Spinoza’s Psychological Theory
In Part III of his Ethics, “On the Origin and Nature of the Affects,” which is the subject of this article, Spinoza addresses two of the most serious challenges facing his thoroughgoing naturalism. First, he attempts to show that human beings follow the order of nature. Human beings, on Spinoza’s view, have causal natures similar in kind to other ordinary objects, other “finite modes” in the technical language of the Ethics, so they ought to be analyzed and understood in the same way as the rest of nature. Second, Spinoza attempts to show that moral concepts, such as the concepts of good and evil, virtue, and perfection, have a basis in human psychology. Just as human beings are no different from the rest of nature, so moral concepts are no different from other concepts. Spinoza’s detailed account of the human affects—the actions and passions of the human mind—is crucial to both tasks. For his argument to succeed, the theory of the affects must be both a plausible account of human psychology and also a plausible basis for ethics.
- 1. The Human Being as Part of Nature
- 2. The Affects
- 3. The Psychological Basis for a Theory of Value
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In the Preface to Part III, Spinoza states his view that all things alike must be understood to follow from the laws of nature:
The laws and rules of nature, according to which all things happen, and change from one form to another, are always and everywhere the same. So the way of understanding the nature of anything, of whatever kind, must also be the same, viz. through the universal laws of nature.
Many philosophers have treated the human mind as an exception to otherwise universal natural laws, as a thing that is conscious, that is capable of good and evil, or that can be an uncaused cause of action, for example. Spinoza though insists that human beings are not “outside nature.” Any features or deeds of human beings that seem exceptional, then, must have for Spinoza some explanation in terms of universal, natural laws. That is, if there is any sense at all in saying that a human being is aware, does good, and is free, then there must be universal, natural laws that justify and explain these designations.
Spinoza’s thesis (IIIp7) that the essence of any finite mode, including any human mind (IIIp9), is a striving (conatus) to persevere in being is an attempt to give an account of nature under which human beings with their apparent peculiarities are natural. Spinoza argues that all finite modes strive to persevere in being (IIIp6), and he uses an analysis of human striving to explain the conscious experience of desire, human freedom, and good and evil in terms that might apply to any finite modes. Desire, as Spinoza understands it, just is striving together with consciousness of striving (IIIp9s; the human experience of desire is discussed in more detail in Section 2.1). An action of a human mind cannot be free, for Spinoza, in the sense of being determined by a faculty of will that is itself undetermined (IIp48; see also letter 58, to Schuller). There is human freedom for Spinoza, however, in the sense of freedom from external interference: I am free in producing some effect (that is, in doing something) to the extent that the effect follows from my essence, or, in other words, to the extent that it is the effect of my striving. (For discussions of action and human freedom, see IIId2 and V Preface.) ‘Good’ and ‘evil’ are labels that describe natural properties in the sense that they describe changes that might occur in any particular things at all (although we reserve the labels for these changes when they occur in human beings). Although scholars debate the precise meaning of these identifications, an increase in the power with which a mind strives is good, for Spinoza, and a decrease evil (see IIIp11s, IIIp39s and IV Preface). Because the striving thesis thus makes central contributions to Spinoza’s accounts of consciousness, of human freedom and of good and evil, it is of great importance to Spinoza’s psychology and ethics. One might raise questions about the validity of Spinoza’s argument to the doctrine, about its plausibility as an account of the nature of particular objects, or about its plausibility as an account of human nature. The subsections which follow address these issues in turn.
Spinoza’s argument to IIIp6 is uncharacteristically insulated from the rest of the Ethics. As Spinoza presents the argument at IIIp6d, it depends principally upon IIIp4, a proposition which Spinoza takes to be self-evident, and IIIp5 which derives from IIIp4 alone. The argument also involves, less directly, IP25C and its gloss at IP34.
I Proposition 25 Corollary: Particular things are nothing but affections of God’s attributes, or modes by which God’s attributes are expressed in a certain and determinate way.
I Proposition 34: God’s power is his essence itself.
III Proposition 4: No thing can be destroyed except through an external cause.
III Proposition 5: Things are of a contrary nature, i.e., cannot be in the same subject, insofar as one can destroy the other.
Therefore, III Proposition 6: Each thing, as far as it can by its own power, strives to persevere in its being.
A thing’s essence may not be absolutely equivalent to its nature for Spinoza, since a thing such as a square circle has a nature but cannot exist (Ip11) and one might interpret Spinoza as holding that anything which has an essence might exist (IId2). Still, the two terms might be taken interchangeably here because Spinoza is only describing existents. If this assumption is correct, then perhaps Spinoza’s reasoning runs like this:
Particular things are expressions of power, since they are modes of God’s attributes (Ip25) and God’s attributes constitute God’s essence (ID4) and God’s essence is his power (Ip34). It is self-evident that nothing can be destroyed except through an external cause (IIIp4), so an apparent particular thing which is self-destructive is in fact at least two (IIIp5). The power a genuine particular thing expresses, then, must therefore be directed toward its own perseverance in being (IIIp6).
Pace Spinoza, the claim at IIIp4 that no thing can be destroyed except through an external cause is not clearly self-evident. Even assuming IIIp4 to be true, however, one might raise questions about Spinoza’s argument. Why is it that, just because a thing does not strive to destroy itself, that thing must therefore strive to persevere in being? A thing might, it seems, not strive for anything, or perhaps it might strive to do something which is neither perseverance nor self-destruction. Spinoza’s use of IP34 and Ip25c seems intended to rule out the first of these possibilities. Although Spinoza’s term ‘express’ (exprimere) is notoriously unclear, it may mean something like “is a particular form of.” In that case, because particular things are expressions of God’s essence, his power, they must be particular forms of power. So there cannot be a thing which does not strive at all or, in other words, there cannot be a thing which is not any expression of power at all.
The second version of the objection, the version which notes the possibility that a particular thing as described in IIIp4 might strive for something other than either self-destruction or perseverance, remains a challenge to sympathetic readers of the Ethics however. The rejection of IIIp6 and an insistence that at least some thing does not strive to persevere in its being, where perseverance in being is understood as a particular end among many possible options, is perfectly consistent with the truth of IIIp4. After all, not striving to persevere in being, which IIIp6 rules out, is not the same thing as striving not to persevere in being, which IIIp4 rules out. A sympathetic reader of Spinoza might try to resolve the difficulty through an understanding of what it means to strive to persevere in being, under which striving to persevere in being comes to mean just the same thing as striving to do something other than destroy oneself, in particular, striving to maintain a present state. (See Curley 1, 109, for an interpretation similar to this one.) This reading comes closer to making the argument from IIIp4 to IIIp6 seem valid, but it raises a new problem: that of reconciling this interpretation of striving with Spinoza’s accounts of human motivation which follow from IIIp6. For Spinoza consistently regards sane human beings as finite modes who, beyond merely not trying to kill themselves, actively try to preserve themselves. People do not merely resist changes to whatever state they are in; they strive to change their states in order to know more and in order to live with a greater force. One of the main problems Spinoza faces, then, is reconciling the most plausible version of IIIp6 as an account of the natures of ordinary objects (under which IIIp6 is a principle of inertia) with the most plausible version of IIIp6 as an account of human nature (under which IIIp6 is a version of psychological egoism).
Despite worries that one might have about the validity of Spinoza’s argument, the doctrine has at least some claim to plausibility as an account of the nature of particular things. The Ethics stands badly in need of some account of what finite modes are, after all, and IIIp4 provides at least one interesting way of distinguishing genuine objects from mere constructs: if the thing in question destroys itself it is not a genuine object. Thus, by IIIp4, a thing that destroys itself—one might think a lit candle or a time bomb such a thing—is not a genuine object but a thing which does not destroy itself is. To the extent that IIIp4 makes most of the things we intuitively consider genuine objects genuine objects, it captures ordinary views. To the extent that it rules out some clear class of things that we intuitively consider genuine objects (lit candles and time bombs), it represents a controversial philosophical thesis. The plausibility of the doctrine depends on whether we find that there really is reason to find basic metaphysical differences in kind between “things” which tend to destroy themselves and things which do not. One strategy for defending the plausibility of IIIp4 may be to investigate what Spinoza means there by an “external cause.” Spinoza’s various claims about essences, properties, and accidents suggest that at least some of the cases of destruction that we might consider self-destruction are, for Spinoza, destruction by external causes (Garrett, 2002, pursues this strategy), a suggestion that is supported by Spinoza’s account of suicide later in the Ethics at IVp20s. The class of things which tend to destroy themselves may be different from, and narrower than, one might think it is on a first reading of IIIp4.
IIIp6 introduces, perhaps, a slightly different thesis about what it means to be a particular thing: a particular thing is one which strives to persevere in being. IIIp6’s dependence upon IIIp4 suggests that this thesis means that any object will remain in the same state unless external causes affect it. Such a thesis appears to be a principle of inertia, and, indeed, Spinoza seems to invoke a principle of inertia in the terms he uses at IIIp6. ‘Conatus’ is a technical term of Cartesian physics, referring to an object’s motion. Spinoza himself uses the term in this way in his exposition of Descartes’s Principles of Philosophy. (Compare, for example, Descartes’s Principles II, art. 37, III, art. 56 and III, art. 58 to Spinoza’s exposition IIp14c, IIID3 and IIp17, respectively). Moreover, at IIIp6, in addition to using the term ‘conatus’ again, Spinoza also uses the same phrase that he uses in framing a different principle of inertia at IIp14 of his exposition of Descartes’s physics: “as far as it can by its own power” quantum in se est. This phrase is also one that Descartes himself uses at Principles II, art. 37. (Note however that there is some controversy over how this phrase is to be understood: see Curley’s footnote to IIIp6 in his translation and Garrett, 1999, note 2.) So there is a good textual basis for the conclusion that IIIp6 indeed has this meaning.
Apart from the question of how a principle of inertia can give us an understanding of human nature, this interpretation of IIIp6 raises a difficult question about Spinoza’s use of the striving doctrine. One might object that IIIp6, understood as a restatement of a principle of inertia, extends a physical principle to mind without sufficient clarity. In stating their versions of a principle of inertia in physics, both Descartes and Spinoza are careful to limit the claim to a claim about bodies. Spinoza, for example, in his definition of conatus ad motum, IIId3 of his exposition of Descartes, writes:
By striving for motion we do not understand any thought, but only that a part of matter is so placed and stirred to motion, that it really would go somewhere if it were not prevented by any cause.
In addition to characterizing matter, however, IIIp6 is a foundational claim about the nature of mind and, in particular, about human psychology. There is a basis, in Spinoza’s metaphysics, for thinking that whatever is true about bodies is true about minds also in some sense (and see IIIp10 and IIIp11 for Spinoza’s account of striving and the mind/body relation). Striving in physics, however, is understood as a tendency to a certain kind of motion, and motion seems, if anything does, to belong to bodies alone. So Spinoza needs to supply an account of the mental correlate to the physical “striving for motion.” But IIIp6 leaves open the question of what it means for a mind to strive. On this objection, the striving doctrine uses a kind of metaphorical language, the term ‘striving’, where a precise and literal account of what it is that is characteristic of mind is required.
Spinoza’s naturalism benefits rhetorically from his use of the term ‘conatus’ to describe the essences of human beings and other finite modes alike. For the term is not only a technical term of Cartesian physics. Cicero uses the term in De Natura Deorum (and other Roman and Greek Stoics use close cognates) in a psychological sense, referring to human desire, and Hobbes in his physiology uses the term to refer to the physical causes of human desire (Leviathan VI). So ‘conatus’ has both broad, physical and specifically human, psychological connotations which help to make the gap between nature and the human mind appear narrow.
Whether Spinoza successfully capitalizes on his rhetorical skill, however, and draws a plausible account of the nature of the human mind out of his general account of the essences of finite modes depends upon IIIp9:
III Proposition 9: Both insofar as the mind has clear and distinct ideas, and insofar as it has confused ideas, it strives, for an indefinite duration, to persevere in its being and it is conscious of this striving it has.
IIIp9 suggests that Spinoza is a psychological egoist of some sort. That is, it suggests that he believes that what human beings desire to do is to secure their own interests (construed here as perseverance in being). Indeed Spinoza goes on to define desire at IIIp9 as human striving (or appetite) together with the consciousness of striving. So clearly human desire for Spinoza is part of the striving for perseverance in being and thus shares its character.
There is some question, however, about what variety of psychological egoism Spinoza holds. Desire might be part of a striving for perseverance, after all, without all desires being desires for perseverance. One might have a strong instinctual desire for things which are instrumental to perseverance in being without desiring perseverance itself, for example. Or one might desire perseverance in being but also desire other kinds of things.
IIIp9 might be supposed to support a very strong version of psychological egoism, orthodox egoism (perhaps Delahunty, 221, holds this view). Orthodox egoism, is the view that human beings are always consciously selfish. Under this view, A consciously desires only those objects which benefit A, B desires only those objects which benefit B, and so on for all human beings. At IIIp9, Spinoza writes that the human mind seeks to persevere in being both insofar as it has clear and distinct ideas and insofar as it has confused ideas. It is natural to understand this claim to mean something like the following:
Sometimes people do things which conduce to their perseverance and other times people do things which fail to so conduce. In both types of case, though, people desire to persevere. When I do something that fails to help me to persevere, it’s because the ideas on which I based my action were confused; that is, I thought I knew what would help me to persevere, but I was wrong. When I do something that does help me to persevere, though (unless I have simply been lucky in acting from an inadequate idea), it is because I acted on clear and distinct ideas or, in other words, genuine knowledge about what would help me to persevere.
The categorical language Spinoza uses in the Appendix to Part I provides explicit support for this interpretation of IIIp9: “men act always on account of an end, viz. on account of their advantage, which they want.” Moreover there are other important passages in Spinoza’s works which are strongly compatible with the interpretation of Spinoza as an orthodox egoist. These include Ethics IVp8d, and his political writings, especially Ethics IVp36s2, and his Political Treatise, chapter 2)
Other evidence suggests that Spinoza is not an orthodox egoist, however. In particular, there is reason to question whether the argument of the Ethics commits Spinoza to the account of actions following from confused ideas that the interpretation of IIIp9 above attributes to him. Part of IVp44s concerns those agents who are the most confused. That passage is useful because it describes explicitly the conscious thought-processes that precede action:
Though men are liable to a great many affects, so that one rarely finds them to be always agitated by one and the same affect, still there are those in whom one affect is stubbornly fixed. For we sometimes see that men are so affected by one object that, although it is not present, they still believe they have it with them. When this happens to a man who is not asleep, we say that he is mad or insane. Nor are they thought to be less mad who burn with Love, and dream, both night and day, only of a lover or a courtesan. For they usually provoke laughter. But when a greedy man thinks of nothing else but profit, or money, and an ambitious man of esteem, they are not thought to be mad, because they are usually troublesome and are considered worthy of Hate. But Greed, Ambition, and Lust really are species of madness, even though they are not numbered among the diseases.
In this scholium (and in several other notable passages, including III Definition of the Affects XLVIII and IVp20s) Spinoza describes a variety of possible ends of human action, none of which is perseverance in being. Moreover, lest one think that the greedy man seeks profit because he mistakenly believes that it leads to perseverance, Spinoza emphasizes the point here that it is always one and the same object that obsesses these men. A man seeking profit because he believes that it leads to perseverance may be obsessed with two objects, profit and perseverance, not one.
IVp44s suggests that Spinoza holds a different kind of view, predominant egoism, the view that most people, most of the time consciously desire perseverance in their own being. The particular type of predominant egoism that IVp44s suggests introduces important aspects of Spinoza’s ethical theory: if the most confused people, people addled by greed or lust or ambition, are those who always seek something other than perseverance in being, then perhaps Spinoza’s view is that, for any of us who act on some similar sentiments occasionally, we do so just to the extent that we also have confused ideas. Thus human beings are predominantly egoistic because, by and large, we act rationally. It is rational to seek to persevere in being (see also what “reason demands” at IVP18S). So if we were always rational, we would always pursue our own preservation, and orthodox egoism would be true, for Spinoza. But we are not orthodox egoists, on this interpretation of Spinoza as a predominant egoist, just because we are not fully rational. To the extent that we have confused ideas, we may indeed consciously pursue ends other than perseverance in being. On this interpretation of Spinoza, there is a right (or at least a rational) end to pursue—perseverance in being—and other ends are wrong (or at least irrational).
IVp20 provides support for this interpretation of Spinoza’s predominant egoism:
IV Proposition 20: The more each one strives, and is able, to seek his own advantage, i.e., to preserve his being, the more he is endowed with virtue; conversely, insofar as each one neglects his own advantage, i.e., neglects to preserve his own being, he lacks power.
Here Spinoza explicitly admits that a person may “neglect his own advantage.” So IVp20 apparently contradicts the orthodox egoism of I Appendix. Moreover, IVp20 states that, to the extent that a person does seek perseverance in being, that person is virtuous. Virtue has a metaphysical connotation in the Ethics. A thing’s virtue is just the same as its power (IVd8). But the term undeniably has moral connotations as well. So IVp20 suggests, as IVp44s does, that consciously trying to preserve oneself is right and neglecting to preserve oneself is wrong.
IIIp9 admits of various interpretations. However, the weight of the textual evidence supports the view that he is a predominant, not an orthodox, egoist. Any particular human desire, even a desire that is not a desire for perseverance in being or its means, must on Spinoza’s view be related to perseverance in being in some way (by IIIp6 and IIIp9s). Spinoza’s discussion of desires for things other than perseverance in being in passages such as IVp44s and IVp20 suggests moreover that such desires are part or product of confusion. So passionate desires, for Spinoza, are often desires for things other than perseverance in being, although they may be confused desires for perseverance as well (see IVp63s2 and other discussions of fear). Recent debates about whether the ends of human desire are really important to his psychological theory and about how Spinoza understands human consciousness are likely to lend further support to this view by showing how these passages and others like them may be reconciled with Spinoza’s more basic commitments in metaphysics and mind.
Further reading: For discussion of IIIp4, see Matson 1977 and Garrett 2002. For interpretations of Spinoza’s argument from IIIp4–IIIp6, see Curley 1988; Della Rocca 1996; Garrett 2002 and Lin 2004. For discussions of historical sources of the striving doctrine, see James 1993, Wolfson 1934, and LeBuffe 2010a, pp.101–102. Youpa 2003 offers an account of self-preservation in Spinoza. For Spinoza’s physics and his use of Descartes, see Lachterman 1978, Peterman 2015 and 2017, and Schliesser 2017. Most book-length interpretations of the Ethics include detailed accounts of Spinoza’s view of human nature. For discussion of IIIp9, see LeBuffe 2004 and 2010a, Chapters 5–7. Some of the best general discussions of psychological egoism come in the context of the interpretation of Hobbes, to whom Spinoza is sometimes compared. For these, see Kavka 1986 and Hampton 1986.
Spinoza’s account of the affects (affectus) of the human mind is a response to one of the central problems for his naturalism. It is an attempt to show how the wide range of desires and emotions of the human mind can be produced by something which follows the order of nature. At the start of Part III (see also Chapter 2 of his Political Treatise), Spinoza notes that traditional accounts of the passions, with the exception of Descartes’s, have rested on the assumption—one wholly baseless in Spinoza’s view—that human beings are a separate “dominion” within the dominion of nature, with different kinds of constituents and governed by different sorts of laws. Spinoza’s project continues what he finds to be Descartes’s important innovation: seeking “to explain human affects through their first causes.” So his account of the affects may be most profitably compared to Descartes’s in his Passions of the Soul. It may also be usefully compared to accounts in the writings of Hobbes (especially Leviathan VI), a contemporary who shared many of Spinoza’s philosophical commitments, or to some of the “traditional accounts” which Spinoza faults, such as Aquinas’s Summa Theologiae. (Aquinas’s treatments of the passions appear mainly between Ia75 and 2a2ae189.)
Spinoza, though, because he denies freedom of the will, is more thorough than Descartes in his commitment to naturalism. This commitment makes the task Spinoza undertakes in the Ethics an even more dramatic revision of traditional understandings of the passions than that which Descartes produced. So Spinoza, even more than Descartes, is open to the sort of objection which traditional authors, those to whom it seems beyond question that human beings are outside nature, might raise: how can the full range of human psychological phenomena be produced by natural causes? For the argument of the Ethics to succeed, Spinoza must produce, first, an account of how human desires and emotions might be a part of nature as he has presented it in the Ethics and, second, a description of those human desires and emotions which is plausibly complex, that is, plausibly consistent with our experience of ourselves. The subsections which follow address these issues in turn.
The human affects, for Spinoza, are a part of nature insofar as each can be redescribed in terms of striving, a property which all particular things in nature share. Desire and its varieties are striving itself, under a certain description. Human passions are for Spinoza changes, that is, increases or decreases, in the power with which we, or parts of us, strive. Active affects are all increases in the power with which we strive.
Spinoza introduces the first of his primary affects, desire, at IIIp9s, directly after introducing the doctrine of human striving, which, in its most general form, he calls appetite.
III Proposition 9, Scholium: …Between appetite and desire there is no difference, except that desire is generally related to men insofar as they are conscious of the appetite. So desire can be defined as appetite together with consciousness of the appetite.
Thus Spinoza identifies human desire with human essence and especially with consciousness of one’s essence, the striving for perseverance in being. Spinoza’s theory of consciousness is notoriously difficult, and it is not clear which ideas in a human mind are conscious or the extent to which things other than human beings have consciousness. For human beings, at least, however, what seems to us to cause us to act, our desire, does, on Spinoza’s view, do just that. If I am asked for the proximate cause of my action in picking up my coffee cup, for example, I will respond that it was my desire for the coffee. In identifying the cause of human action, striving, with conscious desire, then, IIIp9s vindicates common sense to a degree. Had Spinoza identified desire with something other than striving, then he would have committed himself to the view that my desire does not in fact cause me to pick up the cup. (Desire for Spinoza, in its narrow definition at IIIp9s, is both psychological and physical, and in its broader definition at III, Definitions of the Affects I, it may be either. This example therefore, perhaps despite appearances, need not run afoul of Spinoza’s denial of mind-body interaction.)
IIIp9s, then, goes a long way toward showing how the universal striving doctrine can be the basis for an account of human desire. A serious problem remains, however. Although we tend to see desire as the proximate cause of action, we tend also to conceive of desire as involving teleology or final causes. If desire causes me to pick up the cup, how does it do so? The common-sense answer is teleological: I have, as an end, coffee, and I am, in a sense, drawn toward it. Spinoza is well-aware of the fact that we commonly suppose that there are teleological causes of our actions, and some accounts of appetite in the Ethics, notably IVd7, seem to incorporate teleological notions. However, Spinoza also explicitly denies that appetite is anything other than an efficient cause. This passage is from Part IV’s Preface:
What is called a final cause is nothing but a human appetite insofar as it is considered as a principle, or primary cause, of some thing. For example, when we say that habitation was the final cause of this or that house, surely we understand nothing but that a man, because he imagined the conveniences of domestic life, had an appetite to build a house. So habitation, insofar as it is considered as a final cause, is nothing more than this singular appetite. It is really an efficient cause, which is considered as a first cause, because men are commonly ignorant of the causes of their appetites.
Spinoza does not clearly deny, here, that there are teleological causes of action. (For arguments against the view that Spinoza denies all teleology, see Garrett 1999 and Lin 2006. Carriero 2005 is an influential argument that Spinoza does deny all teleology.) He does, however, identify such causes with efficient causes. He needs to show, then, how the ends of human action relate to the processes of efficient causation.
For this task, Spinoza introduces the other primary affects and a number of psychological laws associated with them. He introduces the primary passions at IIIp11s.
III Proposition 11, Scholium: We see, then, that the mind can undergo great changes, and pass now to a greater, now to a lesser perfection. These passions, indeed, explain to us the affects of Joy [laetitia] and Sadness [tristitia]. By Joy, therefore, I shall understand in what follows that passion by which the mind passes to a greater perfection. And by Sadness, that passion by which it passes to a lesser perfection.
The perfectionist language Spinoza uses is important for an understanding of the basis for ethics that he finds in psychology. Here, however, it may be understood in terms of striving. An increased power to persevere in being is for Spinoza a transition to greater perfection and a decreased power is a transition to lesser perfection (see IIIp11, the end of IV Preface, and especially III, Definitions of the Affects, III, Exp.). So, although this generalization is complicated by Spinoza’s definitions that refer passions either to parts of the body or to the body as whole, joy is the passion one experiences in the transition to an increased power to strive, and sadness is the passion one experiences in the opposite transition. Spinoza thus provides, in his account of the affects, the basis for an explanation of how it is that introspection into our conscious experience of desire might fail to bring us accurate knowledge of our own psychological processes. Our conscious experience in forming our desires, has an emotional component: we experience joy and sadness and varieties of these. But we may be unaware of why we feel joy or sadness or why, really, we desire what we desire. So Spinoza writes repeatedly, in the context of his criticisms of teleological reasoning and the introspective experiences of free will or mind/body causation (e.g., at IIIp2s): “men are conscious of their actions and ignorant of the causes by which they are determined.”
Spinoza characterizes the apparent teleology in desire at IIIp28:
We strive to promote the occurrence of whatever we imagine will lead to joy, and to avert or destroy what we imagine is contrary to it, or will lead to sadness.
Spinoza reserves the term ‘imagine’ [imaginor] for the description of conscious states, so IIIp28 describes, at least in part, the objects of desire. If I imagine that coffee will lead to joy, then I will desire that joy and so that coffee. IIIp28, strictly speaking, is not an exhaustive characterization of objects of desire. It implies only that we desire anything which we imagine will lead to joy and are averse to whatever we imagine will lead to sadness and not that we might not have other kinds of desires also, desires unrelated to either joy or sadness. A review of the particular forms of desire Spinoza catalogues in Part III (see, notably, IIIp27c3s, IIIp29s, IIIp40c2s,IIIp41, and IIIp56s) suggests, however, that the view is still stronger than the limited claim of IIIp28: it seems that Spinoza does hold that anything I desire will be a thing which I imagine will lead to joy and that anything I am averse to will be something which I imagine will lead to sadness.
What may seem on introspection, then, to be a wholly teleological cause of action, the end represented by an object of desire, is for Spinoza a peculiar manifestation in consciousness of striving, which in turn is an efficient cause of action. I reach for the cup of coffee, I may think, just because the joy that I anticipate in the coffee “pulls” me to it; in fact, however, I reach for the coffee because my characteristic striving (perhaps as a partial cause in combination with other partial causes such as the memory of past cups—IIIp36) has that effect. It “pushes” me toward the cup.
Perhaps the psychological view that Spinoza introduces at IIIp28 is susceptible to the sort of objection which one might raise against psychological hedonism, the view that human beings only desire pleasure, the avoidance of pain, and what is instrumental to these things. It may seem to some people that IIIp28 is not consistent with their own experience of their motives in acting. So, someone with a strong sense of justice might say:
It’s not that I like Jones or would get any joy from having him walk. I think the guy’s a jerk, and I hate to think of him out on the street. But I want him to be released from prison. He simply did not do what he’s been convicted of, so he should be set free.
On the basis of introspective observations like this one, one might complain that, even if Spinoza’s account of the affects can be shown to be consistent with the general theory of striving as it is presented at IIIp6, still the theory of affects is not itself a realistically complex account of human desire, since it cannot account for desires like this one in which, on the face of it, one anticipates sadness in the desired end. The plausibility of Spinoza’s view depends upon the extent to which it can reasonably redescribe this desire, and other similarly troubling desires, in ways which are consistent with IIIp28.
Spinoza attempts to show that there are many varieties of joy, sadness, and desire. Thus he might attempt to address the complaint by showing that its author offers a slightly inaccurate description of the situation:
The author denies liking Jones. Let us suppose even that he hates Jones. Even so, that does not mean that the author anticipates no joy at all in Jones’s release. Knowing that his society is just in at least this one case may reassure the author inasmuch as it gives him reason to think that he might be fairly treated himself. That is, it might be a kind of hope (IIIp18s2) which motivates the desire. Or perhaps there are people the author likes, his fellow citizens generally perhaps, to whom he wishes a similar peace of mind. The author may want the release in order to find a kind of joy, whether it be out of his ambition to please them or simply out of his human kindness (IIIp29s) or nobility (IIIp59s), in the well-being of these other people.
Far from insisting that there is one particular kind of emotion that moves people, Spinoza writes that there is an innumerable variety of affects:
III Proposition 56: There are as many species of Joy, Sadness and Desire, and consequently of each affect composed of these (like vacillation of mind) or derived from them (like love, hate, hope, fear, etc.), as there are objects by which we are affected.
IIIp51 assures us, moreover, that the same object might affect different people, or even the same person at different times, in different ways. So Spinoza protects himself from the charge that IIIp28 is obviously false (albeit at the risk of forwarding an unfalsifiable psychological claim) by arguing that, despite the seeming simplicity of that proposition, it cannot be falsified by the great variety of conscious human motives.
Although Spinoza repeatedly insists that the variety of affects is innumerable, he nevertheless does characterize, in his own terms, many of the traditional passions, each of which is a kind of joy, sadness, or desire. A few of Spinoza’s particular accounts are notable.
Pity (commiseratio) is for Spinoza a species of sadness, sadness that arises from injury to another (IIIp22s), and so to feel pity, on Spinoza’s view is to experience a decrease in one’s own power to persevere in being. If continued perseverance in being is what virtuous agents seek, then, Spinoza will be committed to the view that pity is not a virtue. Indeed, Spinoza writes at IVp50c, “A man who lives according to the dictates of reason, strives, as far as he can, not to be touched by pity.” So Spinoza stands apart from traditional Christian views on this subject (and also on the subjects of humility and repentance), and with Hobbes who conceives of pity in Leviathan VI as a kind of grief and so a decreasing of human perfection. This revisionary tendency in his thought is tempered, however, by IIIp54, where he presents pity, and also the other traditional Christian virtues of humility and repentance, as, if not genuine virtues themselves, at least means to virtue, by which people are made more able to come to learn to follow the dictates of reason.
Self-esteem (acquiescentia in se ipso) which Spinoza introduces at IIIp30 as Joy accompanied by the idea of oneself as an internal cause becomes an important part of Spinoza’s ethical theory, a species of which is even blessedness (beatitudo, see IV, App. 4), the highest form of human happiness. Human beings, as finite modes, cannot on Spinoza’s view avoid affecting and being affected by external objects. Nevertheless, Spinoza’s emphasis on self-esteem and, in his ethical theory, on self-knowledge suggests that to the extent that we are able to bring about effects, including our own emotions, as whole or adequate causes of those effects we are more free and better off. His remarks concerning the impossibility of controlling the passions and the desirability of controlling them nevertheless to the extent that we can (V Preface) similarly emphasize the ethical importance of self-knowledge and freedom from external influences.
Fear (metus) and wonder (admiratio), together with the theory of the imitation of affects, are notions that are fundamental to Spinoza’s accounts of human society. Reasonable citizens (or all citizens insofar as they are reasonable) will willingly obey the rules of the state (IVp37s2, IVp73). Fear, in the Ethics, seems to be government’s most valuable means of bringing passionate citizens to cooperate and obey: at IVp37s2, Spinoza suggests that states should rely on threats. In the Theological Political Treatise, however, Spinoza’s accounts of religion, and particularly of miracles and scripture, suggest that devotion devotio, a passion associated with wonder at Ethics IIIp52s, is a better political motive than fear. In Chapter 5, for example, Spinoza writes of Moses’s introduction of religion into the Hebrew state:
Two things in particular forced this on him: the stubborn mentality of the people (because it would not allow itself to be compelled solely by force) and the threat of war. For if war is to go well, it is better to encourage the soldiers than to frighten them with penalties and threats. In this way they will be eager to distinguish themselves for excellence and nobility of spirit rather than merely to avoid punishment.
The theory of the imitation of affects informs these and other accounts of social dynamics in Spinoza. Human beings tend, he argues, to imitate the affects of those that we take to be similar to ourselves (IIIp27), and we tend, when we feel a given affect toward a person whom we take to differ from us, to feel that same affect toward that person’s whole class or nation (IIIp46). Spinoza grounds these doctrines on a series of claims about our associative tendencies at Ethics IIIpp14–24.
Finally, active joy and active desire which Spinoza introduces at IIIp58 represent a separate class of affects notable both for their novelty against the background of traditional accounts of the passions and also for their importance to Spinoza’s ethical arguments of Parts IV and V. On traditional accounts of the passions, even Descartes’s (The Passions of the Soul, I.1), actions and passions are the same thing, regarded from different perspectives: when A does X to B, X is an action for A but a passion for B. For Spinoza, however, anything which follows in a person where that person is an “inadequate” or partial cause of the thing, is a passion, and anything that follows where a person is an “adequate” or total cause of the thing is an action. Thus Spinoza’s class of active affects places a strong emphasis on people’s roles as total causes of what they do; because it becomes for Spinoza ethically important that a person be active rather than passive, that emphasis raises a host of questions about the extent to which a person, a particular thing interacting constantly with other things and indeed requiring some of them for sustenance, can come to resist passion and guide himself by means of joy and the active desires.
Because joy and sadness as introduced at IIIp11s are passions, all of the desires arising from them or species of them are passive as well, that is, they are not desires which arise from a person’s striving alone but only as a partial cause in combination with other, ultimately external causes. Active joy, which must include at least some types of warranted self-esteem, and active desires, among which Spinoza lists at IIIp59s tenacity (animositas) and nobility (generositas), are wholly active however; that is, they are emotions and desires that people have only insofar as they are adequate causes, or genuine actors. (Notice that sadness cannot ever be an active emotion. People cannot, insofar as they are active bring it about that their power of acting is decreased, so passive sadness, unlike passive joy and desire, has no active counterpart.)
Of these active affects, the most important for an interpretation of Spinoza’s ethics and political philosophy is likely nobility. Spinoza’s predominant egoism, together with some of his still stronger statements of psychological egoism such as that at I Appendix, suggest that individuals are not, or are not often, altruistic. Moreover, his ethics, with its emphasis on self-esteem and self-knowledge appears in ways to be an individualistic one: the good, when I attain it, is a perfection of myself, not of society or the world. However, Spinoza does offer an argument (IVp37) for the view that any good that I want for myself I will have reason to want for others as well, and, in the Ethics, this argument forms the basis of morality and the state (IVp37s1 and s2, respectively). This is also a theme of the opening sections of the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect (see, especially, Spinoza (1), II/8 23-II/9 3). Nobility is the active affect most closely related to Spinoza’s views about morality and the state. As Spinoza defines it, it is a wholly active desire to join others in friendship and to aid them. It helps to supply, in Spinoza theory of the affects, a basis for the view that aiding others is virtuous and rational.
Further reading: Recent interpretations of Spinoza’s theory of consciousness include Miller 2007, Garrett 2008, Nadler 2008, LeBuffe 2010c, and Marshall 2014. For a discussion of Spinoza’s rejection of Cartesianism and of the theory of action that follows from his theory of ideas, see Della Rocca 2003. For discussions of Spinoza’s theory of affects in a comparative framework, see Voss 1981 and 1993, Hoffman 1991, and James 1997. For discussions of the relationship between striving and the affects, see these works and also Della Rocca 2008a, which is critical of Spinoza’s view, LeBuffe 2009, Davidson 1999, and Schrijvers 1999. Bennett 1990, Curley 1990, Della Rocca 1996, Garrett 1999, and Lin 2006 discuss Spinoza’s views on teleology. For a discussion of the connection between the affects and desire in 3p28, see LeBuffe 2010a, Chapters 5–7 and Della Rocca 2008b pp. 156–172. Voss 1981 and 1993 offers an interpretation and a history of Spinoza’s accounts of particular affects. Lloyd 1994 offers accounts of various particular affects. For discussions of self-esteem, see Rutherford 1999 and Carlisle 2017. For discussion of fear and wonder, see LeBuffe 2015 and 2018, Chapter Four. For accounts of imitation of affects, see Della Rocca 2008b, Chapter 4 and Shapiro 2017. For discussion of nobility, see Youpa 2020, Chapter 10.
Spinoza’s insistence that human beings not be treated as a dominion within a dominion includes a commitment to ethical naturalism also. Just as he insists that the human mind must be explicable in terms of the laws which govern nature, so he insists that ethical properties, which he sometimes characterizes as human “modes of thinking,” be explicable in terms of natural ones. The theory of the affects serves Spinoza’s ethical naturalism by introducing explanations of ethical concepts, most importantly the concepts of good, evil, and perfection, in psychological terms. In his ethics, Spinoza in some way “retains these words,” although he may be understood to do so under some formal refinement or revision of them (See IV Preface). So his discussions of good and evil and of human perfection in Part III provide the basis for the formal ethical argument which follows in Parts IV and V.
Before defining ‘good’ and ‘evil’ formally, Spinoza at IV Preface regards good and evil as labels, “modes of thinking,” that human beings apply to things but which really reveal little about the things to which they are applied:
As far as good and evil are concerned, they also indicate nothing positive in things, considered in themselves, nor are they anything other than modes of thinking, or notions we form because we compare things to one another. For one and the same thing can be good, and [evil], and also indifferent. For example, Music is good for one who is melancholy, [evil to] one who is mourning, and neither good nor [evil] to one who is deaf.
The phrase “nothing positive in things” means perhaps that an observer of people would find that ‘good’ and ‘evil’, as people use them are two place predicates rather than one place predicates. If Martha calls music evil, then, what that indicates to one who knows about the human use of these terms is that the music is evil to Martha. Moreover, since the same music can be good or evil for different people, or for people in different states, the two-place predication reveals more about Martha than about the music. It must be some fact about the person, rather than some fact about the thing called good or evil, that is of central importance to the understanding of the label.
IIIp9s suggests that the fact about the person which the label reveals is her conative state:
It is clear that we neither strive for, nor will, neither want, nor desire anything because we judge it to be good; on the contrary, we judge something to be good because we strive for it, will it, want it, and desire it.
Spinoza finds that the designation of a thing as good follows from a person’s conative state: Martha is averse to music and therefore she calls it evil. Should the music become good to another person, or perhaps Martha herself in different circumstances, it would not be because the music has changed, but because the person’s conative state is different: she desires the music. (This analysis of the good is similar to Hobbes’s at Leviathan VI. Maimonides, another of Spinoza’s influences, also has a similar analysis: Guide of the Perplexed, III, 13.)
IIIp39s builds upon IIIp9s. There Spinoza writes that, “each one, from his own affect, judges, or evaluates, what is good and what is [evil]…So the greedy man judges an abundance of money best, and poverty worst. The ambitious man desires nothing so much as esteem and dreads nothing so much as shame.” However, IIIp39s also uses Spinoza’s theory of the affects to introduce new definitions of good and evil:
By good here I understand every kind of joy, and whatever leads to it, and especially whatever satisfies any kind of longing, whatever that may be. And by evil, every kind of sadness and especially what frustrates longing.
IIIp28, the proposition establishing Spinoza’s doctrine that human beings desire whatever will bring joy and are averse to whatever will lead to sadness, allows Spinoza to connect the objects of any human desire with joy or the avoidance of sadness. So, if it is true that we call a thing good only if we desire it, then it will also be true that anything we call good will be joy or what leads to it. Understood in this way, IIIp39s simply restates the doctrine of IIIp9s in light of IIIp28.
However, Spinoza might be extending rather than merely restating his position at IIIp39s. Every kind of joy we experience is not presumably a result of conscious desire, and Spinoza allows at IIIP39s that these instances of joy (i.e., those which do not satisfy any kind of longing) are also good. On this view, not only is whatever Martha desires good for her, but, in addition, anything which she does not desire but which nonetheless might bring her joy will also be good. Perhaps, for example, Martha will take delight in a view that she never anticipated, a serendipitous good. IIIp39s, so understood, identifies the good and evil for a person with broader classes of things, and makes possible an analysis of good and evil in terms of something other than an individual person’s current desires. Because, in giving an account of the right way of living in Parts IV and V, Spinoza presumably urges people to desire and do things in a way different from what they desire and do already, this broadening of the application of the terms ‘good’ and ‘evil’ (to apply to things other than what people presently desire or are averse to) contributes to the plausibility of his ethical naturalism.
The meaning of ‘perfection’ (perfectio) in various passages of the Ethics is obscured by the fact that Spinoza uses the term both in what he takes to be its common meaning and also in a narrow, formal sense. In some passages, such as IV Preface, Spinoza treats perfection, like good and evil, to be a label that people apply to things, to be explained in terms of those people’s use of the label: people call a thing perfect which conforms to the model of the thing that they create for themselves. In other passages, however, Spinoza treats perfection as whatever is “positive” or “real” in a thing, a genuine property, and this concept forms part of his formal apparatus (IId6).
Both senses of the term occur in Spinoza’s analysis of human perfection. At IV Preface Spinoza invokes a concept of perfection based upon a model of human nature that we set before ourselves. And Spinoza describes perfection of the human mind in terms of its power of thinking, as we have already seen, at IIIp11 and its scholium: the mind’s power of thinking is its perfection; joy is an increase in that power or a passage to a greater perfection; and sadness is a decrease in that power or a passage to a lesser perfection.
Thus Spinoza has two different accounts of human perfection which might contribute to the perfectionist language of the ethical argument that he develops in various ways in Parts IV and V. Although the first account contributes to both Spinoza’s formal definitions of good and evil and also, probably, to the “free man” propositions of Part IV, it is perhaps the second account which is of greater importance. It, after all, resonates with Spinoza’s account of the good at IIIp39s, and so comes to form part of a consistent moral view: if the good is any form of joy (IIIp39s) and joy is the passage to a greater perfection (IIIp11s), then the good is whatever makes us more perfect. On the other hand, the first account might imply a different set of norms from IIIp39s: it seems that we may have different models of human nature that we set before ourselves, and that they may or may not include the various things that give us joy. Perhaps the formal account of perfection at IId6 and later at IIIp11 give Spinoza a means of reformulating the idea of perfection as a model of human nature in a way which reconciles the two senses of the term: the ideal we set before ourselves will be a person who possesses the greatest possible power of action. This would be, in effect, to correlate our systematically distorted ways of perceiving ourselves—as free agents pursuing as an end a model of human nature—with the causes that really determine our actions.
Of course, the question of what an outside observer may infer from another person’s use of moral language, for example that what a person finds good is something in which she anticipates pleasure or that makes her more powerful, is different from the questions of what a person using moral language takes that language to mean or what Spinoza takes moral language to mean. The analyses discussed here invite reductionist interpretations, on which, for example “good” just means pleasant, but the thesis that people consistently find pleasant things good is perfectly consistent with any number of different theses about what they mean by that designation and about what it really means to be good. Reconciling Spinoza’s psychological theses about moral language use in Part III of the Ethics with what appear to straightforward, richer and non-reductive theses about morality in Parts IV and V is one of the biggest challenges facing interpreters of Spinoza.
Further Reading: Curley 1988, Delahunty 1985, Garrett 1996, Yovel 1999, LeBuffe 2010a, Chapters 8 and 9, and Kisner 2010 offer accounts of Spinoza’s ethical language as it relates to his psychology. For a discussion of Spinoza’s views on perfection, see Garrett 1996, Allison 1987, Wolfson 1934, LeBuffe 2010c, and Carriero 2011.
Curley’s translation is used for the passages quoted here. Students of Spinoza in English should be especially attentive to the fact that different translators give widely different translations for Spinoza’s particular affects.
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