Medieval Theories of Analogy

First published Mon Nov 29, 1999; substantive revision Fri Sep 15, 2017

Medieval theories of analogy were a response to problems in three areas: logic, theology, and metaphysics. Logicians were concerned with the use of words having more than one sense, whether completely different, or related in some way. Theologians were concerned with language about God. How can we speak about a transcendent, totally simple spiritual being without altering the sense of the words we use? Metaphysicians were concerned with talk about reality. How can we say that both substances (e.g., Socrates) and accidents (e.g., the beardedness of Socrates) exist when one is dependent on the other; how can we say that both God and creatures exist, when one is created by the other? Medieval thinkers reacted to these three problems by developing a theory which divided words into three sorts, independently of context. Some were univocal (always used with the same sense), some were purely equivocal (used with quite different senses), and some were analogical (used with related senses). Analogical terms were thought to be particularly useful in metaphysics and theology, but they were routinely discussed in commentaries on Aristotle’s logic and in logic textbooks. The background to the discussion was given by what is often called the analogy of being or metaphysical analogy, the doctrine that reality is divided both horizontally into the very different realities of substances and accidents and vertically into the very different realities of God and creatures, and that these realities are analogically related. Nonetheless, the phrase “medieval theories of analogy” as used here will refer to semantic analogy, a set of linguistic and logical doctrines supplemented, at least from the fourteenth century on, by doctrines about the nature of human concepts.

There were three main types of semantic analogy, each based on a type of metaphysical analogy. In the original Greek sense, analogy involved a comparison of two proportions or relations. Thus ‘principle’ was said to be an analogical term when said of a point and a spring of water because a point is related to a line as a spring is related to a river. This type of analogy came to be called the analogy of proportionality. In the second sense, analogy involved a relation between two things, of which one is primary and the other secondary. Thus ‘healthy’ was said to be an analogical term when said of a dog and its food because while the dog has health in the primary sense, its food is healthy only secondarily as contributing to or causing the health of the dog. This second type of analogy became known as the analogy of attribution, and its special mark was being said in a prior and a posterior sense (per prius et posterius). A third type of analogy, sometimes used by theologians, appealed to a relation of likeness between God and creatures. Creatures are called good or just because their goodness or justice imitates or reflects the goodness or justice of God. This type of analogy was called the analogy of imitation or participation. Of the three types, it is the analogy of attribution that is central to medieval discussions.

From the fourteenth century on discussions of analogy focused not so much on linguistic usages as on the nature of the concepts that corresponded to the words used. Is there just one concept that corresponds to an analogical term, or is there a sequence of concepts? If the latter, how are the members of the sequence ordered and related to each other? Moreover, how far should we distinguish between so-called formal concepts (or acts of mind) and objective concepts (whatever it is that is the object of the act of understanding)? These discussions were still influential at the time of Descartes.

1. Medieval Theories of Language

Medieval logicians and philosophers of language were principally concerned with the relationship between utterances, concepts, and things. Written language was only of secondary importance. They agreed that spoken language was conventional, having its origin in imposition, or the decision to correlate certain sounds with certain objects. Concepts, however, were natural, in the sense that all human beings with similar experiences had the same concepts, without any decision being involved. The key semantic notion was signification, rather than meaning, though translated sources tend to obscure this by translating ‘significatio’ as ‘meaning’. For a term to signify is for it to function as a sign, to represent or make known something beyond itself. A typical spoken term, such as ‘horse’ or ‘dog’, signifies in two ways. It signifies or makes known the concept with which it has to be correlated in order to function significatively at all, and it also signifies or makes known something external to and independent of the mind. Modifications were made to this simple scheme to cover the cases of special terms, including syncategorematic terms, such as ‘every’ and ‘not’, fictional terms such as ‘chimera’, and privative terms such as ‘blindness’; and modifications were also made to cover the case of special predicates, such as “is a genus”, or “is thought about”, but we need not concern ourselves with these modifications here.

Theories of signification were complicated by the metaphysical problem of common natures. If we say that words signify not only concepts but things external to and independent of the mind do we mean that ‘human being’ and ‘tall’ signify special common objects such as humanity or tallness, or do we mean that they signify Socrates and his quality of being tall? For Aquinas, who did not want to give common natures any kind of intermediary existence independent of both concepts and actual things, the significate (significatum) of a term was the intellect’s conception (whether simple or definitional) of the thing signified; the thing signified (res significata) was usually the property or the nature characterizing individual external objects; and the referent (suppositum) was the individual external object itself, viewed as the bearer of the property or nature. However,‘human being’ cannot be said to signify Socrates, since the mind cannot conceive physical individuals as such. In the fourteenth century, further developments took place. There was a new focus on the notion of a mental language superior to spoken language, and concepts, as parts of this mental language, were themselves regarded as having signification. Moreover, Scotists and nominalists agreed that, at least in principle, physical individuals could be conceived as such. William of Ockham and his followers not only denied the existence of common natures but insisted that spoken words did not signify concepts. As a result, both spoken words and the concepts to which spoken words are subordinated have the same significates, namely individual things and their individual properties, such as the tallness of Socrates). Other nominalists, notably Buridan, insisted that spoken words did signify concepts as well as individuals, for concepts are required to mediate between spoken words and individual things.

In addition to having signification, terms were also said to have modes of signifying (modi significandi). These modes of signifying were related to the term’s logical and grammatical functions, and include such essential features as being a noun, verb, or adjective, and such accidental features as time (which includes tense without being limited to it), gender, and case. More generally, they included being abstract (e.g., justice) and concrete (e.g., just). They also include modes of predication, related to Aristotle’s ten categories, such as substantial (e.g., horse), qualitative (e.g., brown), quantitative (e.g., square), relative and so on. The notion of modes of signifying was developed from the early twelfth century on, though it was specially emphasized by the speculative grammarians of the late thirteenth century.

It is important to recognize that medieval thinkers had a compositionalist view of language signification, and so words were thought to be endowed as units both with their signification and with nearly all their modes of signifying in advance of the role they would subsequently play in propositions. Moreover, the doctrine of common natures suggested that terms, at least those terms which seem to fall within Aristotle’s ten categories (substance, quality, quantity and so on), each correspond to a common nature and so have a signification which is fixed and precise. This meant that questions of use and context, though explored by medieval logicians especially through supposition theory, were not thought to be crucial to the determination of a term as equivocal, analogical or univocal. It also meant that terms which did not fit into Aristotle’s categorial framework needed a special account. This problem relates especially to theology, because God was thought to transcend the categories in the sense that none of them apply to him, and also to metaphysics, because of the so-called transcendental terms, ‘being’, ‘one’, ‘good’. These transcend the categories in the sense that they belong no more to one category than to another, and they do not correspond to common natures.

2. Problems in Logic, Theology, and Metaphysics

In order to understand how the theory of analogy arose we have to bear in mind the history of education in the Latin-speaking western part of Europe. During the so-called dark ages, learning was largely confined to monasteries, and people had access to very few texts from the ancient world. This situation had changed dramatically by the beginning of the thirteenth century. The first universities (Bologna, Paris, Oxford) had been established, and the recovery of the writings of Aristotle supplemented by the works of Islamic philosophers was well under way.

One source for the theory of analogy is the doctrine of equivocal terms found in logic texts. Until the early twelfth century, the only parts of Aristotle’s logic to be available in Latin were the Categories and On Interpretation, supplemented by a few other works including the monographs and commentaries of Boethius. The Categories opens with a brief characterization of terms used equivocally, such as ‘animal’ used of real human beings and pictured human beings, and terms used univocally, such as ‘animal’ used of human beings and oxen. In the first case, the spoken term is the same but there are two distinct significates or intellectual conceptions; in the second case, both the spoken term and the significate are the same. We should note that equivocal terms include homonyms (two words with the same form but different senses, e.g., ‘pen’), polysemous words (one word with two or more senses), and, for medieval thinkers, proper names shared by different people. By the mid-twelfth century the rest of Aristotle’s logic had been recovered, including the Sophistical Refutations in which Aristotle discusses three types of equivocation and how these contribute to fallacies in logic. For writers throughout the later middle ages, the discussion of analogical terms was fitted into the framework of univocal and equivocal terms provided by Aristotle and his commentators. We will return to this below.

Twelfth-century theology is another important source for the doctrine of analogy, for twelfth-century theologians such as Gilbert of Poitiers and Alan of Lille explored the problem of divine language in depth. Their work initially sprang from works on the Trinity by Augustine and Boethius. These authors insisted that God is absolutely simple, so that no distinctions can be made between God’s essence and his existence, or between one perfection, such as goodness, and another, such as wisdom, or, more generally, between God and his properties. New attention was also paid to Greek theologians, especially Pseudo-Dionysius. These theologians insisted on God’s absolute transcendence, and on what came to be called negative theology. We cannot affirm anything positive about God, because no affirmation can be appropriate to a transcendent being. It is better to deny properties of God, saying for instance that he is not good (i.e., in the human sense), and still better to say that God is not existent but super-existent, not substance but super-substantial, not good but super-good. These theological doctrines raised the general problem of how we can speak meaningfully of God at all, but they also raised a number of particular problems. Must we say that “God is justice” means the same as “God is just”? Must we say that “God is just” means the same as “God is good”? Can we say that God is just and that Peter is just as well? For our purposes, this last question is the most important, for it raises the question of one word used of two different realities.

The third source for doctrines of analogy is metaphysics. The first part of Aristotle’s Metaphysics had been translated by the mid-twelfth century, though the full text was recovered only gradually. One crucial text is found in Metaphysics 4.2 (1003a33–35): “There are many senses (multis modis) in which being (ens) can be said, but they are related to one central point (ad unum), one definite kind of thing, and are not equivocal. Everything which is healthy is related to health…. and everything which is medical to medicine….” In this text, Aristotle raises the general problem of the word ‘being’ and its different senses, and he also introduces what is known as pros hen equivocation or focal meaning, the idea that different senses may be unified through a relationship to one central sense. Another foundational text is from Avicenna’s Metaphysics, also translated into Latin during the twelfth century, where he writes that being (ens) is neither a genus nor a predicate predicated equally of all its subordinates, but rather a notion (intentio) in which they agree according to the prior and the posterior. As we shall see below, this reference to the prior and the posterior is particularly important.

Some further background for the development of doctrines of analogy is provided by Aristotle’s discussion of scientific reasoning in his Posterior Analytics, first commented on in the 1220s by Robert Grosseteste. One important issue was how analogical relations might be used to find a way of referring to things which did not belong to one genus and lacked a common name. A popular example throughout the middle ages involved Aristotle’s account of the relation between the ‘bone’ of a cuttlefish, a spine, and a normal bone (Posterior Analytics, 14.2, 98a20–23), though there was some disagreement about the type of analogy involved. Even more important was Aristotle’s view that scientific reasoning requires demonstrative syllogisms, which, in order to be logically valid, must have a middle term that avoids the fallacy of equivocation. How far analogical terms could fill that role was a frequent topic of discussion and controversy. In the thirteenth century, in his questions on Aristotle’s Physics, Geoffrey of Aspall remarked that analogy did not rule out univocity or prevent a subject from being one, while in the early fourteenth century, Scotus preferred to preserve unity by abandoning the use of analogical terms. In the late fifteenth century Cajetan strongly supported the claim that analogical terms could function as middle terms. None of these authors suggested that natural science and theology could appeal to analogical relationships to produce probabilistic rather than demonstrative arguments.

3. History of the Word ‘Analogy’

The Latin term ‘analogia’ had various senses. In scriptural exegesis, according to Aquinas, analogy was the method of showing that one part of scripture did not conflict with another. In rhetoric and grammar, analogy was the method of settling a doubt about a word’s form by appeal to a similar and more certain case. Several twelfth-century theologians use the word in this sense. In translations of Pseudo-Dionysius, the term had a strictly ontological sense, for it refers to a being’s capacity for participation in divine perfections as this relates to lower or higher beings. In logic, authors were aware that the Greek word ‘αναλογια’, sometimes called ‘analogia’ in Latin, but often translated as ‘proportio’ or ‘proportionalitas’, referred to the comparison between two proportions. However, by the 1220s the word came to be linked with the phrase “in a prior and a posterior sense” and by the 1250s terms said according to a comparison of proportions were normally separated from terms said according to a prior and a posterior sense.

The phrase “in a prior and a posterior sense” seems to have been derived from Arabic philosophy. H.A. Wolfson has presented evidence for Aristotle’s recognition of a type of term intermediate between equivocal and univocal terms, some instances of which were characterized by their use according to priority and posteriority. He showed that Alexander of Aphrodisias called this type of term ‘ambiguous’ and that the Arabic philosophers, starting with Alfarabi, made being said in a prior and a posterior sense the main characteristic of all ambiguous terms. So far as the medieval Latin west is concerned, the main sources for the notion of an ambiguous term said in a prior and a posterior sense are Algazel and Avicenna, both of whom became known in the second half of the twelfth century, and both of whom used the notion to explain uses of the word ‘being’.

The word ‘analogical’ soon became linked with the word ‘ambiguous’ in Latin authors. Speaking of the cuttlefish example in his commentary on Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics, Grosseteste says that Aristotle’s use of analogy to find a common term produces ambiguous names said according to a prior and a posterior sense, and he uses the phrase “ambiguum analogum”. In the same decade, the Glossa of the theologian Alexander of Hales links being said in a prior and a posterior sense with ambiguity and (in one possibly unreliable manuscript) with analogy, and the writings of Philip the Chancellor also link being said in a prior and a posterior sense with analogy. In logic textbooks, the word ‘analogy’ in the new sense appears in the Summe metenses, once dated around 1220, but now thought to be by Nicholas of Paris, writing between 1240 and 1260. The new use of ‘analogy’ rapidly became standard in both logicians and theologians.

4. Divisions of Equivocation

In order to understand the way in which theories of analogy developed, we need to consider the divisions of equivocation found in medieval authors. In his commentary on the Categories, Boethius presented a series of divisions which he took from Greek authors. The first division was into chance equivocals and deliberate equivocals. In the first case, the occurrences of the equivocal term were totally unconnected, as when a barking animal, a marine animal, and a constellation were all called ‘canis’ (dog). Chance equivocation was also called pure equivocation, and it was carefully distinguished from analogy by later writers. In the second case, that of deliberate equivocation, some intention on the part of the speakers was involved, and the occurrences of the equivocal term could be related in various ways. Boethius himself gave four subdivisions. These are found in various later sources, including Ockham’s commentary on the Categories, but as we shall see, other subdivisions became more popular.

The first of Boethius’s four subdivisions was similitude, used of the case of the noun ‘animal’ said of both real human beings and pictured human beings. Medieval logicians seem to have been totally unaware of the fact that the Greek word used by Aristotle was genuinely polysemous, meaning both animal and image, and they explained the extended use of ‘animal’ in terms of a likeness between the two referents — a likeness which had nothing to do with the significate of the term ‘animal’, which picks out a certain kind of nature, but which was nonetheless more than metaphorical in that the external shape of the pictured object does correspond to that of the living object. Those medieval authors whose discussion of equivocation was very brief tended to use this example, and they often claimed that Aristotle introduced it in order to accommodate analogy as a kind of equivocation. On the other hand, authors whose discussion was more extensive tended to drop both the example and the subdivision of similitude.

Boethius’s second type of equivocation is ‘analogia’ in the Greek sense, and the standard example was the word ‘principium’ (principle or origin), which was said to apply to unity with respect to number and to point with respect to a line, or to both the source of a river and the heart of an animal. ‘Principium’ is a noun and, as such, might be expected to pick out a common nature, but although a unity, a point, a source and a heart can all be called ‘principium’ with equal propriety, there is no common nature involved. Mathematical objects, rivers, and hearts, represent not merely different natural kinds, but different categories, in that mathematical objects fall under the category of quantity, and hearts at least under the category of substance. What allows these disparate things to be grouped together is a similarity of relations: a source is to a river as a heart is to an animal — or so it was claimed. While theologians, including Aquinas himself in De veritate, and the fourteenth-century Dominican Thomas Sutton, occasionally make use of this type of analogy, most logicians do not even mention it.

The last two subdivisions found in Boethius are ‘of one origin’ (ab uno), with the example of the word ‘medical’, and ‘in relation to one’ (ad unum), with the example of the word ‘healthy’. These subdivisions correspond to Aristotle’s pros hen equivocation. The example ‘healthy’ (sanum) as said of animals, their diet, and their urine is particularly important here. ‘Sanum’, like other adjectives, was classified as a concrete accidental term. As such, it did not fall within an Aristotelian category, since its primary signification had two elements whose combination was variously explained. On the one hand, some kind of reference is made to the abstract entity health, which belongs to the category of quality; on the other hand, some kind of reference is made to an external object which belongs to the category of substance. This dual reference precludes the term from picking out a natural kind, though in the case of other adjectives, such as ‘brown’, no problem is caused thereby. Brown things may not form a natural kind, but at least they are all physical objects, and ‘brown’ is used in the same sense of each one. ‘Healthy’, however, is more complicated. To say that Rover is healthy is to say that Rover is a thing having health, and obviously this analysis can’t be applied to diet, which is called healthy only because it causes health in an animal, or to urine, which is called healthy only when it is the sign of health in an animal. Whatever the properties which characterize urine and food, they are different from those characterizing the animal.

We should also note that in the same passage of his commentary on the Categories, Boethius linked deliberate equivocation with metaphor, in which the sense of one word with an established signification was extended to apply improperly to something else. A favourite medieval example was ‘smiling’ said of flowering meadows. Later logicians supported this link between equivocation and metaphor by an appeal to Aristotle’s divisions of equivocation in his Sophistical Refutations, where he remarked that the second type was based on common usage. As we shall see, the question of metaphor’s relation to analogy became particularly important in post-thirteenth-century discussions.

5. Divisions of Analogy

Boethius’s subdivisions had one major failure: they did not seem to accommodate the different uses of the word ‘being’ (ens). As a result, many authors used a new threefold division which included Boethius’s last two subdivisions and one more. They presented the division as a division of deliberate equivocals, and they identified deliberate equivocals with analogical terms. This threefold division of analogy was established in the thirteenth-century, in response to a remark by Averroes in his commentary on the Metaphysics to the effect that Aristotle had classified ‘healthy’ as a case of relationship to one thing as an end, ‘medical’ as a case of relationship to one thing as an agent, and ‘being’ (ens) as a case of relationship to one subject. It is found in Thomas Aquinas’s own commentary on the Metaphysics, as well as in his fifteenth-century follower Capreolus. An analogical term is now seen as one which is said of two things in a prior and a posterior sense, and it is grounded in various kinds of attribution or relationship to the primary object: food is healthy as a cause of a healthy animal, a procedure is medical when applied by a medical agent, a quality has being by virtue of the existent substance that it characterizes.

A second threefold division of analogy arose from reflection on the relationship between equivocal and analogical terms. Analogical terms were said to be intermediaries between equivocal and univocal terms, and the standard view was that analogical terms were intermediary between chance equivocals and univocals, and hence that they were to be identified with deliberate equivocals. The notion of an intermediary term, however, is open to more than one interpretation, and some authors went further in suggesting that at least some analogical terms were intermediary between univocals and deliberate equivocals, so that they were not equivocal in any of the normal senses at all. Towards the end of the thirteenth century, an anonymous commentator on the Sophistical Refutations gives the following classification. First, there are analogical terms which are univocal in a broad sense of ‘univocal’. Here reference was made to genus terms such as ‘animal’. Human beings and donkeys participate equally in the common nature animal, but are not themselves equal, since human beings are more perfect than donkeys. This type of analogy was routinely discussed in response to a remark Aristotle had made in Physics VII (249a22–25) which, in Latin translation, asserted that many equivocations are hidden in a genus. Medieval logicians felt obliged to fit this claim into the framework of equivocation and analogy, even if the consensus was that in the end the use of genus terms was univocal. Second, there are those analogical terms such as ‘being’ (ens) which are not equivocal, because only one concept or nature (ratio) seems to be involved, and which are not univocal either, because things participate this one ratio unequally, in a prior and a posterior way. It is these terms which are the genuine intermediaries. Third, there are those analogical terms which are deliberate equivocals, because there are two concepts or natures (rationes) which are participated in a prior and a posterior way. The example here was ‘healthy’. This second threefold division was much discussed. Duns Scotus bitterly criticized it in his earlier logical writings. Walter Burley claimed that both the first and the second kinds of analogical term could properly be regarded as univocal in a wide sense. The division was popular in the fifteenth century with such Thomists as Capreolus, who realized its closeness to the account given by Aquinas in his Sentences commentary.

6. Thomas Aquinas

Despite the vast modern literature devoted to Aquinas’s theory of analogy, he has very little to say about analogy as such. He uses a general division into equivocal, univocal, and analogical uses of terms, and he presents both of the threefold divisions of analogy mentioned in the previous section, but he offers no prolonged discussion, and he writes as if he is simply using the divisions, definitions, and examples with which everyone is familiar. His importance lies in the way he used this standard material to present an account of the divine names, or how it is we can meaningfully use such words as ‘good’ and ‘wise’ of God.

The background to this account has to be understood in terms of Aquinas’s theology and metaphysics. Three doctrines are particularly important. First, there is the distinction between being existent, good, wise, and so on, essentially, and being existent, good, wise, and so on, by participation. God is whatever he is essentially, and as a result he is existence itself, goodness itself, wisdom itself. Creatures are existent, good, wise, only by sharing in God’s existence, goodness, and wisdom, and this sharing has three features. It involves a separation between the creature and what the creature has; it involves a deficient similarity to God; and it is based on a causal relation. What is essentially existent or good is the cause of what has existence or goodness by participation. Second, there is the general doctrine of causality according to which every agent produces something like itself. Agent causality and similarity cannot be separated. Third, there is Aquinas’s belief that we are indeed entitled to claim that God is existent, good, wise, and so on, even though we cannot know his essence.

Against this background, Aquinas asks how we are to interpret the divine names. He argues that they cannot be purely equivocal, for we could not then make intelligible claims about God. Nor can they be purely univocal, for God’s manner of existence and his relationship to his properties are sufficiently different from ours that the words must be used in somewhat different senses. Hence, the words we use of God must be analogical, used in different but related senses. To be more precise, it seems that such words as ‘good’ and ‘wise’ must involve a relationship to one prior reality, and they must be predicated in a prior and a posterior sense, for these are the marks of analogical terms.

Nonetheless, the divine names do not function exactly like ordinary analogical terms such as ‘healthy’. We need to begin by making use of the distinction between the thing signified (a nature or property) and the mode of signifying. All the words we use have a creaturely mode of signifying in that they imply time and composition, neither of which can pertain to God. When speaking of God, we must recognize this fact, and attempt to discount it. To say “God is good” is not to imply that God has a separable property, goodness, and that he has it in a temporally limited way. God is eternally identical to goodness itself. But even when we have discounted the creaturely mode of signifying, we are left with the fact that God’s goodness is not like our goodness. This is where the analogy of attribution enters the picture.

In his early writings, Aquinas questioned whether the standard account of the analogy of attribution was sufficient for his purposes. In his commentary on the Sentences, he suggests that there is one kind of analogy in which the analogical term is used in a prior and a posterior sense, and another kind of analogy, the analogy of imitation, which applies to God and creatures. In his De veritate, he argues that the analogy of attribution involves a determinate relation, which cannot hold between God and creatures, and that the analogy of proportionality must be used for the divine names. We must compare the relation between God and his properties to the relation between creatures and their properties. This solution was deeply flawed, given that the problem of divine names arises precisely because the relationship of God to his properties is so radically different from our relation to our properties. Accordingly, in his later discussions of the divine names, notably in the Summa contra gentiles and the Summa theologiae, Aquinas returns to the analogy of attribution, but links it much more closely with his doctrines of causal similitude. As Montagnes has pointed out, he came to place much greater emphasis on agent causation, the active transmission of properties from God to creatures, than on exemplar causality, the creature’s passive reflection or imitation of God’s properties. In this context, Aquinas makes considerable use of his ontological distinction between univocal causes, whose effects are fully like them, and non-univocal causes, whose effects are not fully like them. God is an analogical cause, and this is the reality that underlies our use of analogical language.

Aquinas’s views about agent causality explain his insistence on definitional inclusion. He says explicitly that the term said in a prior way must be included in the definition of the posterior, just as the definition of healthy food includes a reference to the health of the animal. In the divine case, the reference is not direct or explicit, but is a function of our recognition that when humans are said to be good, this means that they have a participated goodness which must be caused by that which is goodness itself. The nature of this causal relation between God and creature also helps to explain the sense in which terms are said in a prior way of God. So far as imposition is concerned, terms are given their signification on the basis of creaturely effects, and, before we learn about God, we may think that their prior use is to refer to creaturely perfections. However, when we come to know God as the first cause and fully perfect being, we recognize that their prior application is to God. Finally, Aquinas’s causal doctrines help us to explain his insistence on the distinction between the analogy of many-to-one and the analogy of one-to-another. In the first case, both food and medicine are said to be healthy because each is related to something else, the health of an animal. In the second case, food is said to be healthy because of its relation to the health of an animal. Only the second kind of analogy applies to the divine names, for no non-metaphorical name we apply to God can ever be explained in terms of something other than God. Our use of divine names has to reflect God’s absolute priority.

7. John Duns Scotus and the Role of Concepts

One of the issues that Aquinas touched on but did not settle was that of the number of rationes an analogical term was associated with. This issue stemmed from Aristotle’s Categories. As translated by Boethius, Aristotle introduced the distinction between univocal and equivocal terms by claiming that whereas univocal terms were subordinated to one substantiae ratio, equivocal terms were subordinated to more than one substantiae ratio. The word ‘ratio’ here is capable of various interpretations, including ‘definition or description’, ‘analysis’, or ‘concept’, but by the early fourteenth century logicians and theologians came to agree that the appropriate interpretation was ‘concept’. The second threefold division of analogy given above suggests the importance of a focus on concepts; and the question of how many concepts an analogical term was subordinated to came to be central. The nominalists held that so-called analogical terms were either metaphorical or were straightforwardly equivocal terms subordinated to two distinct concepts, but the Thomists were split. Analogical terms could be viewed as subordinated to an ordered cluster of concepts (possibly but not necessarily described as a disjunction of concepts); or they could be subordinated to a single concept which represents in a prior and a posterior manner (per prius et posterius).

The issue was considerably complicated by the influence of John Duns Scotus. In his early logical commentaries, Scotus had argued that it was impossible to have two concepts that were related in a prior and posterior way, just as it was impossible to have a single concept that captured such a relationship. As a result, ‘being’ was a chance equivocal, and metaphor, which was a matter of linguistic usage, replaced semantic analogy. However, Scotus did believe in metaphysical analogy, whereby God and creatures, substances and accidents were related in a prior and posterior way, and in his later theological works he argued that without a unified concept of being neither metaphysics nor theology would be possible. Accordingly, he replaced the claim that ‘being’ was a chance equivocal with the claim that it was univocal. In order to support this claim, he rejected the common doctrine that for a term to be univocal it had to be a strictly categorial term, picking out some natural kind or other. He argued that it was sufficient for univocity that contradiction would arise when the term was affirmed and denied of the same thing. He then argued that ‘being’ (ens) was a univocal term subordinated to a single univocal concept.

Even for those within the Thomistic tradition, Scotus’ arguments about the univocity of ‘being’ had to be taken seriously. On the one hand, the word does not seem to be straightforwardly equivocal, in the sense of being subordinated to more than one concept, for we at least have the illusion of being able to grasp ‘being’ as a general term. As Scotus pointed out, in an argument reproduced by all who considered the issue, we can grasp that something is a being while doubting whether it is a substance or an accident, and this surely involves having a relatively simple concept of being at our disposal. On the other hand, there does not seem to be any common nature involved, and in the absence of a common nature, Thomists thought that to call the term ‘univocal’ was inappropriate. What was needed was a way of allowing the concept to enjoy some kind of unity, while allowing the word to have a significate that was not a simple common nature. For many thinkers from the early fourteenth century onward, the distinction between formal and objective concepts provided the answer.

The formal concept was the act of mind or conception that represented an object, and the objective concept was the object represented. If the spoken word ‘being’ corresponds to just one formal concept (a point on which there were some differences of opinion), the focus of discussion shifts to the status of the objective concept. Is it the actual thing in the world which is thought about; is it a common nature or some other kind of intermediary entity which is distinct from the external object without being mind-dependent; or is it a special kind of mind-dependent object which has only objective being, the being of being thought (esse objective, esse cognitum)? In the case of ‘being’, since we are clearly not talking about either an individual thing or a common nature, we get back to the original set of questions about analogical concepts, now posed at a different level. That is, are we talking about a special ordering intrinsic to a single objective concept, or are we talking about an ordered sequence of objective concepts which corresponds to the one formal concept?

8. Cardinal Cajetan: A New Approach

In 1498 Thomas de Vio, Cardinal Cajetan, wrote a little book called On the Analogy of Names which he intended to supplement his commentary on Aristotle’s Categories. The work was not published until 1506, when it was included in a collection of short texts that was reprinted at least six times during the century. Perhaps because of his important contribution to the sixteenth-century revival of Thomism, Cajetan’s contribution to discussions of analogy has been misrepresented in modern times. It has been assumed that he was commenting directly on Aquinas, rather than on his immediate predecessors, and that his views were central to sixteenth-century discussions. In fact, his influence was slight at first, and when he became more widely read, such important late scholastic authors as Francisco Suárez argued against his doctrines.

Part of Cajetan’s book is devoted to formal and objective concepts and ways in which the latter can be ordered, but he also offered a new threefold division of types of analogy. He called the first type, the case of genus terms, the analogy of inequality, and dismissed it as unimportant, indeed, not properly analogy at all. He called the second type the analogy of attribution, and here he made two changes. First, he gave a new account of its subdivisions by adding Boethius’s subdivision, similitude, to the first threefold division involving attribution to one efficient cause, one end, and one subject. He described the resulting four subdivisions in terms of Aristotle’s four causes. Second, he claimed that attribution involved only extrinsic denomination. That is, in each case of attribution, only the prior object is intrinsically characterized by the property in question, e.g., health.

Cajetan called the third type of analogy the analogy of proportionality, and he subdivided it into metaphor and proper proportionality. His account of metaphor was commonplace, and goes back to Aquinas’s remark that meadows are said to smile because flowering is related to meadows in the way that smiling is related to human beings. He claimed that proper proportionality was analogy in the Greek sense of the word, and that it was the only true kind of analogy. Moreover, it involves only intrinsic denomination, that is, both the primary and the secondary object referred to are characterized by the property in question. He did allow for the word ‘being’ to be used in accordance with attribution when we think of creatures as beings only because they reflect the nature of the God who created them, but in general he held that ‘being’ and all other metaphysically and theologically important analogical terms principally belonged to this third division. Both in his insistence on the priority of proper proportionality and in his use of a sharp distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic denomination, Cajetan departed from earlier medieval discussions of analogy. It was also on these points that his late scholastic successors were to disagree with him. For instance, Suárez held that the main use of proportionality was to account for metaphor, and that the analogy of attribution embraced both intrinsic and extrinsic denomination.

It is unfortunate that many later commentators have been misled into taking Cajetan’s account of analogy as a typical one, and, even more unfortunately, as a useful summary of the doctrines of Aquinas. However, more recent scholarship involving a number of authors is beginning to change this situation.


  • Ashworth, E. J., 1991, “Signification and Modes of Signifying in Thirteenth-Century Logic: A Preface to Aquinas on Analogy,” Medieval Philosophy and Theology 1: 39–67.
  • –––, 1992, “Analogy and Equivocation in Thirteenth-Century Logic: Aquinas in Context,” Mediaeval Studies 54: 94–135.
  • –––, 1992, “Analogical Concepts: The Fourteenth-Century Background to Cajetan,” Dialogue 31: 399–413.
  • –––, 1995, “Suárez on the Analogy of Being: Some Historical Background,” Vivarium 33: 50–75.
  • –––, 1996, “Analogy, Univocation, and Equivocation in some Early Fourteenth-Century Authors,” in Aristotle in Britain during the Middle Ages, John Marenbon (ed.), Belgium: Brepols, pp. 233–47.
  • –––, 1997, “Analogy and Equivocation in Thomas Sutton, O.P.” in Vestigia, Imagines, Verba: Semiotics and Logic in Medieval Theological Texts (XIIth-XIVth Century), Costantino Marmo (ed.), Turnhout: Brepols, pp. 289–303.
  • –––, 2008, Les théories de l’analogie du XIIe au XVIe siècle, Paris: Vrin.
  • –––, 2013, “Analogy and Metaphor from Thomas Aquinas to Duns Scotus and Walter Burley,” in Later Mediaeval Metaphysics: Ontology, Language, and Logic, Charles Bolyard and Rondo Keele (eds.), New York: Fordham University Press, pp. 223–48, 291–99.
  • –––, 2013, “Being and Analogy,” in A Companion to Walter Burley, Alessandro D. Conti (ed.), Leiden, Boston: Brill, pp. 135–65.
  • –––, 2014, “Aquinas on Analogy,” in Debates in Medieval Philosophy, Jeffrey Hause (ed.), New York: Routledge, pp. 232–242.
  • –––, 2017, “Philosophy of Language: Words, Concepts, Things, and Non-Things,” in The Routledge Companion to Sixteenth-Century Philosophy, Henrik Lagerlund and Benjamin Hill (eds.), New York: Routledge, pp. 350–372.
  • Boulnois, Olivier, 1996, “Duns Scot, théoricien de l’analogie de l’être,” in John Duns Scotus: Metaphysics and Ethics, edited by Ludger Honnefelder, Rega Wood, and Mechthild Dreyer, Studien und Texte zur Geistesgeschichte des Mittelalters 53, Leiden, New York, Cologne: E. J. Brill, pp. 293–315.
  • D’Ettore, Domenic, 2014, “The Fifteenth-Century Thomist Dispute over Participation in an Analogous Concept: John Capreolus, Dominic of Flanders, and Paul Soncinas,” Mediaeval Studies 76: 241–273.
  • –––, 2016, “Some Renaissance Thomists on Analogy in Demonstration,” Angelicum 93: 927–950.
  • Henninger, Mark, 2006, “Thomas Sutton on Univocation, Equivocation and Analogy,” The Thomist, 70: 537–535.
  • –––, 2006, “Henry of Harclay on the Univocal Concept of Being,” Mediaeval Studies, 68: 205–237.
  • Hochschild, Joshua P., 2010, The Semantics of Analogy: Rereading Cajetan’s De Nominum Analogia, Notre Dame, Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Libera, Alain de, 1989, “Les sources gréco-arabes de la théorie médiévale de l’analogie de l’être,” Les études philosophiques, 3/4: 319–45.
  • McInerny, Ralph, 1986, “The Analogy of Names is a Logical Doctrine,” in idem, Being and Predication: Thomistic Interpretations, Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press, pp. 279–86.
  • McInerny, Ralph, 1992, “Aquinas and Analogy: Where Cajetan Went Wrong,” Philosophical Topics, 20(2): 103–124, [Medieval Philosophy, Sandra Edwards (ed.)]
  • Montagnes, Bernard, 1963, La doctrine de l’analogie de l’être d’après Saint Thomas d’Aquin, Philosophes médiévaux 6, Louvain: Publications Universitaires; Paris: Béatrice-Nauwelaerts.
  • –––, 2004, The Doctrine of the Analogy of Being According to Thomas Aquinas, trans. E. M. Macierowski, P. Vandevelde, and Andrew Tallon, Marquette Studies in Philosophy 25, Milwaukee: Marquette University Press.
  • Park, Seung-Chan, 1999, Die Rezeption der mittelalterlichen Sprachphilosophie in der Theologie des Thomas von Aquin. Mit besondere Berücksichtigung der Analogie. Studien und Texte zur Geistesgeschichte des Mittalters 65, Leiden, Boston, Köln: Brill.
  • Reynolds, Philip L., 2003, “Analogy of Names in Bonaventure,” Mediaeval Studies, 65: 117–62.
  • Rosier, Irène, 1995, “Res significata et modus significandi: Les implications d’une distinction médiévale,” in Sprachtheorien in Spätantike und Mittelalter, Sten Ebbesen (ed.), Tübingen: Gunter Narr Verlag, pp. 135–68.
  • Valente, Luisa, 2008, Logique et théologie. Les écoles parisiennes entre 1150 et 1220, Paris: Vrin.
  • Wolfson, H. A., 1938, “The Amphibolous Terms in Aristotle, Arabic Philosophy and Maimonides,” Harvard Theological Review, 31: 151–73; reprinted in idem, Studies in the History of Philosophy and Religion, I. Twersky and G. H. Williams (eds.), Cambridge, MA and London: Harvard University Press, 1973. Volume 1, pp. 455–77.

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2017 by
E. Jennifer Ashworth <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free