Structuralism in the Philosophy of Mathematics

First published Mon Nov 18, 2019

Two related slogans for structuralism in the philosophy of mathematics are that “mathematics is the general study of structures” and that, in pursuing such study, we can “abstract away from the nature of objects instantiating those structures”. (As such, structuralism stands in contrast with several other general views about mathematics, including: the traditional view that mathematics is the science of number and quantity; the view that it is an empty formalism used primarily for calculation; and the view that it is the study of a basic set-theoretic universe.) As the present survey aims to show, these slogans, while suggestive, are ambiguous and in need of clarification. Indeed, they have been interpreted in various different, even conflicting ways.

The introduction of structuralist views in the philosophy of mathematics is often assumed to have happened in the 1960s, in works by Paul Benacerraf and Hilary Putnam; the trend picked up steam in the 1980s–90s, when Michael Resnik, Stuart Shapiro, Geoffrey Hellman, Charles Parsons, and others entered the fray; and these debates have been reshaped again during the last 20 years, by several philosophical challenges to structuralism and by the introduction of further variants, including category-theoretic forms of structuralism. Besides introducing the reader to the general topic of “structuralism in the philosophy of mathematics”, a second main goal of the present essay will be to provide a novel, broader, and relatively comprehensive taxonomy for the varieties of structuralism on offer today.

1. Eliminative vs. Non-Eliminative Structuralism

1.1 Beginnings of the Structuralism Debate in the 1960s

The discussion of structuralism, as a major position in English-speaking philosophy of mathematics, is usually taken to have started in the 1960s. A central article in this connection was Paul Benacerraf’s “What Numbers Could Not Be” (1965; cf. also Benacerraf 1996, a later follow-up). The background and foil for this article was the position, dominant at the time, that axiomatic set theory provides the foundation for modern mathematics, including allowing us to identify all mathematical objects with sets. For example, the natural numbers 0, 1, 2, … can be identified with the finite von Neumann ordinals (starting with \(\emptyset\) for 0 and using the successor function \(f: x \rightarrow x\cup \{x\})\); similarly, the real numbers can be identified with Dedekind cuts constructed set-theoretically. Arithmetic truths are then truths about these set-theoretic objects; and this generalizes to other mathematical theories, all of whose objects are taken to be sets as well.

According to Benacerraf, such a set-theoretic foundationalist position misrepresents the structuralist character of arithmetic in particular and of mathematics more generally. To begin with, instead of working with the finite von Neumann ordinals, we can equally well work with the finite Zermelo ordinals (starting again with \(\emptyset\) for 0 but using the alternative successor function \(f: x \rightarrow \{x\})\); and there are infinitely many other choices that are equivalent. Similarly, instead of working with a set-theoretic construction of the real numbers in terms of Dedekind cuts, we can work with a construction based on equivalence classes of Cauchy sequences on the rational numbers as suggested by Cantor and others. This basic observation is hard to deny, and even set-theorist foundationalists can agree with it (more on that below). But Benacerraf draws some further, more controversial conclusions from this basic observation.

Benacerraf argues, in particular, that the natural numbers should not be identified with any set-theoretic objects; in fact, they should not be taken to be objects at all. Instead, numbers should be treated as “positions in structures”, e.g., in “the natural number structure”, “the real number structure”, etc. All that matters about such positions are their structural properties, i.e., those “stem[ming] from the relations they bear to one another in virtue of being arranged in a progression” (1965: 70), as opposed to further set-theoretic properties of the von Neumann ordinals, Dedekind cuts, etc. What we study and try to characterize in modern mathematics, along such lines, are the corresponding “abstract structures”. It is in this sense that Benacerraf suggests a structuralist position concerning mathematics. The details of the position are left open and somewhat vague, however, including how we should think about Benacerraf’s abstract structures in the end, except that they are not to be identified with set-theoretic relational systems (consisting of sets as domains, with set-theoretic relations and functions defined on them).

A second article from the 1960s that was influential in the rise of structuralism is Hilary Putnam’s “Mathematics without Foundations” (1967). Like in Benacerraf’s case, for Putnam the foil was a set-theoretic foundationalist position. This position is sometimes, although not always, understood in a realist sense (e.g., by Gödel), i.e., as the description of an independent realm of abstract objects, namely the universe of sets characterized by the Zermelo-Fraenkel axioms. In opposition to that position, Putnam suggests a form of “if-then-ism” (which can be traced back to Russell). That alternative can again be illustrated in terms of the natural numbers. How should an arithmetic theorem, say “\(2+3=5\)”, be understood now? It should be analyzed as having this form:

For all relational systems M, if M is a model of the Dedekind-Peano axioms [the basic axioms for arithmetic], then \[2_M +3_M =5_M\]

(where \(2_M\), \(3_M\), and \(5_M\) are what “play the roles” of 2, 3, and 5 in the model M). Similarly for the real numbers (see Reck & Price 2000 for details).

Instead of talking about if-then-ism in this connection, one can describe Putnam’s position also as a kind of “universalist structuralism” (see again Reck & Price 2000), since it involves universal quantification over relevant systems and since our two structuralist slogans above seem satisfied. Often an objection to this position is the “non-vacuity problem”. It is based on the observation that if-then statements of the given form are vacuously true if there is nothing that satisfies the antecedent, e.g., if there is no model of the Dedekind-Peano axioms. (As this would also be the case for, say, “\(2+3=6\)”, the overall result is clearly not desirable.) In response, one can invoke axiomatic set theory as providing the needed models. But from Putnam’s point of view this has two drawbacks: First, it relies on a realist and foundationalist view about set theory, it would seem, thus undermining the thrust of if-then-ism. Second and more basically, it forces us to treat set theory differently from other mathematical theories, on pain of circularity. As a way out of these dilemmas, Putnam suggests to employ modal logic. However, the details are again left open and largely unexplored, especially for the case of set theory.

1.2 Consolidation and Further Discussions in the 1980s

One way to understand Benacerraf’s discussion in his 1965 article is that he proposes to treat the natural number structure as a new kind of abstract entity, different from set-theoretic objects and systems of objects. All depends then on what exactly that amounts to, including whether one should treat such structures as objects themselves, thus reifying them in some substantive and still to be worked out way, or not. Benacerraf himself was reluctant to do the latter, in line with his overall hesitancy to talk about mathematical objects.

One subsequent writer who picked up on Benacerraf’s ideas in the early 1980s and tried to spell them out further, while still refraining from treating structures as full-fledged objects, is Michael Resnik (cf. Resnik 1981, 1982, 1988, and, most systematically, 1997). For him too, modern mathematics involves a “structuralist perspective”. This includes a kind of pattern recognition; and one of Resnik’s main goals is to spell out the corresponding epistemology further. Along Benacerraf’s lines, mathematical objects are viewed as “positions” in corresponding patterns; and this is meant to allow us to take mathematical statements “at face value”, in the sense of seeing ‘0’, ‘1’, ‘2’, etc. as singular terms referring to such positions. At the same time, doing so is not supposed to require reifying the underlying structures, which would mean specifying precise criteria of identity for them, something Resnik avoids intentionally. (He presents himself as a Quinean on this point, in the sense of adopting Quine’s slogan: “No entity without identity!”)

Stewart Shapiro is a second philosopher of mathematics who, in the early 1980s, attempts to build on Benacerraf’s paper (see Shapiro 1983, 1989, and most systematically, Shapiro 1997). By focusing more on metaphysical questions and leaving behind hesitations about structures as objects, Shapiro’s goal is to defend a more thoroughly realist version of mathematical structuralism, thus rejecting nominalist and constructivist views (more on that below). Such realism includes the semantic aspect mentioned above (taking mathematical statements at face value); but Shapiro also wants to clarify the talk about “positions in structures” further. He distinguishes two perspectives on them. According to the first, the positions at issue are treated as “offices”, i.e., as slots that can be filled or occupied by various objects (e.g., the position “0” in the natural number structure is occupied by \(\emptyset\) in the series of finite von Neumann ordinals). According to the second perspective, the positions are treated as “objects” themselves; and so are the abstract structures.

For Shapiro, the structures at issue thus have a dual nature: they are “universals”, in the sense that the natural number structure, say, can be instantiated by various relational systems (the system consisting of the finite von Neumann ordinals, or of the Zermelo ordinals, etc.); but they are also “particulars”, to be named by singular terms and treated as objects themselves. To defend the latter further, Shapiro develops a general structure theory, i.e., an axiomatic theory that specifies which structures exist. While modeled on set theory, this theory is justified independently (more on how below). As such, it is meant to underwrite “ante rem structuralism”. Shapiro’s terminology of “ante rem versus in re” involves an explicit reference to Medieval discussions of universals. The crucial point in our context is that the structures specified in his theory are meant to be ontologically independent of, indeed prior to, any instantiations of them. In other words, the structures do not just exist in their instantiations, but separate to and before them.

While Resnik’s and Shapiro’s structuralist positions are sometimes identified, this is somewhat misleading given the differences already mentioned. Nevertheless, there is significant overlap. Both recognize mathematical structures as certain patterns with positions in them etc. (whether these patterns are then treated as full-fledged objects, in a realist sense, or not). And for both Resnik and Shapiro, the notion of isomorphism is crucial (or some related, more general notion of equivalence; see Resnik 1997 and Shapiro 1997). That is to say, for both a relevant structure/pattern can be instantiated by any of a relevant class of isomorphic relational systems. This corresponds to the fact that the axiomatic systems at issue, for the natural numbers, the real numbers, and similar cases, are all categorical (or quasi-categorical in the case of set theory). Not every mathematical axiom system has that feature, of course, e.g., the axiom systems for group or ring theory allow for non-isomorphic instances or models. For Resnik as well as Shapiro, such “algebraic” theories are to be treated in a different, more derivative way; their structuralist point of view is meant to apply primarily to “non-algebraic” theories, paradigmatically arithmetic.

There is another structuralist position from the 1980s that is quite different and explicitly not realist, namely that introduced by Geoffrey Hellman (cf. Hellman 1989, 1996, and later articles). While for Resnik and Shapiro the inspiration was Benacerraf’s 1965 article, the starting point for Hellman is Putnam’s 1967 article. In fact, Hellman’s “modal structuralism” is meant to be a systematic development of Putnam’s modalized if-then-ism. The modal aspect is now spelled out in detail and with real ingenuity, including for the case of set theory (building on work by Zermelo etc.). For Hellman, a sentence such as “\(2+3 = 5\)” is analyzed as follows:

Necessarily, for all relational systems M, if M is a model of the Dedekind-Peano axioms, then \(2_M +3_M =5_M\).

To avoid the non-vacuity problem, he adds the following assumption:

Possibly, there exists an M such that M is a model of the Dedekind-Peano axioms.

(We will come back to its justification below.)

As Hellman makes clear, his goal is to develop a form of “structuralism without structures” (Hellman 1996), since the existence of abstract structures, postulated by Resnik and Shapiro, is replaced by the modal aspects of his position (and corresponding assumptions about necessity and possibility). In fact, Hellman’s position is meant to be a form of nominalism, i.e., to eliminate the appeal to any kind of abstract entity (not only abstract structures but also sets etc.). Yet it is also not meant to rely on possibilia, i.e., possible objects existing in some shadowy sense. This leads Hellman to a specific understanding of the modalities at issue. They are meant to be basic, i.e., the relevant possibilities and necessities are not reducible to anything further. On the other hand, they are specified precisely in terms of laws of modal logic (those of the system S5).

1.3 Towards a First Taxonomy of Structuralist Positions

From the late 1980s on, Shapiro’s and Hellman’s positions have often been treated as the two main structuralist options. (This is still reflected in Hellman & Shapiro 2019.) As they are quite different, this already indicates that it is wrong to see “structuralism in the philosophy of mathematics” as a unique position or a unified perspective, even though certain general slogans are shared. Beyond that, other versions of structuralism started to play a role in the late 1980s and early 1990s (including forms of “set-theoretic structuralism” that go back further in time than the 1960s, as we will see). Consequently, the discussions about structuralism have become both richer and more complex.

To clarify this situation, Charles Parsons suggested a first taxonomy, or at least a distinction between two main kinds of positions (Parsons 1990). Namely, there are “eliminative” forms of structuralism, as illustrated paradigmatically by Hellman; and there are “non-eliminative” forms of structuralism, like Shapiro’s. (The elimination at issue concerns the postulation, or avoidance thereof, of structures as abstract objects.) Or put in Hellman’s slightly later terminology, there is “structuralism without structures”, on the one hand, and “structuralism with structures”, on the other hand. Besides Shapiro and Resnik (with the qualifications above), another proponent of the non-eliminative form is Parsons himself (see Parsons 1990, 2004, and, most systematically, 2008); and another proponent of the eliminative form of structuralism is Charles Chihara (cf. Chihara 2004).

Nevertheless, it seems to have been tempting, and has remained fairly widespread in the literature, to identify non-eliminative structuralism with Shapiro’s position, i.e., with his realist and ante rem version. In fact, critics sometimes dismiss “philosophical structuralism” generally as a misguided form of metaphysics, thereby identifying such structuralism with Shapiro’s realist form. (This seems especially tempting for mathematicians and for philosophers rooted deeply in mathematical practice; cf. Awodey 1996 and Carter 2008 for related discussions.) A further consideration of Parsons’ form of non-eliminative structuralism can help to show that this is too quick and inadequate in the end.

Unlike Shapiro, Parsons does not offer a novel, philosophically motivated structure theory as the backing for his position. For him, we should remain closer to mathematical practice (as it developed in the late nineteenth and the twentieth centuries). In fact, structuralism should be seen as growing out of that practice, rather than being imposed on it from outside. For Parsons this means, among others, taking abstract structures to be introduced directly by categorical axiom systems, a practice he spells out further in a “meta-linguistic” way inspired by Quine (see Parsons 2008). It also means that we should refrain from “cross-structural identifications” (as they can be found in Shapiro’s early works), e.g., from identifying the natural number 1 and the real number 1. Such putative identities should be left indeterminate, as is done in mathematical practice.

As should be evident, Parsons’ structuralist position, like Resnik’s, is less realist than Shapiro’s. Moreover, he is explicit that adopting a “structuralist view of mathematical objects” should be seen as separable from, and orthogonal to, the realism/nominalism dichotomy. Consequently, for Parsons one can be a non-eliminative structuralist without being a realist in any strong sense; his own position is a case in point. Yet Parsons’ version of structuralism is still meant to allow taking mathematical statements at face value (as characterized above), so that it remains realist in this minimal semantic sense.

2. Later Developments and a Broader Taxonomy

2.1 Metaphysical and Epistemological Challenges

So far we have traced the development of structuralism in the philosophy of mathematics from Benacerraf and Putnam, in the 1960s, to Resnik, Shapiro, Hellman, Chihara, and Parsons, in the 1980s–90s. During the last 20 years, a number of further philosophers have started to address this topic. We now turn to the corresponding discussions, starting with certain epistemological and metaphysical challenges to structuralism. Some of these concern non-eliminative structuralism alone, especially Shapiro’s position. (This again reflects the prominence of Shapiro’s position, to the point that it is often identified, misleadingly, with “philosophical structuralism”.) Others are broader, including comparing the basic commitments of various forms of structuralism. In what follows, we will not try to be comprehensive, but provide a number of illustrative examples.

Non-eliminative structuralism, in Shapiro’s and other versions, involves the thesis that all that matters about mathematical objects are their structural properties (as opposed to further intrinsic properties). In fact, such properties are taken to determine the objects’ identities. But then, objects that are indistinguishable in this respect—“structural indiscernibles”—should be identified, it seems. As several critics pointed out around the year 2000, this leads to the “identity problem” for structuralism (cf. Keränen 2001, earlier Burgess 1999). It arises prominently for systems or structures that are non-rigid, i.e., allow for non-trivial automorphisms. In such cases, there are supposedly distinct objects that are indistinguishable in the relevant sense. A widely known case is the system of complex numbers (with the conjugate numbers i and −i); but geometry and graph theory, among others, provide further examples. The simplest example is probably an unlabeled 2-element graph with no edges, whose two vertices are structurally indiscernible.

How can such cases be handled from a structuralist point of view? Is structuralism (of this kind) simply incoherent, as some of its critics charge? Or is it at least not applicable to non-rigid cases, which would limit its reach significantly? Several responses to the identity problem have been offered in the literature. One suggestion is to “rigidify” such structures by enlarging the vocabulary that is used, e.g., by adding the constant symbol ‘i’ for the complex numbers (either into the original language or into the language for the “setting” used in the background, cf. Halimi 2019). But this still seems problematic in the case of many indiscernibles, perhaps even uncountably many. Another suggestion is to treat identity as a primitive notion, as is arguably part of mathematical practice. But in that case too a number of questions remain (see Ladyman 2005, Button 2006, Leitgeb & Ladyman 2008, Shapiro 2008, Ketland 2011, and Menzel 2018, among others).

A second, more basic problem for structuralism starts again with the idea that all that matters about mathematical objects are their structural properties. With respect to non-eliminative structuralism, this is sometimes strengthened to the thesis that the positions in mathematical structures, as well as the abstract structures themselves, “only have structural properties”. But if not formulated more carefully, this leads to counterexamples (cf. Reck 2003). For instance, does the natural number structure not have the property that it is a favorite example in many debates about structuralism? And isn’t it a property of the number 9 to have long been taken to be the number of planets in the Solar System? Both seem clearly non-structural properties. Once again, structuralism appears incoherent or, at the very least, in need of further clarification.

A natural response to this challenge is to refine the original structuralist thesis, e.g., by saying that abstract structures only have structural properties “essentially”, that only such properties are “constitutive” for them, or something similar, while admitting that they have other properties too (see Reck 2003, Schiemer & Wigglesworth forthcoming). This leads to questions about how exactly to make this distinction. But even if it is taken to constitute a satisfactory response, another problem remains: How can we distinguish “structural” from “non-structural” properties in the first place? Several answers to that question have been proposed in turn, e.g., that structural properties are those definable in a certain way, or that they are those preserved under relevant morphisms. Yet no consensus on that issue has been reached either (see Korbmacher & Schiemer 2018, also for further references).

A third challenge directed again especially, or even exclusively, at non-eliminative structuralism concerns the following. From a structuralist point of view, positions are always “positions in a structure”; i.e., the structure is primary and the positions are secondary. Hence, a particular mathematical object, such as the natural number 2, seems “ontologically dependent” on the background structure, here the structure of the natural numbers. (The fact that for a structuralist it is misguided to consider the number 2 as existing in itself reflects this aspect. It also illustrates a main difference between structuralism and logicism or set-theoretic foundationalism.) But how should this ontological dependence be understood? Are there perhaps connections to “grounding” or related notions in current analytic metaphysics? In this context too, many open questions remain and a lively debate has started (cf. Linnebo 2008, also, e.g., MacBride 2005 and Wigglesworth 2018).

A fourth basic challenge for structuralism, mostly again in its non-eliminative form, is how we can have “access” to structures seen as abstract objects (cf. Hale 1996, among others). To some degree, this revives an older, more general debate about such objects. An initial response, by Resnik, Shapiro, and Parsons (all following Quine here), is to talk about the “positing” of structures, which promises to undercut the access problem. But under what conditions is such positing legitimate (given the threat of paradox familiar from naïve set theory)? A plausible answer points to the “coherence” of the relevant theories (which, after Gödel’s incompleteness results, is seen as taking the place of provable consistency). Yet what exactly does such coherence amount to? An interesting outcome of the debate about this issue is that Shapiro and Hellman, coming from very different directions, have arrived at views that are very close to each other (see Hellman 2005). Thus, in terms of some basic commitments—ultimate conditions for existence in Shapiro’s case and for possibility in Hellman’s case—their approaches converge in surprising ways. (This may be seen as providing support for both sides, but also as undermining the realism/nominalism dichotomy.)

There are more challenges to structuralism in mathematics that one can find in the literature of the last 20 years. While usually connected to the problems just surveyed, sometimes these challenges go further. For example, additional questions about the semantics involved in structuralism have been raised, typically again for the non-eliminative variant (cf. Button & Walsh 2016, Assadian 2018, etc.). Instead of summarizing these challenges too, we hope our survey so far provides enough illustration of the kinds of debates that have occurred in the recent literature already.

2.2 Several Additional Variants of Structuralism

As mentioned earlier, in many discussions of structuralism, from the 1980s to the early 2000s and beyond, a few positions have taken center stage: Shapiro’s, Hellman’s, sometimes Parsons’, and occasionally Resnik’s. But other forms of structuralism have been around for decades too. These deserve, and are starting to get, more attention as well. Without any claim to comprehensiveness, we want to mention several noteworthy examples. A major one, whose origins can be traced back to before the 1960s, is “set-theoretic structuralism” (cf. Reck & Price 2000, also Reck & Schiemer forthcoming). To introduce it, let us reconsider the example central to Benacerraf’s 1965 paper: the natural numbers.

As Benacerraf argued, there is something wrong with identifying “the natural numbers” with a particular set-theoretic system; or at least, it seems wrong to do so in any absolute sense. Benacerraf’s conclusion was that numbers are not sets, nor objects of any kind, but positions in a structure. Now, one can agree with almost everything Benacerraf says and still want to identify “the natural numbers” with some set-theoretic system in a less absolute sense. In doing so, one can admit that any other model of the Dedekind-Peano axioms “would do as well”, i.e., could have been chosen instead (except perhaps for pragmatic reasons, e.g., the ability to generalize to the transfinite). This means that what we identify as the natural numbers depends on an initial, provisional, and somewhat arbitrary choice. For most mathematical purposes, such a pragmatic identification is sufficient; in fact, this is exactly what one does in standard axiomatic set theory. The resulting position deserves again to be counted as a form of structuralism, as its defenders insist. What makes it structuralist is the “indifference to identify” the natural numbers in any more absolute sense (cf. Burgess 2015).

The core of set-theoretic structuralism, as just described, is to choose one of several isomorphic systems as the pragmatic referent for “the natural numbers” (similarly for the real numbers etc.). In a sense, our talk of “the natural numbers”, then also of “the number 0”, “the number 1”, etc., is relative to this initial choice. This is seen as unproblematic because, no matter how we choose, we will get the same arithmetic theorems (because of the categoricity of the axiom system, which implies its semantic completeness). As background, we can again employ Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory. But we can also broaden the approach slightly by allowing for “atoms” or “urelements”, i.e., objects that are not sets. Thus, we can include Julius Caesar or some beer mug in our domain, with the consequence that either of them can “be” the number 2, say, in the sense of taking up the “2-position” in the model for arithmetic we choose to work with. Because of this feature, we will use “relativist structuralism” for this approach (cf. Reck & Price 2000). It also seems fair to say that this position, particularly in its set-theoretic version, is accepted by many mathematicians, explicitly or implicitly. In fact, it may be the most widely favored form of structuralism.

In set-theoretic structuralism, and in relativist structuralism more broadly, the only mathematical objects at play are those that axiomatic set theory, possibly with urelements, allows us to introduce. We do not need to postulate abstract structures in addition. For that reason, the position is another form of eliminative structuralism (while it is not fully eliminative insofar as it countenances sets). In fact, set-theoretic relational systems (the set-theoretic models of theories) are themselves taken to be the relevant structures here. (It is exactly such relational systems that are called “structures” in many mathematics textbooks.) However, there is another option in connection with the latter. Namely, we can also identify the structure of the natural numbers, say, with the (higher-order) concept defined by the Dedekind-Peano axioms; similarly for other (categorical) axiom systems. This leads to yet another eliminative form of structuralism: “concept structuralism” (cf. Isaacson 2010, Feferman 2014, also Ketland 2015, Other Internet Resources).

According to concept structuralism, what matters in modern axiomatic mathematics aren’t really objects, especially not problematic abstract objects. Rather, crucial are mathematical concepts, e.g., the concept “natural number system” (or “model of the Dedekind-Peano axioms”, “progression”); similarly for the concept “complete ordered field” etc. (In Ketland 2015, Other Internet Resources, such concepts are explicated further in terms of intensional propositional functions, while Isaacson and Feferman leave their nature more open.) More precisely, what matters in the end is what follows from those concepts, in the sense of what can be derived from the corresponding axioms. It is true, as concept structuralists might admit, that often the way in which we reason in mathematics involves talking about objects falling under the relevant concepts. But as they would add, such talk can be explained away in the end (e.g., by taking up a formalist position). In this or similar forms, concept structuralism seems again a fairly widespread view among mathematicians and logicians, even though it has not been very prominent in the structuralism debates until recently.

For the sake of a more comprehensive survey, we want to go even further. As the next step, we will introduce two forms of structuralism that are closely related to relativist structuralism and concept structuralism but not identical with either. (Both are forms of “abstractionist structuralism”, as we will see.) Let us start again with a higher-order concept defined by an axiom system, such as “natural number system”, together with the set-theoretic systems falling under it. However, instead of identifying the corresponding structure either with that concept or with some pragmatically chosen system falling under it, we focus on the whole equivalence class determined by the concept.

At this point, we can go down one of two “abstractionist” paths. First, we can simply identify the relevant structure with that equivalence class (with the “concept in extension”, as it is sometimes put). Thus, corresponding to the concept “natural number system” and set-theoretic systems falling under it, like the finite von Neumann ordinals, there is the entire equivalence class of corresponding models as a third entity. (Our primary focus is again on categorical axiom systems, but the approach can be generalized.) It is this class that is now called “the natural number structure”. It is not a set, to be sure, but a proper class; but it can still be studied logico-mathematically. Looked at from a “relativist” perspective, the new approach can also be described as follows: Its core is to go from a particular, arbitrarily chosen system falling under a higher-order concept to the related equivalence class, i.e., the class of all systems isomorphic to it (in the categorical case). And we can think of this move as involving a kind of “abstraction”, specifically in the sense of the “principle of abstraction” in Russell (1903; also adopted by Rudolf Carnap and others). The result is a first form of “abstractionist structuralism”.

There is a second path we can take, resulting in a second form of abstractionist structuralism. It too has played a role in the recent structuralism debates; but, like the first, it can also be traced back further in time. Let us start again from a relevant higher-order concept, or from the axiom system that defines it, together with an arbitrarily chosen relational system falling under it (a set-theoretic system, say, possibly with urelements). The new suggestion is to proceed as follows: We “abstract away from the particular nature of its elements” so as to arrive at a novel, distinguished relational system that deserves to be called “the natural numbers” (cf. Dedekind 1888, especially as interpreted in Reck 2003). The intention is that the objects introduced by such abstraction only have structural properties, or better, only have these essentially. Also, together these objects form a system isomorphic to the one from which we started (unlike the equivalence class we just considered). Finally, it is the latter we now consider the relevant abstract structure.

In several respects, this second abstractionist alternative is close to Shapiro’s ante rem structuralism (who occasionally appeals to “abstraction” himself, e.g., in Shapiro 1997); it is also close to Parsons’ form of non-eliminative structuralism. Yet it neither involves a separate structure theory à la Shapiro nor an appeal to Parsons’ meta-linguistic procedure. Instead, abstract structures are introduced “by abstraction” from more concrete systems, e.g., from set-theoretic relational systems. The relevant abstraction can be explicated further in terms of an “abstraction operator” and a corresponding “abstraction principle”. Another comparison that suggests itself then is with the use of abstraction principles in contemporary neo-logicism. In fact, that connection has already been explored in Linnebo & Pettigrew (2014) and Reck (2018a). What we arrive at along such lines is an abstractionist form of non-eliminative structuralism. In contrast, the first alternative mentioned above is an abstractionist form of eliminative structuralism. (Given their historical roots, these positions might be labeled “Russellian abstractionist structuralism” and “Dedekindian abstractionist structuralism”, respectively; cf. Reck 2018a.)

The list of additional variants of structuralism does not end here either. Let us mention five further examples very briefly, without going into any details (and there may undoubtedly be more). First, Uri Nodelman and Edward Zalta have introduced a form of non-eliminative structuralism, parallel to Shapiro’s, which uses an “object theory” inspired by Meinong to account for the abstract structures (Nodelman & Zalta 2014). Parallel to that, one can use other fundamental theories for the introduction of abstract structures, leading to further forms of non-eliminative structuralism. As a second example, Hannes Leitgeb has described how to adapt graph theory for this purpose (Leitgeb forthcoming). Third, Leon Horsten has built on Kit Fine’s theory of “arbitrary objects” to construct a parallel form of “generic structuralism” (Horsten forthcoming). Fourth, above we already mentioned Charles Chihara’s “eliminative” form of structuralism, which is not identical with Hellman’s (see Chihara 2004). And fifth, there is a whole family of “categorical forms of structuralism”, based on a variety of axiom systems from category theory, that has become prominent recently.

We will postpone our discussion of categorical structuralism to section 3, both because it is important mathematically, thus deserving treatment in a separate section, and because it is harder to compare to the other forms of structuralism. Before that, we want to offer a richer, more comprehensive taxonomy for structuralist positions. This taxonomy will be wide enough to encompass all the positions mentioned so far. But it will also point beyond them, starting with the introduction of a basic dichotomy between “metaphysical” and “methodological” structuralism.

2.3 A Broader Taxonomy of Structuralist Positions

All the variants of structuralism described up to this point are forms of “philosophical structuralism”, or more precisely, of “metaphysical structuralism”. What that means is that these positions are intended to provide answers to questions about what mathematical structures are (even when this involves an eliminative stance), including views about their existence, abstractness, identity, dependence, etc. Now, one can distinguish this whole variety of philosophical positions from what is sometimes called “mathematical structuralism”, or again more precisely, “methodological structuralism” (cf. Reck & Price 2000, earlier Awodey 1996). In fact, we suggest that recognizing this basic dichotomy—“metaphysical versus methodological”—to is crucial with respect to both systematic and historical discussions of structuralism. (Among others, it allows us to connect more naturally with categorical structuralism; see, e.g., Corry 2004 and Marquis 2009.)

As its name suggests, methodological structuralism concerns the methodology of mathematics, thus mathematical practice. Or as one might also put it, it concerns a certain “style” of doing mathematics. That style consists in studying whole systems or structures of objects in terms of their global, relational, or structural properties, while neglecting the intrinsic nature of the objects involved. This can be done in two main ways, often intertwined in practice: by proceeding axiomatically, i.e., by deriving theorems from basic axioms for the systems at issue; and by considering morphisms between them (homomorphisms, isomorphisms, etc.), together with invariants under those morphisms. As such an approach typically involves infinite sets, non-decidable properties, and classical logic, it tends to be opposed to more “computational” and “constructivist” ways of doing mathematics (cf. Reck & Schiemer forthcoming for extensive historical background).

Such a structuralist methodology, or corresponding forms of methodological structuralism, tends to be tied to a general assumption about the subject matter of mathematics, namely: mathematics is the study structures. But accepting that assumption does not, in itself, involve any further views about the nature of those structures, at least not in any detailed and philosophically loaded way. In contrast, all the forms of metaphysical structuralism considered earlier are meant to provide such views. This is exactly how they go beyond methodological structuralism (often by building on it).

With respect to such metaphysical positions, Parsons’ “eliminative versus non-eliminative” distinction remains helpful (although a more positive label for the latter kind of views, along the lines of “structuralism with structures”, might be better). However, the differences among metaphysical forms of structuralisms do not stop there. In fact, only working with Parsons’ distinction obscures some important differences. As already mentioned, Shapiro’s ante rem structuralism is far from the only version of non-eliminative structuralism; nor is Hellman’s the only form of eliminative structuralism. We now want to suggest some more fine-grained distinctions so as to introduce more order and clarity into the debates.

Let us first look again at non-eliminative versions of structuralism. Some positions falling under that label introduce abstract structures by means of a basic theory. This includes Shapiro’s structure theory, but also, e.g., Nodelman & Zalta’s object theory and Leitgeb’s adaptation of graph theory. All of them are forms of ante rem structuralism, but significantly different ones. In addition, there are forms of non-eliminative structuralism that are based on abstraction principles instead, which we called “abstractionist forms of structuralism” above. We distinguished two variants of those, the Russellian and the Dedekindian variant, which involve different kinds of structures as the outcome of the abstraction process. (If we reconstruct such abstraction as mathematical operations or functions, their arguments are the same but their values are different.) And as this shows, there are abstractionist and non-abstractionist versions of non-eliminative structuralism.

If we reflect on these alternatives more, the role of a further basic dichotomy becomes apparent (within the category of non-eliminative structuralism): that between ante rem positions and either in re or post rem positions. Shapiro’s position is explicitly a form of ante rem structuralism. In contrast, Russellian abstractionist structuralism can be seen as a form of post rem structuralism, because the equivalence classes used as the relevant structures are “built out of” their elements as classes, to which they are thus posterior. In Dedekindian abstractionist structuralism, there is a form of posteriority involved as well. Here too, we start with more concrete relational systems, usually systems of sets or urelements, and we introduce abstract structures on that basis. But the prior versus posterior relation is different now. (It is not based on the element-class relation, but on a more basic argument-function-value relation.) We also end up with abstract structures that are neither standard sets nor classes.

On the side of eliminative structuralism, further sub-divisions should be made as well. Again, there are fully eliminative positions, which avoid commitment to any kind of abstract objects. Hellman’s modal structuralism is designed to be of this sort. But there are also semi-eliminative positions, which avoid commitment to abstract structures in addition to more usual, relatively concrete mathematical objects, which are accepted. Set-theoretic structuralism is a good illustration; universalist structuralism is another, at least when backed by set theory. Should relativist structuralism in general, and set-theoretic structuralism in particular, be seen as cases of in re structuralism, in the sense that abstract structure exist “in” their more concrete instantiations? Perhaps; but this thesis does not seem to be forced on us (cf. Leitgeb forthcoming for more on this issue). Note also that we would end up with a form of non-eliminative structuralism then instead. The same question arises for in re forms of structuralism more generally; the details will matter. (For more on such approaches—sometimes labeled “Aristotelian” as opposed to “Platonist”—see Pettigrew 2008 and Franklin 2014.)

Yet another version of eliminative structuralism that has started to attract more attention in the literature is concept structuralism. In cases where this position is meant to do without any appeal to abstract objects (e.g., by basing itself on formalism), it amounts to a fully eliminative view. Various questions remain, however, about the appeal to concepts in it, i.e., about their existence, nature, and identity (cf. Parsons 2018). Depending on the answers, a strict nominalist might still find this position unacceptable, since concepts may be seen as another problematic kind of abstract entities. If a concept structuralist allows for abstract objects, such as sets, to play a secondary role, this becomes a semi-eliminative position. Structures conceived of as abstract objects are still eliminated (by reconceiving them as concepts), but relational systems remain. Alternatively, we might be dealing with a particular form of methodological structuralism here, where additional metaphysical questions are brushed aside.

3. Category-Theoretic Structuralism

3.1 Category Theory as the Study of Mathematical Structures

Over the past two decades, different proposals have been made to formulate a theory of mathematical structuralism based on category theory, thus a theory, or theories, of “categorical structuralism”. We are now in a better position to consider these proposals, although we will still proceed indirectly, starting with more background. Category theory was first introduced as a branch of abstract algebra in Eilenberg & Mac Lane’s famous article, “General Theory of Natural Equivalences” (1945). It subsequently developed into an autonomous mathematical discipline, in work by Mac Lane, Grothendieck, Kan, Lawvere, and many others, with important, wide-ranging applications in algebraic topology and homological algebra and, more recently, in computer science and logic (cf. Landry & Marquis 2005, also the entry on category theory in this encyclopedia).

Building on these developments, the philosophical discussion of categorical structuralism was initiated by Awodey, Landry, Marquis, and McLarty in the 1990s. To understand their contributions better, it helps to go back to our distinction between “metaphysical” and “methodological structuralism”, which is drawn explicitly in Awodey (1996). Or rather, Awodey distinguishes between the use of category theory as a framework for “mathematical” and for “philosophical structuralism”. He describes mathematical structuralism as a general way of “pursuing a structural approach to the subject“, i.e., a particular style of practicing mathematics that employs structural concepts and methods. He then argues that category theory provides the best way of capturing structural mathematics in this sense. However, he also presents it as a framework for philosophical structuralism, i.e., “an approach to the ontology and epistemology of mathematics”. Let us first consider the former argument. (We will return to the latter in section 3.3).

Category theory, understood as a branch of pure mathematics, has frequently been described as a “general theory of mathematical structures”, e.g., by Mac Lane (1986, 1996). But what exactly is meant by “structure” here? At least two relevant notions are mentioned in the literature. First, a structure can be understood in the set- and model-theoretic sense, i.e., as a tuple consisting of a domain and an ordered sequence of relations, functions, and distinguished elements used for the interpretation of a formal language. (This is the notion of “relational system” we appealed to above more informally.) Such structures are often called “Bourbaki structures” in this context. Their properties are usually defined axiomatically, e.g., by the group axioms or the Dedekind-Peano axioms for arithmetic.

Second and alternatively, there is a categorical notion of structure based on the primitive concept of morphisms between mathematical objects. Typically, a category consists of two types of entities, namely objects and morphisms between them, i.e., mappings represented by arrows that preserve some of the internal structural composition of the objects. An axiom system that defines the general concept of a category, along such lines, was first introduced by Eilenberg and Mac Lane (1945). It describes a suitable composition operation on arrows, its associativity, as well as the existence of an identity morphism for each object (cf. Awodey 2010 for a textbook presentation of category theory).

Why might category theory be considered a more adequate framework for a mathematical structuralism than other disciplines, in particular traditional (Cantorian, Zermelo-Fraenkel) set theory? It is helpful to consult Awodey (1996) on this issue. According to him, the Bourbaki notion of structure is a direct result of the modern axiomatic tradition of Dedekind, Hilbert, and the Bourbaki group. This tradition eventually led to a structuralist perspective on mathematics. Yet set theory is not an ideal framework for capturing a structuralist understanding of mathematical objects. To begin with, set theory is closely tied to a model-theoretic conception of mathematical theories, including the view that such theories study their models only “up to isomorphism”. But central to a structuralist point of view is the principle (more on which below) to “identify isomorphic objects”; and this principle is well motivated from a category-theoretic viewpoint, but less so if mathematical objects are represented set-theoretically.

A second advantage of category theory over set theory, also mentioned in Awodey (1996), is that the categorical notion of structure is “syntax invariant”. That is to say, unlike in standard model theory the categorical specification of objects in terms of their mapping properties is independent of the choice of a particular signature used for their description (a choice of basic relations, functions, and distinguished elements). Third and most importantly, characteristic for category theory is its focus on morphisms and transformations between mathematical objects that preserve (some of) their internal structure. It is the emphasis on structure-preserving mappings in the specification of objects that is often viewed as a central feature of the structuralist turn in modern mathematics. As such, it was present in various parts of nineteenth- and early twentieth-century mathematics, including Galois theory, Klein’s Erlangen program, Dedekind’s foundational writings, as well as in work on abstract algebra by the Noether school (cf. again Reck & Schiemer forthcoming).

Category theory was first developed, against the background of these developments, as a unifying framework for the study of the relations between different mathematical structures (cf. Landry & Marquis 2005, Marquis 2009). Different types of mappings were introduced for this task. One type involves the morphisms between the objects of the same category, e.g., group homomorphisms in the category of groups, or linear maps in the category of vector spaces. Another important type of mappings are “functors” between different categories. (Roughly, a functor between two categories is a mapping of objects to objects and arrows to arrows that preserves the categorical properties in question.) It is such functors that are the central tools in category-theory for comparing the objects of different mathematical categories, and thus, to “relate structures of different kinds” (Awodey 1996). As such, they are central to categorical structuralism.

3.2 Categorical Foundations and Debates About Them

As has been argued repeatedly in the literature along the lines just summarized, category theory provides a more natural framework than traditional set theory for mathematical or methodological structuralism in mathematics. But what about its prospects as a form of philosophical structuralism, i.e., an alternative to the theories of Resnik, Shapiro, Hellman, etc.? We already mentioned that Awodey (1996) also presents it as such; but this has led to ongoing controversies. Hellmann (2003) contains a first critical discussion of philosophical claims such as Awodey’s. That is to say, Hellman’s article raises several objections against the view that category theory provides an adequate framework for a structuralist account of mathematics in the philosophical sense. As we will see, these objections are closely related to the status of category theory as a foundational discipline.

Recently there has been much debate on which criteria a theory has to meet in order to serve as a proper “foundation” for mathematics. According to a helpful proposal in Tsementzis (2017), a foundational system has to consist of three items, namely:

  1. a formal language;
  2. an axiomatic theory expressed in that language; and
  3. a rich universe of objects, described by the theory, in which all mathematical structures can be located, represented, or encoded.

Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory clearly represents a foundational system in this sense. The axioms of ZFC are usually formulated in a formal first-order language; and they describe a comprehensive universe, the cumulative hierarchy of sets, in which mathematical objects such as number systems, groups, rings, topological spaces, etc. can be represented.

In research on category theory from the 1960s onward, several axiomatizations of specific categories have been proposed as alternative foundations for mathematics. This includes the axiom systems describing the category of sets and functions, on the one hand, and the category of categories, on the other hand, as first presented in Lawvere (1964, 1966). Both were explicitly introduced as foundational systems, and thus, as alternatives to Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory. More recently, elementary typos theory has been developed as a form of categorical set theory that can serve as a foundational system in the above sense (cf. Landry & Marquis 2005, Marquis 2013).

This puts us in a position to return to Hellman’s 2003 challenge. The question of whether category theory can be used to formulate a version of philosophical structuralism is, in his view, directly related to the presumed autonomy of these new approaches from traditional set theory. Building on Feferman (1977), he formulates two general objections. Following Linnebo & Pettigrew (2011), we can call the first the “logical dependence” objection. Its core is the argument that category theory, general topos theory, etc. are not autonomous of set theory in the end. The reason is that the axiomatic specification of categories and topoi presupposes the primitive concepts of operation, collection, and function, and the latter need to be defined in a set theory such as ZFC. Categorical foundations are therefore dependent on non-structural set theory.

The second argument against the autonomy of categorical foundations has been called the “mismatch objection”. It concerns the general status of category theory or topos theory; and it is based on the distinction between two ways of understanding mathematical axioms, namely as “structural”, “algebraic”, “schematic” or “Hilbertian”, on the one hand, and as “assertoric” or “Fregean”, on the other hand. As Hellman argues, foundational systems such as classical set theory need to be assertoric in character, in the sense that their axioms describe a comprehensive universe of objects used for the codification of other mathematical structures. Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory is an assertoric, “contentual” theory in this sense. Its axioms (e.g., the power set axiom or the axiom of choice) make general existence claims regarding the objects in the universe of sets.

In contrast, category theory represents a branch of abstract algebra, as its origin reveals. Thus it is, by its very nature, non-assertoric in character; it lacks existence axioms conceived as truths about an intended universe. For example, the Eilenberg-Mac Lane axioms of category theory are not “basic truths simpliciter”, but “schematic” or “structural” in character. They function as implicit definitions of algebraic structures, similar to the way in which the axioms of group theory or ring theory are “defining conditions on types of structures”. This point is related to another argument against the autonomy of category theory that Hellmann calls the “problem of the ‘home address’: where do categories come from and where do they live?” (2003: 136). Given the “algebraic-structuralist perspective” underlying category theory and general typos theory, its axioms make no assertions that particular categories or topoi actually exist. Classical set theories, such as ZFC with its strong existence axioms, have to step in again in order to secure the existence of such objects.

Hellman’s and Feferman’s arguments against the foundational character of category theory have been examined from various angles in the subsequent literature. One can distinguish between two main types of responses, namely:

  1. by proponents of “categorical foundations”, who aim to defend the autonomous character of category theory relative to classical set theory; and
  2. by “non-foundationalists”, who call into question that category theory should be viewed as a foundational discipline.

A series of articles by McLarty represent the first line of response well (e.g., McLarty 2004, 2011, 2012). Roughly speaking, his reply to Hellman is the following: Whereas category theory and general topos theory did originate as algebraic theories and are, thus, not feasible as foundational systems, certain theories of particular categories and toposes have been introduced as alternative foundations. McLarty’s central examples are Lawvere’s axiomatizations of the category of categories and his “Elementary Theory of the Category of Sets” (ETCS).

According to McLarty, these theories should be understood as assertoric in Hellman’s sense. That is to say, their axioms are not merely implicit definitions, but general existential claims about categories, sets, and functions. ETCS, for instance, presents a function-based set theory, where sets and mappings between them form a topos. In contrast to ZFC, with its primitive membership relation, in ETCS a set is not specified in terms of its internal composition, but rather in terms of its mapping properties with respect to other sets, which are formulated independently of ZFC. McLarty’s response to the two objections mentioned above is then that categorical set theories such as ETCS do provide a foundation for mathematics that is logically autonomous from traditional, non-structural set theories. Moreover, given that mathematical structures can only be encoded in ETCS as objects up to isomorphism, such categorical set theories provide a more adequate foundation for modern structural mathematics than ZFC. (We will return to this point below.)

The second, quite different line of response to Hellman’s objections is represented in Awodey (2004; cf. Landry 1999). In that article, Awodey outlines a category-theoretic form of structuralism that is decidedly anti-foundationalist. He holds, in agreement with Hellman and McLarty, that both the Eilenberg-Mac Lane axioms for category theory and the axioms of general topos theory are schematic. But he then argues that category theory in general does not, and should not be taken to, provide a foundation for mathematics, either in a logical or ontological sense. Rather, it presents a general and unifying framework or language for structural mathematics. He thus rejects Hellman’s assumption that the success of categorical structuralism is in any form dependent on whether category theory is usable as a foundational enterprise or not.

In fact, according to Awodey the central motivation for a category-theoretic approach to mathematics is to sidestep foundational issues concerning the nature of mathematical objects or the study of a single comprehensive universe in which all structures can be represented. While topos theory, say, might well serve as a structural foundation for mathematics, for Awodey such a foundational approach runs against the structuralist perspective embodied in category-theory. In his own words, “the idea of ‘doing mathematics categorically’ involves a different point of view from the customary foundational one” (Awodey 2004: 55). In light of such fundamental, ongoing debates about categorical foundations for mathematics, what are the implications for categorical structuralism in the philosophical sense, along Awodey’s lines and more generally? This is what we turn to next.

3.3 Distinctive Features of Categorical Structuralism

Beyond the issue of methodological structuralism, the literature on categorical structuralism during the last 20 years centers around two questions that have already been mentioned. First, in what sense does category theory provide a framework for philosophical structuralism? Second, why is it better suited for that task than other frameworks, such as set theory, Shapiro’s structure theory, and Hellman’s modal logic, as has been claimed? In recent work on these topics, one can find three related philosophical assumptions that characterize categorical structuralism and distinguish it from the versions of structuralism surveyed earlier. We will treat each of them in turn, starting again with Awodey’s writings.

A first characteristic assumption is that all mathematical theorems are schematic statements that have a conditional form. This point is explicit in Awodey (2004). We already saw that according to Awodey a category-theoretic approach is non-foundational in character. This includes that mathematical axioms and theorems, as expressed in category theory, should be understood as schematic statements. They do not express truths about the specific nature of mathematical objects, but rather, about their respective properties and relations. In addition, mathematical theorems are, at least in principle, all of hypothetical form. They can be reconstructed as if-then statements. Note that this view of the logical form of mathematical theorems is prima facie similar to the if-then-ism one can find in Putnam’s works, and earlier in Russell’s, as mentioned in section 1.

However, there is also an important difference between standard if-then-ism and a category-theoretic approach in terms of the ontological commitments involved, as Awodey points out. According to standard if-then-ism, any mathematical statement can be translated into a universally quantified conditional statement, where the quantifiers are effectively meta-theoretic in nature, ranging over all set-theoretic systems of the right type. As such, the approach presupposes a rich ontology of sets in which such systems can be constructed. In contrast, along category-theoretic lines mathematical theorems do not involve such ontological commitments. There is no implicit generalization over the Bourbaki structures of a theory, e.g., over all groups, rings, or number systems. Rather, a mathematical theorem is “a schematic statement about a structure […] which can have various instances” (Awodey 2004: 57). These instances remain undetermined on purpose, unless a further specification of them is needed for the proof of the theorem in question.

A second distinctive feature of categorical structuralism, not only for Awodey, concerns a certain “top-down” conception of mathematical objects characteristic for category theory. According to standard set theory, mathematical objects are constructed from the “bottom up”, in successive steps starting from some ground level (the empty set or also a domain of urelements). Every object is thus determined, as a set, in terms of its members. In contrast, mathematical objects in category theory are characterized in a top-down fashion, starting with the Eilenberg-Mac Lane axioms and using the notion of morphism. Hence, the objects in a given category, such as that of rings or topological spaces, are not considered independently of the relevant morphisms. They are fully determined by their mapping properties, as expressible in the language of category theory. Nothing further is assumed about their inner constitution. In particular, questions about their set-theoretic nature are considered redundant (see also Landry & Marquis 2005.)

Third, arguably the most important feature of categorical structuralism is that it verifies a version of the “structuralist thesis” (hinted at earlier). Recall here Benacerraf’s argument in his 1965 paper that numbers should not be identified with particular sets, but rather, with positions in an abstract structure. Benacerraf also emphasizes that only certain properties are relevant in arithmetic. For him, these are the number-theoretic properties, such as “being prime” or “being even”, that can be defined in terms of the primitive relations and functions of the theory at issue. The general structuralist thesis holds, then, that all (relevant) properties of the objects treated by a mathematical theory should be structural in a specified sense. (The question what “structural” means also came up earlier.)

Categorical structuralists typically argue that category theory presents the most adequate framework for a structuralist understanding of mathematical objects given that all the properties expressible in its language turn out to be structural (see, e.g., McLarty 1993, Awodey 2004, and Marquis 2013). This is so because the category-theoretic study of mathematical objects, such as rings or topological spaces, allows us to express just the right kind of “structural information”, namely information about the structural properties of these objects. In this context, structural properties are usually characterized in terms of the notion of isomorphism invariance. Given a category C, a morphism \(f: A \rightarrow B\) presents an isomorphism between objects A and B if and only if there is a morphism \(g: B \rightarrow A\) such that \(g \circ f = 1_A\) and \(f \circ g =1_B\). A property P of an object A in category C is then structural if it remains invariant under the isomorphisms in C, that is, if \(P(A) \leftrightarrow P(f(A))\), for all isomorphisms f (cf. Awodey 1996).

We saw above that the representation of mathematical objects in traditional set theory (proceeding “bottom up”) brings with it the possibility to express all sorts of properties about their set-theoretical constitution that are not isomorphism invariant in this sense. The central advantage of category theory over classical set theory (and similar approaches) is, according to this argument, that such non-structural properties are simply ruled out in the categorical framework. This point was first stressed in McLarty’s “Numbers Can Be Just What They Have To” (1993), which, as the title suggests, presents a rejoinder to Benacerraf (1965). McLarty’s central thesis in this article is that Benacerraf’s structuralist program is most successfully realized if one considers numbers to be represented in categorical set theory (such as in ETCS or a subsystem thereof), and not in orthodox set theory.

To elaborate this advantage further, number systems of basic arithmetic can be characterized in such categorical frameworks as “natural number objects”, as was first shown by Lawvere. In contrast to their ZFC-based representation, such objects are not just isomorphic but share “exactly the same properties”, namely those expressible in the language of the category of sets. In other words, any two natural number objects are “provably indiscernible”, in the sense that they “provably have the same properties” (McLarty 1993). Moreover, all of these properties are structural in the above sense. As a consequence, Benacerraf’s dilemma of isomorphic numbers systems with different set-theoretic properties does not arise in the context of categorical set theory. The conclusion is that numbers can, after all, be identified with sets, but with structural ones as defined in ETCS.

As McLarty and others have argued, this observation generalizes from numbers to all other mathematical objects studied in category theory. The claim is that any property of the objects in a given category that is expressible in the language of category theory is structural in the sense of being isomorphism invariant. The main consequence for a structuralist conception of mathematical objects is summarized by Awodey as follows:

Since all categorical properties are thus structural, the only properties which a given object in a given category may have, qua object in that category, are structural ones. (Awodey 1996: 214)

This would seem to illustrate a main advantage of categorical forms of structuralism over set-theoretic and similar ones.

A rejoinder should be added, however. McLarty’s and Awodey’s claim that all mathematical properties expressible in categorical set theory are isomorphism invariant has been contested, e.g., in Tsementzis (2017). In fact, Tsementzis argues that neither ZFC nor ETCS provide fully structuralist foundations for mathematics, since their respective languages do not, after all, exclusively allow for the formulation of invariant properties. Then again, both Makkai’s FOLDS system (Makkah 1995, Other Internet Resources, 1998) and the Univalent Foundations program developed in Homotopy Type Theory (Univalent Foundations Program 2013) seem to meet this condition. Here we have reached another ongoing debate in the literature.

The technical results just mentioned are clearly relevant for our discussion, but we cannot explore them further in this general survey. (Cf. Awodey 2014 for more on the relation between structuralism and the Univalent Foundations project.) We also have to leave a further, more definite evaluation of the philosophical claims and arguments concerning categorical structuralism to another occasion, interesting and important as that debate is. Instead, we now conclude with some more general remarks about structuralism, even beyond the philosophy of mathematics.

4. Conclusion

4.1 The Varieties of Mathematical Structuralism

We had two main goals in this essay. The first was to introduce our readers to the general discussion of structuralism in contemporary philosophy of mathematics. Second, we tried to provide a richer, more inclusive taxonomy for that discussion, including making evident that a much larger variety of structuralist positions has played a role in it than is usually acknowledged. To be sure, a certain amount of variety has been recognized before, as reflected in the distinction between eliminative and non-eliminative positions, with Shapiro’s ante rem structuralism and Hellman’s modal structuralism as paradigms; and categorical structuralism has been acknowledged as a third main alternative. But the range of positions at play is much greater than that, especially in the recent literature. “Mathematical structuralism” is not the name of a single position, but of a multifaceted family of them.

There are two main reasons for promoting our more inclusive taxonomy. The first is that, while numerous versions of structuralism for mathematics have been proposed, several of them have not received much attention yet, partly because their relationships to Shapiro’s, Hellman’s, and category-theoretic positions have remained unclear. Along the way, we tried to build some corresponding bridges. The second reason is that several important variants played a role already before the 1960s, i.e., before the publications by Benacerraf and Putnam that are often seen as the starting point for debates about structuralism in philosophy. This concerns both methodological and metaphysical structuralism, a basic distinction we highlighted; but we only hinted at the relevant “pre-history” of our topic in the present survey (We refer the reader to Reck & Schiemer forthcoming for more on it.)

4.2 Structuralism Beyond Mathematics

Another relevant aspect we did not explore in the present essay, although it should be mentioned at least briefly before closing, consists of debates about “structuralism” outside the philosophy of mathematics. There are two main areas in which one can find such debates (although they have reverberated further). The first is the philosophy of physics, where structuralist positions have played a significant role as well (including one called “structural realism”, which comes in both an “ontic” and an “epistemic” form). The second consists of several parts of the humanities and social sciences, primarily linguistics and anthropology, but also psychology, sociology, etc. There too, “structuralism” (and “post-structuralism”) has been a major topic, indeed for a relatively long period. In both cases, there are ties to mathematical structuralism, although sometimes these ties are only loose.

At a basic level, the debate about structuralism in the philosophy of physics concerns how to think about the “objects” of modern physics, given the revolutionary changes quantum mechanics and relativity theory have brought with them. More particularly, it concerns the suggestion to refer to “structures” in this connection (cf. French 2014, Layman 2007 [2019], etc.), in a way that is closely related to the philosophy of mathematics. At another level, this debate concerns how to conceive of what, if anything, remains constant through theory changes in the ontology of physics (cf. Worrall 1989, and see the entry on structuralism in physics in this encyclopedia). Third, there are debates about representation in science that are related to structuralism (cf. van Frassen 2008). While there are several points of contact one could pursue further (e.g., concerning “structural indiscernibles” and versions of “set-theoretic versus category-theoretic structuralism” in the context of physics), we refrain from doing so here.

The structuralism introduced into linguistics by Ferdinand de Saussure and Roman Jakobson, then adopted by other thinkers in the humanities and social sciences—most prominently by Claude Levi-Strauss in anthropology and by Jean Piaget in psychology (cf. Levi-Strauss 1958 [1963], Piaget 1968 [1970], also Caws 1988)—does have ties to mathematical structuralism as well. However, they are looser than in the case of the philosophy of physics. In addition, the kind of psychological determinism often associated, or even identified, with structuralism in the humanities and social sciences (and criticized in post-structuralism) has no analogue on the side of mathematical (or physics). Still, these connections are not totally uninteresting (starting with contacts between Levi-Strauss and mathematicians in the Bourbaki group, cf. Dosse 1991–92 [1997]). Hence they might be worth exploring further too, in this case not so much to derive benefits for the philosophy of mathematics, but to understand the history of structuralism in human thought more fully.


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Other Internet Resources


The authors wish to thank Steve Awodey, Francesca Biagioli, Norbert Gratzl, Henning Heller, Pierre Keller, Johannes Korbmacher, Hans-Christoph Kotzsch, Hannes Leitgeb, Øystein Linnebo, Jean-Pierre Marquis, Michael Price, Andrea Sereni, and John Wigglesworth for helpful discussions on topics addressed in this entry.

We would also like to thank the editors for The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy for their considerable patience with this entry, which took far longer to complete than anticipated. And we would like to thank an anonymous reviewer for constructive suggestions.

Research by Georg Schiemer on this project has received funding from the European Research Council (ERC) under the European Union’s Horizon 2020 research and innovation program (grant agreement No. 715222).

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Erich Reck <>
Georg Schiemer <>

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