save himself. Harming both violates the necessity constraint, but we can see this only by moving beyond the one-to-one relationship between Victim and each threatener. Moreover, it seems that necessity dictates which of the two should be harmed: Victim should disable Attacker, since this is less harmful than disabling Villain, and achieves the same end of saving Victim (Tomlin 2020; see also Draper 2016: 114–115). If, as McMahan argues, necessity is internal to liability, liability cannot be about these one-to-one relationships either. Rather, liability must involve comparisons across threateners.

4.4 Responsibility for Defensive Options

A further difficulty with judging necessity arises when a defender bears responsibility for the range of available defensive options. Consider Damage:

Damage: Villain wrongly tries to kill Victim. Victim can protect himself by non-lethally stunning Villain with his Taser, or shooting Villain dead with his gun. Victim destroys his Taser. He can now prevent the attack only by killing Villain.

It seems unlikely that a defender satisfies necessity if they deliberately deprive themselves of less harmful means of defense, at least if they do so at the time of the attack. We might think that earlier choices also preclude satisfying necessity. For example, imagine that Victim knew that there was a high chance that Villain would try to kill him today, and decided to leave his Taser at home. If Victim violates necessity by killing Villain in Damage, he plausibly also does so by killing Villain after deliberately leaving the Taser at home (Schwartz 2020: 3). Of course, this verdict becomes less plausible as we increase the costs to the defender of maintaining defensive options.

Daniel Schwartz suggests that even if Victim’s lethal defense in Damage violates necessity, this does not entail that Victim acts impermissibly. Schwartz argues that Villain’s death could be construed as the lesser evil compared to Victim’s death. He proposes a distinction between excessive harm (which is unnecessary, yet achieves a valuable goal), and wanton harm (which achieves nothing valuable). In general, excessive harms that are part of a defensive action are, Schwartz claims, less bad than wanton harms of the sort that Villain threatens to impose on Victim. Thus, Victim can have a lesser-evil justification for imposing excessive harm on Villain to prevent Villain imposing wanton harm on her (Schwartz 2020: 9–11).

4.5 Provocateurs

Cases of provocation also raise questions about how a defender’s responsibility for the necessity of using force bears on the permissibility of defense. Consider Provoke:

Provoke: Enemy wants to punch Rival. Enemy insults Rival’s mother, intending to cause Rival to attack him. Rival prepares to punch Enemy. Enemy can prevent this only by punching Rival in self-defense.

Kimberly Ferzan argues that although it is impermissible for Rival to punch Enemy, and Enemy is not liable to be harmed, it is also impermissible for Enemy to defend himself by punching Rival (Ferzan 2013: 615). Since Enemy has unjustifiably engineered the situation in which force against Rival is necessary to avert a threat to himself, Enemy lacks defensive rights against Rival’s predicted response (Ferzan 2013: 616).

On Ferzan’s view, Enemy may not defend himself against being punched, since this is what he predicts Rival will do. But Enemy retains his defensive rights against harms that exceed those he expects Rival to inflict. As Lisa Hecht points out, adopting this type of proportionality constraint for provocateurs produces a counterintuitive asymmetry between provocateurs and ordinary threateners (Hecht 2019: 171–173). According to Ferzan, a provocateur who foresees a lethal response to an insult lacks a right to defend herself against lethal harm. In contrast, a threatener whose punch elicits a lethal response has a right to defend herself against lethal harm. And yet the threatener commits a much more serious wrong than the provocateur. It seems odd, therefore, that the provocateur forfeits her defensive rights to a greater degree.

5. Defense Against Justified Threateners

When an aggressor is liable to be harmed, they are typically morally prohibited from using counter-defense to thwart their victim’s justified use of defensive force. Moreover, third-parties may intervene only on behalf of the victim. We might think that this result holds more generally: If one party is justified in harming another, it follows that the other party is not justified in responding with defensive force. This view avoids the purportedly

paradoxical result that each of two people is justified in trying to bring about the death of the other while keeping himself alive. (Waldron 2000: 715)

However, as we have seen, liability justifications are not the only the only possible justification for causing harm. Sometimes agents may infringe others’ rights not to be harmed, either because doing so is the lesser-evil or (more controversially) because the agent has an agent-relative justification. In these cases, the victim faces a threat of harm to which she is not liable. Are these victims permitted to defend themselves?

Consider a variation on Trolley:

Defensive Trolley: A runaway trolley is lethally heading towards five innocent people. Engineer is about to divert the trolley away from the five towards Workman, who will be killed. Workman can prevent the diversion by throwing a grenade that will destroy the switch, but also kill Engineer. The five will be hit by the trolley. (Frowe 2018: 475, revising a case in Quong 2016: 826)

Assume that Engineer has a lesser-evil justification for killing Workman. Is it permissible for Workman to defend himself against Engineer? Many people have the intuition that it is. These cases thus challenge the view that defensive permissions are necessarily asymmetric.

The debate about harming justified threateners focuses on two key questions (see Mapel 2010 for helpful discussion). First, what is the moral status of justified threateners: are they liable to defensive force? Second, is defensively harming justified threateners morally permitted, all things considered?

Several writers argue that that justified threateners are liable (Steinhoff 2008; 2019: Ch.3; Rodin 2011a: 86–87; Hosein 2014; Draper, 2016: 67–68). On this view, posing a threat of unjust harm is a sufficient ground for liability; the fact that the threat is justified makes no difference. One source of support for this idea is that people whose rights are justifiably transgressed are typically thought to be entitled to compensation for the harms they suffer (Steinhoff 2008: 223–224; Gardner 2011: 42). However, not all claims to compensation for suffering a harm entail a claim to prevent that harm. For example, homeowners are entitled to compensation when their houses are demolished to make way for a new road, but it does not follow that they may forcefully prevent the demolition of their houses.

Some writers deny that agents such as Engineer are liable, arguing that “justification defeats liability” (McMahan 2005a: 399; 2008; 2014; Frowe 2018: 476; Quong 2016: 826). This claim is often defended by appeal to a deeper account of the basis of liability. For example, McMahan argues that if we accept the view that

the assignment of liability follows the distribution of harm in accordance with the demands of justice, (McMahan 2008: 234)

it follows that

there is no reason that justice would demand that unavoidable harm be distributed towards [justified threateners], (2008: 234)

and so these threateners are exempt from liability. Similarly, Quong (2016, 2020) holds that if liability is grounded in treating others as though they lack rights, then justified threateners do not incur liability (since their actions are justified in spite of their victim’s rights.)

On the question of permissibility, those who believe that Engineer is liable to be killed typically hold that Workman may kill Engineer in self-defense, even if this prevents the saving of the five (Steinhoff 2008: 221). Among those who deny Engineer’s liability, opinion is divided. Proponents of agent-relative prerogatives, such as Quong, hold that Workman is permitted to kill Engineer, at least when this does not prevent the saving of the five (Quong 2016: 827). By contrast, McMahan argues that killing Engineer is impermissible, though Workman may harmlessly prevent the saving of the five in order to save his own life (for example, by remotely jamming the switch that diverts the trolley) (McMahan 2014: 111).

A stronger view holds that Workman may not even harmlessly prevent the five’s being saved, and may not kill Engineer to save himself even after the five are saved (Frowe 2018: 476–478). Frowe argues that agents are typically required to act on lesser-evil justifications for defending others. If morality requires Engineer to divert the trolley, it cannot also permit Workman to prevent the trolley’s being diverted. And since Engineer is not liable to be killed, and killing her is not the lesser evil, it is impermissible for Workman to kill Engineer to save his own life.

6. Defending Others

6.1 Self-Defense vs. Other-Defense

What is the relationship between the morality of self-defense and the morality of defending others? One natural view is that the two share the same underlying rationale, such that the permissibility of other-defense goes “hand-in-hand” with the permissibility of self-defense (Thomson 1991: 306). This seems most plausible in the case of liable attackers. Since the justification for harming such person’s rests on the “entirely impersonal” fact that they have forfeited their ordinary right against harm, it seems plausible that that any suitably situated person may act on that justification (Thomson 1991: 308).

However, as explained in §2, some writers deny that all justifications for defensive harm are impersonal (or “agent-neutral”) in this way. Proponents of agent-relative permissions hold that some justifications apply only to defense of oneself (or of others to whom one is specially related). If this view is correct, then the permissibility of self and other-defense will often come apart. For example, it may be permissible for an individual to kill an innocent person in order to defend her own life (and perhaps also permissible for her loved ones to kill to save her), but impermissible for third-parties to do so (on whether agent-relative justifications can be transferred, see Bazargan-Forward 2018; Lazar 2015.

6.2 Other-Defense as a Duty to Rescue

Self-defense is typically assumed to be morally optional: victims are permitted to refrain from use defensive force. By contrast, we might think that defending others is presumably morally required (at least if the costs of doing so are not excessive).

This claim is most intuitive when it comes to defending innocent victims from culpable attackers (Fabre 2007). But it is controversial when defending others requires harming innocent persons as the lesser-evil. Recall Trolley, in which Engineer can, at no risk to herself, save five by lethally diverting a trolley towards Workman. Comparatively little attention has been paid to whether Engineer is morally required (and not merely permitted) to save the five. Those who consider the question typically argue that saving is supererogatory, because Engineer cannot be morally compelled to kill Workman (Thomson 1985: 1406; Alexander 2005: 618; Walen & Wasserman 2012: 554).

However, if killing Workman is indeed justified as the lesser-evil, this means that Engineer can prevent serious harm to others at no risk to herself, and without imposing a disproportionate cost on anyone else. If we are normally under a duty to aid when these conditions are met, then diverting towards Workman should also be morally required. The challenge is to explain why acting on lesser-evil justifications should be excluded from the more general duty to rescue (Frowe 2018: 465–466).

6.3 Other-Defense and Consent

Several theorists argue that defending others is subject to an additional moral requirement: that the beneficiary of defense must consent to being defended (or, more plausibly, that the beneficiary must not validly refuse) (Fabre 2009b: 159–160; Finlay 2010: 292; Parry 2017: 358).

There are different ways of understanding the rationale behind the consent requirement. On one view, the right to use defensive force initially applies only to the victim of aggression. In order for third-parties to be permitted to use force against the aggressor, this right must be “transferred” by the victim (Fabre 2009b: 158). An alternative approach focuses on the victim’s welfare, rather than their rights (Parry 2017: 370–376). On this view, the consent requirement is grounded in the anti-paternalist idea that we may not act “for the good” of another person if they refuse to be benefited (on paternalism, see Dworkin 2002 [2020]). If a victim validly refuses defensive assistance, then defenders cannot justify harming the aggressor by appeal to the benefit it would provide to the victim.

The consent requirement rests on the idea that victims occupy a privileged position within the ethics of defensive harm: It’s their rights and interests that are at stake, so they get to decide whether they are defended. One important objection denies that victims have exclusive control over whether others may act on justifications for harming aggressors. For example, one might argue that victims’ lives and interests are agent-neutrally valuable, and so any agent may act to preserve that value, regardless of the victim’s will (Lazar 2016: 217). The plausibility of this objection will depend on its implications in other cases of non-consensual benefiting. Alternatively, one might argue that we have moral reasons to prevent wrongful attacks that are distinct from the moral reasons to protect victim’s lives and welfare. Perhaps wrongdoing is impersonally bad (Parfit 2017: 354–357; see also, Kamm 2014: 75–76) or bad for the wrongdoer (Tadros 2016c: 1–2, 164; Brownlee 2019). Either way, the consent sceptic can say to the victim: “it’s not all about you!” The success of these objections will depend on whether these alternative moral reasons for defending victims are sufficiently strong to justify harming and killing (for skepticism, see Parry 2017: 379–382; Oberman 2020: 447–452).

One interesting puzzle about the consent requirement is how it applies in cases where multiple victims are threatened, and some victims refuse while others do not. One obvious answer is to adopt a majoritarian interpretation of the consent requirement. But this view generates counter-intuitive results. Consider the following example:

Abuse: Your alcoholic neighbor is mercilessly beating his five adult children. You can rescue the children by defensively harming the neighbor. Four children explicitly and competently refuse defense, while one consents. Are you required to defer to the wishes of the majority in this case? (adapted from Altman & Wellman 2008: 244)

Many find it intuitive that defense would be permissible, despite the refusal of the majority. This tracks the more general idea that individuals’ basic rights place limits on majority rule. Reflection on this kind of case has led many to conclude that the consent requirement imposes only a minimal constraint in multiple victim cases: Provided some member(s) of the victim group do(es) not validly refuse, the consent requirement is satisfied (Altman & Wellman 2008: 243–245; McMahan 2010: 52; Frowe 2014b: 109).

This skepticism has recently been challenged in favor of a more robust interpretation of the requirement (Parry 2017). On this view, if a victim validly refuses defensive assistance, we must exclude the benefit of rescue to that victim when evaluating whether the use of force is proportionate. Defending a group is permissible only if the benefits to the non-refusing victims is sufficient to render defense proportionate. Hence, this is known as the “Proportionate Consent Requirement” (PCR).

The PCR captures the judgment that other-defense is permissible in Abuse. Since it would be proportionate to harm the father in order to defend just one victim, it is permissible to do so provided one victim consents. However, in other cases the justification for defending a group does requires appealing to the good of many victims (and potentially every victim). Consider:

Elevator: Five Victims are riding in an elevator. Aggressor begins to saw through the elevator cable in order kill Victims. Rescuer is able to kill Aggressor by throwing a grenade, thereby saving Victims. However, the blast from the grenade will kill innocent Bystander as a side-effect (Parry 2017: 385).

Let’s assume that it is permissible to kill one innocent person as a side-effect of saving five innocent persons, but not four. In Elevator, the permissibility of using defensive force involves appealing to the good of every member of the victim group. However, since four members have refused intervention on their behalf, the PCR holds that this refusal renders it impermissible to intervene. The good of the single consenting member of the group is insufficient to justify killing the innocent bystander as a side-effect. Indeed, in this case, the PCR holds that defense is only permissible if every victim consents (or does not validly refuse).

One important worry for the PCR is whether it is vulnerable to the same objection that plagued the majoritarian view. If it is objectionable to give a majority the power to veto the defense of a consenting minority, it seems even more objectionable to give a minority of dissenting victims the power to veto the defense of a much larger number of victims.

7. Uncertainty

In this entry, for reasons of space, we have focused primarily on the moral principles that govern the objective (or fact-relative) permissibility of defensive harm. Of course, this leaves open questions about how defensive agents ought to act in light of their evidence and under conditions of uncertainty. While the majority of the debate has also centered on questions of objective permissibility, there is growing literature exploring the subjective (or evidence-relative) ethics of defensive harm (and non-consequentialist moral principles more generally) (see, for example, Tomlin 2019; Haque 2017; Bolinger 2017, 2021, forthcoming; Frowe 2010; Lazar 2018, 2019a, 2019b; van der Vossen 2016).


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