Francisco Suárez (1548–1617) was a highly influential philosopher and theologian of the Second Scholastic (or “Early Modern Scholasticism”), that is, the revitalized philosophical and theological inquiry of the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries, conducted within the tradition shaped by Thomas Aquinas, Duns Scotus, and other medieval scholastics. While Suárez is commonly praised for his comprehensive, exhaustive, and systematic exposition of more or less everything known in philosophy up to his time (certainly, at any rate, in metaphysics), his achievement in this regard should not be permitted to overshadow the depth, power, and originality of his own ideas. He worked in a great variety of fields, including metaphysics, natural theology, philosophy of mind, philosophy of action, ethics, political philosophy, and law. In all these areas he made contributions the influences of which are so widespread and commonplace that they sometimes escape notice. Still, it is noteworthy that figures as distinct from one another in place, time, and philosophical orientation as Leibniz, Grotius, Pufendorf, Schopenhauer, and Heidegger, all found reason to cite him as a source of inspiration and influence. Grotius, for instance, praised the Jesuit doctor as a theologian and philosopher of such depth, breadth, and penetration that “he hardly had an equal” (Grotius, Letter of 15 October, 1633; 2001: 194). See the entry on the School of Salamanca for more context.
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Francisco Suárez was born in Granada on 5 January 1548, the son of Gaspar Suárez de Toledo and Antonia Vázquez de Utiel. He made a famously slow start. Thus, for example, his application to join the Society of Jesus at the age of sixteen was the only one of fifty to be rejected: his health was weak and his intellect seemed unpromising. After appeal, he was finally admitted to the novitiate, but only as a lowly ranked indiferente—someone whose permanent rank within the Society would be determined at a later date. Even after being admitted, it took some time—and some praying—before Suárez's talent for philosophy and theology began to emerge. Eventually, however, they emerged as fully and undeniably apparent, and he rose to a position of great professional and academic prominence.
Suárez's intellectual landscape was marked by the revival of Iberian scholasticism, triggered in part by Francisco de Vitoria. His works should therefore, in the first instance, be read as contributions to this far-reaching theological and philosophical movement and research program. The revival was very widespread, engaging dozens, if not hundreds, of theologians, not only across Europe and in the centers of learning and universities of Iberian America (such as Lima, Quito, and Mexico), but as distant from the Iberian peninsula as Japan, China, the Philippines, India and Ethiopia. In all these lands philosophically minded missionaries, mainly Jesuits, promulgated his works. Consider as an illustration that the Jesuit missionary Martino Martini, based at Hangzhou, even attempted a Chinese translation of Suárez's great masterpiece, the Metaphysical Disputations, in the mid-seventeenth century.
Suárez was thoroughly educated within the framework of this revival, receiving two years of philosophy and four of theology, before he himself started teaching at the Jesuit School in Segovia. This first appointment was followed by positions at Avila, Valladolid, Alcalá, Salamanca, the Jesuit School at Rome (the Collegio Romano), and, for almost twenty years, at Coimbra, in Portugal. While an unsuccessful preacher (his few attempts failed because of his tendency to digress into the abstruse points of doctrine, the subtleties of which tended to be lost on his auditors), Suárez proved to be a dedicated and original teacher, if not always a popular one. His method departed from the norm: instead of merely repeating the opinions of others, he believed in taking a fresh look at the issue under consideration, examining, as he used to say, the very root of the problem (Scorraille 2005: I, 156).
Like many of his fellow Jesuits, Suárez was frequently accused of straying too far and too often from views attributed to Thomas Aquinas. During Suárez's own lifetime and shortly after, allusions to a “Suarista” party (here in opposition to the Thomists) became popular. Suárez himself resisted these distinctions as false and as resting on fabricated oppositions. He denied being any sort of “inventor of a new school” or as “in opposition to or creating a faction against anybody” (Scorraille 2005: I, 310). He also faced opposition within his own order, in particular, from the other great theologian of his time, Gabriel Vázquez—an opposition which developed into a life-long rivalry and a partisanship which survived their deaths.
Beyond authoring works of highly abstract metaphysics and philosophical theology, Suárez wrote a number of polemical tracts motivated by the political upheavals of his day. In De immunitate ecclesiastica, written in 1606, he defended ecclesiastical rights against alleged encroachments by the Republic of Venice. In Defensio fidei, published in 1613 at the behest of the papal nuncio in Madrid, Decio Caraffa, he offered a response to James I of England's defence of his requirement that Catholic subjects take an oath of fidelity. This work went beyond its original purpose, to the point where it provided something close to a full-fledged theory of political power. Seen as undermining the foundations of regal absolute rule, it was publicly burned, not only in London at the end of 1613, but also the following year in the courtyard of the Parliament in Paris.
These unhappy events, though, came towards the end of Suárez's life, the last two decades of which were spent in the more peaceful surroundings of Coimbra, then an intellectual hub of the revitalization of scholastic philosophy. Philip II of Spain (Philip I of Portugal), who imposed his rule on the whole of the Iberian peninsula in 1580, sought to appoint a distinguished theologian to the most eminent university of this new part of the realm. After initially accepting Suárez's personally tendered apologies, given on grounds of ill-health, Philip reconsidered and then insisted in a second letter that Suárez take up a post in Coimbra. Clearly, Suárez could not decline. Travels apart, Suárez would remain in Coimbra until shortly before his death on 25 September 1617, aged almost seventy, after convalescing for two weeks in Lisbon from what may have been dysentery.
During his working life, Suárez was both remarkably prolific and industrious (according to Fichter 1940: 327, he wrote about 21 million words, more than twice the output of Thomas Aquinas), not only writing but equally involving himself in all manner of editorial matters. Given his eminence and popularity, almost as soon as Suárez published a book, unauthorized copies were printed in places such as Paris, Vienna, Cologne, Geneva, Lyons, and Mainz.
Twenty-two volumes of Suárez's works were published, nine of them posthumously under the care of his friend Baltasar Alvarez. Within this corpus most of the philosophical interest has gone to the monumental Disputationes metaphysicae (Metaphysical Disputations, 1597), a work in which Suárez collects and thoughtfully assesses the views of numerous authors, on a vast array of problems, before offering his own solutions; De legibus (1612), where he outlines his natural law theory; and De anima (1621), where he offers a critical exposition of Aristotelian approaches to life and cognition.
A number of writings have been lost, including his commentaries on Aristotle, which Suárez had used for his classroom presentations during his first tenure at Salamanca. His oeuvre has been collected, most recently in the 28 volumes (including indexes), and published in Paris between 1856 and 1878 (Opera omnia). We also have a collection of responsa (Conselhos e Pareceres).
It is scarcely credible that there is no complete English translation of Suarez's great masterpiece of metaphysics, the Metaphysical Disputations—though, happily, we do possess a translation into Spanish. It is a work of surpassing sophistication and comprehensiveness, serving at once as a kind of authoritative epitome of ancient and medieval metaphysics and as a free-standing, incisive, and original discussion of all topics pertaining to metaphysics, conceived, according to Suárez's understanding of this subject, as the study of being. As Schopenhauer remarked, the work is “an authentic compendium of the whole scholastic tradition”. Extending to fifty-four disputations, each in its own right effectively a dedicated monograph on a discrete topic, the work contains 7,709 references, citing some 245 authors, led in typical scholastic fashion by Aristotle, who receives 1,735 references, followed by Thomas Aquinas, with whose philosophy Suárez retains an animating sympathy, who receives 1,008 (Iturrioz 1949). Still, Suárez is hardly beholden to Aristotle, Thomas Aquinas, or any other thinker: he is, as his Metaphysical Disputations makes manifest, a thinker of fearless originality and innovation.
As shown in this work, Suárez has a conception of metaphysics which initially seems much more narrowly focused than that subject as it is conceived today. Still, even given this narrower concentration, metaphysics as practiced by Suárez opens itself into many of the topics commanding the attention of current day metaphysicians. His avowedly narrow focus results from his taking metaphysics to have but one, exclusive object: “the study of being insofar as it is real being” (DM I 1.26). In this sense, Suárez understands metaphysics in a broadly Aristotelian manner as the study of being and its causes. This study was rechristened in the seventeenth century as “ontology”, literally, the study of to on, or being, in view of the then broadening sweep of metaphysics whereby it came to include the investigation of minds and bodies, causation, numbers, identity and other relations, properties and propositions, modality, and, eventually, the nature of abstract entities, including fictional ones. Relative to this broader conception, ontology, as the study of being, seems highly specific. Still, this appearance is misleading, especially where Suárez is concerned, since he addresses most of the topics on this list in one way or another, if in an idiom alien to those unschooled in Aristotelianism. For, as it turns out, he understands “the study of being” and its causes very broadly indeed.
This is partly because he looks at being as a subject matter requiring consideration of the categories; of terms or properties which transcend the categories; of infinite and finite beings; and even—as indispensable but falling outside the remit of the metaphysician proper—the study of beings of reason (entia rationis), that is, beings which do not in fact exist, such as fictitious entities, privations, and various forms of abstraction, all of which, Suárez insists, force themselves into view, despite their non-existence.
Altogether, then, Suárez's Metaphysical Disputations comprises fifty-four questions, or topics for discussion, constituting seven unequal sections, ordered first under a general division of being in general (DM I–XXVII) and then being as divided into infinite and finite being (DM XXVIII–LIII):
- The nature of metaphysics (DM I)
- The transcendentals (DM II–XI)
- The causes of being (DM XII–XXVII)
- Finite and infinite being (DM XXVIII–XXXI)
- Substance and accident, pertaining to finite beings (DM XXXII–XXXVIII)
- The nine categories of accident (DM XXXIX–LIII)
- Real and conceptual being (DM LIV)
The first and last of these, which in different ways stand outside of the subject matter proper of the Metaphysical Disputations, we have already characterized briefly.
The second topic (DM II–XI) treats transcendental terms, including being (ens), but also good (bonum) and true (veritas), which are transcendental in the sense that they may be predicated of beings in any category (a quality is a being, an ens, just as a substance is an ens, and so on for every category of being). Every being is, as such, according to Suárez, one; hence being one is predicated across the full range of categories as well. So, too, but less obviously and more controversially, according to Suárez, every single being is something true, in some suitably ontological sense of true (as in “true propositions are simply facts”) and also something good. So, these terms require dedicated treatment at the hands of the metaphysician.
The remaining sections of the Metaphysical Disputations are centrally and recognizably discussions of kinds of being: infinite being, that is, God; finite being, what is created by God; and then the nature and features of finite beings, again as delineated by a theory of categories: substance and accident, and then all of the kinds of accident there may be. We will restrict ourselves mainly to (3), the causes of being, since doing so provides a clear picture of the character of Suarez's inquiry in the Metaphysical Disputations.
Before doing so, however, because of its relative obscurity and inaccessibility to present-day readers, it will be helpful to offer a complete outline of the fifty-four disputations.
- The nature of metaphysics (DM I)
- Being as such (DM II)
- The transcendentals (DM III–XI)
- The attributes of being in general (DM III)
- Unity (DM IV–VII)
- Transcendental unity in general (DM IV)
- Individual unity and individuation (DM V)
- Universals and unity (DM VI)
- Distinguishing various kinds of unity (DM VII)
- Truth (DM VIII–IX)
- Truth as an attribute of being (DM VIII)
- Falsity (DM IX)
- Goodness (DM X–XI)
- Transcendental goodness (DM X)
- Evil (DM XI)
- The causes of being (DM XII–XXVII)
- The causes of being in general (DM XII)
- The material cause (DM XIII–XIV)
- The material cause of substance (DM XIII)
- The material cause of accidents (DM XIV)
- The formal cause (DM XV–XVI)
- The formal cause of substance (DM XV)
- The formal cause of accident (DM XVI)
- The efficient cause (DM XVII–XXII)
- The efficient cause in general (DM XVII)
- The requisites of causality (DM XVIII)
- Necessary and contingent causes (DM XIX)
- The first cause (DM XX–XXII)
- Creation: the first action of the first cause (DM XX)
- Conservation: the second action of the first cause (DM XXI)
- Concurrence: the third action of the first cause (DM XXII)
- The final cause (DM XXIII–XXIV)
- The final cause in general (DM XXIII)
- The ultimate final cause (DM XXIV)
- The exemplar cause (DM XXV)
- Properties common to all causes (DM XXVI–XXVII)
- The relation of causes to their effects (DM XXVI)
- The relation of causes to one another (DM XXVII)
- The transcendentals (DM III–XI)
- Being, infinite and finite (DM XXVIII–LIII)
- The distinction between finite and infinite being (DM XXVIII)
- Infinite being (DM XXIX–XXX)
- The existence of the first being, as known by natural reason (DM XXIX)
- The nature of the first being, as known by natural reason (DM XXX)
- Finite being (DM XXXI–LIII)
- The essence and individuation of finite beings (DM XXXI)
- The distinction between substance and accident (DM XXXII)
- Created substance (DM XXXIII–XXXVI)
- Created substance in general (DM XXXIII)
- Primary substance (the suppositum) (DM XXXIV)
- Immaterial substance (DM XXXV)
- Material substance (DM XXXVI)
- Accidents in general (DM XXXVII–XXXVIII)
- The nature of accidents (DM XXXVII)
- The relation of accident to substance (DM XXXVIII)
- The nine categories of accident (DM XXXIX–LIV)
- The nine highest genera (DM XXXIX)
- Quantity (DM XL–XLII)
- Continuous quantity (DM XL)
- Discrete quantity (DM XLI)
- Quality (DM XLII–XLVI)
- Quality in general (DM XLII)
- Potentiality and actuality (DM XLIII)
- Habits (DM XLIV)
- Contrariety among qualities (DM XLV)
- Intensity of quality (DM XLVI)
- Relation (DM XLVII)
- Action (DM XLVIII)
- Passion (DM XLIX)
- Time (DM L)
- Place (DM LI)
- Position (DM LII)
- Having (DM LIII)
- Beings of reason (entia rationis) (DM LIV)
As is clear from this list of topics, the Metaphysical Disputations covers a great deal of territory. In fact, again, if in a different idiom, Suárez traverses virtually all of the topics of concern to metaphysicians practicing in the periods which followed him, down even to the present day.
Suárez conducts his metaphysical inquiries against the backdrop of a pervasive commitment to nominalism, according to which only individuals exist: all extra-mental entities are singular and individual (DM VI 1.2; cf. DM V passim). Since whatever is singular and individual is not common, it follows, in Suárez’s preferred idiom, that ‘formal unity, as it exists in a thing, is incommunicable’ (DM VI 1.11). This is to say, then, that nothing extra-mental is fully shared by more than one being; hence, there are no universals, where these are conceived as mind- and language-independent entities capable of being wholly present in more than one place at one time.
Those approaching Suárez’s works for the first time, however, are confronted with not a few passages in which he seems to assert exactly the opposite. For instance:
Things which are denominated universals truly exist in reality (res quae universales denominatur vere in re existunt). First it must be established that those things we denominate universal and common are real and exist in things themselves; for we do not fabricate them mentally, but rather apprehend them and understand them to be in things, and we produce definitions, construct demonstrations, and we seek knowledge of them thus conceived (DM VI 2.1).
So, some work is required to come to terms with his approach to this issue. The effort required is, however, productive, since once one appreciates Suárez’s nominalism, many otherwise obscure remarks he makes become immediately intelligible.
In order to come to terms with Suárez’s position, the first point to appreciate is that a nominalist of his day faced an immediate, inescapable problem. It is, in fact, the very problem mentioned by Suárez in the passage cited: Aristotelian science presupposes a conception of the organization of knowledge according to which a science must proceed via demonstrations, that is, deductions, or logically valid syllogisms, the premises of which are necessary, better known than their conclusions, and universal in scope (cf. Aristotle, APo. 71b16–25, 77b5–73a6; Met. 981a5–30, 1006a6–18, 1039b27–1040a7). If the premises are universal in scope, however, then that is presumably due to their featuring universals as terms. This is why, in part, Suárez is inclined to take the claims of realism about universals seriously. Like others of his time, he embraces an Aristotelian theory of demonstration and so must confront its evident commitment to realism.
The easy way to address this commitment, of course, would simply be to embrace realism about universals. Suárez does not take the easy route. Instead, when he considers an argument for the existence of universals conceived as mind- and language-independent entities (in, for instance DM VI 1.4), he offers in response the ‘true and contrary opinion’ (DM VI 1.8–12). This is that in all real things, there is a formal unity per se, belonging to each essence or nature (DM VI 1.8). As a result, every individual is not only one in number but one essentially. Formal unity is distinguished from singular unity by reason (per rationem) (DM VI 1.9). An individual unity does not belong to some common essence just by itself; something must be added, namely formal unity. That is to say, then, nothing is a φ, a human being say, merely in virtue of its being one thing; that one thing must have in addition some definite formal character, namely being-φ. The claim that something is a unity tells us nothing determinate about an individual beyond that it is some one thing or other. By contrast, formal unity takes us directly to an essence, without any addition, even by reason. This is what Suárez means when he says that formal unity and singular unity are not one and the same. Even so, this difference is not given by the extra-mental individual (ex parte rei), but by reason alone (sed ratione tantum) (DM VI 1.10)
The common essence and the singular entity are distinguished, then, not on the basis of the nature of the thing (ex natura rei), but by reason; hence, again, there is no world-given distinction between something’s existing as an individual and its existing as this or that kind of individual: reason makes this distinction. This permits Suárez to insist that formal unity, as it exists in a thing, is incommunicable (unitas formalis prout in re existit, incommunicabilis est) (DM VI 1.11). The formal unity marches in step with the nature of a thing, and in real things there is no common nature; instead, ‘nature and essence are multiplied as many times as there are individuals’ (DM VI 1. 12). So, while formal unity at the individual level is mind- and language-independent, formal unity as common is not: it is supplied by the operations of the mind.
So, why does he say, then, that ‘things which are denominated universals truly exist in reality (res quae universales denominatur vere in re existunt; DM VI 2.1)? The crucial and characteristically subtle coloration comes from the word ‘denominated’ (denominatur). Suárez is thinking, in fact, that things called ‘universals’ really do exist—but what they turn out to be are extrinsic denominations, that is, in this case, features of individuals brought forth by the workings of the mind. He says, for instance:
Universals in reality are not separate from singulars. Secondly, it must be supposed that these things or natures which we denominate universals, are not really separated from singular things, since, as as been demonstrated above, every thing which exists is necessarily singular and individual … (DM VI. 2. 2).
His position, then, is that only individuals exist, but that a collection of individual φ-things can be—and indeed are in scientific demonstrations—regarded as having a common nature, being-φ. This is just to say, for example, that the universal predicate ‘. . . is a human’ is applied equally and rightly to Peter and Paula by a discerning mind; but that is not to say that there is a universal in which they equally partake.
That this common predication is ‘rightly’ made derives from the fact, according to Suárez, that there is an objective similarity obtaining between Peter and Paula—this similarity is not imposed by the mind, but is rather reflected in the mental apprehension ascribing a common predicate to them. This permits him to say, then:
And it follows from these considerations, first, that although some individuals may be, a parte rei, formally one apart from the thinking of the mind, nevertheless several individuals which are said to be of the same nature are not one thing with the true unity which is in the things, but only either by way of being grounded or through the intellect … It follows, secondly, that it is one thing to speak of formal unity and another thing to speak of the community of this unity, for unity is in things, as has been insisted; community, however, properly and strictly is not in things, for no unity which exists in things is common, as we have shown, but there is in singular things a certain similarity in their formal unities in which their community is grounded, which community the intellect is able attribute to such a nature, as conceived by it, which similarity is not properly unity, since it does not represent the undividedness of the entities on which it is based but only their congruence or their relation or their co-existence with one another (DM VI 1.12).
His view is, then, nominalistic. Since, however, the word ‘nominalist’ is used in different ways by different philosophers, and is, indeed, used rather austerely by some of the philosophers with whom Suárez was acquainted, we should specify precisely his variety of nominalism, in a single sentence: a universal is a being of reason (an ens rationis), properly regarded as an extrinsic denomination grounded in the intrinsic individual formal unities of mind- and language-independent things (res), as mediated by non-formally representing intelligible species related to their objects predicatively by some manner of analogy of attribution. That the representations are non-formal is, in this context, just to say that they represent their objects not as universals, but as individuals regarded as being the same, which manner of regarding them is grounded in a real fact about them, namely that they are objectively similar.
One may wish to question whether Suárez's position is defensible. What is required for understanding his conception of metaphysics, however, is recognizing that this is his position. For better or worse, Suárez is a nominalist, in the sense specified. His investigation of the causes of being respects this constraint throughout.
Suárez devotes a great deal of energy to an investigation of topics pertaining to causation, broadly construed. This is because he is interested in the first instance, as a metaphysician, in an investigation into the causes of being (DM XII–XXVII), an approach to metaphysics colored by the writings of Aristotle, the broad idiom of which Suárez, in common with other scholastics, embraces. More specifically, first, in keeping with the Aristotelian conception of science (scientia), Suárez supposes that to understand anything we must grasp and understand the causes of that thing; so, as a special case, to understand being (ens) we must investigate and understand the causes of being, taken in its most general and abstract aspect. Second, as he conceives it, causal inquiry proceeds within the context of an Aristotelian four-causal framework of explanatory adequacy: material, formal, efficient, and final. Suárez supposes, however, that to execute his study of the causes of being, it is first of all incumbent on him to understand precisely what it is for something to be a cause, but then also further, as a distinct matter, what it is for a cause to exercise its causality.
As Suárez approaches these issues, the question of what a cause is differs crucially from the question of how a cause actively brings about its effects—two questions which were often run together in later periods of philosophy. According to Suárez, one might truly say, for instance, that a doctor is a cause of health, without yet understanding the precise activity of the doctor in virtue of which he is a cause, how it is that his activity on a specific occasion qualifies as an instance of healing—how, that is, the cause exercises its causality (DM XII 2.13). To have a full understanding of the science of medicine, then, one must understand the causes of health and, further, how those causes exercise their causality, that is, how those causes manage to have the effects they have. So too, then, with the causes of being. To understand being, we must understand what brings being about, in the broadest possible sense—what is responsible for being (ens). Thereafter, we must come to terms with what causes individual beings (entia) to come into existence, or to change their manner of existence once they have come into existence. This involves reflection on all the causes of being, however many and of whatever kinds they may be. It further involves reflection on the narrower question of how the causes of being exercise their causality—how precisely, that is, such causes come to be responsible for being. This, then, licenses, or indeed requires, Suárez to engage in a thorough examination of causation itself.
The fifteen disputations in which Suárez explores these matters (DM XII–XXVII) consequently contain extended, intricate discussions of each of the four causes, as well as detailed explorations of how each cause effects its causality on a specific occasion. In general, he urges, a cause is a sort of origin or source (a principium). But what sort of source or origin? Not every source or origin qualifies as a cause (a journey from Athens to Jerusalem begins in Athens, but Athens is not the cause of this journey). Suárez notes that certain of his contemporaries sought to characterize the relevant sort of principle simply as that on which other things depend as such (DM XII 2.4: causa est id a quo aliquid per se pendet); but he sets aside this formulation in favor of one which, if initially odder sounding, is more contentful and characteristic of the idiom within which he works. He thinks that a cause is the sort of principle that “in its own right imparts being to something else” (causa est principium per se influens esse in aliud: DM XII 2.4). One reason his approach sounds odd is that talk of one thing's “imparting being”, or perhaps even of one thing's “flowing being into” (influens esse) another thing, is initially hard to fathom. This fact does not escape Suárez, however. Indeed, he calls attention to this very word “flowing” (influens) and glosses it simply as “giving” or “communicating” being to another thing (dandi vel communicandi esse alteri). So at the most general level, a cause is the sort of principle or source which can impart being to another being—that is to say, then, that a cause is something that makes something exist or makes something already existing come to exist in a new and different way.
Of course, this generic formulation by itself tells us very little, but that too is by design. On the overarching approach favored by Suárez, causation is initially very broadly characterized: a cause, taken most generically, is responsible for the existence or features of some being beyond itself; and an exercise of causality is precisely the activity by which a cause imparts existence to another, by creating it, or altering its features once it exists. As he moves through each of the four ways one thing might be responsible for the existence or features of another, Suárez brings content and specificity to his first generic notion, by explicating the various ways each of four causes manages to impart being to some being beyond itself.
In fact, this general approach to causation encourages Suárez to treat the subject so broadly that, for instance, he devotes an entire disputation (DM XIX, of some 39,000 words), one of the six disputations given over to efficient causation (DM XVII–XXII), to the topics of necessity and contingency, fate and luck, freedom of the will, and issues pertaining to God's freedom in creation. He even indulges in this disputation on efficient causation in a discussion of the question of whether there could be contingency in the world if—(in his view) contrary to modal fact—God were necessitated to create the world as it is. This discussion offers a good example of the richly metaphysical character of Suárez's general philosophical outlook: he very often engages not only in counterfactual reasoning, but in counterfactual reasoning featuring counterfactuals with impossible antecedents. Such reasoning permits him to make fine-grained, highly intensional discriminations that would otherwise be inaccessible to him. Thus, with respect to the current illustration, he concludes that there could indeed be contingency in the world if it were the case that God, per impossibile, was necessitated to create the world just as we find it. This finding, whether or not ultimately defensible, then permits him to make further, finer-grained distinctions among different types of contingency, and so also among different types of modality: physical, nomic, and logical.
When focusing on the nature of the individual causes seriatim, Suárez begins by dividing the four causes into the internal and external (or intrinsic and extrinsic; DM XII 3.19). Formal and material causes are internal, whereas efficient and final causes are external. A thing's matter accounts for the material features of the thing which it constitutes, without actually being that thing; and the same again for the form. So, for example, a statue is malleable because it is made of bronze, though that quantity of bronze in virtue of which it is malleable is not identical with the statue, since it may exist when the statue does not; and the bronze statue is a statue of Hermes because of its form, which, like its matter, can be readily thought of as a constituent of the statue without being identified with the statue, which is itself neither exhaustively matter nor form, but a composite of both. In Suárez's terms, then, matter and form conform to the general definition of a cause, because each in its own way infuses something beyond itself—the statue—with its existence and features. Each manages to give some manner of being (esse) to the statue, even they are in different ways internal to the entity whose being they influence. By contrast, neither of the statue's external causes—the efficient cause, that is, the sculptor who sculpts the bronze so as to give it this or that form, and its final cause, that is, the goal or reason the sculptor has in view when sculpting—is a constituent of the statue. They are thus external causes in Suárez's terminology.
Within this overarching framework, Suárez proceeds to investigate each of the four causes minutely. One immediately appreciates when studying his treatment of these issues a level of detail and sophistication plainly lacking in many of the accounts of causation written in the several centuries after his death. It is difficult to believe, for example, that Hume's modest and cursory suggestion, in An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, that a cause is “an object, followed by another, and where all the objects similar to the first, are followed by objects similar to the second” (Hume 1993 , II.7) is an advance in nuance or sophistication over Suárez's the protracted discussions of the Metaphysical Disputations.
However that may be, one is confronted in this work with a discussion which is by any measure rich, intricate, and comprehensive. Each of the four causes receives it own extended treatment in the sections of the Metaphysical Disputations dedicated to the causes of being (DM XII–XXVII). To come to see the character of these discussions, we may reflect especially on Suarez's presentation of two of the four causes in particular, one internal and one external. His treatments of formal and final causes are in any case of special note, since each in its own way represents a departure and development from the very Aristotelian tradition which forms the basic foundation for Suárez's metaphysics.
Suárez's treatment of formal causation provides a good example. He begins his treatment of the formal cause in his typical fashion, by showing it conforms to his overarching causal framework. A standard textbook account of formal causation familiar to Suárez holds simply that “form in an internal cause that gives being to a thing” (causa intrinseca quae dat esse rei: DM XII 3.3). This approach certainly comports with his basic framework for causation, at least in general terms. Suárez is, however, unwilling to adopt this formula unqualifiedly, since he thinks the other internal cause, matter, has a causal efficacy of its own, not parasitic on the causality of form. Thus, when he comes to give an account of the most significant kind of formal cause, the substantial form, he offers the following definition:
x is a substantial form =df x is a definite simple and incomplete substance, which, as the actuality of matter, constitutes with it the essence of composite substance (forma est substantia quaedam simplex et incompleta, quae ut actus materiae cum ea constituit essentiam substantiae compositae: DM XV 5.1)
Suárez here insists that it is the form together with the matter (cum ea) which constitutes the essence of a substantial composite. He thinks, then, that matter has, so to speak, its own independent causal pathway as an internal cause. Even though the substantial form is the actuality of the matter, this does not deprive matter of its causal efficacy. In this respect, he parts company from a good many of his contemporaries and predecessors, who had opted for the simpler formulation, often by representing the causal efficacy of matter as somehow parasitic on the causality of the form.
If this shows some development by acknowledging the independent role of matter in causation and explanation, it is also likely to appear retrograde in its basic appeal to the apparatus of formal causation. Indeed, in Metaphysical Disputations XV Suárez takes up in detail a question about substantial forms which has a special resonance because of the contumely poured on this doctrine by philosophers writing in the centuries after his death, many of whom were self-consciously concerned to distance themselves from the entire idea of formal causation—a doctrine they regarded as noxious, obscurantist, and explanatorily vacuous. Locke, for instance, in his Essay Concerning Human Understanding, derided his predecessors for their “fruitless Enquiries after substantial Forms, wholly unintelligible, and whereof we have scarce so much as any obscure, or confused Conception in general.” (Locke 1976 : 3.6.10)
Locke's reaction was in many ways typical of the general tenor of post-scholastic rejections of substantial form in that he founded his charges of unintelligibility largely on epistemic considerations: the fruitlessness of substantial forms, he thinks, is shown most readily by their empirical inadequacy. We have, he complains, no experience of them at all, and therefore, no idea of what we might be taking ourselves to be positing. This is in part because Locke conflates the notion of substance with that of substratum, which he derides as a something “I know not what, [introduced] to support those ideas we call accidents” (Locke 1976 : 2.23.15).
It is striking that Suárez, a staunch defender of substantial forms, in a way agrees the Locke's dominant complaint. At any rate, he thinks that we might have only two reasons for accepting substantial forms:
The first reason for doubting that substantial forms exist is that they cannot be known by any experience (ratio dubitandi est primo quia formae substantiales nullo experimento cognosci possunt); nor are they necessary [to account for] the actions and differences in things which we do experience. Therefore, lacking any [sufficient] reason, they are not to be introduced (DM XV 1.1).
There are two distinct succinctly stated arguments here. First, if we can have no experience of substantial forms, we have reason for doubting their existence. Second, if we have no need to posit them to explain the phenomena we do experience, then, again, we have reason to doubt their existence. These arguments are clearly connected, though discrete, in that the second becomes dialectically salient precisely when the first is endorsed. If one grants that we have reason to doubt the existence of substantial forms insofar as we never experience them directly, the question immediately arises as to whether we have some indirect, non-experiential reason for granting them. The proponent of the second argument contends that we do not.
What is striking is that Suárez simply grants the first premise of the first argument, and so effectively cedes the point on which Locke later laid so much emphasis: we have no direct experience of substantial forms. Hence, he agrees, we have some reason for doubting their existence. Needless to say, however, Suárez does not join Locke or any of the many philosophers who followed him in finally casting substantial forms aside. This is because he roundly rejects the first premise of the second argument, according to which it is not necessary to posit substantial forms to explain other data known to us through experience. Suárez counters that, on the contrary, substantial forms have significant explanatory work to do. He concludes, then, that to the extent that this is so, we have reason to countenance their existence after all.
His argument for the existence of substantial forms is thus effectively abductive: for some range of data or phenomena, Suárez contends, some explanation is required, and the only, or, more weakly, the best, explanation of these phenomena involves a commitment to substantial forms. So, his general argument schema is clear: (i) some phenomenon φ requires explanation; (ii) the only or best explanation of φ is the existence of substantial forms; hence, (iii) there are substantial forms. The argument thus assumes that the phenomena in question both obtain and are not primitive, that is, that we are confronted with some data for which some form of explanation is both wanting and available.
What are these phenomena? In Metaphysical Disputations XV, Suárez appeals most forcefully to the following four: first, we find accidents unified in a single subject (DM XV 1.7); second, as a related matter, we observe various properties in a single subject, both essential and accidental, standing in superordination and subordination relations to one another (DM XV 1.14); third, we experience various entities coming into and going out of existence, suffering, in his preferred idiom, generation and corruption (DM XV 1.7); and finally, we observe various physical systems, including especially (but not only) living beings manifesting equilibrium states which they maintain unless put under pressure, and to which they return when a pressure applied has been relieved (DM XV 1.8).
The arguments for these claims are varied, but in each case show great sensitivity to matters of systematicity and unity. To explicate the first, by way of illustration, Suárez appeals to the simple thought that there are privileged unities in our world. He thinks it plain—and does not dally to offer an argument—that, for instance, Socrates is a unified being, who exists in a specific place and time, that he is a human being who eats, sleeps, grows, diminishes and dies. By contrast, the mereological sum of Socrates, the Pinturricchio frescoes in the Bufalini Chapel in Rome, and a volume of water equal to one pint in somewhere in the Indian Ocean is no such unity. There is, of course, a mereological sum of these three diverse items; but this sum does not exhibit the form of unity we observe in Socrates. By the same token, Socrates is himself a mereological sum of various atoms. Suárez takes it for granted that he is also a mind- and language-independent privileged unity. If he is right, then this further fact is either primitive or explicable. Suárez thinks it explicable rather than primitive and tenders the existence of substantial forms—in this case the form of being a human being—as the appropriate explanatory posit.
Needless to say, this last step requires further amplification and defence if it is to be at all credible. Again, however, one can see, at a bare minimum, that Suárez has fully anticipated objections to his views later taken as decisive; yet many of those unreflectively satisfied by those later objections seem to show no awareness of his anticipations.
In offering his spirited and protracted defense of substantial forms, and of formal causation more generally, Suárez shows himself aware of the need to articulate and defend core features of his broadly Aristotelian framework, including some which later came in for harsh criticism. Indeed, in the case of substantial forms, these criticisms were finding voice already during his lifetime; he was, for instance, an older contemporary of Descartes (b. 1596), who was twenty years old when Suárez died in 1617. Descartes simply reports without argument that substantial forms are “a philosophical being unknown to me” (Letter to Morin, 12 September 1638; Descartes 1984: 122). Because he is alert to such concerns, and addresses them directly, Suárez appears to many historians of philosophy as a sort of bridge figure between scholastic and early modern philosophy. That may or may not be so, depending on the principles of periodization presupposed by those offering this sort of judgment. What is clearly true, however, is that he very often develops Aristotelian theses in a manner betraying a willingness to abandon those features of Aristotelianism which were to come in for the harshest treatment by philosophers subsequent to him.
One such thesis pertains to his attitude towards teleological causation. He endorses its centrality to his framework, but recognizes that it requires articulation and defense. In the Metaphysical Disputations it receives both:
Although a final cause is in a certain way more eminent than all others and even prior [to them], its nature of causing is, nevertheless, more obscure and for that reason was almost entirely unknown to the ancient philosophers… For this reason … in order to explain this more thoroughly and to resolve the difficulties, it should first be inquired as to whether an end is a cause, then in what manner and what it causes, and also how many kinds of ends there are and what the nature of causing is for each one of them (DM XXIII 1.1)
Here, as elsewhere, Suárez shows himself to be aware of many of the sorts of problem that came to form the basis for the widespread rejection of teleological causation. Whether this redounds to his credit, given his affirmation of their centrality to causation in general, is an independent question.
We find him wondering expressly whether we are right to call the final cause a cause at all:
But that any whichever of these is a true cause can easily be proven indeed in the case of material, formal, and efficient [causes], for any whatever of these manifestly inflows some being… But concerning the final cause there can be some reason for doubting, since no real being is presupposed in it by which it could cause (De fine vero potest esse nonnulla dubitandi ratio, quia nullum esse reale in eo praesupponitur, quo causare possit: DM XIII 3.3)
The worry, according to Suárez is that the final cause perhaps has no “real being” (esse reale), in which case it could not enter into any kind of causal relation. In so speaking, he is not just saying in a colorful way that perhaps the final cause does not exist, but rather that it is perhaps a mere fictum, that possibly all of our appeals to final causation are merely convenient fictions, able in principle to be replaced by appeals to other kinds of cause, those with real being, like efficient causes. If Ponce de León travelled to Florida in order to find the Fountain of Youth, that is well and good; but the Fountain of Youth does not exist—it has no esse reale—and so it hardly caused him to do anything at all.
In more detail, Suárez offers six distinct worries about final causation (DM XXIII 1.1–6): (i) Every cause is a principium, but no end is a principium; hence, no end is a cause of any kind; (ii) every cause infuses being (influit esse) into its effect; no end does so; hence, no end is a cause: (iii) a form is an end; if an end were a real cause, form would thus have to cause itself; nothing causes itself; hence the end is not a real cause; (iv) if an end is real cause, then it is also a moving principle, and no end is a moving principle; hence, no end is a cause; (v) natural agents (here Suárez is thinking of elements and beasts) have determinate propensities; the postulation of ends for beings with determinate propensities is idle; hence, the postulation of final causes for natural agents lacks sufficient foundation; (vi) one cannot specify what or in relation to what (quid vel circa quid) a final cause causes; if not, then a final cause does not impart motion; hence, a final cause is not a cause.
In different ways, these objections call into question the status of the final cause as cause. Some of them directly anticipate and address the sorts of considerations which came to dominate later, often caustic rejections of final causation.
Be that as it may, Suárez roundly affirms final causation. It is noteworthy, however, that he does so by offering significant concessions to what came to be the textbook rejections of final causation:
Although the end is last in execution, nevertheless it is first in intention and under that aspect has the true nature of a principle. Moreover, the principle is not a fictum but is true and real (verum et reale), since it truly excites and moves. Hence, just as it has sufficient being by which it can exercise the sort of nature a principle has, so also it has the nature of a cause (DM XII 3.3).
The endorsement is clear. The concession comes in the phrases “first in intention” (primum in intentione) and “under that aspect” (sub ea ratione), where Suárez allows that a final cause qualifies as a cause only because and to the degree that it is conceived by an intentional agent. This, then, removes final causation from the realm of non-intentional nature, even while affirming that final causes play an ineliminable role in psychological explanation, particularly as regards intentional action.
In a positive vein, Suárez argues on behalf of final causes by means of a simple counterfactual argument. One might say, for instance, that someone made a journey to the store in order to buy milk. The buying of milk, then, is the final cause of that journey. If it were discovered that store had unfortunately run out of milk, then, suggests Suárez, the milk, or the buying of the milk, would remain the final cause of the action all the same; otherwise there would have been no journey. To the rejoinder that the actual cause was not the milk, but the agent's desire to buy milk, coupled with her belief that milk was to be had at the store, Suárez readily agrees—but then insists that the desire would not be the desire it was were it not a desire for buying milk. He contends, in other words, that the identity conditions of any desire to buy milk derive from the end, which is to say that final causation remains in play in the sphere of intentional action by providing the very identity conditions of the desires which serve as efficient causes of intentional action. Still, this reasoning, positive though it is, also contains a large concession: final causes are implicated in the efficient causal realm only under the aspect of intentionality. This is why Suárez ultimately concludes:
I say first: in order for an end to cause, it is altogether necessary that it be cognised in advance. (Dico ergo primo: ut finis causet, necessarium omnino est ut praecognitus sit: DM XXIII 7.2)
Suárez seems to have conceded a great deal to the critics of final causation in allowing that every final cause remains at root implicated in the realm of the intentional. Still, again, he makes this concession only by way of affirming the existence of final causes. He has thereby also, however, evidently maneuvered himself into an uncomfortable position whereby the Fountain of Youth, for instance, is a final cause, even though it has no real being (esse reale). Yet he himself insists that nothing is a cause, or principium in general, without having real being. He thus owes an explanation of how he avoids falling into a direct contradiction on this point. The Fountain of Youth cannot both lack real being and be a cause, of any kind.
He offers his explanation in last chapter of his Metaphysical Disputations, which is dedicated to beings of reason (entia rationis). This disputation is independently interesting because it engages a question which has continued to fascinate metaphysicians down to the present day, though it has taken various forms in various periods of inquiry. This is the question of how we are to speak (or think) about things that are not. If something is unavailable to be spoken or thought about, then, presumably, we do not speak or think about it. After all, as Suárez notes, non-existing beings of reason about which we pretend to think or speak
are neither true, real beings, because they are not capable of real and true existence, nor indeed do they have any true likeness with real beings. (DM LIV 1.4)
Still, according to Suárez, we can and do think and speak about beings of reason. It follows, then, that we do speak and think about things which do not exist. It falls to the metaphysician to offer an account of how this might be so. Indeed, for better or worse, the metaphysician must address the topic of beings of reason, not least because, invariably and inevitably, such (non-)beings force themselves into view along the periphery of any inquiry into real beings. To take but one example, even if we think that there is no void, indeed even if we think that it is impossible that there should be a void, and so think that the void is merely a being of reason, we will find ourselves discussing “the void” when investigating the characteristics of space, motion, matter, and quantity. We may ask, for instance, whether the existence of motion requires the existence of the void, and, even if we decide that it does not, our inquiry into space and motion—certainly appropriate topics of inquiry for the metaphysician—has led us to consideration of a non-existing being, the void. So, in Suárez's terms, inquiry into beings inevitably propels the metaphysician into consideration of non-existing beings of reason. So, entia rationis—these non-beings—require a treatment by the student of being.
It is first of all striking in Suárez's treatment that the class of entia rationis includes a seeming motley of cases, extending beyond non-existing objects of thought and reference (and so beyond non-existent final causes). In addition to final causes which are not, the student of being finds himself confronted with true-sounding appeals to phantasmagorical and mythical beasts and creatures of fiction of various sorts, even though their subjects have vacuous reference (“Pegasus is a winged horse”). More importantly, Suárez countenances a whole range of other non-beings among entia rationis, some of which are more pedestrian than creatures of fiction: negations, such as being not-human; privations, that is, lacks keyed to positive properties, such as blindness; and also (what he takes to be mere) logical abstractions, such as being a consequent or an antecedent; and taxonomical categories, which, in view of his general nominalism, he takes to be mere metaphysical abstractions, such as species and genus.
The first thing to notice about this list is its heterogeneity. Suárez is interested in a group of entities, broadly conceived, that end up in metaphysical discourse even though they do not exist. Note, too, that he does not say that such entities do not exist “strictly speaking” or “fully” or “really” or that they exist “in the mind or imagination only”. Instead he insists: they do not exist. Even so, in metaphysics and physics, we speak of genera and species; in logic, of antecedents and consequences; in causation and metaphysics more broadly, of privations; and in many walks of life, of non-existent entities, often enough innocently imputing causal profiles to them.
Focusing on the last case, which is in any case the most colorful and captivating, Suárez argues that it falls to the metaphysician to come to terms with such true sentences such as “The gryphon is fierce”, “Gryphons do not exist”, and even “The gryphon frightened the children to the point where some of them began to cry uncontrollably”. How can these sentences be true, when there is nothing here about which one may talk or think? What must be the case, if these sentences are to be accepted as true? Perhaps, one may think, the gryphon must exist in some way, if it is to be fierce; that if it can be said not to exist, then it—the thing about which the speaker is speaking—must exist in some one way but not in some other; and, most of all, that if it is to be implicated in the causal network, it certainly must exist—or else it could not stand in a causal relation to anything at all. Indeed, Suárez himself gives voice to just these sorts of contention in other contexts. For example, this last observation is perfectly reflected in a claim he makes about the necessary conditions of formal causation: “The first requisite [for formal causation] is the actual existence of a form itself” (prima est actualis existentia ipsius formae: DM XV 6.3). The question, then, is how beings of reason can enter the causal network if they fail this first requirement of any cause: that it exist.
At first it may seem as if Suárez intends to hold that beings of reason do, in fact, have some mode of existence, perhaps some sort of subsistence or some mode of being short of the sort manifested by what he calls “true, real beings”. For instance, he contends that “beings of reason must be granted” (DM XLIV 1.4), and then hastens to add that:
such beings are neither true, real beings, because they are not capable of real and true existence, nor indeed do they have any true likeness with real beings—[any likeness, that is,] in terms of whose account they would have a common concept of being with them. (DM XLIV 1.4).
He also insists that: “fictitious things … or beings of reason, are not said to endure truly and properly, because they do not exist” (DM L 1.1). So, again, it may seem as if he means to contend that they exist, though not in the manner of true and real beings, or, again, insofar as they may be said to endure at all, they do so not truly or but rather only improperly.
This is not at all, however, his view of entia rationis. His approach to them is in one way disarmingly simple: he insists that they do not exist (Shields 2012b). Even so, he maintains, one may freely speak of them as if they existed. Indeed, just as “they are fashioned or apprehended as if they truly existed, they are further conceived as if they endured”. His view, more fully:
Again, that objective being, even though the being of reason in itself is nothing, still necessarily supposes some real being, on which it is founded, or from whose denomination or relation that objective being quasi-results (quasi resultet). Therefore, that cause which produced such a real being is the cause of the being of reason (DM LIV 2.3).
His picture is that beings of reason are such that, although they do not exist, one may speak and think as if they existed, where the thinking in question is a real, existing formal structure in the mind of an actual thinker. Thinking is in this way contentful, because founded in some real feature of some real thinker, but not therefore such as to take an object. One may think of Socrates or one may think of a gryphon; the gryphon's being thought, however, unlike Socrates's being thought, is not an extrinsic denomination of the gryphon, as it is of Socrates; for Socrates is and the gryphon is not. Were there a gryphon, says Suárez, the formal structure of the thinker would indeed give rise to an extrinsic denomination of it, no more or less that Socrates's being thought gives rise to such a feature of him. Still, he insists, because there is not such a gryphon, there is not such a feature to be had by him.
In short, then, the content of the thought derives from the real, formal structure in the mind of the thinker and not from the object. That holds fixed across all episodes of thought. It is just that some thoughts are about something and others about nothing at all. Their being about nothing, insists Suárez, hardly robs them of their contentfulness: the motion of a missed punch is a real motion, and not the same as the motion of a missed kick; but neither makes contact, and so in neither case is there something contacted, something kicked or punched. On the contrary, nothing is kicked in a missed kick, and nothing punched in a missed punch. In the same way, then, nothing is thought or referred to when there is no object of thought or reference. In such cases, all the causation involved eventuates from and reaches only the actual formal structures of an actual mind:
all that efficient [causation] is terminated—as to a terminus of real production—at the formal concept of the mind itself, and it stops there. (tota vero illa efficientia, ut ad terminum realis productionis terminatur ad formalem conceptum ipsius mentis, et ibi sistit: DM LIV 2.3)
Taking all that together, S can speak of the gryphon, though there is no gryphon there to be spoken of; and the thinking in this case is in all respects like the thinking that goes on in one who is thinking of Socrates. The difference is that Socrates comes to have an extrinsic denomination—being thought of by S—whereas the gryphon, who does not exist, does not acquire this or any other denomination, extrinsic or intrinsic. There is, nonetheless, a fact about the world such that were there to be a gryphon, it would have acquired such a denomination, precisely because some actual person would have been in the relevant state of thinking about it.
Exactly the same holds true, according to Suárez, of the other sorts of entia rationis he countenances: negations, privations, and abstractions. They are not, but this does not preclude our thinking of them and speaking about them. Our doing so in no way invests them with existence of any kind. This is how Suárez insists that entia rationis “must be granted” even though they lack “any true likeness with real beings” (DM LIV 1.4).
Needless to say, Suárez regarded God as a being and not a being of reason. He also thought that unaided natural reason could go a long way towards providing a philosophically tenable description of the nature of God. Because of this, he devoted two book-length disputations, Metaphysical Disputations XXIX and XXX to the topics of God’s existence and nature, the second of which, devoted to God’s nature, comprises 17 sections covering his essence and attributes, insofar as these are accessible to human reasoning.
In his treatment of God’s attributes, Suárez concentrates on perfection, infinitude,, simplicity, immutability, oneness, invisibility incomprehensibility, and ineffability; he also investigates God’s life, knowledge, will, omnipotence, and omnipresence. The breadth, extension, and detail of Suárez’s discussion makes it impossible to consider all of these topics here. We may, however, consider a subset of these attributes as representative of his approach: perfection, infinitude, simplicity, and immensity or omnipresence. Here we treat only the foundational topic of God’s perfection.
Suárez maintains, in common with many others of his period, that God’s attributes can be known by us as they truly are only by means of a manifest vision of him, something made possible only through his supernatural aid. Even so, natural reason can offer a limited knowledge of God and can proceed, according to Suárez, in two different ways. It can deduce divine attributes from the knowledge of the effects of divine operation (a posteriori). Alternatively, it can proceed by deducing one attribute from another (a priori) (DM XXX.1. intro). Suárez applies both of these demonstrative methods to each of the divine attributes in turn.
Can it be demonstrated by natural reason that God is by his essence an absolutely perfect being? This question is immediately complicated by the fact that Suárez recognizes two central senses of ‘perfection’ (DM XXX.1.1). In one sense, which he calls ‘privative’, what is perfect is whole and lacks nothing required by its nature; in these sense we could speak, for instance, of a perfect horse. In a second sense, which Suárez calls ‘negative or absolute’, we refer to what is absolutely perfect—perfect, that is, not relative to the standard set by a thing’s nature but in absolute terms. Such perfect entities necessarily have or contain every other perfection. Suárez wishes to demonstrate that it belongs to the essence of God to be perfect in both of these senses.
Suárez believes that imperfection in the sense of lacking something that is due to nature always comes from external causes. A horse without tail is a horse which had its tail removed or was somehow prevented from growing one. But there is nothing capable of making God less than perfect in this sense: nothing can damage him or otherwise interfere with his perfection. God is not vulnerable to imperfection coming from without (DM XXX.1.2). This can be shown a priori, Suárez contends, by reasoning from God’s other attributes. In the first instance, we can deduce God’s perfection from his simplicity; because he is simple, God is non-composite. Since partless entities cannot be partially diminished, but either exist totally or are totally destroyed, it follows that if God is simple, and exists, he must be perfect in the sense of being complete (DM XXX.1.2).
Let us turn now to absolute perfection. Every perfection, says Suárez, is either created or uncreated. If a perfect entity is uncreated, that entity must be God. If, however, something is created, it owes its existence to God. Created perfection is the effect of a cause able to bring about such an effect . According to a causal principle held in common by Suárez and many of his peers, this cause must be more noble and more excellent than its effect (if only in the sense that it possesses perfection in itself and not as caused by something else). From this, Suárez deduces that it belongs to the essence of God to posses in some way the perfections of all created beings in a mode that is more noble than the way in which these perfections exist in created beings. This, then, constitutes his a posteriori proof for God’s absolute perfection (DM XXX 1.4).
Suárez thinks that God’s absolute perfection can also be demonstrated a priori. As the first cause of everything and the most necessary being, it is necessary that God is also first in absolute perfection. Suárez adds that the very idea of perfection requires us to posit a completely perfect thing to serve as standard for other beings admitting of degrees of perfection. This standard, he infers, must be God (DM XXX.1.5).
Suárez notes, however, that his view that the most perfect being must be understood as containing the perfections of all other beings is not self-evident and requires being argued for as it is liable to be wrongly interpreted. Human beings are more perfect than kangaroos, for example, but do not contain within themselves the perfections of kangaroos (for one thing, we cannot hop as high) (DM XXX 1.5).
Suárez maintains instead that God is not simply and in fact more perfect than all other beings: he is more perfect in so far as he is the first principle or origin of all the perfections of all other beings. To be the first principle or origin of another is not just to be more perfect than every other thing: a first principle must additionally be more perfect in a determinate way than the perfections of the beings for whose perfections he serves as an origin. This determinate way of being perfect Suárez labels ‘eminent’.
A second a priori proof offered by Suárez (DM XXX.1.6) is that: (i) God is the most perfect not only of all existing beings but also of all possible beings; (ii) therefore—for reasons explained below—God must be perfect in a higher sense than all other possible beings; (iii) this higher sense of perfection consists in containing the perfections of all other possible beings. The first premise (i) is shown thus: if there is a more perfect being than God, either it is a necessary being and exists in act, or it is not yet existent and would be produced by something else in order to exist. If this other, productive entity already exists, then we do not have a possible being which more perfect than every actual being. On the other hand, this entity could not be merely possible, since a less perfect being cannot create a more perfect being. The question thus arises: who or what would be able to create it? It follows, then, that it is not possible to think of a possible being more perfect than God. That (ii) follows from (i) is shown thus: if the first being does not contain all the perfections of other beings, it is not the most perfect of all possible beings since in that instance one could think of a possible being that is at least as perfect as the first being. It would then contain all the other perfections.
Suárez suggests a third a priori proof as well: the first being must be more perfect than any other being not in specific respects but absolutely, which is to say in all respects. Thus, for instance, human beings are more perfect than dogs in most respects, but not as concerns their olfactory capacity. God must be more perfect in every respect and for this reason he must include all the perfections of lesser beings (DM XXX.1.7).
One might be tempted to infer on this basis that God must have the perfections of all lesser beings in the same mode as they exist in those beings. Suárez rejects this inference. Following other theologians, he distinguishes between absolute and secundum quid perfections. Absolute perfections are those that can inhere without conflict or opposition in the same thing. These, then, belong to the very idea (or “formal concept”) of God. By contrast, the secundum quid perfections can be incompatible with one another and can be hypothetical in the sense that they presuppose some imperfection in that in which they inhere (for example, sensory perception seems to involve the imperfection of being unable to know the qualities of things perceived in an unmediated way. So, we could not say that God “sees” in the sense we see). So, God has that perfection “eminently”, which means that his creative essence has the capacity to communicate to or cause these perfections in beings (for example to communicate the capacity of vision to us) (DM XXX.1.8).
The absolute (non-secundum quid) perfections are possessed by God formally (that is, not eminently). These perfections are also attributed to creatures, but not, then, in the same way. God is wise, but his wisdom has only some formal fittingness (covenientia) to ours. For Suárez, our talk about God’s absolute perfections is analogical.
Suárez thus entered deeply into the metaphysical debates of his day. He was hardly, however, therefore indifferent to other, more practical areas of philosophy and society. Along with his fellow scholastic theologians, Suárez was deeply interested in moral and social goodness and cared greatly about the sphere of human action. Also like his fellow scholastics, he tended to preface his treatment of the moral goodness and badness of human actions with a discussion on the nature of the morality of action as such. The morality of human actions, he held, is that by virtue of which a human action can contract the species of goodness or badness (De bonitate et malitia actuum humanorum, disp. 1, proem, in Suárez, Opera omnia IV). To use an analogy: there is bad art and good art, but there are also properties which make an object a work of art, that is, an object which can be specified as good or bad qua work of art. For Suárez, in distinction to some present-day moral theorists, the nature of an act cannot be divorced from the mode of its production; neither, then, can its normative evaluation.
Suárez operated in a context where the two main competing views of the nature of morality were that: (1) the morality of the act consists in its being in principle able to conform to the external standards provided by reason; and (2) the morality of the act belongs to the act itself, quite apart from any external standards.
Suárez, against Vázquez (Vázquez 1608: I, 414, d. 73 c. 9 n. 43), held the second view. For him, the morality of the act consists in its dependence on volition as the productive impetus behind the act and on reason as the guiding set of rules that the agent takes herself to be guided by in shaping the precise characteristics of the act (De bonitate, sect. 2, n. 15). Suárez provides the parallel of the production of an artefact. An artefact can be evaluated by the standards applying to artefacts (say, beauty or ugliness), because its producer took herself to be guided, in the act of production, by the rules of her art (De bonitate, sect. 2, n. 17). The mode of production defines the nature of the object. Thus, two objects that look identical may be susceptible to different standards of judgment, because one might be an artefact (say, a carved stone) and the other not (say, a stone which fell from a cliff and broke, resulting in the same shape as the carved stone).
For Suárez, it was important to argue that the morality of human action belongs to the act itself. This he regarded as a necessary precondition to arguing that the moral goodness or badness of actions can be ascertained regardless of the presence of commanding or prohibiting divine law. If acts are to have pre-positive moral properties, they must also have a pre-positive aptitude to be morally good or bad.
Operating within this basic framework of morality, Suárez developed a theory of natural law that has attracted much attention despite his consciously attempting to position himself midway between two radically opposed views about natural law. There was, on the one hand, extreme naturalism, which he attributed to Gregory of Rimini (DL II, 6.3). According to extreme naturalism, the moral law does not require an exercise of legislative will by God. The natural goodness and badness of actions exhaustively generates all our moral obligations. Even if God had not have given us laws, or even, indeed, if God had not existed at all, on the version of extreme naturalism favored by Gregory of Rimini, all the presently existing moral duties would still apply.
At the other extreme was the voluntarism attributed by Suárez (rightly or wrongly) to William of Ockham and to a lesser extent also to Duns Scotus (DL I, 6.4). According to this view, actions have no intrinsic (pre-positive) goodness or badness (or, even if they have some goodness and badness, this does not determine or constrain what we ought to do). Obligations come from divine commands resulting from the free exercise of God's will. Further, in this view, God is entirely free as to the content of the moral law. Should God command us to hate him, then this is what we ought to do.
As is characteristic of his general approach to his predecessors, Suárez disagrees with both views without wholly disregarding either. He agrees that natural law, if it is genuine “law”, requires an act of imperium, a command by the legislator expressing his will. Therefore, any obligation falling under natural law derives its moral force from God's legislative act (DL I, 5.13). In Suárez's terminology, natural law is not “indicative”; it is not merely a way of telling us about what is good and what is morally bad in itself. Rather it is “preceptive”: it creates obligations that would otherwise not exist.
So far, then, Suárez's position agrees with voluntarism. He also, however, believes that what is naturally good is necessarily commanded by God and what is naturally bad is necessarily prohibited. Therefore, the content of natural law, unlike its binding force, does not have a positive source. Rather, it is dictated by created nature itself, to which God's commands respond.
Interpreters disagree on whether Suárez leaves room for pre-positive moral duties (that is, moral duties which do not draw their binding force from God's commands) and on whether, if this is in fact the case, such duties are compatible with his general account of natural law. At the center of the debate is Suárez's assertion that the performance of an intrinsically bad action constitutes sinning and involves culpa (guilt/blame) regardless of a prohibition from above. According to John Finnis, this amounts to positing the existence of pre-positive obligations incompatible with Suárez's view that all law involves the expression of the will of a superior (Finnis 1980: 46–49). Thomas Pink construes Suárez's theory of natural law in a way that aims to avoid the incoherence produced by pre-positive obligations. On his construal, the expression of a superior's will gives us additional reasons to perform an act that is already obligatory by reason of its intrinsic moral properties (Pink 2005: 42).
Still, thus far Finnis's charge of incoherence remains a threat. After all, Suárez does say that the force to oblige (vis obligandi) can only come from an act of will. A solution is provided by Terence Irwin. In his reading, what intrinsic moral properties of actions generate are not obligations, but rather duties (debita) (Irwin 2012). Obligations, unlike duties, involve a sort of “moral motion”. The idea is that obligations constitute an act of imposing an obligation, an obliging. Obliging is the tool the holder of legitimate power has in order to move those under his command to do some actions and refrain from others. As is clear from Suárez's discussions on the influx of divine grace, God's grace moves us morally (rather than physically) by making the performance of some good actions more attractive to reason than they would otherwise be (De Gratia Dei seu de Deo Salvatore, III.41.3, in Suárez, Opera omnia VIII). Intrinsic goodness does not involve an obliging because it is not impelling us to do anything; unlike the presence of law or the effect of grace, intrinsic goodness is not a new influx that was not there before. But this is not to say that intrinsic goodness does not exert a rational attraction on moral agents; it is simply that our natural tendency to do what is good is not the result of any sort of moving or pushing. In this reading, there is no contradiction between making room for the existence of pre-positive duties and insisting that obligations only originate in law. The distinction between obligations and duties is not merely a verbal one, but points to the difference between what in Aristotelian terms would be an efficient and final cause of motion.
It emerges, then, that Suárez's theory of natural law is less comprehensive than some have thought: it covers, qua lawful, only those “oughts” that result from the command of the superior.
What, if anything, makes political subjection legitimate? For Suárez, the question is compelling given that “man is by his nature free and subject to no one, save only to the Creator” (DL III, 1.1).
As Suárez conceives of the basic position of humanity, the inhabitants of a hypothetical pre-political state would have two main reasons to try to transcend it. First, families, the basic unit of human organization, are not self-sufficient: they contain within themselves neither the offices nor the arts necessary for survival. They simply lack the requisite knowledge. Secondly, evoking the idea of a state of war, Suárez argues that if families were divided from one another, peace could hardly be preserved among men, nor could wrongs be duly averted or avenged (Defensio fidei catholicae, et apostolicae adversus anglicanae sectae errores, III.1.4, in Suárez, Opera omnia XXIV). Inhabitants of the pre-political state are thus capable of envisaging a possible political state, in which cooperation between families exists for some common purpose. They can thus realize that power must be vested in one or some individuals because “nobody can be preserved unless there exists some principle whose function is to provide for and seek its common good” (DL III, 1.4–5).
The constitutive act of the community cannot simply be a decision by each family to live in proximity to each other and interact peacefully. This would create, at most, a certain familiarity or friendship, but would fail to generate what Suárez terms a “moral union”. This moral union originates instead in the assumption of the duties and obligations that make political life possible. These, in turn, are incurred by an act of “express or tacit pact” between the would-be citizens to help each other, together with their consent to subordinate themselves to a superior (De opere sex dierum, V.7.3, in Suárez, Opera omnia III).
This view places Suárez very close to the social contract school. It is a central tenet of this school that the citizens contract an obligation towards the political authority because they have given express, tacit, or hypothetical consent to it. Some of Suárez's interpreters have resisted this conclusion, arguing that, for him, although consent creates the state, it does not directly cause political obligation. In this interpretation, just as the right of a person to rule over his body “naturally results” (to use Suárez's phrase) from his being a person and is independent from the means by which he was generated (so that, say, an in vitro generated human being would also have these rights), so the right of the ruler(s) to rule over the city naturally flows from the fact that the city is a city, independently from the consent that generated it.
Other interpreters, such as Schwartz, argue that, for Suárez, consent directly causes political obligation without the mediation of the political community (Schwartz 2008). What the political community causes by “natural resultancy” is not the citizens' political subjection to the ruler. Rather, it is the community's original rightful incumbency to the role of the ruler (its self-mastership). For Suárez, to say that the self-mastership of the political community emanates by natural resultancy is simply a way of saying that this mastership has no external cause (such as God). The right to self-rule of the political community has the same origin as the political community itself: consent. This effect is not mediated by any intervening cause.
Note that for Suárez the ruler's power is not the result of a transfer or alienation of individual self-rule rights. Hence, Suárez's ruler is not, as in Hobbes, the depositary of a part of the citizens' right over themselves. The seat of power remains always, if only latently, with the community (Schwartz 2008: 71).
Suárez's highly original discussion of distributive justice has been unjustly neglected. Its originality resides in the rejection of some of the main principles of the Aristotelian conception of distributive justice that significantly shaped the modern conception, including that of, for instance, John Rawls. Among these were the principles that distributive justice operates only when total funds are insufficient to meet some ideal or desired standard and that a just distribution is a just division and so presupposes a divisible good and multiple recipients.
His fundamental break with Aristotelianism, however, resulted from his rejection of the view that distributive justice distinctly aims at proportional allocation. For Suárez, the types of justice should be distinguished by the type of right which they oversee rather than by the ideal distributional pattern at which they should aim. Distributive justice oversees a right to the thing, rather than a right in the thing (a ius ad rem rather than a ius in rem). The ius ad rem was usefully defined by Austin as “a right of compelling you to pass me a right in rem” (Austin, 1869: 993). Unlike infringements of iura in rem, those of iura ad rem do not call for restitution. For example, if in a competition for public office, the best candidate is not chosen, he has an actionable claim against the appointment committee, but he cannot say that he has been deprived of something that was his.
For Suárez, in order to have a distributive justice claim it is not enough to exhibit the quality that in principle entitles you to a share. He provides this illustration: if someone works in your vineyard without your knowledge or consent, this does not mean that you owe him wages. Distributive justice requires a background pact between the owner of the common stock (the community) and its members. This pact defines the criteria that allow members to have actionable claims to the receipt of a share of the common stock.
Although this pact creates rights, the rights have pre-positive foundations. In order to ground a debt to a reward an action must be of a value commensurate to the reward. Not all posited conditions indebt the promisor as a matter of justice, but only those that correspond to a pre-contractual fittingness or commensurability between the reward and the action or personal quality.
Distributive justice, insofar as it is the sovereign's justice, governs also the enjoyment of property rights. The sovereign (in the political case, the community or its appointee) retains a form of superior ownership (which he terms “supreme dominium”) over private possessions (Disputatio de Iustitia 1.12, in Suárez, Opera omnia XI). This means that the sovereign can withdraw your property rights, say over your car, and transfer them to someone else (say, to be used for security patrols). You could lodge a complaint that your private ownership of the car was more conducive to social utility (say, because you are a doctor). By lodging this complaint, however, you would not be claiming a violation of your property rights (as in the case of theft), but rather, of your right to property rights under agreed, public criteria regulating their allocation.
Suárez extended his conception of justice to the arena of war, writing one of the most exhaustive and lucid treatments of the justice of war available in the scholastic corpus. It covers justice ad bellum, in bello and, also, post bellum.
The discussion of ad bellum justice concerns the fundamentals of just war theory, including: the moral permissibility of war; the difference between defensive and offensive war; legitimate authority to declare war; the requirement of a reasonable hope of victory; the constraints imposed by charity in any resort to war; and the moral implications of the domestic costs of wars which are in principle just. It also contains a compelling discussion of the duty of participants in war to investigate the presence of a just cause, as it applies to decision-makers, advisors, and various types of combatants, including mercenaries.
His discussion of ius in bello considers, among other things: the category of “innocents” and their immunities; the “doctrine of double effect” as applied to war; the self-defence rights of collateral victims; the attendant possibility of a war that is just on both sides (if the collateral victims decide to defend themselves); and the peculiarities of civil war and the permissibility of deceiving the enemy. It also dwells on topics that are not typically discussed by today's just war theorists. These include the difference between participating in highly risky missions and using suicide as a weapon, the justice of concerted confrontations (both mutually agreed and forced by one of the parties), the permissibility of military alliances with infidels, the rights of soldiers against the sovereign, and justice in the distribution of booty.
Interwoven in these discussions one can find topics that today would be classed in the ius post-bellum category, in particular, on whether victory, regardless of its justice, confers rights, and on the rights of just victors to the property found in enemy territory. Here, to appreciate the basic tenor of his approach, we may survey the ad bellum just cause requirement.
A just cause of war is “a grave wrong which cannot be avenged or repaired in any other way” (DDB 4.1). Examples are the unjust seizure of property of the prince or subjects, violations to the rights of nations, and, controversially, grave injuries to the honor or reputation of the prince or the subjects (DDB 4.3).
Suárez places significant moral weight on the distinction, only tacitly present in Thomas Aquinas's treatment, between defensive and offensive or aggressive war. The defensive use of force aims to foil an attempt to inflict a wrong. The offensive use of force, by contrast, aims at obtaining some form of satisfaction for wrongful harms that have been already perpetrated (DDB 1.6). Suárez devotes some attention to cases in which applying this binary distinction becomes complicated. Because aggressive or offensive war seems morally more problematic, it was natural for Suárez to devote the most attention to it. Offensive war is an essentially a punitive response to the refusal to redress past wrongful harms. In the same way that domestic peace requires empowering the republic to punish domestic wrongs, so international peace requires that someone be vested with the power to punish international wrongs. Suárez reasons that, given the absence of a commonly acknowledged superior, this power must belong to each sovereign. Sovereigns thus assume the role of judges. A just offensive war is therefore the meting out of just punishment (DDB 4.5).
Justice, however, is not likely to be served if the judge is also a party to the dispute. Suárez is well aware of this problem but tries to downplay it. He notes that rulers are less inclined than private persons to act on emotion and the thirst of vengeance. Moreover, they are regularly assisted by the more temperate opinion of their expert advisors. Recognizing that this may not be enough to surmount the problem, Suárez candidly says that once we accept that someone must have the power to punish in the international arena, for all their faults, there are simply no better candidates for this role than sovereigns (DDB 4.7). Furthermore, the unjust party has only itself to blame for the judge's partiality since, by refusing to give satisfaction, it exposed itself to sentencing by a biased judge. The argument comes across as flawed, since whether or not satisfaction was due is precisely part of what is at stake.
The presence of a just cause of war is not always sufficient to make war morally permissible. Some wars may be just but nevertheless violate other moral injunctions. This may happen, for instance, when a wealthy and prosperous country demands satisfaction for a wrong done by a poor country, knowing it is impossible for it to do so without falling into utmost deprivation. In these circumstances, resorting to war may be just but nevertheless uncharitable. However, violations of the duties of charity do not impose a posterior duty to restitute, so long as justice has not been infringed (DDB 4.8).
There is another sense in which the presence of a just cause is not sufficient to make war morally permissible. While making decisions about war, the ruler must consider not only whether his cause is just, but also whether its prosecution by the sword is beneficial to the realm's subjects. A war may pursue a just cause and yet involve injustice towards the subjects of the warring country if it manifestly harms the subjects' common good. In such cases, the ruler acts as tyrant; the subjects are merely treated as means to avenge wrongs done to him, while they themselves suffer serious loss (DDB 4.8).
For war to be morally permissible, is it necessary that, in addition to having a just cause, it is also certain that the just cause will be achieved? The Renaissance Thomist commentator, Cardinal Thomas de Vio, known as Cajetan, thought so. Suárez considered such absolute certainty to be unachievable, and requiring it to be undesirable: waiting to attain this degree of certainty could result in a dangerous postponement of the business of justice. In addition, he thought that this requirement discriminated against weaker countries by making it more difficult for them to pursue justice as compared to stronger countries (DDB 4.10).
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See Sydney Penner's excellent website: Suarez in English Translation.
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- Suarez in English Translation, Sydney Penner keeps a full list of material pertaining to Suárez, including links to translations.
- Bibliography of Works on Francisco Suárez, 1850–present: A comprehensive bibliography of secondary literature on Suárez compiled by Jacob Schmutz and updated by Sydney Penner.