Spinoza's Theory of Attributes

First published Tue Feb 3, 2009; substantive revision Mon Mar 19, 2018

Attributes sit at the very heart of Spinoza’s metaphysics. They enable us to understand and talk about an extended world and a thinking world in terms of which we understand such things as bodies and minds. Furthermore, it is due to the relation of attributes to one another and to the infinite substance that an elegant resolution to the Cartesian mind–body problem is possible. Attributes furnish Spinoza’s substance with variety while preventing it from being an ephemeral, homogenous totality—an eleatic “one” of which nothing can be said or known. They constitute variety without dissolving the infinite substance into multiple substances.

Spinoza defines the term “attribute” in Definition 4 of Part One of the Ethics thus: “Per attributum intelligo id, quod intellectus de substantia percipit, tanquam ejusdem essentiam constituens.” That is, “By attribute I understand what the intellect perceives of substance as constituting its essence.”[1] Nonetheless, it is astonishing how little agreement there is among scholars as to some of the most basic features of Spinoza’s theory of attributes. For this reason, this article first considers the important places where Spinoza establishes fundamental characteristics of attributes: such as their definition, their real distinction, and their identification with the substance. It then explains the main issue on which interpretations diverge and signals in broad terms which interpretative avenues have been taken or are conceptually open (without delving too deeply into any one of them). In light of these very different interpretative avenues the article revisits some of the characteristics explained in the first part and considers how they are affected by the different kinds of interpretations. Finally, and perhaps most importantly, given the holistic and systematic nature of Spinoza’s metaphysics and the central role attributes play in it, the article points out how the different interpretative options on one issue bear on others (e.g. the number of attributes and the understanding of 2P7 and its scholium). The different ways of understanding Spinoza’s theory of attributes inevitably give rise to very different conceptions of Spinoza’s metaphysics as a whole.

1. Attributes in the Ethics

Before discussing the theory of attributes in the Ethics, it will be helpful to keep in mind a rudimentary sketch of the general structure of Spinoza’s ontology:[2]

Attributes/Substance: Thought ––– God ––– Extension
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Infinite Modes: Infinite Intellect        Motion and Rest
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Finite Modes: A Mind A Body

There is only an infinite substance (1P14), that is, there are no created substances. The infinite substance consists of infinite attributes (1D6). Every mode, be it finite or infinite, must be conceived through an attribute (1D5, 1P10Schol, 2P6 and 2P6Dem). Finally, what other philosophers consider to be “created substances,” such as my mind (as well as my body), are finite modes for Spinoza (1P11).[3]

1.1 What are Attributes?

Spinoza is not the first to furnish his metaphysics with attributes and in that he is following a very long tradition. He is, though, mostly influenced by Descartes, and in some ways is trying to keep with Descartes’ notion of “attribute.” It therefore will be useful to look back and get a sense of what Descartes had in mind and thus get a preliminary grasp (which will be revised) of what Spinoza means by “attribute.” Descartes states in the Principles of Philosophy that attributes are the essence of a thing, so the essence of mind is thought or thinking, and the essence of body is to be extended (Principles, I, §53, CSM, I, p. 210, AT 25). To see why this is so, it is worth revisiting the first and second Meditations, even if very briefly. Let us begin with body and Extension. To understand the essence of body, we can look to the famous wax example in Meditation Two (CSM, II, p. 20–21, AT 30–32). While sitting by the fireplace, Descartes inspects a piece of wax and asks himself what he knows of the wax. He begins by listing all the sensory properties of the wax: it is white, has a certain smell, makes a certain sound when one raps it with one’s finger, is hard, and has a certain taste. After listing all its sensory properties, he then places the piece of wax by the fire and sees how it loses all those properties: it changes color, smell, texture, taste, etc. Descartes concludes, among other things, that the essence of the wax, insofar as it is a body, is that it is extended in length, breadth, and depth since that is the only thing that remains constant about the wax. In this respect, the piece of wax is no different from any other body—that is, its essence is to be extended. Extension, then, according to Descartes, is the essence of body. In the Meditations we also, famously, come to recognize our own essence as thinking things. We realize this by recognizing that we cannot doubt that we are doubting while doubting. Furthermore, we realize that doubting in this sense is no different from understanding, affirming, denying, willing, unwilling, imagining, and having sense perceptions (seeming to see, etc.) (CSM, II, p. 19, AT 28). Descartes then reaches the conclusion that the essence of the mind is Thought. For these reasons, Descartes claims that Thought and Extension are the principal attributes of mind and body and that they are “really distinct”, that is, they exist independently one from the other.[4] It is important to note that for Descartes, any created substance has only one principal attribute, as opposed to God who has infinite attributes.

Spinoza adopts some aspects of the Cartesian set up while rejecting others. He agrees that Thought and Extension are attributes (2P1, 2P2) and are related to essences (1D4). He agrees they are “really distinct” from each other (1P10Schol).[5] Furthermore, he agrees that “mind” has to be conceived through Thought, and “body” through Extension. (2P5 and its demonstration make the case with regard to ideas and Thought; 2D1 establishes it for bodies and Extension. This is also made very clear in 3P2 and its demonstration.) However, he does not agree that they are attributes of created substances, since he rejects the possibility of created substances altogether (1P6Cor., 1P8Schol1, 1P14). One way to understand Spinoza is to see how he can hold both Thought and Extension (and other attributes, if there are others) to be divine attributes or attributes of one and the same (infinite) substance.[6]

1.2 Definition of Attribute

Spinoza defines the term “attribute” thus: By attribute I understand what the intellect perceives of substance as constituting its essence” (1D4). This definition is reminiscent of Descartes’ notion of attributes as it appears in the Principle of Philosophy insofar as attributes are related to the essence (or essences) of substance. However, as many have noticed, it is not clear from the definition alone what exactly Spinoza means. There are several, by now famous, ambiguities in the definition.[7] These, together with the different interpretative options, are discussed in Section 1.8.

1.3 Real Distinction

Spinoza makes a very important claim about attributes in the Scholium to Proposition 10 of Part One: “…although two attributes may be conceived to be really distinct (i.e., one may be conceived without the aid of the other), we still cannot infer from that that they constitute two beings, or two different substances.” Spinoza here is explaining something about the relationship among attributes—one may be conceived without the aid of the other—and about the relation of the attributes to the substance, namely, that conceiving attributes independently is not evidence of the existence of independent substances.

To understand why this scholium is so important, it is helpful to recall Descartes’ definition of a “real distinction.” In the Principles of Philosophy, Descartes says: “Strictly speaking, a real distinction exists only between two or more substances; and we can perceive that two substances are really distinct simply from the fact that we can clearly and distinctly understand one apart from the other” (Principles, I, §60, CSM, I, p. 213, AT 28). For Descartes, this anchors the strict epistemological and ontological separation between mind and body. One of the things we learn from going through the Meditations is that we are capable of clearly and distinctly perceiving ourselves without a body—the cogito in the Second Meditation, and we clearly and distinctly perceive body without thinking in the Fifth Meditation. (Of course, in retrospect, we realize that we already did this in a sense with the wax as well). Descartes thus concludes that mind and body are really distinct, that is, one can exist without the other.

One important implication of this distinction is that it allows for a fully mechanistic explanation of the physical world. To explain the interaction between two bodies requires alluding only to their physical properties (size, shape and motion) without the need to take recourse to any Aristotelian explanation involving final causes. Making room for mechanistic explanations, that is, for the New Science, was one of Descartes’ chief motivations for writing the Meditations. Spinoza preserves this aspect of Cartesian doctrine (cf. appendix to Part One of the Ethics and discussion in Section 1.3.1).

Having separated the mind so sharply from the body, Descartes is left with having to explain their evident unity. More specifically, he is burdened with trying to explain how two really distinct substances seem to interact causally. Their causal interaction seems problematic because, according to Descartes, each substance is independent; the infinite substance depends on nothing but itself (Principles, I, §51, CSM, I, p. 210, AT 24), while created substances depend on nothing but God for their existence (Principles, I, §52, CSM I, p. 210, AT 25). If distinct substances interact causally then they seem to depend on one another, and this would go against their nature qua substances. This is why the union of the mind and body is a thorny issue for Descartes, and was and continues to be a source of much debate (Cf. for example, Hoffman, 1986). For some, a version of this problem translates into Spinoza’s metaphysics (cf. Section 1.9.4). The issue of the nature of the “real distinction” for Spinoza is discussed in the subsequent section.

1.3.1 No Cross-Attribute Causation or Conception

For Descartes, then, there is the epistemological claim that perceiving Thought does not involve perceiving Extension and vice versa. Each is explanatorily independent from the other, (although not from God). Spinoza adopts this aspect of Cartesian philosophy and holds, as well, that there is what Della Rocca calls, “a conceptual barrier” between Thought and Extension as Spinoza states in the scholium “i.e., one may be conceived without the aid of the other” (Della Rocca, 1996, 9–17). Spinoza holds Thought and Extension to be explanatorily self-contained. Physical changes are to be understood in terms of other physical items, and ideas are to be understood in terms of other ideas. What is ruled out is what can be called “cross attribute explanations.” For example, explaining the movement of my hand by my desire to move my hand. According to Spinoza, the movement of my hand is to be explained purely physically by alluding to other bodies and their motions, while my desire is to be explained by other desires and ideas. Spinoza makes this very clear in 3P2, its demonstration and scholium:

3P2: The body cannot determine the mind to thinking, and the mind cannot determine the body to motion, to rest, or to anything else (if there is anything else).

Dem.: All modes of thinking have God for a cause, insofar as he is a thinking thing, and not insofar as he is explained by another attribute (by 2P6). So what determines the mind to thinking is a mode of thinking and not of extension, that is (by 2D1), it is not the body. This was the first thing.

Next, the motion and rest of a body must arise from another body…whatever arises in the body must have arisen from God insofar as he is considered to be affected by some mode of extension, and not insofar as he is considered to be affected by some mode of thinking (also 2P6), that is, it cannot arise from the mind, which (by 2P11) is a mode of thinking. This was the second point. Therefore, the body cannot determine the mind, and so on, q.e.d.

Although this is reminiscent of Descartes in some respects, there is, of course, one crucial difference. For Descartes the fact that one can conceive Thought distinctly from Extension is evidence for the existence of two substances—mind and body. For Spinoza, this is not the case, and this is the point he is making in this central proposition (1P10), namely, that although two attributes may be conceived independently—one without the other—this does not imply that there are two substances existing separately. For Spinoza there is only one substance with infinite attributes, and although each attribute is conceived independently from the other/s they still are, nonetheless, all attributes of one and the same substance. It is possible then to conceive, think, or completely explain the entire universe, or everything that exists, under each one of the attributes. That is, we can give a complete physical description of everything that exists, or alternatively explain, describe, or conceive everything as ideas or thought. Being able to explain the entire universe under the attribute of Extension is what allows Spinoza to preserve Descartes’ effort of providing room for progress in the New Science (Cf. Appendix to Part One).

Spinoza and Descartes agree about the epistemological separation between Thought and Extension, but not about the ontological one. Descartes calls the distinction between attributes of the same substance, and between a given attribute and its substance a “rational distinction,” (Principles, I, §62, CSM, I, p. 214, AT 30) and so, insofar as Thought and Extension belong to the same substance for Spinoza, they would be, in Descartes’ terminology, rationally distinct.[8] Spinoza however, says that they are “really distinct.” How exactly to understand the “reality” of the distinction among the attributes is a crucial interpretative matter and is discussed in Sections 1.8.1–1.8.2.

1.4 The Identification of Attributes with Substance

Another claim that has to be taken into account in an analysis of Spinoza’s view on attributes is that God is his attributes: 1P4: “Therefore, there is nothing outside the intellect through which a number of things can be distinguished from one another except substance, or what is the same (by 1D4), their attributes, and their affections” (italics added), 1P19: “God is eternal, or [sive] all God’s attributes are eternal,” 1P20Cor.: “It follows second, that God, or [sive] all of God’s attributes, are immutable.” Some might consider 1P29Schol to be making an identity claim as well: “But by Natura Naturata I understand whatever follows from the necessity of God’s nature, or [sive] from any of God’s attributes…” Spinoza in these places seems to be claiming that there is an identification of the substance with its attributes. However, this identification can be understood in several ways and in various degrees of strictness. How one reads this claim depends on other considerations discussed in Section 1.9.3.

1.5 Extension as a Divine Attribute

One of the important things that Spinoza does in the first two parts of the Ethics is to establish Extension as a divine attribute (elements of this view are evident already in KV I/25). Although Spinoza adopts many important aspects of Cartesian metaphysics, he collapses the divide between the infinite and created substances. This means that principal attributes that were at the “created substance” level in the Cartesian set-up are “moved up”, so to speak, to the infinite substance level for Spinoza. One of these attributes is, of course, Extension. Spinoza has to explain to a resistant audience how Extension can be considered a divine attribute.

The important steps that will allow Spinoza to claim that Extension can be an attribute of God are the following. He defines God as a substance consisting of infinite attributes (1D6).[9] He shows that substances cannot share attributes (1P5), that every substance is infinite (1D8), that a single substance can have several attributes (1P10schol), and that an infinite substance exists (1P11). With an eye towards specifically establishing Extension as a divine attribute, he claims in 1P12: “No attribute of a substance can be truly conceived from which it follows that the substance can be divided.” In 1P13, he states: “A substance which is absolutely infinite is indivisible,” and in the corollary, he makes the point especially clear with respect to Extension: “From these propositions it follows that no substance, and consequently no corporeal substance, insofar as it is a substance, is divisible.” In 1P14, he establishes that there is only one substance (or rather, that there are no created substances). Finally in 1P15 he claims: “Whatever is, is in God, and nothing can be or be conceived without God.” With this, the stage is set for Extension being a divine attribute or applicable to God, if in fact it is a genuine attribute (which is established only in Part Two).

Spinoza is aware that this will be received with great resistance. The possible objection he imagines is that since Extension is divisible by its very nature then, if Extension were an attribute of God, God would be divisible. God, of course, cannot be divisible, for then he would not be infinite. In the Scholium to 1P15 he shows the ensuing contradictions if one holds Extension to be by its very nature divisible. It is important for him to show that Extension cannot imply divisibility in answer to possible objectors holding traditional views. Moreover, he has just shown that there is only one substance, which is indivisible (1P12 and 1P13), and so whatever attributes it has, none of them can imply divisibility in the only substance. Spinoza then shows that if Extension is an attribute, it is applicable to God, and there is no danger of that implying any real division in the substance. One important result of this is that what appear to be individuated bodies cannot be really individuated in the Cartesian sense of implying real distinction and the existence of multiple substances. Rather, what appear to be individuated bodies are only modes of substance under the attribute of Extension.[10] Only in Part Two does Spinoza show that Extension (as well as Thought) are in fact attributes of God: “Thought is an attribute of God, or [sive] God is a thinking thing” (2P1) and “Extension is an attribute of God, or [sive] God is an extended thing” (2P2).

1.6 The 2P7 Doctrine

A very important characteristic regarding attributes is established in 2P7 and its scholium, which is sometimes referred to in the literature as the “parallelism doctrine.” However, as will be discussed in Section 1.9.2, this nomenclature is laden with a significant amount of interpretative bias and the term is nowhere to be found in the Ethics itself. It is thus advisable to stay clear of it and simply refer to it as “the 2P7 Doctrine.” 2P7 states: “The order and connection of ideas is the same as the order and connection of things,” (“ordo, & connexio idearum idem est, ac ordo & connexio rerum”). Spinoza explains this proposition in the scholium:

For example, a circle existing in Nature and the idea of the existing circle, which is also in God, are one and the same thing, which is explained through different attributes…Therefore, whether we conceive Nature under the attribute of extension, or under the attribute of thought, or under any attribute, we shall find one and the same order, or one and the same connection of causes, that is, that the same things follow one another.

Spinoza is claiming here that a mode X under the attribute of Thought is one and the same as mode X under Attributey. A good way to get some intuitive sense of this is to see how this works with respect to ourselves. Under the attribute of Thought, I am a finite mode—an idea or mind. Under the attribute of Extension, I am a finite mode, that is, a body. The claim in 2P7 and its scholium is that my mind (a mode of Thought) and my body (a mode of Extension) are one and the same. This is the case for all modes. Furthermore, whatever causal relation my body, say, bears to other modes of Extension, my mind will bear to the other modes of Thought. The understanding of this doctrine and its implications in more depth depends, probably more than any other doctrine, on how one construes other central elements of Spinoza’s theory of attributes (e.g. the number of attributes). In Section 1.9.2 different directions of interpretation are considered regarding 2P7 and its scholium.

1.7 The Two Known Attributes

Spinoza famously claims that we, human minds, only know two attributes—Thought and Extension. This can be seen as arising from the axioms in Part Two: 2A2: “Man thinks,” 2A4: “We feel a certain body is affected in many ways,” 2A5: “We neither feel nor perceive any singular things, except bodies and modes of thinking,” as well as 2P13: “The object of the idea constituting the human mind is the body, or [sive] a certain mode of extension which actually exists, and nothing else” [italics added] (this is true already in KV, 1/27). In Letter 64 Spinoza tries to explain why we can only perceive these two attributes, and he does so by referring back to 2P13 and claims in the letter: “Therefore, the mind’s power of understanding extends only as far as that which this idea of the body contains within itself, or which follows therefrom. Now this idea of the body involves and expresses no other attributes of God than extension and thought.” Although some have found this line of argumentation unsatisfying (e.g. Bennett, 1984, 78–79) it is worth noting that Spinoza here is relying on axioms.

1.8 Ambiguities and Interpretative Directions

The attempt to understand Spinoza’s doctrine regarding the attributes has traditionally led interpreters in two main directions, although others have been proposed (e.g. Lennon, 2005. 12–30; Shein, 2009).[11] The first is what is known as the “subjective” interpretation which follows Hegel, and is given its paradigmatic expression by Wolfson. More recently, Michael Della Rocca as been advocating a more idealistic interpretation of the attributes, which shares certain important features with the subjectivist camp. The other, which has become the standard, is the “objective” interpretation. These two principal avenues stem from some important ambiguities in the definition of “attribute”: “By attribute I understand what the intellect perceives of substance as constituting its essence” (1D4).[12] The first term that is ambiguous is “intellect,” since it can refer either to the finite intellect or the infinite one (cf. diagram in Section 1). The second important ambiguity lies in the Latin term tanquam, since it can mean either “as if, but not in fact,” or “as in fact.” The definition can therefore be read, either as stating that attributes are what the intellect perceives of substance as constituting its actual essence, or that attributes are what the intellect perceives only as if they are what constitute the essence but are not what in fact constitutes it or them. The subjectivists accordingly claim that attributes are what the finite intellect perceives of substance as if constituting its essence. The objectivists, by and large, instead claim that it is the infinite intellect that perceives the attribute as in fact constituting the essence of substance. In the following sections the different interpretative options are explained a grosso modo. The ways in which the different interpretative avenues affect other Spinozistic doctrines are discussed in Sections 1.9.1–1.9.4.

1.8.1 Subjective Interpretations

As is well known, Hegel, in various respects, considered himself to be modifying Spinoza’s doctrine (“to be a follower of Spinoza is the essential commencement of all philosophy”) and his interpretation of Spinoza was extremely influential.[13] In his Lectures on the History of Philosophy, Hegel says that what has utmost reality for Spinoza is the absolute (or the infinite substance) and that anything else (finite modes, in particular) are ways of negating this absolute. He goes on to explain that the understanding [or “intellect”] grasps the reality of substance through attributes, but “it is only reality in view of the understanding.” He stresses that understanding in terms of attributes is due to the nature of the understanding and not because of the nature of the absolute (or the infinite substance) as such. It is clear that he considers the understanding to be the understanding of finite minds, because he goes on to explain that Spinoza’s claim that there are “infinite attributes” has to be interpreted as “infinite in character” and not in number and that there are only the two attributes known to finite minds—Thought and Extension.

What is referred to in the literature as the subjectivist reading, following Hegel, holds that the intellect perceiving the attributes is the finite intellect and that the attributes are projections of the finite mind onto the infinite substance which it cannot fully comprehend. In other words, according to the subjectivist interpretation, the definition of attribute states that attributes are what the finite intellect perceives of substance as if (but not in fact) constituting its essence. In contrast, the objectivist reading takes the intellect in question to be the infinite one, and the tanquam to mean “as in fact,” and so it read the definition as claiming that attributes are what the infinite intellect perceives of substance as (in fact) constituting its essence. Wolfson summarizes the difference between the two positions thus:

According to the former interpretation [subjectivism], to be perceived by the mind means to be invented by the mind, for of themselves the attributes have no independent existence at all but are identical with the essence of the substance. According to the latter interpretation [objectivism], to be perceived by the mind means only to be discovered by the mind, for even of themselves the attributes have independent existence in the essence of substance (Wolfson, 1934, 146).

One of the motivations behind Wolfson’s view is that he considers Spinoza to be the last of the medieval Jewish rationalists, and in following with that tradition, Spinoza locates all multiplicity not in the infinite substance (God), but rather in the human mind. That is, the fact that God has multiple attributes is explained not by his having multiple essences, natures, or aspects, but rather because of the nature of the human mind. This is based on the conviction that God’s true nature is simple and any multiplicity is merely apparent but not real. It is because of the limitations of the finite mind that it attributes multiplicity to the infinite substance, when in reality the infinite substance is simple. In this view there is a gap between the attributes and the infinite substance. The infinite substance as it is in itself, so to speak, is unknowable to the finite mind. With respect to the “real distinction,” the distinction between the attributes in this view is grounded in the different ways the finite mind has of conceiving the infinite substance. That is, the distinction between the attributes is not based on the nature of the infinite substance itself, but it reveals, in a way, something about the nature of finite perception. It is in these terms that the “reality” of the distinction is to be understood, i.e., as if but not in fact. Objections to Subjectivism

Two main objections have been brought forth against the subjectivist interpretation. These are considered by most commentators to be forceful enough for rejecting subjectivism as a serious contender for a satisfying interpretation of Spinoza’s theory of attributes. The first objection to subjectivism is that, finite minds can never have true knowledge of God, but only knowledge “as if.” All knowledge is rendered illusory. The reason for this is quite clear. In the subjectivist interpretation the attributes are projections of the finite mind, therefore the finite mind can never come to know the infinite substance as it is in itself. This seems to contradict Spinoza’s claim that the finite mind can have adequate, that is, perfect knowledge of God’s essence (2P47). The second objection is that this interpretation seems irreconcilable with those places in the text where Spinoza identifies the attributes and God (cf. 1P4, 1P19 and 1P20Cor.). Again, as projections of the finite intellect, the attributes do not properly pertain to the substance, and therefore cannot be identical to it. For these reasons, among others, the subjective interpretation (understood in these terms) has fallen out of favor.[14] Michael Della Rocca, however, has been advocating more recently that attributes (and diversity more generally), are mind-dependent yet not illusory. Thus he aims to overcome some of the traditional objections to subjectivism (primarily “illusory knowledge” objections) while insisting on the mind-dependent status of attributes. He takes the mind-dependant nature of diversity (be it of attribute or modes) to be an inevitable consequence of Spinoza’s adoption of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (cf. Della Rocca, 2012).

1.8.2 Objective Interpretations

In light of these kinds of criticisms to the subjectivist interpretation, commentators have turned towards what are known as “objectivist” accounts. Although the details of these accounts are quite diverse, there are a few key elements they share—all related to the fact that they do not wish to be subjectivist. The first of these characteristics is that they hold that knowledge in the system cannot be illusory. That is, knowledge through attributes must yield true, or adequate, knowledge. One way to do this is to claim that it is the infinite intellect that perceives the attributes, and so knowledge through attributes is the kind of knowledge the infinite intellect has, and therefore is not illusory (e.g. Bennett, 1984, 147; Delahunty, 1985, 116; Della Rocca 1996, 157; Haserot, 1972, 32–35). Therefore, the tanquam in the definition is to be read “as in fact” and not “as if.”

As opposed to subjectivism, which does not emphasize the “reality” of the distinction between the attributes, or rather, does not ground the distinction in the nature of the infinite substance, objectivist interpretations place ontological weight on the “real distinction” between the attributes. In other words, for the multiplicity to have a certain reality and not be illusory, it must somehow be grounded not in the perceiver but in the thing perceived, namely, the infinite substance. The danger of this kind of interpretation is that if the distinction is stressed too strongly, the unity of the substance is lost. If the infinite substance has “really distinct” attributes, and this distinction is grounded in, say, distinct natures or essences of the infinite substance, then there has to be an explanation of how a multiplicity of natures or essences can be united to form one substance. (This issue is addressed in further detail in Section 1.9.4 as it emerges in the discussion of the nature of the union of mind and body).

Any interpretation of Spinoza must characterize the relation between any given attribute and the substance. As mentioned, in the subjectivist account there is a problematic gap between the substance and any given attribute. The alternative is to deny this gap. For example, Bennett claims the following:

I think that here [Ep. 9] he is saying that substance differs from attribute only by the difference between a substance and an adjectival presentation of the very same content. If we look for how that which is extended (substance) differs from extension (attribute), we find that it consists only in the notion of that which has… extension or thought or whatever; and that, Spinoza thinks, adds nothing to the conceptual content of extension, but merely marks something about how the content is logically structured. As I did in §12.7, he is rejecting the view that a property bearer is an item whose nature qualifies it to have properties, in favour of the view that the notion of a property bearer, of a thing which…, is a bit of formal apparatus, something which organizes conceptual content without adding to it. According to this view, there is an emptiness about the difference between substance and attribute (Bennett, 1984, 62–63).

Although Bennett claims there is an emptiness about the distinction between the two, he does not consider it an absolute identity either. He finds an identity claim to be irreconcilable with the claim that attributes are really distinct. Della Rocca has suggested intentionality as a way of denying the gap and treats “… is extended” and “… is thinking” as referentially opaque. In other words, what is being picked out by the infinite intellect in either instance is the same, but the way in which it is picked out is different. Yet another way of denying the gap is to claim, along with Descartes, that the distinction between an attribute and the substance is only a rational distinction. That is, in reality there is no distinction, but in the finite mind we can separate, contra natura, the attribute from the substance. Or in other words, the finite mind can abstract the attribute from the substance, but in reality they are not separated. This type of view must be supplemented by an account, then, of what is meant by the “real distinction” among the attributes.

1.9 Implications of the Various Readings on Other Spinozistic Doctrines

1.9.1 Number of Attributes

Although Spinoza claims that there are infinite attributes, a question arises as to how many there are, because “infinity” may not necessarily refer to numeric infinity.[15] Bennett, among others, has made the case that infinity in early modern philosophy means totality (Bennett, 1984, 75–79). Spinoza’s claims, then, that the infinite substance has infinite attributes can be understood as the claim that the infinite substance has all the attributes there are to be had.[16] This is consistent with there being, say, only the two known attributes. There are sections in the text, on the other hand, that seem to suggest that infinity means a numerical infinity, and thus the infinite substance has as attributes Thought and Extension, as well as infinitely many other unknown attributes. The places used as evidence for those wishing to claim there are more than two attributes are the following:

1D6: By God I understand a being absolutely infinite, that is, a substance consisting of an infinity of attributes, of which each one expresses an eternal and infinite essence.

Exp.: I say absolutely infinite, not infinite in its own kind; for if something is only infinite in its own kind, we can deny infinite attributes of it; but if something is absolutely infinite, whatever expresses essence and involves no negation pertains to its essence.

2P7Schol: Therefore whether we conceive Nature under the attribute of Extension, or the attribute of Thought, or any other attribute, we shall find one and the same order, or one and the same connection of causes, that is the same things follow one another.

Letter 56: To your [Hugo Boxel] question as to whether I have as clear an idea of God as of a triangle, I reply in the affirmative. But if you ask me whether I have as clear a mental image of God as of a triangle, I reply in the negative. We cannot imagine God, but we can apprehend him by the intellect. Here it should also be observed that I do not claim to have complete knowledge of God, but that I do understand some of his attributes—not indeed all of them, or the greater part—and it is certain that my ignorance of very many attributes does not prevent me from having knowledge of some of them. When I was studying Euclid’s Elements, I understood early on that the three angles of a triangle are equal to two right angles, and I clearly perceived this property of a triangle although I was ignorant of many others.

This issue can be linked to the previous discussion regarding the ambiguities in the definition of attribute, although this is not always done. If one holds that it is the infinite intellect that is doing the relevant perceiving, there seems to be no reason to limit the number of attributes it perceives. Conversely, it might be claimed that if the infinite intellect perceives only two attributes, there must be a sufficient reason why there are only two, and why they are Thought and Extension and not other attributes. If, on the other hand, one holds that it is the finite intellect that conceives the attributes, and it only conceives Thought and Extension, then these are the only two attributes there are. In the literature, however, this line of reasoning is not always followed, and examples can be found of interpreters who hold that it is the infinite intellect that does the perceiving, but that there need not be more than two attributes (Bennett, 1984, 75–76). At the same time, there are interpreters who claim it is the finite intellect that perceives the attributes while there are infinitely many attributes (Wolfson, 1934, 226). How many attributes there are affects how one reads another central doctrine in Spinoza’s metaphysics, such as 2P7 and 2P7Schol, to which we turn next.

1.9.2 The Metaphysical Structure of 2P7 and its Scholium

A crucial role in Spinoza’s system is played by 2P7 and its scholium, since they lay the ground for solving, or rather dissolving, the mind–body problem. Therefore, the understanding of the nature of the union of mind and body depends on one’s interpretation of Spinoza’s theory of attributes and 2P7 and its scholium in particular. (For a discussion of the issues regarding the union of Mind and Body, see Section 1.9.4). The interpretation of the metaphysical structure of what is expressed in 2P7 and its scholium is affected greatly by the number of attributes one believes there are in Spinoza’s system and how one understands the relation between the attributes and the substance. The general description of 2P7 and its scholium is discussed above in Section 1.6.

2P7 and its scholium can be understood in very different ways. In what follows three types of interpretive directions are described. This is not meant to be exhaustive by any means, but it will provide a sense of the kinds of options that have been offered by commentators. Let us begin with the simplest option first. If one holds that there are only two attributes, Thought and Extension, the metaphysical structure of 2P7 and its scholium is quite straightforward. Every mode under the attribute of Thought is associated with a mode in Extension, and vice versa and the relations between modes in one attribute are mirrored in the other. Those that hold this kind of view must, of course, provide a convincing argument to the effect that there are only two attributes.

However, if one takes there to be more than two attributes, the structure gets quite a bit more complex. One option that has been advanced is that Thought is a special attribute and encompasses ideas of all the modes in all the other attributes (Cf. for example Curley, 1969, 146; and more recently, Melamed, 2009, Chapters 1–2). Thought turns out to be “special” in this kind of interpretation because there are many more modes (ideas) or facets of modes in Thought than there are under any other attribute. Another way of expressing this is by saying that 2P7 is not a biconditional. The requirement of an associated mode goes only in one direction from any mode in any attribute to a mode in Thought. The burden on this type of view is that it must account for the favoring of Thought over the other attributes, and perhaps also for the relation between all the non-Thought modes in the other attributes.

Another option (or class of options) that is available is to claim that attributes come in pairs: an object-like attribute coupled with a thought-like attribute (Curley entertains this option as well; Curley, 1969, 146). Under this type of interpretation we would get Thought and Extension following the structure of the first alternative, that is, each idea in Thought is associated with (one and the same) a mode in Extension. Taking there to be more than just two attributes, we also get Thoughtx coupled with Extensionx in which each ideax is one and the same as bodyx under Extensionx, and Thoughty coupled with Extensiony, and so on. Letter 66 provides some support for this view. This kind of account has to be supplemented, of course, with an account of the relations among these Thought-like / Extension-like pairs of attributes.

1.9.3 The Nature of the Identification of Substance and the Attributes

As mentioned earlier, Spinoza identifies God, or the infinite substance with the attributes (1P4, 1P19 and 1P20Cor.). The nature of this identification is also affected by one’s interpretative stance regarding the attributes. The traditional subjectivist view, since it claims that the attributes are a projection of the finite mind onto the substance, cannot hold this identification to be strict. Objectivist views, which stress the distinctness of attributes, also cannot accept these claims literally (E.g., Bennett, 1984, 64; Curley, 1988, 13; Gueroult, 1968, 50). The reason for this is as follows: if the substance is strictly identical to any one of its attributes, then attributes will be identical to each other (by transitivity), and therefore no longer distinct, as Spinoza claims. Different objectivist interpretations address this issue differently. Curley, for example, holds that the identity is not one that holds between any given attribute and the substance, but rather between the totality of the attributes and the substance (Curley, 1988, 30). Bennett, on the other hand, believes Spinoza is simply overstating the case (Bennett, 1984, 64).

This identity can be understood strictly if the distinction between the attributes and the substance is taken to be only rationally distinct, that is identical in reality, and at the same time taking the distinction between attributes to be only epistemological and not ontological.

1.9.4 The Nature of the Union of Mind and Body

Another doctrine that is heavily affected by how one understands the attributes is the union of mind and body. For Descartes, the issue was how to unite two really distinct created substances—uniting minds with bodies. Descartes’ reply is that God unites these two substances, and we have tools by which to recognize that we are united in this way, i.e., sensory experience (Meditation Six). Spinoza, of course, cannot allude to God as creator to unite minds and bodies, since what is being united are not created substances but finite modes. The possible problem can be articulated as follows: How can Spinoza claim, on the one hand, that there are modes of really distinct attributes, e.g., my mind and my body, and therefore there is a real distinction between my mind and my body, and, on the other, claim in the Scholium to 2P7 that my mind and body are one and the same?

This problem which arises for the objectivist interpretations has been addressed in a variety of ways. It is worth noting that this problem does not arise for subjectivist views. This possible tension in Spinoza does not present itself for the subjectivists, since they do not claim that the “real distinction” between the attributes has ontological weight. That is, there are no two things that have to be united. Commentators wishing to stress the “distinctness” of the attributes find themselves having to explain the sense in which Spinoza can mean that the mind and the body are “one and the same.” A common strategy among commentators has been to appeal to a structure that is attribute-neutral in order to account for the unity. To better understand this issue it is useful to consider a few examples.

One important example is Bennett, who claims that the unity is to be understood as a unity of properties, but not of the modes themselves:

…his [Spinoza’s] thesis about the identity of physical and mental particulars is really about the identity of properties. He cannot be saying that physical P1=mental M1; that is impossible because they belong to different attributes. His thesis is rather that if P1 is systematically linked with M1, then P1 is extension—and—F for some differentia F such that M1 is thought—and—F. What it takes for an extended world to contain my body is exactly what it takes for a thinking world to contain my mind (Bennett, 1984, 141)

That is, Bennett thinks that there is some trans-attribute feature (what he calls “differentia F”) such that it can be added to Extension to get extended-F, and added it to Thought to get thinking-F. Bennett admits that nothing like this is found anywhere in the text, but he believes that this way we can make sense of Spinoza’s holding that the attributes are “really distinct” from each other and, at the same time, that thinking-F and extended-F are one and the same.

Della Rocca, while holding a view different from that of Bennett regarding Spinoza’s theory of attributes, also finds himself having to account in some way for the unity of mind and body, and so he suggests that modes are said to be numerically identical when they share all of their neutral properties, where “neutral properties” are those properties which do not involve being thought under any particular attributes. This is contrasted with “intentional properties” which are attribute-dependent such as “being of a certain volume.” As an example of a neutral property, Della Rocca offers “having five immediate effects.” He then claims that if modes share all of their neutral properties, they are identical (that is, one and the same). Therefore, since my mind and my body share all of their neutral properties, they are identical (Della Rocca, 1996, 133–38).

The final example that shall be considered is Gueroult’s interpretation. Gueroult, in order to account for the professed identity between modes of different attributes in 2P7 and its scholium, considers 1P28 which states:

Every singular thing, or any thing which is finite and has a determinate existence, can neither exist nor be determined to produce an effect unless it is determined to exist and produce an effect by another cause, which is also finite and has a determinate existence; and again, this cause also can neither exist nor be determined to produce an effect unless it is determined to exist and produce an effect by another, which is also finite and has a determinate existence, and so on, to infinity.

To explain this proposition, Gueroult draws a distinction between “modes of substance” and “modes of attributes.” The claim is that 1P28 treats only modes of substance and not attributes, and is therefore unique. In other words, the identity is then understood in reference to “modes of substance” and not “modes of attributes” (Gueroult, 1968, 338–39). Again, we see an attribute-independent structure—the chain of modes of substance—that is meant to account for the “one and the sameness” of modes of different attributes.

It has been pointed out, however, that this type of solution is not without serious problems (Shein, 2009). Briefly, the issue is as follows: The main reason for rejecting the subjectivist view is that in that type of interpretation, God, as he is in himself, remains unknowable, and this conflicts with Spinoza’s view that adequate knowledge is possible. However, as Spinoza makes clear in 1P10Schol, nature must be conceived under attributes. In light of this, an attribute-independent structure, by its very nature as “attribute-independent,” is unknowable as well. Therefore, in this view, knowledge of the union or the nature of the identity between mind and body, is in principle unknowable, and, in that respect, does not provide any advantage over subjectivist views.

An alternative mentioned above that has been suggested is to deny the gap between the attributes and the substance by claiming that, along with Descartes, Spinoza holds there to be a rational distinction between them, that is, in reality they are identical (Shein, 2009). This avoids the kind of problems that are raised for the subjectivist view, since, in this interpretation to know the attributes is to know the substance. Since in this view the attributes are only rationally distinct from the substance, the “real distinction” between the attributes, that Spinoza states in 1P10Schol, is understood as being only an epistemological claim, as he states in the text—“i.e., one may be conceived without the other” (1P10Schol). That is, it does not carry additional ontological weight as the objectivists hold. This avoids having to impose onto the Spinozistic system an attribute-independent structure to account for the unity which does not seem to fit with his epistemology.

2. Attributes in the Short Treatise

In the Short Treatise Spinoza develops ideas that will come to a full articulation later on in the Ethics, such as the idea that, strictly speaking, there are only two attributes through which we can properly come to have knowledge of God—Thought and Extension. However, unlike in the Ethics, he does not simply dismiss the more traditional attributes such as omnipotence, eternality, immutability, and infinity. To maintain some sense of these traditional divine attributes, Spinoza explains that they are not attributes strictly speaking, but rather propria of God. This is stated first clearly in the first footnote to Chapter III (“How God is the Cause of All Things”):

The following are called Propria because they are nothing but Adjectives which cannot be understood without their Substantives. I.e., without them God would indeed not be God; but still, he is not God through them, for they do not make known anything substantial, and it is only through what is substantial that God exists.

Spinoza then, is distinguishing between that which gives us knowledge of God, or better yet, through which God can be known—Thought and Extension—and things that can be said of God, that is, adjectival, but give us no knowledge—what he terms propria. This is explained most explicitly in Chapter VII of the Short Treatise. The difference Spinoza wishes to draw between these is that although these traditional divine attributes can be said of God, they do not teach us anything about what God is really like. An analysis of these traditional attributes (propria) shows them either to be said of God when considering all of the attributes or to be only modes of attributes. For example, Spinoza claims that when statements such as that “God is one,” “eternal” and “immutable” are said of God, they are said “in consideration of all his attributes.” On the other hand, something like “omniscience” is only a mode of an attribute, since it is only said of God when he is conceived through, or considered under, the attribute of Thought. That is, only when God is thought of as a thinking thing, can he be said to be omniscient. Similarly, when God is said to be “omnipresent,” it is only when he is conceived of through Extension. In the Ethics though, Spinoza does away with the talk of propria and does not accord them really any status as such.

3. Conclusion

With the collapse of the divide between created substances and the infinite substance, attributes play a new role for Spinoza; traditional divine attributes are eliminated while attributes traditionally associated with created substances (Extension in particular) are attributed to the infinite substance. Furthermore, with the elimination of this divide and the establishment of the infinite substance as the only substance, Spinoza hopes that attributes account for variety in the substance without jeopardizing its unity. All interpreters and readers of Spinoza are forced to wrestle with making sense of this double role since it sits at the very core of his metaphysics. It is vital to realize that this endeavor is necessarily and beautifully linked to other fundamental aspects of Spinoza’s metaphysics such as the “real distinction” between the attributes, the proclaimed identity of the substance and its attributes, the nature of the conceiving intellect in the definition of ‘attribute’, the nature of this intellect’s conceptions (illusory or not), the number of attributes, the structure of 2P7 and its scholium, and finally the nature of the union of mind and body. These inter-connections are a reflection of the fully systematic nature of Spinoza’s metaphysics.


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Noa Shein <sheinn@bgu.ac.il>

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