School of Salamanca

First published Fri Mar 22, 2019

The School of Salamanca is a name for an intellectual movement or a certain group of theologians in sixteenth- and seventeenth-century Spain and Portugal. In a broad sense, it is more or less identical with Spanish Scholasticism, which also includes authors from the Spanish Netherlands. In a narrower sense, the School of Salamanca refers to two or three generations of pupils of Francisco de Vitoria, who was, in effect, the founding father of the school in both the broad and narrow sense. On the whole, it is more useful to choose the broader understanding of the term, even though it means considering some figures who were never at Salamanca; and this approach has been adopted here. Regarded as forefathers of the law of nations (ius gentium), they also were theoreticians willing to depart from the teachings of Aristotle, and some of them were early theorists of monetarist economics. They based themselves on the works of Thomas Aquinas but felt free to depart from them, especially in dealing with contemporary issues like Spanish expansion in the Indies and the challenge of Protestantism to Catholic Christianity.

1. The University of Salamanca

In order to understand the theoretical aspects of the School of Salamanca, it is necessary to give a short introduction to the history of the University of Salamanca. The focus will then turn to two Dominicans, Francisco de Vitoria and Domingo de Soto, and two Jesuits, Luis de Molina and Francisco Suárez, though there were, of course, many other extremely important participants in the various fields of discourse in which the School engaged.

The University of Salamanca is the oldest institution of higher education on the Iberian Peninsula. A cathedral school, located in Salamanca by 1130, received a charter from King Alfonso IX of León in 1218 as a “general school” for his realm. The regulations for this school were promulgated by King Alfonso X “el Sabio” in 1254. Pope Alexander IV, in 1255, confirmed the foundation of the studium generale and conferred on it the licentia ubique docendi, a universally valid license to teach. Thereafter, Salamanca was recognized as a university. Courses in theology and law were offered, with many graduates receiving employment by the crown of Spain. Lectures on authoritative texts were the most common means of teaching. Starting in the fifteenth century, professors also offered relectiones, treating in greater depth a particular topic previously covered during lectures. Disputations were also held. Christopher Columbus made his case for a sea route to Asia to the university before his voyage in 1492.

Two notable learned men, Juan de Segovia and Alfonso Tostado de Madrigal, were affiliated with the University of Salamanca in the fifteenth century. A short account of their careers will highlight the range of views that characterized Spanish theology at the university in those years. Juan, a professor of theology (1422–1435), participated in the Council of Basel (1431–1449), beginning in 1432. He defended conciliar supremacy and supported the doctrine of Mary’s immaculate conception. His writings include polemics on behalf of the council against Pope Eugenius IV (1431–1447) and a History of the General Council of Basel. Juan was made a cardinal by the antipope Felix V (1439–1449); but he retired after Felix yielded to Eugenius’ successor, Nicholas V (1447–1455). In retirement, Juan wrote on the need for dialogue with Islam. Aware of his impending death (c. 1458), Juan bequeathed his library to the university.

Alfonso Fernández de Madrigal, “el Tostado”, taught theology before becoming a bishop in 1454. He, too, supported the Council of Basel, and he displayed his knowledge in extensive writings on Scripture and ecclesiastical history. His tract on the polity defended popular regimes in a realm whose intellectuals usually embraced monarchy. Alfonso also wrote against clerical concubinage. Certain controversial opinions of his were denounced to both pope and council. The Castilian Dominican Juan de Torquemada wrote, on behalf of the Council of Basel, a critique of Alfonso’s views, to which he replied. Alfonso later defended his teachings in Rome before Pope Eugenius. “El Tostado”, on his death, left behind a reputation for great learning.

The Dominican order had established itself in Salamanca by 1244, when a provincial chapter was held in that city. The convent of San Esteban, chosen as the site of a studium generale of the order in 1299, offered courses in grammar, logic, and theology. During the fourteenth century, the Dominican convent gained control of two of the university’s four chairs of theology. In 1489, Salamanca’s Dominican studium received from the papacy the right to award academic degrees. The building now associated with Vitoria and his school was begun in 1524 but not finished until 1610, when the university was falling into decline. By that date, other Iberian universities, especially Alcalá and Coimbra, had become competitors of Salamanca for intellectual leadership. In addition, the Jesuits had become competitors of the Dominicans as leading philosophers and theologians. In Vitoria’s century, distinguished scholars at Salamanca included the jurist Martín de Azpilcueta, who is known for developing a monetarist theory, and the Scripture professor Gregorio Gallo, who considered the possibility that the Apostle Thomas had preached in the New World.

2. Francisco de Vitoria and His Disciples

Francisco de Vitoria (1486–1546) is usually regard as a late Scholastic, who employed Aristotelian thought in his philosophy and theology. Although Spanish Scholastics like Vitoria were primarily theologians, the topics they discussed went far beyond the limits of theology and even of the traditional philosophical companions of theology, such as metaphysics and logic. This is partly because Dominican theologians had to comment on the Summa theologiae of Thomas Aquinas (Sancti Thomae Aquinatis Doctoris Angelici Opera Omnia, volumes 4-12), with all the different topics it covered. The fifteenth and sixteenth centuries saw a revival of Thomism in Paris, Rome, and Salamanca. In Rome, Thomas de Vio (Cajetan) wrote the most influential commentary on the Summa theologiae. In Paris, Peter Crockaert, a pupil of John Mair, joined the Dominican order and became a zealous Thomist. Francisco de Vitoria, who studied in Paris, embraced this Thomist revival. When he began teaching in Salamanca in 1524, he supplemented Peter Lombard’s Sentences with the Summa theologiae as the textbook for the study of theology. Although the University of Salamanca was not a new foundation, Vitoria and his disciples, especially Domingo de Soto (1494–1560) and Melchior Cano (1509–1560), transformed it into a center for a revived Scholasticism, applying Thomism to such practical problems as the evangelization of the indigenous populations of the New World and the legality of slavery. In addition, the Dominicans of Castile influenced the intellectual development of the fledgling Jesuit order, which produced such luminaries as Luis de Molina (1535–1600) and Francisco Suárez (1548–1617).

Some works of these theologians can be seen as vast, overflowing commentaries on a number of questions from the Summa theologiae, especially on topics such as law and justice. Since they were confronted by a rapidly changing universe—the New World, populated by inhabitants who belonged to none of the traditionally known religions, and a globalizing economy (including the slave trade)—they had to deal with new opportunities and new problems, while still considering long-standing questions such as the legitimacy of charging interest. Because they were understood, or understood themselves, as confessors or as advisors of confessors—Domingo de Soto was Emperor Charles V’s confessor, Luis de Molina declared that he wrote for the confessors of those who hold power—they had to cope with political, economic, and legal reality, often in a quite detailed manner.

The authors of the School of Salamanca used traditional tools to deal with the new situations they faced. Besides the overarching influence of Thomas Aquinas—who became a Doctor of the Church in 1567 and whose works Ignatius of Loyola had obliged the members of his newly founded Jesuit order to study diligently—they engaged with other medieval traditions, including the glosses to the Decretum Gratiani, Franciscan authors (especially John Duns Scotus and William Ockham), Jean Gerson and even Marsilius of Padua, a banned author who was not even allowed to be cited, but nevertheless had a considerable impact on the conciliarist debate. Scholastic authors made a creative, instead of philologically correct, use of their authorities, interpreting and explaining them in their own sense. Molina and Suárez even overtly criticized Thomas Aquinas and his understanding of law.

Vitoria’s thought inevitably depended—but not slavishly—on Thomas Aquinas, not only in his commentary on the Summa theologiae, but also in his relectiones and other writings on law and society. His admiration for “Divus Thomas” had already begun when he studied and later taught theology at Paris and Valladolid. At Paris, he had assisted in the preparation of Crockaert’s edition of the Summa theologiae, published in 1515. His lectures commenting on the Prima and the Prima secundae of the Summa are lost, but must have been quite successful. His most famous works were published after he was elected to the first chair of theology at the University of Salamanca in 1526, the most important professorship in the Spanish kingdom; and, contrary to the statutes of the university, he took the Summa theologiae as the basis for his teachings (Vitoria, Vorlesungen 1995: 36). His reflections on political topics, such as the political status of the Church and the Conquista in Mexico and South America, were followed attentively in the highest circles, even if not always approved, as Emperor Charles V’s harsh reaction to Vitoria’s lecture De Indis showed.

Vitoria’s health became precarious in the 1540s, and the dominant role at Salamanca passed to his disciples. The most important of these was Domingo de Soto, who was born in Segovia 1494 of humble origins, studied in Alcalá and Paris, entered the Dominican order before he was thirty and was appointed to the second chair of theology, the Catedra de visperas, at the University of Salamanca in 1532. Later he became the prior of the Convent of San Esteban in Salamanca and was from 1548–1550 confessor to Charles V. After this, he returned to the university, where he held the first chair of theology. He died at San Esteban in 1560. Together with Melchior Cano, another important disciple of Vitoria, who later became bishop of the Canary Islands, he participated in the Council of Trent (1545–1563) by order of Spain’s privy council. Soto, although without a vote in the council, urged bishops to attend to the work of preaching; and he defended Scholastic theology against proposals to suppress it. Before returning to Spain, Soto helped with the preparations for Charles V’s Augsburg Interim (1548), which made concessions to the Protestants. One result of Soto’s presence at Trent was his tract De natura et gratia, which focused on the errors of Martin Luther, whose writings he called “diabolic” (Soto-DII VII, qu. 5 ad. 4; Grimm 2017: 64). In addition, he wrote an Apologia against a fellow Dominican, Ambrosius Catharinus Politus, concerning the certitude of grace.

Melchior Cano was less involved in controversy at Trent, concentrating instead on preaching and sacramental theology; however, another Dominican present at the council, Bartolomé Carranza (1503–1576), the future archbishop of Toledo, participated in the discussion of justification, arguing for “twofold justification”. Carranza was reported to be reading Luther’s works, a sign of future troubles in which his Commentary on the Christian Catechism was criticized by both Cano and Soto. Eventually, Carranza was condemned by the Inquisition for his views on nature and grace and underwent a long imprisonment, despite Soto’s efforts to defend him with a more balanced opinion, which Carranza cited in his own defense (Tellechea 1962).

Vitoria and his disciples engaged in arguments over Spain’s rights in the New World. The debate began when the Dominicans in the Antilles criticized the conquerors’ treatment of indigenous peoples. In a sermon given by the Dominican friar Antonio de Montesinos on December 21, the fourth Sunday of Advent 1511, in Hispaniola (today’s Haiti and Dominican Republic), the Spaniards who attended were told that they lived and died in mortal sin because of the cruelties they had inflicted upon the Amerindians. One of his listeners was Bartolomé de Las Casas (1474–1566), who joined the Dominican order and was converted by Montesinos into the most severe critic of the Conquista (Las Casas 1992).

A Junta of Burgos (1513) declared that Charles V had a sound title to the Indies. One argument in that context, grounded in Aristotle’s thought, was that the Amerindians were slaves by nature. This view did not remain uncontested; and, eventually, on June 2, 1537, Pope Paul III, influenced by Las Casas, issued the bull Sublimis Deus, declaring the indigenous peoples to be fully human with souls and just title to their possessions. The ongoing debate climaxed in the disputation between Las Casas, defending the liberty of the indigenous populations, and the humanist Aristotelian Juan Ginés de Sepúlveda (1494–1573), who defended the Spanish title to the Indies because of the Amerindian’s sins and because they were slaves by nature. This took place in the Junta of Valladolid (1550/51), which Charles V had assembled with a number of other leading scholars on both sides.

3. The Role of the Jesuits

After the deaths of Domingo de Soto and Melchior Cano, the reputation of Salamanca’s Dominicans declined. Domingo Bañez (1528–1604), a pupil of Cano, is the best known of their successors. When his commentary on Thomas’ Summa appeared (1584), admitting of no dissent from its doctrines, it provoked a controversy over the theology of grace and free will. Bañez—also the confessor of St. Theresa of Avila—was opposed by the Jesuit Luis de Molina, who accused him of being overly deterministic.

Molina was born in Cuenca (Spain) in 1535, entered the Jesuit order at the age of 18, studied in Salamanca and Coimbra, taught theology in Évora (Portugal) from 1568 to 1583 and later in Lisbon. In 1591 he was sent to the Jesuit college of his home town of Cuenca and was elected in 1600 to the chair of moral theology at the Jesuit College in Madrid, where he died in the same year. In 1588 Molina published a volume entitled Liberi arbitrii cum gratiae donis, divina praescientia, providentia, praedestinatione et reprobatione concordia (Molina 1588 [1953]), usually abbreviated as Concordia, in which he tried to reconcile free will with grace, God’s pre-knowledge, providence, etc. It produced a devastating effect (see below and MacGregor 2015), a passionate debate between Dominicans and Jesuits, raising accusations of both Pelagian and Calvinist heresy, both of which were extremely dangerous for Catholic theologians. This controversy continued until a congregation De auxiliis meeting in Rome under Paul V decreed (1607) that Dominicans and Jesuits could hold their own opinions on efficacious grace. The conflict did not end, however, and in 1611 the Roman Inquisition forbade the publication of any further books on the topic—the most drastic case of ecclesiastical censorship in the seventeenth century (Knebel 2000: 170).

In general, the Jesuits felt less bound than Dominicans to the opinions of Thomas Aquinas, which meant that Molina and Suárez were allowed a greater degree of originality in their teachings. For this reason, some modern scholars emphasize the differences between the Dominican School of Salamanca and the Jesuit School of Coimbra, which came after it, though both belong to the broad tradition of Spanish Scholasticism.

Suárez was a student at Salamanca in 1561, when he joined the Society of Jesus. He was an educator, settling eventually in Coimbra, where he produced a tract De legibus ac Deo legislatore (1612). As a polemicist, he intervened in the quarrel over the oath of allegiance imposed by James I on English Catholics after the Gunpowder Plot (1605). Suárez and his Jesuit contemporary Robert Bellarmine were the most important Catholic writers on political and ecclesiological issues following the Council of Trent.

With the death of Suárez, the School of Salamanca and its offshoots lost their creative edge. Instead, there was an urge to recapitulation. The Discalced Carmelites produced an enormous compilation of past thought, the Cursus Theologiae Moralis; and the publication of its third volume in 1670 is often treated as marking the end of the School of Salamanca.

4. Theology and Church Law

A common theological topic for the authors of the School of Salamanca was the need to resist what they considered to be Lutheran heresies (Skinner 1978: 135–173). They suspected, for instance, that connecting legal authority to the virtue of princes could “inveigle away the hearts of simple men from due obedience to their princes and their priests”, as Vitoria put it (De potestate ecclesiastica I qu. 1, art. 2; transl. Vitoria 1991b: 55); and they regarded as heretical the view that grace is not increased directly by the sacraments ex opere operato but requires the faith of the recipient (De potestate ecclesiastica I qu. 2, art. 2). Other points at issue were whether all Christians could be seen as priests (ibid., II qu. 2, art. 1), the role of papacy, the veneration of the Virgin Mary, and the central problem of free will, which was denied by Luther. As we shall see, the problem of free will and grace also gave rise to an extremely bitter and long-lasting controversy inside Catholicism after the Council of Trent between Dominicans and Jesuits.

Vitoria’s awareness of the challenge of Luther to Catholicism affected his teaching and that of his successors. In his Relectiones de potestate ecclesiastica (1532–1533) and Relectio de potestate papae et concilii (1534), he was critical of the Roman curia, especially on account of its free-handed distribution of dispensations; but he was careful not to open the way for any assault on the papacy and Catholic orthodoxy.

Vitoria’s basic ecclesiology was traditional, identifying the ecclesia as the “congregation of the faithful”. When heretics left this community, they did so like deserters from an army. The Church received its power from Christ, which was distinct from that of lay regimes, in order to promote good and resist evil. The priesthood of the New Law superseded that of the Old Law. The Church’s power had two aspects: orders and jurisdiction. Orders involved the sacraments, especially the eucharist and penance. Jurisdiction included spiritual censures inflicted on erring believers. By divine command, the Church was a “perfect” community, that is, one which was able to defend itself and punish iniquity.

Christ established the papacy to look after the Church’s welfare. Priests administered the sacraments under the supervision of the pope and the bishops. Orders came via the apostles but jurisdiction via Peter, Christ’s vicar. It was the responsibility of his successors, the popes, to build up the Church. Bishops legislated for their diocese or province, but the pope acted for the whole Church. Vitoria expressed great respect for general councils as gatherings of bishops, but he maintained that a council did not have power superior to that of the pope. Moreover, after considering the councils of the fifteenth century, which had resolved the Great Western Schism (1378–1417), he denied conciliarism in its dogmatic form. The most ancient councils had not claimed that supreme power was invested in the Church.

Spiritual power was superior to temporal, but that did not make the pope lord of the world. Papal power could have an impact on Christian regimes, making and unmaking rulers, but only for spiritual ends. The pontiff could authorize just wars against the Saracens and other enemies of the faith. The ecclesiastical commonwealth had its powers from grace, but grace did not cancel nature. On the contrary: according to Thomas Aquinas “grace presupposes nature and perfects it” (“Gratia praesupponit naturam et perficit eam”: Summa theologiae I qu. I art. 8 ad 2).

The topic of grace and free will was the main ingredient of the controversy over Molinism. It began with the work of Molina mentioned above, Liberi arbitrii cum gratiae donis, divina praescientia, providentia, praedestinatione et reprobatione concordia (Molina 1588 [1953]), in which he explains how God can preserve his omnipotence, providence, and pre-knowledge, while conceding free will to humans, by means of his scientia media, or “middle knowledge”, which gives him the ability to know what human beings will decide—but no control over their decisions. Scientia media is placed between scientia naturalis, by which God knows everything that can be, and scientia libera, by which he knows what will be. Molina places God’s counterfactual knowledge before the creation—contrary to Luther and Calvin. God’s omnipotence consists in the possibility that he could have created beings without the capacity to accept or reject the offer of grace by their will (Concordia pars IV, disp. 52). Furthermore, humans are able by their free will, without the special help of God (“sine auxilio speciali Dei”: Concordia pars I, disp. 5; Molina 1588 [1953: 29]), but only with his concursus generale, to act morally in a temporal sense; however, they need grace within temporal life and God’s special help for the effort to receive eternal grace, i.e., the visio beatifica, the vision of God of the blessed after their death. In the ensuing controversy, known as De auxiliis, fierce criticisms came from the Dominican Domingo Bañez, who had the first chair of theology at Salamanca, and his pupils; they held a special Thomist theory of grace, which referred to the praedeterminatio physica, mankind’s inability to resist God’s grace.

It is easy to forget that Suárez was concerned not only with metaphysics and law; but he has also been described as the founder of Mariology on account of his treatment of the Immaculate Conception and Mary’s bodily assumption. Suárez took a balanced view of the issues of divine foreknowledge, free will, and predestination in the De auxiliis controversy; and, building on Molina, he developed the doctrine of Congruism, which argued that God had arranged matters to allow free will to assent to grace. He also discussed how God rewards the good and punishes sinners.

Suárez was a confirmed papalist, who regarded the Holy See as necessary to the Church’s unity. Canon law existed as a distinct aspect of human law, supporting humanity’s higher ends and unifying all peoples. The pope was divinely guided in pronouncements on doctrine, and he had a universal responsibility to spread the gospel. Suárez, however, refused to accept evangelization as an excuse for war. Not even unnatural acts justified the use of violence. Consequently, Suárez, like Vitoria and Soto, upheld the legitimacy of non-Christian regimes operating within the bounds of natural law.

5. Natural Law, Political Theory, and the Rise of International Law

5.1 Natural Law

One of the generally acknowledged merits of the School of Salamanca was the revival of natural law or at least its Thomist version. This was more or less closely connected to commentaries on the second part of Thomas Aquinas’ Summa theologiae. Vitoria’s lectures on the quaestiones 90–105 of the Prima secundae, entitled De lege, dealing with the different kinds of law, and his voluminous commentary on the Secunda secundae are now available in critical editions by Vicente Beltrán de Heredia. Molina described his monumental De iustitia et iure, which in current forms of printing would take up around 6,000 pages, as a commentary on quaestiones 57–79 in the Secunda secundae of the Summa theologiae, but he admitted that he was not following Thomas precisely and that his theory covered a wider range compared to what had been discussed by “Divus Thomas”. Whether the ten volumes of Suárez’s De legibus ac Deo legislatore are primarily to be seen as a commentary on quaestiones 90–108 of the Prima secundae is still debated by modern scholars. Soto, who is mentioned by Suárez as one of his main sources besides Thomas Aquinas, commented on questions from both the Prima secundae and Secunda secundae in the ten books of his extremely influential treatise De iustitia et iure. The common background for all the authors of the School of Salamanca, as well as their Jesuit successors, who dealt with law, natural law, and justice was, therefore, Thomas Aquinas’s division of the different kinds of law in the Prima secundae and his reflections on the different meanings of justice, law, and right from the Secunda secundae, whether they followed him or not.

The classification of laws in the Summa (Ia IIae, qu. 91–4) begins with God’s regulation of the universe via the eternal law, manifest to humans through revealed divine law and through natural law, which was accessible by reason. Humans, even those lacking revelation, could derive from natural law the principles for enacting human law. Human law, inevitably, had to be adapted to time, place and climate and was, therefore, limited. Nor was reason able to craft laws covering all contingencies. They had to be useful to the commonwealth and also mutable if circumstances changed. Dispensations were required where a law did not apply in a particular case. Disobeying laws was a vice, while obeying them was a virtue. Divine law, embodied in the Old Law or the New Law, which regulated contingent elements of religious cult, but also the punishment of those who had escaped human justice, was in accordance with natural law and eternal law: it just had its specific functions. Human laws were invalid if they contradicted either divine or natural law. In the quaestiones 57–79 of the Secunda secundae, Thomas addressed questions such as “Whether right is the object of justice”, and “What is justice?”; he also discussed judgment, kinds of justice, restitution, injustice, kinds of injustice, and so on.

Vitoria followed this schema in his lectures on the Summa theologiae, especially in his 1533–1534 lectures and in his commentary. He treated law as made by “reason and enlightenment”, not just the will. Natural law, derived from eternal law by reason, was binding on all humanity; its principles applied to mutable situations and different peoples. God was the indirectly cause of human laws, which were binding on the conscience of individuals. There was a human urge to obey natural law, for example, by honoring one’s parents, preferably out of love. Failure to heed these precepts was a moral fault.

The gospel was valid when promulgated by Christ, but barbarians ignorant of the gospel might violate its commands in a pardonable way. The Church had general laws which were applicable anywhere, and failure to obey them was sinful. Human legislators could enact laws favoring religion, but they must not confuse their role with that of the clergy under divine law.

Human laws were intended to serve the common good, not the interests of the legislator, who was “the servant of the commonwealth”. Any “perfect” community, sacred or secular, had the power to make and enforce laws. Human laws were binding once publicly promulgated; but the Church had its laws from God. The Church had one ruler on earth, the pope, the vicar of Christ, just as the universe was ruled by God; but, like other rulers, the Roman pontiff delegated power for its effective exercise.

Despite the preeminent place that Thomas Aquinas occupied for these authors, there are significant deviations from the Thomist concept of natural law that are shared by some of them, who at times also directly criticized the “Doctor Angelicus”. Suárez, for instance, says that law has to be seen as something that rules the behavior of beings capable of free decisions (De legibus I iii 2); therefore, Thomas’ concept of an eternal law that rules the whole universe can be understood as a law only in a metaphorical sense. There are still ongoing debates as to whether eternal law can be seen as the theological basis of all other kinds of law (Schweighöfer 2018: 234–256). Natural law, for Thomas, on the one hand, is known to humans because of their participation as rational beings in eternal law, but, on the other, it is at least partially shared with animals (Summa theologiae Ia IIae qu. 95 art. 4 ad 1; IIa IIae qu. 57 art. 3 co) in parallel to Roman Law (Digest 1,1,1,4). Its role for Thomas was labeled as something like a “style”, i.e., a universal principle (Westerman 1998: 81) governing animate nature. For Suárez it becomes a device to rule the behavior of humans as rational beings who are responsible for their activities. It not only contains the most general principles of law, leaving the more detailed regulations to human law, but also everything that follows logically from these principles; otherwise not even the ten commandments would belong to natural law. According to Suárez, natural law is the voice of right reason which effects human behavior via man’s conscience, and

a man who is led by this law is said to be his own law, because he has the law written within himself. (“dicitur homo, qui illo ducitur, sibi lex, quia habet in se scriptam legem”: De legibus II v 9–10)

This conceptual shift was initiated at least implicitly by Vitoria in his commentary on quaestio 57. Thomas gives as an example of what is just by nature in an absolute sense the natural inclination of the male to the female for the sake of procreation and the efforts of parents to nurture their children. Vitoria replaces these examples by the obligation to return deposits and the Golden Rule. This moralization of natural law is not found in all the authors under consideration. Molina, for example, argues that someone who uses the extreme poverty of another to make that person his slave, instead of providing help without imposing conditions, commits a sin against charity; but the contract is valid according to natural law (Molina-DII II, disp. 34).

The Salamancan theologians and their successors not only discussed and modified Thomist natural law but also referred to other sources with slightly different categorizations, such as the distinction between ius humanum and ius naturale vel divinum made by Isidore of Seville (Liber etymologiarum, lib. 5 c. 2–18, Isidori Hispalensis episcopi etymologiarum libro XX, 1833), cited in Decretum Gratiani (Friedberg [ed.], Corpus Iuris Canonici, vol. 1, 1–5) and discussed by Soto (Soto-DII I, qu. V, art. iii and iv). There were many further differences among them on natural law, as on law in general. For instance, with regard to whether law was an act of will or an act of intellect, some, like Soto, favored the intellect despite his early education in Nominalist-dominated Paris, where voluntarism, an emphasis on the will over the intellect, prevailed; others, like Suárez, gave some relevance to the will. Nevertheless, they were in agreement that the principles of natural law were inscribed in the heart of humans, so that “no human being can plead ignorance as an excuse”, as Soto put it (Soto-DII I, qu. I art. 4; translated in Hamilton 1963: 15). Suárez’s concept of law has been described as voluntarist, but reason still played a significant role in his thought. Reason diagnosed situations, identifying possible remedies; but the will implemented these measures. These deliberations happened within the context of immutable natural law, which Suárez believed was known through specific precepts. In addition, he held that individual virtue lay in following right reason. Reason’s dictates were unique to human beings, not impulses shared with animals. The laws common to many peoples, though not universal, made up the ius gentium. What may seem at first glance an acknowledgment of the moral competence of all human beings was also used to justify punishment, including war and enslavement, against peoples from other continents.

It is the ius gentium, not natural law, that regulates the distribution of property and the enslavement of human beings. The immutable natural law, however, gives permission for these activities, because, after the Fall, the circumstances of its application changed dramatically, making an enforced regulation of possession necessary (see, e.g., Suárez, De legibus L I xvi 7). Although property—or dominium as it was called—is not part of human nature, according to the majority of Salamancan thinkers and their followers, there are many reflections by different authors arguing for the advantages of private property. Soto and Molina make direct use of Aristotelian and Thomist arguments, saying that common ownership would prevent men from working and from taking care of their things to the disadvantage of the common good (Soto-DII IV, 3; Molina-DII II, 19; see Chafuen 2003: 3–38). There are differences concerning the way in which dominium in this sense is bound by regulations from positive and natural law. Most authors, such as Vitoria, in his commentary on quaestio 66 in the Secunda secundae of the Summa theologiae, accepted the Thomist view that those in extreme need are entitled to take what is necessary for their survival. Martin de Azpilcueta (1491–1586), known as “Doctor Navarrus” or “Navarro”, however, held that there is no obligation to donate to those who are in extreme need and that anyone who receives such a donation must see it as a loan, not as something of his own (Chafuen 2003: 44).

Some of these theologians adopted an understanding of the word ius in the sense of right, even subjective right. This is not a Salamancan invention but seems to have been initiated in the glosses to the Decretum Gratiani and enforced by authors like Ockham and Gerson (Tierney 1997). But it plays an important role in arguments on dominium—a term that oscillates between domination and property—and in reflections on the ius gentium. The first lecture of Vitoria’s De Indis deals with the question of whether the Indians may be called veri domini, that is, real masters or real possessors, of their goods, and the third lecture claims that they violated the rights of the Spaniards. Molina takes this subjective meaning of ius as the paradigmatic understanding of the term throughout his voluminous treatise De iustitia et iure. He defines ius as

a faculty to do or have something or to maintain it or to behave in any way such that if it is hindered without legitimate reason an injury is done to the person who has it. This way, that right, in this meaning, becomes something like a measure of injury: because as much as it is opposed and damaged without legitimate reason, injury is done to the one who has it. (Molina-DII II, 1)

Though it may be exaggerated to call the School of Salamanca the cradle of human rights, individual rights are pivotal for a number of their arguments. Molina states that a slave may have a ius qua homo, even in the special case of a right to things he has won from his master in gambling and suchlike. Furthermore, he declares that an injustice toward someone is a violation of that person’s rights, and he gives a number of examples where injustice is done toward a slave and must be corrected or punished. We may, therefore. conclude that slaves also have rights in his system (Molina-DII II, 38).

5.2 Political Theory

The central topics in the political theory of authors from the School of Salamanca are the aim of political community, the legitimacy of its power and the relationship between the commonwealth and its ruler.

In his lecture On Civil Power (De potestate civili), Vitoria holds that every power, public or private, comes from God and cannot be abolished by human beings, not even if they are in full consensus. Vitoria’s ideas about society depended partly on his Aristotelian belief that human beings are social by nature, needing others to survive and achieve a good life. Thus, a natural good, survival, not moral goodness, was its original purpose. Nature, following God’s purpose, had implanted in early peoples the urge to establish households, cities, and regimes. Society eventually came to promote virtues, especially justice and amity, which supported the common good. He followed in a certain sense an Aristotelian line, using the theory of the four causes for his analysis, first of public, then of private power, and starting with the final cause, which was regarded in the Aristotelian and Thomist tradition as the necessary cause. According to Vitoria, “the origin of human cities and commonwealths was not a human invention … but a device implanted by nature in man for his own survival” and for the sake of this it also needs an “ordering force” (ibid., qu. 1, art. 2, p. 9). The efficient cause of public power is God, and its material cause is the commonwealth itself. Royal power is not from the commonwealth, even if the king is elected, but from God himself (ibid., qu. 1 art. 5). Non-Christians have legitimate rulers, and a legitimately constituted power cannot be abolished by the consent of the people (ibid., qu.1. art 6–7).

All peoples created regimes: since a multitude could not govern itself well, power was entrusted to a group or individual acting for the common good. The best regime, in Vitoria’s opinion, was rule by one person, who was both above the community and within it. Individuals might even sacrifice their lives in defense of the common good. Society’s natural purpose, the preservation of temporal life of its members, was not in contradiction to the Church’s end: the salvation of souls. In a Christian commonwealth, salvation was the primary purpose, with human felicity as the secondary end. The commonwealth transferred its power to the ruler, but his power ultimately derived from God; and after its transfer of power to the ruler, the commonwealth ceased to be able to legislate. Since the ruler was within the commonwealth, he was bound by its laws. Vitoria states that monarchy is the best form of government, but insists that a whole commonwealth may be punished for the sins of its king, if he, for example, wages an unjust war against another prince (ibid., qu. 1 art. 8–9). This commonplace among the theorists of the ius gentium was important for some of the justifications of slavery and the slave trade, because captives in a just war traditionally became slaves and because the punishment of a whole commonwealth decided the fate of all its members, regardless of their individual guilt or innocence.

Once different temporal regimes were created, each ruler was situated within a commonwealth. The ruler of France could not legislate for Spain. A ruler with multiple realms, like Emperor Charles V, had to promulgate laws in each region. Within a realm, custom was supposed to reinforce law or to be enforced itself. A ruler was best advised to support good customs. Vitoria faced the possibility that some laws might be obeyed only by a few citizens, in which case they could be revoked by the ruler. Revoking laws arbitrarily, however, might be sinful. Even a tyrant’s laws had to be obeyed if they served the common good. Vitoria claimed that legislators are bound by civil laws (ibid., qu. 3 art. 4), but that the laws of tyrant are valid (ibid., qu. 3 art. 6), a view which conflicts with positions later held by Jesuits. The community, according to Vitoria, retained the right to defend itself against a tyrant threatening its survival, but it could not abolish a licit regime. The regime did not have to be Christian, but a non-Christian regime could not be overthrown solely on the grounds of injustice.

Soto never denied that God is the ultimate origin of the Christian commonwealth, but he distinguished between the natural and supernatural order and held that, in the natural, temporal order, peace and tranquility have to be guaranteed by the commonwealth and can be identified with the bonum commune (Grimm 2017: 74–77; Soto-DII I, qu.1 art. 2). This internal peace, the bonum commune, is the aim of any legitimate law; on the other hand, it is stabilized by just laws, which are more easily waged by a peaceful society. In this way, the theologians of the School of Salamanca implicitly paved the way for a secular understanding of the state as a human institution that preserves peace and prosperity within a society. There are differences between some of the authors concerning the anthropological question of whether human organizations and the distribution of property were already to be found in statu innocentiae or only later, after the Fall, when domination and property became necessary because of human weakness.

Molina explained why and how domination was introduced after the Fall, coining the term dominium iurisdictionis for temporal power, in contrast to dominium proprietatis (Molina-DII II, 20; II, 22; II, 23; Brett 2011), in order to avoid the equivocal use of the term dominium that had confused discussions since the debate on Franciscan poverty in thirteenth and fourteenth centuries (Brett 1997). The political authority of the commonwealth—res publica—is directly given by God, as it was difficult to imagine that there was a new contract in every generation. Nevertheless, the power (potestas) of the government comes only indirectly from God and directly from the republic (Molina-DII II, 26.4). Molina accepted the common Salamancan view that communities had transferred power to rulers.

All dominion was founded on natural reason, shared even by non-Christians. “Government is the channel through which the natural power of the commonwealth is exercised” (Costello 1974: 49). Therefore, if a government misuses its power by trying to exercise a dominium proprietatis over its citizen, that is, treating them like slaves, there is a right to resist. This also holds for a king, notwithstanding that, for Molina, monarchy was the best form of government (Molina-DII II, 23.10). While this resistance has to be supported by the common will of the citizens in the case of abuse of power by a legitimate ruler, every citizen has the right to kill an illegitimate usurper of power (Molina-DII III, 6.2).

Suárez believed that individual peoples reached agreement on the need for government. God then granted rulers power to direct humanity toward its proper ends. Critics of his thought like Robert Filmer objected to bringing in God at this late stage, in order to explain the formation of regimes, rather than emphasizing his role in the creation of commonwealths since Adam (Filmer 1680: chap. II 2). Suárez thought that it was the responsibility of the ruler to promote harmony between subjects, to exercise power well, and to enact laws to perfect the community. He also treated the relationship of law to conscience and that of ecclesiastical to lay powers. Like many representatives of Spanish Scholasticism, Suárez favored monarchy, within limits, as the best regime. Individuals had the right to self-defense, as did the society as a whole, and they might resist a ruler who acted badly. Suárez even contemplated the possibility that tyrants could be killed for threatening the survival of the commonwealth. In his polemics against King James I of England, he argued for the immunity of the Church from control by lay regimes. The English oath, the so-called oath of allegiance that King James had required his subjects to take in 1606, the year after the Gunpowder Plot, he said, violated this immunity and undermined obedience to the Roman pontiff in spiritual matters. Suárez was willing to believe that the pope could exhort the people to rise up against a tyrant or to invoke the aid of outsiders against one. Except in such cases, however, Christians were to obey their lay rulers in conformity with natural law. This right to resistance was widely taken for granted by the Jesuits and considerably expanded by Juan de Mariana (1536–1624). Although recent scholarship has cast doubt on the traditional labeling of Mariana as an early exponent of popular sovereignty (Braun 2007), the Catholic zealot who assassinated Henry IV of France in 1610 is known to have referred to his writings.

6. Ius gentium, ius ad bellum, and the Enslavement of Indians, Africans, and Others

6.1 The Spanish Indies Debate

Among the most influential elements in the works from the School of Salamanca are those connected to what was called the ius gentium until the late eighteenth century but is nowadays referred to as international law. Firstly, they separated the ius gentium from natural law, with which it had more or less been identified with since the formulation of Roman Law; secondly, they developed a martial law on the basis of quaestio 40 in the Secunda secundae of Thomas Aquinas’s Summa theologiae; and thirdly, they treated the alleged right to enslave non-European human beings.

When James Brown Scott (1934: 3, 160) called Vitoria the father of modern international law, it was mainly in reference to his lectures on the problems associated with the Indies. Vitoria’s opinions on this matter loomed large in this debate. He addressed the Indies in three relectiones: De temperantia (1537), De Indis (1539), and De iure belli (1539). In the first of these he discussed cannibalism, while in the others he considered whether a just war could be waged against indigenous peoples and whether Spain’s title to the Indies was valid. In addition, Vitoria, lecturing on the Summa theologiae (1534), discussed evangelization. His account of the right to rule also extended to the role of the clergy in evangelizing peoples who, before 1492, had never heard of Christ.

As mentioned above, in the first of his three lectures De Indis, delivered in the summer of 1539, he shows that the Amerindians were veri domini of their goods, even if they were unbelievers, sinners, and irrational (Vitoria 1991b: 239–250). He discussed the argument from Aristotle that “barbarians” were little better than animals, madmen or those lacking sense, then he turned to an argument of apologists for the Conquista, claiming that Amerindians were infidels, living in a perpetual state of mortal sin, requiring Christian intervention. He dismissed the argument from sin, on the grounds that sin did not cancel natural dominium. Brute beasts lacked such rights, but even children and the mad, although they had guardians, nevertheless had property rights. Aristotle wrote about those who needed direction from others, but this did not negate ownership. Vitoria extended rightful ownership even to Saracens. He blamed the poor education of indigenous peoples, which he compared to that of many European peasants, for their depraved condition. Slavery, he added, was a legal or civil construct. No one was a slave by nature.

The second lecture lists seven “unjust titles” for the war against the Amerindians. Vitoria rejected the idea that either the emperor or the pope is master of the world. He denied that Emperor Charles V could take away the domains of others. He cited Juan de Torquemada’s Summa de ecclesia to prove that the pope’s supremacy was spiritual, not temporal; and he maintained that the pope could not force unbelievers to convert. According to Vitoria, discovery was not a justification for conquest; and he refuted the view that sins against nature like cannibalism and incest, which were exceptions to the natural immunity that canon law allowed to non-believers, justified conquest. There were sinners in every nation, but the pope was not entitled to wage war against Christians who were guilty of sin. Furthermore, neither the alleged voluntary choice of the Amerindians nor the idea of a gift from God could justify the conquest of their territory (Vitoria 1991b: 252–276).

The third lecture, finally, lists eight “just titles” for the war against Amerindians, among them the violation of the right of Spaniards to travel in the Indies and to conduct missions, the protection of innocents, etc. (Vitoria 1991b: 278–291). Vitoria argued for free intercourse between all peoples: indigenous rulers could not exclude Christians from their lands, and Christian travelers attacked by the local inhabitants had the right of self-defense. Spanish children born in the New World were able to choose, under natural law and the ius gentium, to become citizens of the country where they resided. Vitoria also argued for the right to evangelize. Christians could intervene to protect converts, allies, and friends. He warned, however, that waging war on indigenous peoples might obstruct conversion. Vitoria weakened his defense of the Indians by saying that Spain might govern them for their own benefit. The indigenous peoples might even be treated “partly as slaves”. Moreover, once large-scale conversions had taken place, Spain could not abandon the New World.

In De temperantia Vitoria stated that all nations regarded cannibalism as an abomination. A prince might convert and suppress evil customs like human sacrifice on the grounds of justice; but foreign princes could not intervene. Vitoria also dismissed arguments from sins against nature as calumnies intended to excuse warfare and plunder.

Vitoria and the other authors of the School of Salamanca dealt with martial law and developed a theory of just wars that was, on the one hand, based on Thomas Aquinas’ arguments and, on the other hand, built on the foundation of the “classical doctrine of just war” (Orend 2006). Vitoria dealt with just war in his lecture De Indis relectio posterior sive De iure belli. He discusses who can wage war—private persons only for self-defense, the commonwealth, and the prince also for other reasons (Vitoria 1991b: 299–302); what cannot be considered just reasons for waging war, such as difference in religion and enlargement of empire (1991b: 302–304); what can be done in a just war (1991b: 304–306, 314–317); and the view that it may not be enough if a prince believes that his war is just (1991b: 306–7). Vitoria regarded “perfect” commonwealths as able to defend themselves from internal and external threats. The right of self-defense permitted the use of force to repel force. A society, pagan or Christian, could wage a just war in self-defense and execute malefactors. Vitoria accepted repelling invaders and avenging injury as justifications for war, but not the invasion of realms in order to acquire land, slaves or plunder. Religious difference and the vainglory of princes were also not sufficient reasons. Those in authority could declare and wage war, but they should take counsel about this. Subjects could not refuse service in a just war. All necessary means were acceptable in a just conflict, even entering an enemy’s territory. Vitoria, however, applied a criterion of proportional harm to wars, so that a war was unjust if it caused more harm than good. Moreover, a ruler who had waged an unjust war was obliged to make restitution. Booty could recompense property unjustly seized by an enemy, but only if taken on a superior’s orders. Vitoria permitted enslaving Saracens defeated in a just conflict, but he denied that Christians could enslave other Christians. Moreover, he denounced devices used in capturing slaves for export. Overall, Christians were expected to abide by the rules of war, showing moderation and humility when victorious.

Similar ideas—legitimate authority; just cause, which only one side can have; trying all other ways of conflict resolution; etc.—can be found in Suárez’ De bello, the thirteenth disputation of his De caritate. Molina, however, seems to have believed that, at least from a subjective point of view, both sides may believe that their cause is just (Fernandes 2014).

According to Molina, moreover, the ius gentium was not entirely a part of natural law, since it affirmed natural principles but also embodied positive laws, including private property and slavery. Generally, it was in the period between Vitoria and Suárez that natural law was separated from the ius gentium, further divided by Suárez into the ius supra gentes (the law above nations) and the ius inter gentes (the law among nations), which eventually became international law in the strict sense. Natural law and ius gentium were quite close to each other in Roman Law and in Thomas Aquinas; but Vitoria, in his commentary on quaestio 57 in the Secunda secundae of the Summa theologiae, already maintained that, for Thomas, the ius gentium was part of positive law. Suárez makes it clear that, in contrast to natural law, which is inscribed in the heart of human beings and is immutably valid for all of them, the ius gentium is a positive convention among peoples or nations, which is valid for all or nearly for all of them; it includes the right to punish those who are defeated in a just war and, therefore, also the right of enslavement (De legibus II xviii 8).

It was furthermore the consensus among a majority of authors in the School of Salamanca that no wars could be waged against non-Christians by reason of their infidelity and that hostile actions could be resisted in self-defense. As we have seen, however, this natural immunity did not extend to permitting cannibalism or human sacrifice. Molina, who favored the right to evangelize and permitted armed protection for missionaries, was more wary than Vitoria of making free commerce a right enforceable by war, using arguments which are somewhat similar to those of Immanuel Kant, limiting “cosmopolitan right … to conditions of universal hospitality” in his treatise Toward Perpetual Peace (Kant 1795 [1996: 328–331]). For Molina as for Kant, the locals have merely charitable obligations toward those who arrive in their territories, if they are in need. They have no obligation to open them their ports. Countries might refuse to trade if they feared that commerce was an excuse for conquest (Molina-DII II, 105). Just wars could be waged by rulers, but hating the enemy was prohibited. Subjects were obliged to inquire about a ruler’s decision to wage a just war if there was “honest doubt” about it. Molina was willing to concede to the pope a role mediating between Christian rulers, but he warned against intervening directly in their squabbles.

One of the recurring questions with respect to the treatment of indigenous peoples was whether their enslavement as slaves by nature in the traditional Aristotelian sense was justified. As mentioned above, a famous discussion of this issue took place at the Junta of Valladolid, when the Aristotelian Juan Ginés Sepúlveda debated with the Dominican Bartolomé de Las Casas, an ardent defender of the Amerindians and their rights. Sepúlveda argued that the Amerindians, as barbarians, were slaves by nature, more or less on the level of beasts. Las Casas maintained that although there were humans so simple-minded that they could be considered slaves by nature, such people existed in Spain as well as in the Americas (Hanke 1959: 28–74).

Soto, who also participated in the debate in Valladolid, said that the ius gentium was a universally applicable form of positive human law, which was created by applying reason to natural principles. This law governed trade, exchange of envoys, and even slavery, if it spared lives during war. It also included respect for property, even of non-Christians, to avoid squabbles over possessions. Nor was conversion a just reason for going to war and enslaving conquered peoples.

Soto once considered going to the New World to resolve the controversies there. Unable to go himself, he advocated sending good missionaries. In addition, his writings were employed by the Third Mexican Council (1585) in the preparation of a confessors’ manual geared to a world of both Hispanic and Amerindian residents (Poole [ed.] 2018). Soto’s relectio on dominion concluded that Spain’s title to the Indies was hard to justify. He rejected the opinion of Sepúlveda on the justice of waging war on infidels, also Pope Alexander VI’s division of overseas domains between Spain and Portugal. Soto was trusted by all participants in the Junta of Valladolid to summarize the conflicting opinions of Las Casas and Sepúlveda, though he, or perhaps Cano, another critic of conquest, may have been the one person who, according to Sepúlveda, opposed him. The Dominicans of Salamanca continued to argue for just conduct by Spaniards in their overseas dominions; and also Jesuits like Molina, even in their defense of slavery and slave trade, did not refer to the concept of slaves by nature. Soto, though accepting slavery, rejected the idea of natural slavery: in his view, human beings who were incapable of leading their own lives clearly had to be guided by wiser men, but for reasons of their own well-being, not as living tools in the Aristotelian sense. So, slavery for him was merely conventional.

Molina, who wrote the first treatise on the Portuguese transatlantic slave trade, followed Soto on this point, accepting only conventional slavery. He justified slavery and mentioned the four just titles for enslavement: committing certain crimes; being captured in a just war; selling oneself because of urgent need; and the principle of partus sequitur ventrem, that is, the children of enslaved mothers are also slaves (Molina-DII II, disp. 33). Then he described the history of the Portuguese slave trade and gave a critical evaluation of it (Molina-DII II, disp. 34–35). Interestingly, although he dealt intensively with the transatlantic slave trade, especially from Africa, he never put forward a justification for enslavement based on race, though in his age were drawn to it. For example, Noah’s curse on the children of Ham – or more correctly of Caanan (Genesis 9:20–7) – for mocking his drunken nakedness, making them slaves of Sem and Japhet. Medieval connections to Ham to blackness were used as a justification of Africans from at least the fifteenth century to the nineteenth (Whitford 2009; Goldenberg 2017).

7. Economic Theory

Alongside the debates on just war, colonization, and the slave trade, economics is perhaps the most striking example of how the theologians from the School of Salamanca used and transformed traditional medieval theories in order to deal with new situations, creating innovative solutions that had long-lasting influence. They have often been mentioned as the ancestors of the Austrian School of Economics, that in the late nineteenth and twentieth century emphasized the role of the consumer’s estimation in the development of prices and the importance of the market against any attempt at rationally planning economic processes, while Molina has been described as a “solid economic liberal” (Rothbard 2006: 113). This may be a restrictive interpretation, because there is an undeniable relevance of the medieval heritage with its rigid condemnation of usury to be found in the authors from the school of Salamanca. Their views on economy are founded in natural law, implying therefore a normative view of economic processes instead of the purely strategic rationality of a homo oeconomicus. Nonetheless, the general consensus is that there are liberal elements in late Scholastic economics (Schüssler 2014). Among the topics they dealt with were public finance, the danger of exhausting public treasuries and of excessive taxes (Chafuen 2003: 53–60), the just price for different goods and the problem of charging interest for lending money, which was connected to the traditional condemnation of usury. The exchange of money was another major issue, because there were a large number of monetary systems simultaneously in use within the Spanish and Portuguese kingdoms. According to Marjory Grice-Hutchinson, who published an early and still important volume on their monetary theory, the original contribution of the School of Salamanca in this field consists

in its formulation of a psychological theory of value applied to both goods and money, of the quantity theory, and of a theory of foreign exchange that closely resembles the modern purchasing-power parity theory. (Grice-Hutchinson 1952: 47–8.)

A more or less common view of Spanish Scholastics on just price is that the value of goods—and money—depends on estimation, not primarily on the costs of production, nor on the needs of buyers (Grice-Hutchinson 1952: 48–51). It is not the communis aestimatio of theologians that determines the natural price, but rather that of businessmen, as Molina says (Molina-DII II, 407); and it is not a fixed margin, but moves within a certain range, depending also on the quantity of goods and money available. Monopolies are criticized by Molina because they make such a determination of just price impossible (Molina-DII II, 345). Some authors argued for a public limitation on the price of foodstuffs. Molina favored support of the poor but hesitated to make only corn dealers pay for it, because a fixed price would prevent merchants from importing corn, thus damaging the common good (Molina-DII II, 365).

The first formulation of the quantity theory of money is often attributed to the jurist Martín de Azpilcueta, perhaps the best known Salamancan writer on economic issues. In an appendix to his manual for confessors, now published as On Exchange (1549 [2014]), he discussed exchange, supply and demand, and money. Azpilcueta attempted to explain the rampant inflation of the sixteenth century as connected to the large-scale input of specie from the New World. Goods, he argued, were more costly when money was abundant. This quantity theory of money was widely accepted throughout Europe.

Azpilcueta, moreover, maintained that the exchange of money is not unnatural, contradicting Aristotle and many Scholastics. He treated money like other merchandise, positing that the morality of exchanges which were not dependent on money as their object was equitable. There were different questions connected to exchange. One of these was whether, in the case of petty exchange, it was licit to take more than the legally fixed commission; this view was rejected, and the legal commission was seen as binding in conscience (Alonso-Lasheras 2011: 172–173). Another problem arose in relation to exchange bills because the value of money varied considerably between different places within the Spanish Empire, offering new possibilities of making and losing money. Spanish theologians such as Azpilcueta and Molina countered the suspicion of usury associated with this kind of business by means of an early version of purchasing power theory according to which the exchange rates between currencies are in equilibrium when their purchasing power, i.e., what can be bought with a certain amount of money, remains the same (Grice-Hutchinson 1952: 52–53; Alonso-Lasheras 2011: 179). Concerning the topic of lending money, authors like Molina justified taking interest, first, by the lucrum cessans, the amount of money that the lender could have made during the time it was on loan as a credit and, then, by the periculum sortis, the risk that he might lose his capital (Molina-DII II, 315).

Despite the liberal elements which can be found in the works of authors from the School of Salamanca, they nevertheless had a completely different understanding of the market from that of modern neoliberals.

The market was first of all a physical place in which real people came together. These people possessed a moral conscience that was also part of the economic process. (Alonso-Lasheras 2011: 169)

8. Metaphysics and Logic

Spanish theologians were also involved in traditional discussions of logic and metaphysics. Two representative examples will be discussed: Soto’s Summulae, a compendium on logic which is little known today but which at the time was the compendium on logic in the Thomist tradition, ordered and paid for by the University of Salamanca in order to resist the influence of Nominalism; and Suárez’s famous and much studied treatise, Disputationes metaphysicae.

8.1 Soto on Logic

Soto is regarded as responsible for the revival of Spanish-Thomistic logic, as distinct from both Renaissance-oriented logic, which used only ancient sources, and the extremely technical “sophistic” logic of Nominalism. His main sources were Aristotle, Thomas Aquinas and Petrus Hispanus’ Summulae logicales, from all of which, however, he deviated in many areas. In his Summulae, especially starting with the second edition of 1547, which became one of the most influential textbooks of this genre, he gives an introduction to traditional logic, including a theory of terms, propositions and conclusions (Soto 1529 [1980]). Whereas Petrus Hispanus had been criticized for serious inconsistencies, Soto gives his own interpretation, in an effort to build up a coherent doctrine. In the presentation of the different kinds of terms, he did not follow the Aristotelian categories, but instead presented the medieval distinctions between mental, written, and spoken terms, between categorematic and syncategorematic terms (that is, terms that have a meaning because they refer to things, concepts or other terms and those which only make sense within propositions as connections, but cannot be a subject or predicate, such as ‘if’, ‘all’, etc.), between absolute and connotative terms, and so on. He continued by presenting different kinds of proposition, including a version of supposition theory—the doctrine of the entities that the terms in a proposition, subject and predicate stand for (1529 [1980: 31–36]). Here Soto also discussed Nominalist and realist objections; but, in the end, he mostly defended the positions of Petrus Hispanus, largely omitting, however, complicated types of supposition such as distributive, confused, merely confused, etc., which had long puzzled medieval authors. The third book explains the different kinds of relation between propositions, including an extended version of the square of oppositions (1529 [1980: 72]), as well as truth conditions for modal propositions, conjunctions and disjunctions. In his discussion of the different kinds of valid and invalid conclusion, Soto not only referred to syllogisms (book 5) and the so-called insolubilia, or reflections on paradoxes (book 6), but also elements of the theory of consequentiae, a medieval type of logical conclusion that may go back to the Stoic logic of propositions (Read 1993; D’Ors 1983).

While the Summulae provide something like a basic introduction to the logical topics discussed at the time, Soto’s In dialecticam Aristotelis commentarii (Salamanca 1543) contains philosophical reflections on questions such as whether logic is a science and if so, what kind of logic, the logica docens in contrast to logica utens, which is a “mode of knowing”, and whether the subject of dialectics is an ens rationis (Di Liso 2000: 221–250). These reflections are presented within the context of a selective commentary on the Aristotelian Organon, omitting De interpretatione and the Analytica Priora, which were treated in the Summulae (ibid.). He also wrote Super octo libros Physicorum commentarii and Super octo libros Physicorum quaestiones as part of the Artes liberales course.

8.2 Suárez’s Metaphysics

Suárez’s Disputationes metaphysicae (1597) was published in eighteen editions over a few decades in printing centers throughout Europe—not only in Catholic, but also in Protestant regions—and had an enormous influence on philosophy teaching in European universities. It is still considered to be the most complete and comprehensive presentation of prima philosophia; and it was the most important link between Scholastic metaphysics and seventeenth-century school philosophy, influencing Descartes, Leibniz, and Wolff. Although modern scholars debate the roots of the extremely complicated system of metaphysics which Suárez presents in the treatise, they seem to agree that he created a kind of synthesis of Thomist and Scotist theories. Only a very general survey of the topics discussed in Suárez’s 54 metaphysical disputations can be provided here, along with a brief mention of some of the most important approaches to their interpretation.

Suárez’s Disputationes do not follow the structure of Aristotle’s Metaphysics. Instead, he starts with an extensive introduction to the Aristotelian treatise, according to a slightly different order than in modern editions, and indicates the precise places where the topics discussed there can be found in his disputations. His first disputation reflects on the nature metaphysics as prima philosophia. It is followed by disputations on the concept of being (ens), its passions, different understandings of unity, on the true and the false, and the good and the bad. The pivotal role that these “transcendentals” of medieval metaphysics play in Suárez’s metaphysics was the basis for the interpretation of his theoretical philosophy as transcendental (Honnefelder 1990). Next come sixteen disputations dedicated to the four Aristotelian causes (material, formal, efficient, and final), followed by the various divisions of being (infinite and finite, uncreated and created—including some kind of rational theology which discusses questions such as whether God can be recognized with natural reason (Disp. XXIX), whether there are physical proofs for God’s existence (Disp. XXX) etc.—and the division of created being into substance and accidents). Then there are about twenty disputations dealing with the Aristotelian categories, concluding with one on the special theoretical problems associated with the concept of ens rationis, which does not belong to any of the previously discussed categories.

Interpretations of the Disputationes metaphysicae over the last decades have all attempted to fit Suárez into a kind of theoretical history (Darge 2004: 7–26). Gilson (1949) identified an essentialism (according to the Thomist distinction between ens and essentia) that neglects the act of being in favor of a purely abstract conceptualization and that can be traced in a line of thinkers from Avicenna through Duns Scotus and Suárez to Wolff and Kant. Honnefelder (1990) sees Suárez as dependent on the same earlier philosophers, but he does not present it as a history of decadence from a Thomist perspective, as Gilson did, but rather as a success story for the transcendental Scotist approach. Scotus uses a univocal instead of an analogous concept of being for created and uncreated substance (i.e., God) and individuates the realm of what may be meant by “being” based on the most general understanding of being as “id cui non repugnat esse”, i.e., the existence of which does not imply logical contradictions. Furthermore, he gives a modal explication of the different grades of finite and infinite being including the existence of finite and infinite substance. Courtine (1990) and Boulnois (1999) share this “Scotist perspective”, but they see it more as a move from the science of what is to the science of what can be thought, that is, an onto-logic. Precisely in the years when the term “ontology” was coined by Rudolf Goclenius (Lamanna 2013), it no longer referred to the “furniture of the universe”, as Putnam (1985: 28) called it, but instead to ways of thinking and speaking about the things in the world—a process that ends with the determination of what is through our speaking about it. Darge, finally, tries to free Suárez from this purely logicistic interpretation and from the Scotist perspective, in order to emphasize his innovative merits against his classification as an intermediate figure between Duns Scotus and Thomas, on the one hand, and Wolff and Kant, on the other. There is no doubt, however, that “Renaissance and Baroque scholastic culture”, to which Suárez doubtlessly belongs, has finally become an object of serious research (Novák 2014: 2). This research is not only providing a general systematization and historical integration of Suárez’s metaphysics, but also investigating particular aspects of his extremely rich theory (Hill and Lagerlund 2012); Novák 2014).

9. The Influence of the School of Salamanca

It is difficult to give a precise evaluation of the influence of the School of Salamanca in the many fields to which it contributed. There are various ideological motives, apart from the general tendency to conceal one’s sources, why later authors did not mention these theologians. This was especially the case for philosophers, theologians, and legal theorists from the Protestant North with their aversion to Catholic thinkers, and especially Jesuits. Quarrels arose, for instance, as to whether the Dutch jurist Hugo Grotius (1583–1645) was the father of modern natural law and international law or whether he only copied and slightly altered the works of Suárez and other Spanish authors. Another pertinent issue is that Suárez was regarded as the representative of “the schools”, to which the founders of modern philosophy opposed their new philosophical systems, often denying their heritage. Some works by Spanish Scholastics therefore fell into oblivion. In recent years, however, the ideological barriers have vanished, and there is a growing interest in an open-minded discussion of the School’s achievements and impact.

As has been indicated, the School of Salamanca is credited with a role in the development of international law. The gradual detachment of the ius gentium from natural law, particularly as it pertained to issues such as slavery and the slave trade, was another notable accomplishment, So, too, was its consistent defense of the full humanity of the Amerindians. That argument could be applied to other non-European peoples who had also never heard of Jesus; their regimes and property rights were closely tied to reason and natural law.

The School, in addition, made important contributions to areas such as trade and finance. Azpilcueta’s approach to inflation and his defense of the morality of exchange was a step toward a culture of accepted risk and profit. Vitoria’s argument that commerce fell within the ius gentium was not embraced by everyone in the School; but this argument had a direct influence on Grotius. Moreover, although a Protestant and an opponent of papal claims to temporal power, Grotius drew on Thomas Aquinas, Cajetan, and Vitoria to argue for the freedom of the seas and to develop a framework for international law. Because of the School’s role in the development of economic theory, some economists, including those belonging to the Austrian School of National Economy, refer to them as their ancestors.

Suárez and Mariana formulated theories of resistance to unacceptable rulers, which Roman Catholic thinkers engaged in opposing Protestantism and Protestant rulers like James I (England) found attractive. In the heated atmosphere of the times, it is possible that these theories may have inspired the Catholic fanatics who assassinated Henry III (Valois), Henry IV (Bourbon), and William the Silent (Nassau). Similar theories were also developed by Protestant writers, including French Huguenots and Calvinists in the Low Countries.

Members of the School of Salamanca departed from Aristotle and Thomas Aquinas as they saw fit. This is apparent in Soto’s logic and Suárez’s widely read metaphysics. Less noted until recently is the influence of Soto on Galileo. Diverging from Aristotle, Soto advanced theories that have been described (Duhem 1913, 555-562) as forerunners of the modern idea of mechanics. His theory of falling bodies was well known to Jesuit scholars, who circulated it through their writings. As a young student, Galileo was probably exposed to these ideas, which influenced his approach to the physical laws governing the universe (Wallace 1981 and 2004). Galileo’s theories about falling bodies eclipsed Soto’s, while his astronomical observations helped to create a heliocentric and un-Aristotelian intellectual milieu, in which many ideas of the School of Salamanca were regarded as obsolete.

Starting in the 1930s, with the work of James Brown Scott and others, the School of Salamanca gained renewed attention for its contribution to ideas of international law, including respect for non-Christian peoples. Academic interest overcame old prejudices tied to Europe’s past confessional and ideological divisions. The interest of economists in monetarism also placed Salamanca in the scholarly mainstream. The revived study of Scholasticism has drawn attention to Soto, Molina, and Suárez, while modern editions, including those in the series “Corpus Hispanorum de Pace”, have made these thinkers more accessible to a new generation of scholars.


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