First published Thu Aug 25, 2016; substantive revision Mon Aug 31, 2020

Behavior is normally described as altruistic when it is motivated by a desire to benefit someone other than oneself for that person’s sake. The term is used as the contrary of “self-interested” or “selfish” or “egoistic”—words applied to behavior that is motivated solely by the desire to benefit oneself. “Malicious” designates an even greater contrast: it applies to behavior that expresses a desire to harm others simply for the sake of harming them.

Sometimes, however, the word is used more broadly to refer to behavior that benefits others, regardless of its motive. Altruism in this broad sense might be attributed to certain kinds of non-human animals—mother bears, for example, who protect their cubs from attack, and in doing so put their own lives in danger. So used, there is no implication that such adult bears act “for the sake” of their young (Sober and Wilson 1998: 6).

This essay will discuss altruism in the former sense, as behavior undertaken deliberately to help someone other than the agent for that other individual’s sake. There is a large and growing empirical literature on altruism, which asks whether there is an evolutionary or biological basis for human altruism, and whether non-human species exhibit it or something similar to it. These issues are addressed by the entries on empirical approaches to altruism and biological altruism.

It is commonly assumed that we ought to be altruistic at least to some extent. But to what extent? And is altruism necessarily admirable? Why should one act for the sake of others and not only for one’s own sake? For that matter, do people in fact act out of altruism, or is all behavior ultimately self-interested?

1. What is altruism?

Before proceeding, further clarification of the term “altruism” is called for.

1.1 Mixed motives and pure altruism

Altruistic acts include not only those undertaken in order to do good to others, but also those undertaken in order to avoid or prevent harm to them. Suppose, for example, someone drives her car extra cautiously because she sees that she is in an area where children are playing, and she wants to insure that she injures no one. It would be appropriate to say that her caution is altruistically motivated. She is not trying to make those children better off, but she is being careful not to make them worse off. She does this because she genuinely cares about them for their sake.

Furthermore, altruistic acts need not involve self-sacrifice, and they remain altruistic even when they are performed from a mixture of motives, some of which are self-interested. The driver in the preceding example may have plenty of time to get where she is going; slowing down and paying extra attention may not be contrary to her own good. Even so, her act counts as altruistic if one of her motives for being cautious is her concern for the children for their sake. She may also be aware that if she injures a child, she could be punished for reckless driving, which she of course wants to avoid for self-interested reasons. So, her caution is both altruistic and self-interested; it is not motivated by only one kind of reason. We should not be confused by the fact that “self-interested” and “altruistic” are opposites. A single motive cannot be characterized in both ways; but a single act can be undertaken from both motives.

If someone performs an act entirely from altruistic motives—if, that is, self-interested motives are entirely absent—we can describe her act as a case of “pure” altruism. We should be careful to distinguish purely altruistic behavior from self-sacrificing behavior: the former involves no gain for oneself, whereas the latter involves some loss. If someone has a theater ticket that he cannot use because he is ill, and he calls the box office so that the ticket can be used by someone else, that is a case of pure altruism, but it involves no sacrifice.

1.2 Self-sacrifice, strong and weak altruism

Consider someone whose deliberations are always guided by this principle: “I shall never do anything unless doing so is best for me”. Such an individual is refusing ever to sacrifice his well-being even to the slightest degree. But in view of the terminological points just made, he could have altruistic motives for some of what he does—or even for much or all that he does! On any given occasion, he could have mixed motives: he is careful always to do what is best for himself, but that allows him also to be motivated by the perception that what he does is also good for others.

It would be odd or misleading to say that such an individual is an altruistic person. Many people would criticize him for being insufficiently altruistic. It is part of common sense morality that one should be willing to compromise with other people—to cooperate with others in ways that require one to accept what is less good for oneself than some other alternative, so that others can have their fair share.

These reflections lead to a peculiar result: each act undertaken by such an individual could be altruistically motivated, and yet we are reluctant, and reasonably so, to say that he is an altruistic person. The best way to accommodate both ideas, which seem to be in tension, would be to make a distinction between two uses of the word “altruism”. An act is altruistic in the strong sense if is undertaken in spite of the perception that it involves some loss of one’s well-being. An act is altruistic in the weak sense if it is motivated, at least in part, by the fact that it benefits someone else or the fact that it will not injure anyone else. The individual described two paragraphs above is someone who never acts altruistically in the strong sense. That policy seems objectionable to many people—even though he may act altruistically in the weak sense on many occasions.

1.3 Moral motives and altruistic motives

Some of what we do in our interactions with other people is morally motivated but not altruistic. Suppose A has borrowed a book from B and has promised to return it within a week. When A returns the book by the deadline, his motive might be described as moral: he has freely made a promise, and he takes himself to have an obligation to keep such promises. His motive is simply to keep his word; this is not an example of altruism. But if A gives B a book as a gift, thinking that B will enjoy it and find it useful, he is acting simply out of a desire to benefit B. His motive in this case is altruistic.

Similarly, suppose a mother refrains from giving her adult son advice about a certain matter because she thinks that it is not her place to do so—it would be interfering too much in his private affairs. Even so, she might also think that he would benefit from receiving her advice; she respects his autonomy but fears that as a result he will decide badly. Her restraint is morally motivated, but it would not normally be described as an act of altruism.

As these examples indicate, the notion of altruism is applicable not to every morally motivated treatment of others, but more narrowly to what is done out of a concern for the good of others—in other words, for their well-being. Altruistic acts might be described as charitable or benevolent or kind, for these words also convey the idea of acting for the good of others, and not merely rightly towards others.

Often the individuals who are the “targets” of altruistic behavior are selected for such treatment because of a personal tie between the benefactor and the beneficiary. If A was extraordinarily kind to B when B was a child, and at a later time B is in a position to help A out of a difficult situation, the help B gives to A is altruistically motivated, even though their common past explains why it is A that B has chosen to help (rather than a stranger in need). Here it is assumed that B is not promoting A’s well-being as a mere means to his own (B’s) own well-being. If that were so, B would not be benefiting A for A’s sake, but only for B’s sake. (A further assumption is that B is not motivated simply by a sense that he owes repayment to A; rather, he not only feels indebted to A but also genuinely cares about him.) The people whom we treat altruistically are often those to whom we have a sentimental attachment, or towards whom we feel grateful. But that is not the only possibility. Some altruistic acts are motivated simply by a recognition of the great need of those who benefit from them, and the benefactor and beneficiary may be strangers to each other.

That an act is altruistically motivated does not entail that it is justified or praiseworthy. A may mistakenly think that she is enhancing the well-being of B; B might also mistakenly think that she is benefiting from A’s efforts. We could say that in such cases there is something admirable about A’s motive, but nonetheless judge that she ought not to have acted as she did.

1.4 Well-Being and perfection

As noted above, altruistic acts are guided by assumptions made by the agent about the well-being of some other individual or group. What well-being consists in is a disputed matter, but it is uncontroversial that a distinction must be drawn between (i) what constitutes well-being and (ii) what is a necessary means towards or a pre-condition of well-being. This kind of distinction is familiar, and is applicable in all sorts of cases. For example, we distinguish between what a breakfast consists in (cereal, juice, coffee) and the things one needs in order to eat breakfast (spoons, glasses, mugs). There is no such thing as eating breakfast but not eating anything that breakfast consists in. In the same way, well-being must be sought and fostered by seeking and fostering the good or goods in which well-being consists. Rival theories of well-being are competing ways of answering the question: what are its constituents? After we have answered that question, we need to address the further question of how best to obtain those constituents. (Contemporary discussions of well-being can be found in Badhwar 2014; Feldman 1994, 2010; Fletcher 2016; Griffin 1986; Kraut 2007; Sumner 1996 Tiberius 2018.)

Well-being admits of degrees: the more one has of the good or goods in which it consists, the better off one is. It would be an awkward manner of speaking to say of someone: “she has well-being”. A more natural way to express that idea would be to use such terms as these: “she is faring well”, “she is well off”, “she is flourishing”, “her life is going well for her”. The constituents of well-being can also be spoken of as benefits or advantages—but when one uses these terms to refer to well-being, one must recognize that these benefits or advantages are constituents of well-being, and not merely of instrumental value. Benefits and advantages, in other words, fall into two categories: those that are good for someone merely because they foster other goods, and those that are good for someone in that they are constituents of that individual’s well-being.

A distinction must be drawn between being good at something and having what is good for oneself. It is one thing to say, “he is good at acting” and another to say “acting is good for him”. Philosophers speak of the former as “perfectionist value” and the latter as “prudential value”. That is because when one tries to be good at something, one hopes to move closer to the ideal of perfection. Prudential value is the kind of good that it would be in someone’s interest to obtain—it is another term that belongs to the group we have been discussing: “well-being”, “welfare”, “benefit”, and so on.

Even though perfectionist and prudential value must be distinguished, it should not be inferred that that being good at something is not a constituent of well-being. To return to the example used in the preceding paragraph: if someone has great talent as an actor and enjoys acting and every aspect of theatrical life, it is plausible to say that his well-being consists, at least to some extent, in his enjoyment of these activities. There are two different facts in play here: (i) he is an excellent actor, and (ii) being an excellent actor is good for him (not as a mere means, but as a component of his well-being). The value referred to in (i) is perfectionist value, and in (ii) prudential value. It would be prudent of him, in other words, to continue to excel as an actor.

These points about well-being and excellence are pertinent to a study of altruism because they help guard against a too narrow conception of the sorts of goods that an altruist might promote in others. Altruists do not aim only at the relief of suffering or the avoidance of harm—they also try to provide positive benefits to others for their sake. What counts as a benefit depends on what the correct theory of well-being is, but it is widely and plausibly assumed that certain kinds of excellence are components of a good life. For example, someone who founds a school that trains children to excel in the arts and sciences, or in sports, simply so that they will enjoy exercising such skills, would be regarded as a great public benefactor and philanthropist. Similarly, teachers and parents who foster in their students and children a love of literature and the skills needed to appreciate it would be viewed as altruists, if they are motivated by the thought that by themselves these activities are benefits to those students and children.

However, it is possible for someone to be dedicated to excellence and at the same time to be utterly indifferent to human well-being—and when this happens, we have no inclination to say that such a person is motivated by altruism. Someone might be devoted to a subject—mathematics, or philosophy, or literature—rather than to the well-being of those who study and master that subject. For example, imagine a student of literature who cares deeply about James Joyce’s Ulysses, because he takes it to be one of the supreme achievements of the human mind. He does not want that novel merely to gather dust on library shelves—it deserves readers who love and understand it, and so the skills needed to appreciate it must be kept alive from one generation to another. This kind of devotion to perfectionist value is not a form of altruism.

For an act to be altruistically motivated is for the benefactor—not the beneficiary—to have a certain attitude towards it. A child who acquires from a tennis instructor the skills of a good athlete and a love of the game may simply think of tennis as great fun—not as something that benefits him or as a constituent of his life going well. The child does not need to practice his skills because he believes that doing so is good for him: that is not a necessary condition of his being the beneficiary of an altruistic act. Similarly, someone might deny that physical suffering counts as something that is bad for him. (He should deny this, according to the Stoics.) But on any plausible theory of well-being, he is wrong about that; someone who aims to diminish the pain of another individual, out of a concern for that individual’s well-being, is acting altruistically.

To take another example, consider someone who develops a love of philosophy and immerses herself in the subject. When she asks herself whether she is doing this for her own good, she may reply that her reasons are quite different. She may say, “philosophy is worthwhile in itself”. Or: “I want to solve the mind-body problem and the free will problem because these are deep and important issues”. If we suggested to her that her philosophical struggles are a component of her well-being, she might regard that as a strange way of looking at things. But her view is not authoritative—whether she is right depends on what the best theory of well-being is. Others who care about her could plausibly believe that her love of philosophy is a component of her well-being, because it constitutes an enrichment and deepening of her mind, which is of value to her in itself, whether or not it leads to some further result. If they help her pursue her philosophical interests simply for her sake, their motives would be altruistic, even if she herself does not care about philosophy because she thinks it is good for her.

2. Does altruism exist?

2.1 Psychological egoism: strong and weak versions

According to a doctrine called “psychological egoism”, all human action is ultimately motivated by self-interest. The psychological egoist can agree with the idea, endorsed by common sense, that we often seek to benefit others besides ourselves; but he says that when we do so, that is because we regard helping others as a mere means to our own good. According to the psychological egoist, we do not care about others for their sake. Altruism, in other words, does not exist.

Since we have distinguished several different ways of using the term “altruism”, it will be helpful to make similar distinctions between different varieties of psychological egoism. Recall that an act is altruistic in the weak sense if it is motivated, at least in part, by the fact that it benefits someone else (or the fact that it will not injure anyone else). Psychological egoism, as defined in the preceding paragraph, denies that altruism in this sense exists. That is the strongest form of this doctrine; it is usually what philosophers have in mind when they discuss psychological egoism. But we can imagine weaker versions. One of them would deny that altruism is ever pure; it would say, in other words, that whenever we act, one of our motives is a desire for our own good. Another weaker form of psychological egoism would hold that we never voluntarily do what we foresee will sacrifice our well-being to some extent. This third form of psychological egoism would admit that sometimes one of our reasons for acting is the good we do for others for their sake; but it claims that we never act for the good of others when we think that doing so would make us worse off.

2.2 An empirical argument for psychological egoism

Someone might arrive at one or another of these forms of psychological egoism because she takes herself to be a keen observer of the human scene, and her acquaintance with other people has convinced her that this is how they are motivated. But that way of justifying psychological egoism has a serious weakness. Others can say to this psychological egoist:

Perhaps the people you know are like this. But my experience of the world is rather different from yours. I know many people who try to benefit others for their sake. I myself act altruistically. So, at most, your theory applies only to the people in your social world.

The psychological egoist can respond to this criticism in either of two ways. First, she might claim that his doctrine is supported by experimental evidence. That is, she might believe that (i) the subjects studied by psychologists in carefully conducted experiments have been shown to be not purely altruistic, or (more strongly) that these subjects ultimately care only about their own good; and (ii) that we can infer from these experiments that all human beings are motivated in the same way.

This is a disputed matter. There is experimental evidence that casts doubt on psychological egoism in its strong and in weaker forms, but the controversy continues (see Batson 2011; Stich et al. 2010).

2.3 An a priori argument for psychological egoism

A second response on the part of the psychological egoist would consist in an a priori philosophical argument for one or another version of that doctrine. According to this line of thinking, we can see “from the armchair”—that is, without seeking empirical confirmation of any sort—that psychological egoism (in one of its forms) must be true.

How might such an argument go? Drawing upon some ideas that can be found in Plato’s dialogues, we might affirm two premises: (i) What motivates us to act is always a desire; (ii) all desires are to be understood on the model of hunger (see Meno 77c; Symposium 199e–200a, 204e).

To elaborate on the idea behind (ii): When we are hungry, our hunger has an object: food (or perhaps some particular kind of food). But we do not want to ingest the food for its own sake; what we are really after is the feeling of satisfaction that we expect to get as a result of eating. Ingesting this or that piece of food is something we want, but only as a means of achieving a sense of satisfaction or satiation.

If all desire is understood in the same way, and all motivation takes the form of desire, then we can infer that psychological egoism in its strong form is true (and therefore its weaker versions are also true). Consider an action that seems, on the surface, to be altruistically motivated: I give you a gift simply because I think you will like it. Now, since I want to give you this gift, and all desire should be understood as a kind of hunger, I am hungering after your feeling pleased, as I hunger after a piece of food. But just as no one wants to ingest a piece of food for its own sake, I do not want you to feel pleased for your sake; rather, what I am seeking is the feeling of satisfaction I will get when you are pleased, and your being pleased is simply the means by which I achieve satisfaction. Accordingly, we don’t have to be keen observers of other people or look within ourselves to arrive at psychological egoism. We can recognize that this doctrine is correct simply by thinking about the nature of motivation and desire.

2.4 Hunger and desire

But the assumption that all desires are like hunger in the relevant respect is open to question. Hunger is not satisfied if one still feels hungry after one has eaten. It seeks a certain kind of consciousness in oneself. But many kinds of desires are not like that. Suppose, for example, that I want my young children to be prosperous as adults long after I have died, and I take steps that increase to some small degree their chances of achieving that distant goal. What my desire is for is their prosperity far into the future, not my current or future feeling of satisfaction. I don’t know and cannot know whether the steps that I take will actually bring about the goal I seek; what I do know is that I will not be alive when they are adults, and so even if they are prosperous, that will give me no pleasure. (Since, by hypothesis I can only hope, and do not feel confident, that the provisions I make for them will actually produce the good results I seek for them, I get little current satisfaction from my act.) It would make no sense, therefore, to suggest that I do not want them to be prosperous for their sake, but only as a means to the achievement of some goal of my own. My goal is their well-being, not my own. In fact, if I allocate to them resources that I myself need, in the hope that doing so will make their lives better, I am doing something that one form of psychological egoism says is impossible: sacrificing my own good, to some degree, for the sake of others. If the psychological egoist claims that such self-sacrifice is impossible because all desire is like hunger, the reply should be that this model does not fit all cases of desire.

Recall the two premises used by the armchair psychological egoist: (i) What motivates us to act is always a desire; (ii) all desires are to be understood on the model of hunger. The second premise is implausible, as we have just seen; and, since both premises must be true for the argument to reach its conclusion, the argument can be rejected.

2.5 Desire and motivation

It is worth observing, however, that first premise of this argument is also open to question.

This thesis that what motivates us to act is always a desire should be accepted only if we have a good understanding of what a desire is. If a desire is simply identified with whatever internal state moves someone to act, then the claim, “what motivates us to act is always a desire”, when spelled out more fully, is a tautology. It says: “the internal state that moves us to act is always the internal state that moves us to act”. That is not a substantive insight into human psychology, but a statement of identity, of the form “A = A”. We might have thought we were learning something about what causes action by being told, “what motivates people is always a desire”, but if “desire” is just a term for whatever it is that motivates us, we are learning nothing (see Nagel 1970: 27–32).

Here is a different way of making the same point: As the words “desire” and “want” are often used, it makes good sense to say: “I don’t want to do this, but I think I ought to”. That is the sort of remark we often make when we take ourselves to have an unpleasant duty or obligation, or when we face a challenge that we expect to be difficult and stressful. In these sorts of situation, we do not hunger after the goal we move towards. So, as the word “desire” is often used, it is simply false that what motivates us to act is always a desire. Now, the psychological egoist who seeks an a priori defense of this doctrine might say:

when I claim that what motivates us to act is always a desire, I am not using the word “desire” as it is sometimes used. My usage is much broader. Among desires, in this broad sense, I include the belief that one ought to do something. In fact, it includes any internal state that causes someone to act.

Clearly, the thesis that what moves us is always a desire, when so understood, is empty.

The common sense terms we often use to explain why we help others do not need to refer to our own desires. You are in a public space and come across someone off-putting in appearance but who seems to need your help. He appears to be in pain, or confused, or needy in some way. Recognizing this, you take yourself to have a good reason to offer him your assistance. You think that you ought to ask him whether you can help—even though that will delay you and may cause you some trouble and discomfort. These ways of describing your motivation are all that is needed to explain why you offered him your help, and it is not necessary to add, “I wanted to help him”. Admittedly, when “desire” is used to designate whatever it is that motivates someone, it is true that you wanted to help him. But what does the explanatory work, in these cases, is your recognition of his need and your judgment that therefore you ought to offer your help. Saying, “I wanted to help him” would be misleading, since it would suggest that there was something pleasant that you expected to get by offering your assistance. After you have given him your help, it is true, you might think back on this encounter, and be pleased that you had done the right thing. But you might not—you might be worried that what you did actually made him worse off, despite your good intentions. And in any case, if you do look back with pleasure at your good deed, it does not follow that feeling good was your goal all along, and that you merely used him as a means to that end. That would follow only if desire by its very nature is a form of hunger.

2.6 Pure altruism and self-sacrifice

Of the three forms of psychological egoism distinguished above, the one that is least open to objection is the weak form that holds that altruism is never pure. It claims that whenever we act, one of our motives is a desire for our own good. There is no good a priori argument for this thesis—or, at any rate, the a priori argument we have been considering for the strongest form of psychological egoism does not support it, because the two premises used in that argument are so implausible. But it might nonetheless be suggested that as a matter of fact we always do find some self-interested motivation that accompanies altruistically motivated behavior. It is difficult to refute that proposal. We should not pretend that we know all of the considerations and causes that underlie our behavior. Some of our motives are hidden, and there is too much going on in our minds for us to be aware of the whole of our psychology. So, for all we know, we might never be pure altruists.

But what of the other weak form of psychological egoism?—the one that admits that sometimes one of our reasons for acting is the good we do for others for their sake, but claims that we never act for the good of others when we think that doing so would make us worse off. It says, in other words, that we never voluntarily do what we foresee will sacrifice our well-being to some extent.

The first point to be made about this form of psychological egoism is that, once again, there is no a priori argument to support it. The two premises we have been examining—that all action is motivated by desire and all desire is like hunger—are implausible, and so they do not support the thesis that we never sacrifice our well-being to any degree. If this form of psychological egoism is to be sustained, its evidence would have to be drawn from the observation of each human being’s reasons for acting. It would have to say: when our motives are carefully scrutinized, it may indeed be found that although we do good to others for the sake of those others, we never do so when we think it would detract even slightly from our own well-being. In other words, we count the good of others as something that by itself gives us a reason, but it is always a weak reason, in that it is never as strong as reasons that derive from our self-interest.

We have no reason to suppose that human behavior is so uniform in its motivation. A far more plausible hypothesis about human motives is that they vary a great deal from one person to another. Some people are never altruistic; others are just as this weak form of psychological egoism says: they are altruistic, but only when they think this will not detract from their own well-being; and then there is a third and large category filled with people who, to some degree or other, are willing to sacrifice their well-being for others. Within this category there is wide range—some are willing to make only small sacrifices, others larger sacrifices, and some extraordinarily large sacrifices. This way of thinking has the great advantage of allowing our experience of each individual to provide us with the evidence by means of which we characterize him. We should not label everyone as an egoist on the basis of some a priori theory; rather, we should assess each person’s degree of egoism and altruism on the basis of what we can discern of their motives.

2.7 Does egoism exist?

One further point should be made about our reasons for supposing that there is such a thing as altruism. Just as we can ask, “what entitles us to believe that altruism exists?” so we can ask: “what entitles us to believe that egoism exists?” Consider the possibility that whenever we act for our own good, we are not doing so only for our own sake, but also for the sake of someone else. On what grounds are we entitled to reject that possibility?

Once again, the egoist might reply that it is an a priori truth that all of our actions are ultimately motivated only by self-interest, but we have seen the weakness of the premises that support that argument. So, if the hypothesis that sometimes one acts only for one’s own sake is true, it must recommend itself to us because close observation of human behavior supports it. We must find actual cases of someone promoting his own good only for his own sake. It is no easier to be confident about such matters than it is easy to be confident that someone has acted out of purely altruistic motives. We realize that much of what we do for ourselves has consequences for other people as well, and we care to some degree about those other people. Perhaps our ultimate motivation always includes an other-regarding component. It is more difficult to find evidence against that suggestion than one might have thought.

To take matters to an extreme, it might be suggested that our ultimate motivation is always entirely other-regarding. According to this far-fetched hypothesis, whenever we act for our own good, we do so not at all for our own sake, but always entirely for the sake of someone else. The important point here is that the denial that altruism exists should be regarded with as much suspicion as this contrary denial, according to which people never act ultimately for their own good. Both are dubious universal generalizations. Both have far less plausibility than the common sense assumption that people sometimes act in purely egoistic ways, sometimes in purely altruistic ways, and often in ways that mix, in varying degrees, the good of oneself and the good of others.

3. Self and others: some radical metaphysical alternatives

An assumption that many people make about egoistic and altruistic motives is that it is more difficult to justify the latter than the former, or that the former do not require justification whereas the latter do. If someone asks himself, “Why should I take my own good to be a reason to do anything?” it is tempting to respond that something is amiss in the very asking of this question—perhaps because there can be no answer to it. Self-interest, it might be said, can be given no justification and needs none. By contrast, since other people are other, it seems as though some reason needs to be given for building a bridge from oneself to those others. In other words, we apparently have to find something in others that justifies our taking an interest in their well-being, whereas one need not seek something in oneself that would justify self-regard. (Perhaps what we find in others that justifies altruism is that they are just like oneself in important respects.) It is worth asking whether this apparent asymmetry between justifying self-interest and justifying altruism is real or only apparent.

One response to this question is that the asymmetry is illusory because the very distinction between oneself and others is artificial and an obstacle to clear thinking. One can begin to challenge the validity or importance of the distinction between self and others by noticing how many changes occur in the inner life of what is, conventionally speaking, a single “person”. The mind of a newborn, a child, an adolescent, a young adult, a middle aged person, and an old person approaching death—these can have at least as many differences as do those who are conventionally counted as two distinct individuals. If a young man of twenty years sets aside money to provide for his retirement in old age, he is saving for someone who will be quite different from himself. Why should that not be called altruism rather than self-interest? Why does it matter whether it is called acting for his own good or for the good of another? (See Parfit 1984.)

Another kind of challenge to the validity of the distinction between self and others derives from the observation made by David Hume that when we look within and make an inventory of the contents of our mental life, we have no acquaintance with any entity that would provide a reference for the word “self”. Introspection can tell us something about sensations, feelings, and thoughts—but we do not have any experience of some entity that is the one who has these sensations, feelings, and thoughts. That point might be regarded as a reason to reject the common sense view that when you refer to yourself, and distinguish yourself from someone else, there is something real that you are talking about, or some valid distinction between yourself and others. It might be thought, in other words, that the ordinary distinction between altruistic and egoistic motives is misguided because there are no such things as selves.

A third metaphysical possibility is this: human beings cannot be understood one by one, as though each were a self-sufficient and fully real individual. That way of thinking about ourselves fails to recognize the profound way in which we are by our nature social beings. You and I and others are by our nature mere parts of some larger social unit. As an analogy, one might think of the human body and such parts of the body as fingers, hands, arms, legs, toes, torso, and so on. They cannot exist, much less function properly, in isolation. Similarly, it might be said that individual human beings are mere fragments of a larger social whole. Accordingly, instead of using the concepts expressed by the terms “self-interested” and “altruistic”, we should see ourselves as contributors to the success and well-functioning of the larger community to which we belong (see Brink 2003; Green 1883).

The remainder of this essay will set aside these unorthodox alternatives to the common sense metaphysical framework that we normally presuppose when we think about self-interested and altruistic motives. It would take us too far afield to examine them. We will continue to make these assumptions: First, a single individual human being persists over time from birth to death, even when the mental life of that individual undergoes many changes. Second, there is someone one is referring to when one talks about oneself, even though there is no object called the “self” that we detect introspectively. And the fact that we do not encounter such an object by introspection is no reason to doubt the validity of the distinction made between oneself and others. Third, although certain things (arms, legs, noses, etc.) are by their very nature parts of a whole, no human being is by nature a part in that same way. Rejecting these ideas, we will continue to assume, with common sense, that for each human being there is such a thing as what is good for that human being; and that the questions, “what is good for me?”, “what is good for that other individual, who is not me?” are different questions. Accordingly, it is one thing for a reason to be self-interested, and another for it to be altruistic (although of course one and the same act can be supported by both kinds of reasons).

Assuming, then, that the distinction between these motives is real, the questions we asked at the beginning of this section remain: Why ought one to be altruistic? Does one need a justification for being motivated in this way? Is egoistic motivation on a sounder footing than altruistic motivation, in that it stands in no need of justification?

4. Why care about others?

Radically different ways of answering these questions can be found in moral philosophy. The first makes self-interested motivation fundamental; it holds that we should be altruistic because it is in our interest to be so moved. That strategy is often attributed to the Greek and Roman philosophers of antiquity—Plato, Aristotle, the Stoics, and the Epicureans (see Annas 1993).

In the modern era, a second approach has come to the fore, built on the notion that moral thinking is not self-centered but impartial and impersonal. Its basic idea is that when we think morally about what to do, reason takes a god’s-eye perspective and sets aside the emotional bias we normally have in our own favor, or in favor of our circle of friends or our community. Here Kant 1785 is a representative figure, but so too are the utilitarians—Jeremy Bentham 1789, John Stuart Mill 1864, and Henry Sidgwick 1907.

A third approach, championed by David Hume (1739), Adam Smith (1759), and Arthur Schopenhauer (1840), gives sympathy, compassion, and personal affection—rather than impartial reason—a central role to play in the moral life. It holds that there is something extraordinarily valuable in the sentimental bonds that take hold among human beings—a feature of human life that is overlooked or distorted when morality is understood solely or primarily in impersonal terms and from a god’s-eye point of view. In favorable conditions, we naturally and emotionally respond to the weal and woe of others; we do not and should not look for reasons to do so. (The assorted ideas labeled “sentimentalism” in this entry are an amalgam of ideas derived loosely from the writings of Blum 1980; Noddings 1986; Slote 1992, 2001 2010, 2013; and others. The term is sometimes applied to a family of meta-ethical views that ground the meaning or justification of moral propositions in attitudes rather than response-independent facts (Blackburn 2001). Here, by contrast, sentimentalism is a ground-level thesis about what is most valuable in human relationships. It could be combined with meta-ethical sentimentalism, but need not be.)

These three approaches are hardly an exhaustive survey of all that has been said in the Western philosophical tradition about altruism. A fuller treatment would examine the Christian conception of love, as developed by thinkers of the medieval period. To a large extent, such figures as Augustine and Aquinas work within a eudaimonistic framework, although they are also influenced by the Neoplatonic picture of the visible world as an outpouring of the bountifulness of divine goodness. To the extent that rewards of heaven and the sufferings of hell play a role in a theocentric framework, there are instrumental reasons, for those who need them, to care for others. But there are other reasons as well. Other-regarding virtues like charity and justice are perfections of the human soul and are therefore components of our earthly well-being. Christian philosophy rejects Aristotle’s doctrine that divine being has no ethical qualities and makes no interventions in human life. God is a person who loves his creation, human beings above all. When we love others for themselves, we imitate God and express our love for him (Lewis 1960).

4.1 Eudaimonism

The term “eudaimonism” is often used by philosophers to refer to the ethical orientation of all or the major philosophers of Greek and Roman antiquity. “Eudaimonia” is the ordinary Greek word they apply to the highest good. As Aristotle observes at the beginning of the Nicomachean Ethics, whenever we act, we aim at some good—but goods are not all at the same level. Lower goods are undertaken for the sake of more valuable goals, which are in turn pursued in order to achieve still better goods. This hierarchy of value cannot continue endlessly—a life must have some ultimate goal, something that is valuable in itself and not for the sake of anything still better. What that goal should be, Aristotle acknowledges, is a much disputed matter; but at any rate, everyone uses the word “eudaimonia” to designate that highest good. (“Happiness” is the standard translation, but “well-being” and “flourishing” may be closer to the Greek word’s meaning.)

Aristotle does not say that one’s ultimate goal should be one’s own well-being (eudaimonia) and no one else’s. On the contrary, he holds that the common good (the good of the whole political community) is superior to the good of a single individual. Nonetheless, it has become common among scholars of ancient ethics to attribute to Aristotle and the other major moral philosophers of antiquity the assumption that one’s ultimate goal should just be one’s own well-being.

Is this an implausible assumption? That is the accusation of many systems of modern moral philosophy, but one must be careful not to attribute to Greek and Roman ethics an extreme endorsement of selfishness. One way to see that this would be unfair is to recognize how important it is to Aristotle that we love others for their sake. That is a key ingredient of his lengthy discussion of friendship and love in Books VIII and IX of the Nicomachean Ethics. There he argues that (i) friendship is an ingredient of a good life, and (ii) to be a friend to someone (or at any rate a friend of the best sort) one must not treat him as a mere means to one’s own advantage or one’s own pleasure. He elaborates on (ii) by adding that in friendships of the best sort, each individual admires the other for the excellence of that other person’s character, and benefits him for that reason. It is clear, then, that he explicitly condemns those who treat others as mere means to their own ends. So, even if it is true that, according to Aristotle, one’s ultimate goal should be one’s own well-being (and no one else’s), he combines this with the denial that the good of others should be valued solely as a means to one’s own.

It is crucial, at this point, that we keep in mind the distinction, drawn above in section 1.4, between (i) what constitutes well-being and (ii) what is a necessary means towards or a pre-condition of well-being. Aristotle argues that one’s well-being is constituted by the excellent use of one’s reason, and that such virtues as justice, courage, and generosity are among the qualities in which one’s good consists. When one acts with justice and generosity towards one’s family, or friends, or the larger community, that is good for oneself (one is achieving one’s ultimate goal) and it is also good for others—in fact, one’s action is motivated in part by the desire to benefit those others for their sake. If treating others justly and in accordance with the other ethical virtues were merely a means towards one’s own well-being, Aristotle’s framework for ethics would be objectionably self-regarding—and it would be difficult for it to endorse, without inconsistency, the thesis that we ought to benefit others for their sake.

We should recall a point made in section 1.1: altruistic acts need not involve self-sacrifice, and they remain altruistic even when they are performed from a mixture of motives, some of which are self-interested. For Aristotle, altruism should always be accompanied by self-interested motives. His system of practical thought could be dismissed out of hand if one begins with the assumption that moral motivation must be purely altruistic, free from all taint of self-regard. Otherwise, it would not count as moral. That idea has some currency, and it is often attributed (rightly or wrongly) to Kant. But on reflection, it is open to question. If it is the case that whenever one has a good reason to benefit someone else for that person’s sake, there is also a second good reason as well—namely, that in doing so one will also benefit oneself—it would be implausible to suppose that one should not let that second reason have any influence on one’s motivation.

Nonetheless, if another point made earlier is correct, there is a serious problem for Aristotle’s eudaimonism. In section 1.2, we noted that someone is open to criticism if he is always guided by the principle, “I shall never do anything unless doing so is best for me”. Such a person seems insufficiently altruistic, insufficiently willing to make compromises for the good of others. He is (to use the term introduced earlier) never altruistic in the strong sense. Aristotle, it might be said, would have been on firmer ground if he had said that ultimately one should act for one’s own good and that of others. (To be fair to him, he does not deny this; on the other hand, he does say that treating others well never makes one worse off.)

If the project undertaken by Greek and Roman moral philosophy is to begin with the unquestioned assumption that one should never act contrary to one’s own good, and that one’s ultimate end should be only one’s own eudaimonia, it faces the serious objection that it will never be able, on this basis, to give proper recognition to the interests of others. The idea underlying this objection is that we should be directly concerned with others: the fact that an act one performs benefits someone else can already provide a reason for undertaking it, without having to be accompanied by a self-interested reason. There is no argument to be found in ancient ethics –none is offered—that purports to show that the only way to justify having other-regarding motives is by appealing to the good it does oneself to have them.

At the same time, that gives us no reason to dismiss out of hand the efforts made by these authors to show that in fact one does benefit by having altruistic motives. There is nothing morally offensive about asking the question: “is it good for someone to be a good person?” once it is understood that being a good person might be a component of well-being, not a means to further private ends. As noted earlier (section 1.4), certain kinds of excellence are widely assumed to be components of a good life. The examples used there were excellence in the arts, the sciences, and sport. But excelling at ethical life is also a plausible example, since it consists in developing and exercising cognitive, emotional, and social skills that we are pleased and proud to have. In any case, it would be sheer dogmatism to close our minds and refuse to listen to the arguments found in Plato, Aristotle, and the Stoics that ethical virtue is of great value because it is a component (and for the Stoics the sole component) of one’s well-being.

4.2 Impartial Reason

We turn now to the idea, central to one modern approach to ethics, that when we think morally, we reason from an impartial or impersonal perspective. Moral thinking is not self-centered. Of course we all have an emotional bias that attaches special weight to self-interest, and we are often partial to our particular circle of friends or our community. But when we look at the world from a moral point of view, we try to set aside this self-centered framework. Taking a god’s eye perspective on things, we ask ourselves what one ought to do in this or that situation—not what would be good for me or my friends. It is as though we forget about locating ourselves as this particular person; we abstract away from our normal self-centered perspective and seek the solution to a practical problem that anyone similarly impartial would also arrive at.

We can find anticipations or analogues of this idea in ancient ethics—for example, in Plato’s and Aristotle’s recognition that the political community serves the common good rather the interest of some one class or faction; and in the Stoic belief that the cosmos is governed by a providential force that assigns to each of us a distinctive role by which we serve not just ourselves but also the whole. In the ideal city of Plato’s Republic, the family and private property are abolished within the elite classes, because these institutions interfere with the development of a common concern for all individuals. It is not clear how these ideas can be made to fit within a eudaimonistic framework. How can the good of the community serve as the highest standard of evaluation if one’s own good alone is one’s highest end? One way of looking at the history of ethics would be to say that modern ethics salvages the impartialism that occasionally appears in ancient ethics, and rightly abandons its attempt to derive a justification of altruism from a prior commitment to self-interest. Contemporary eudaimonists, of course, would tell a different story (see, for example Annas 1993; LeBar 2013; Russell 2012).

The notion of impartiality has thus far been described in highly general terms, and it is important to see that there are different ways of making it more concrete. One way of doing so is adopted by utilitarians, and more generally, by consequentialists. (The utilitarianism of Bentham 1789, Mill 1864, and Sidgwick 1907 holds that one is to maximize the greatest balance of pleasure over pain—treating pleasure and the absence of pain as the sole constituents of well-being. Consequentialism abstracts away from this hedonistic component of utilitarianism; it requires one to maximize the greatest balance of good over bad. See Driver 2012.) In their calculus, no individual’s good is given greater weight or importance than any other’s. Your own good, therefore, is not to be treated by you as having greater weight as a reason than anyone else’s, simply because it is your own good. The well-being of a human being (or of a sentient creature) is what provides one with a reason to act: that is why one has a reason to take one’s own good into consideration in practical thinking. But the same point applies equally and with equal force to the well-being of anyone else.

But that is not the only way of taking the general notion of impartiality and making it more specific. The general idea, as stated earlier, is that moral thinking, unlike prudential thinking, is not self-centered. One can make this idea more concrete by taking it to mean that there is a single set of rules or norms that apply equally to all human beings, and so the standard by which one answers the question, “what should I do in this situation?” is the standard by which one answers the question, “what should anyone do in this situation?” Someone whose practical reasoning is guided by this condition is abiding by an ideal of impartiality. He makes no special exceptions for himself or his friends.

Suppose, for example, that you are a lifeguard and one afternoon you must choose between swimming north to rescue one group and swimming south to rescue another. The northern group includes your friend, but the southern group, full of strangers, is much larger. The ideal of impartiality described in the previous paragraph does not by itself determine what one should do in this situation; what it requires is simply that it should make no difference that the lifeguard faced with this dilemma is you (and the northern group includes your friend). What you should do, if you are the lifeguard, is what any lifeguard ought to do in that situation. If it is right to take friendship into consideration, when making this decision, then it would be right for anyone to do so. (What would be right, in that case, would be for each individual to choose the good of his or her friend over the good of strangers.)

The consequentialist has a more radical interpretation of what impartiality means and requires. His ideal of impartiality does not allow the lifeguard to take into consideration the fact that by swimming north he will be able to save his friend. After all, the well-being of his friend is not made more valuable simply because that person is his friend. Just as my good is not made more valuable than the good of others simply because it is my good, so too the well-being of my friend deserves no extra weight because he is a friend of mine. So, the lifeguard, according to the consequentialist, must choose to save one group rather than the other solely on the basis of the greater balance of good over bad.

The consequentialist will correctly point out that quite often one is in a better position to promote one’s own good than that of others. As a rule, I have more knowledge about what is good for me than I have about what is good for strangers. It often requires fewer resources for me to benefit myself than to benefit others. I know immediately when I am hungry without having to ask, and I know what kind of food I like. But additional steps are needed to find out when others are hungry and which food they like. These sorts of facts about one’s special relationship to oneself might allow the consequentialist to justify giving somewhat more attention to one’s own well-being than that of anyone else. Even so, there is only one individual who is me; and the number of other individuals whom I can benefit, if I make the effort, is very large. When all of these factors are taken into consideration, it will often be the case that self-interested reasons ought to give way to altruistic motives.

Consequentialism evidently does not recognize certain ways in which each human being has a special relation to her own well-being—a relation different from the one she has to the well-being of others. When each of us becomes an adult, we are normally charged with the special responsibility of having to look after our own welfare. Young children are not expected to be in command of their own lives; they are not yet competent to occupy this role. But the point of their education is to train them so that as adults they can be responsible for themselves. A fully mature person is rightly expected by others to care for someone in particular—namely herself. She is given room to make decisions about her own life but is not given the same kind and degree of authority over the lives of others. If she would like to devote herself to others, she cannot simply do so without receiving their permission, or without taking other steps that make her entry into their lives permissible. Consequentialism, by contrast, regards all adult human beings as equally responsible for the well-being of all. It does not take seriously the idea that our social relations are governed by a division of labor that charges each with a special responsibility for herself—and certain others as well (one’s children, one’s friends, and so on.)

According to the weaker interpretation of impartiality described above, moral rules reflect this division of labor. (By the “weaker interpretation” is meant the thesis that moral thinking avoids being self-centered because it upholds a single set of rules or norms that apply equally to all human beings.) Consider, for example, the duty we normally have to help others, even when they are strangers. If someone is in need, and asks for your assistance, that gives you a reason to help him, and you should do so, provided that compliance with such appeals is not overly burdensome. Notice the escape clause: it builds into the duty to aid others a recognition of the importance of each person having a significant degree of control over his own life. Common sense morality assumes that what we owe to others might call for some sacrifice of our own good, but also that in the ordinary business of life the degree of sacrifice should fall within certain limits, so that we can make good use of the responsibility we have been given as adults to seek our own good. The balance struck by moral rules between the claims of self-interest and the claims of others is what makes it possible for those rules to be recognized and accepted as appropriate. These rules leave us free to volunteer to make greater sacrifices; but such greater sacrifices are not required of us except in extraordinary circumstances (wars, disasters, emergencies).

The three approaches to altruism that we have examined thus far give three rather different answers to the question: “why should one act for the sake of others and not only for one’s own sake?”

Eudaimonism replies that those who act for the sake of others are benefited by having an altruistic disposition.

The consequentialist’s answer begins with the claim that one’s own well-being ought to be of concern to oneself simply because it is someone’s well-being; it should not be of importance to oneself simply because it is one’s own well-being. There is, in other words, no reason why a benefit should go to you rather than someone else just because you are the one who would be receiving it. Accordingly, if one assumes, as one should, that one should act for one’s own sake, then one has no less a reason to act for the good of anyone and everyone else.

If we adopt a weaker interpretation of impartiality, we see the justification of altruism simply by seeing that we have a duty to aid other people in certain circumstances. The moral rule that requires us to help others is a rule that calls upon us to help them not as a means to our own good, but simply in virtue of their need. And we see the rule as justified by recognizing that it strikes a proper balance between our self-concern and the appropriate claims of others.

Notice that both consequentialism and the weaker impartialist position are compatible with the eudaimonist’s thesis that having altruistic motives is a component of one’s own well-being. What these two forms of impartialism reject is the stronger eudaimonistic thesis that one’s ultimate goal should be one’s own well-being and that alone.

That stronger eudaimonistic thesis and consequentialism stand at opposite poles from each other, in the following respect: The first of these poles elevates the self to a position of primacy, since it is only one’s own well-being that constitutes one’s ultimate goal; by contrast, consequentialism, at the opposite extreme, deflates the self to the point where it has no more claim to one’s attention than does any other individual. The weak impartialist attempts to occupy a middle ground.

4.3 Nagel and the impersonal standpoint

Yet another conception of impartiality—and a novel argument for the rationality of altruism—can be found in the work of Thomas Nagel. In The Possibility of Altruism (1970), he seeks to undermine both psychological egoism, in its strong form, as defined in section 2.1 above, and its normative counterpart (sometimes called “rational egoism or “ethical egoism”), which holds that one ought to have no direct concern with the good of others. Indirect concern, the ethical egoist grants, can be justified: the good of others may be instrumental to one’s own good, or one might happen to have a sentimental attachment to others. But absent these contingent relations to others, one has, according to the ethical egoist, no reason to care about their well-being.

Nagel doubts that anyone actually is a psychological egoist (1970: 84–85), but his major concern is to refute ethical egoism, by showing that altruism is a rational requirement on action. His idea is not simply that we ought in certain circumstances to help others for their sake; it is also that we are acting irrationally if we do not. That is because it is required of us as rational beings to view ourselves and others from what Nagel calls “the impersonal standpoint”. As he puts it,

to recognize others fully as persons requires a conception of oneself as identical with a particular, impersonally specifiable inhabitant of the world, among others of a similar nature. (1970: 100)

Nagel likens the impersonal standpoint to the prudential policy of regarding all times in one’s life as equal in importance. One has reason not to be indifferent to one’s future because the present moment is not more reason-giving simply by virtue of being present. Similarly, he holds, one has reason not to be indifferent to other people, because the fact that some individual is me is not more reason-giving simply because he is me. Terms like “now” and “later, ” “me and not me” point to no differences that make a rational difference. A time that is later eventually becomes a time that is now; that is why it is arbitrary and irrational to discount the future simply because it is future. Giving greater weight to someone’s good because that person is me is no less irrational.

The “impersonal standpoint”, as Nagel conceives it, is a view of the world from outside it, one that deprives one of information about which individual in that world one is. (It is, in the phrase Nagel chose as the title of his 1986 book, The View From Nowhere.) From this perspective, one need not be a utilitarian or consequentialist—one need not maximize the good, but can abide by the constraints of principles of the right. But certain principles are ruled out from the impersonal standpoint: egoism is, as well as any other principle that gives one individual or group a reason not shared by all others. For example, if someone has reason to avoid pain, that must be because pain—anyone’s pain—is to be avoided. So, it cannot be the case that although I have a reason to avoid pain, others are permitted to be indifferent to my plight, as if that pain were not an objectively bad thing, something that gives only the person who feels it a reason to oppose it. Nagel called such reasons “objective”, as contrasted with “subjective”. Parfit, in Reasons and Persons (1984), speaks instead of “agent-relative” and “agent neutral” reasons, and subsequently Nagel himself adopted these terms. The critique of egoism in The Possibility of Altruism rests on the thesis that all genuine reasons are agent neutral.

What Nagel’s position and utilitarianism have in common is a perspective that is the opposite of the self-centered world of rational egoism: from the point of view of this self-less perspective, each individual is just a tiny part of a vast universe of moral subjects, each of no more importance or value than any other. Our common sense point of view, moving from our inner life looking outward, lulls us into a massive kind of insularity—a tendency to downplay or ignore the fact that we are just one individual of no greater importance than any other. We put ourselves at the center of our world, and this can only be corrected by stepping back, leaving out of our picture the particular individual one is, and making general judgments about how human beings should behave towards each other. From this perspective, when one person ought to do something, some related requirement is imposed on all others as well –some “ought” statement applies to each.

Nagel is faced with the problem of how to explain why self-interest is not regularly swamped by agent-neutral reasons. If anyone’s pain imposes on all other moral agents a requirement of some sort, then one person’s pain is everyone’s problem. As Nagel says in The View From Nowhere, (using the term “objective standpoint” for the impersonal standpoint),

when we take up the objective standpoint, the problem is not that values seem to disappear but that there are too many of them, coming from every life and drowning out those that arise from our own. (1986: 147)

It would be consistent with this picture to add that the weight of reasons that derive from the situation of other people is extremely small and becomes increasingly so, as they are added together. Therefore, it might be said, they do not often outweigh reasons of self-interest. But that would be an ad hoc stipulation, and would differ only slightly from the egoist’s thesis that the good of others has no independent weight. It is hard to believe that we are forced to choose between ethical egoism (which says that only one’s own pain ought to be one’s direct concern) and Nagel’s conception of impartiality (according to which everyone’s pain ought to weigh on me, because that of others is as bad as my own). The first demands no altruism of us, the second too much.

4.4 Sentimentalism and fellow feeling

Some philosophers would say that the approaches to altruism discussed thus far are missing an important—perhaps the most important—ingredient in moral motivation. These approaches, one might say, make altruism a matter of the head, but it is much more a matter of the heart. The eudaimonist can say that we should have a certain amount of fellow feeling, but justifies that emotional response by giving a self-interested reason for being so motivated. The consequentialist seems to leave no legitimate room in our moral thinking for the friendly feelings and love we have for particular individuals, for these sentiments are often at odds with the project of increasing the total amount of good in the world. The weak impartialist says that in certain situations we are to be moved by the good of others, but that is only because there is a moral rule, striking a reasonable balance between oneself and others, that requires one to do so. All three approaches—so the objection goes—are too cold and calculating. They call upon us to treat others in accordance with a formula or rule or general policy. What is most important in human relationships cannot be captured by an approach that begins with a general rule about how to treat others, and justifies a certain way of treating each particular individual simply by applying that general rule.

It would miss the point of this critique if one said, in response, that having an emotional response to the good of others is an effective means of getting oneself to give them the aid they need. (For example, the consequentialist can say that this doctrine does call upon us to act on the basis of friendly feelings and love towards particular individuals, because over the long run relationships solidified by such sentiments are likely to result in a greater balance of good over bad than would colder relationships.) But a defender of the critique put forward in the preceding paragraph would reply that one’s emotional response to the good or ill of others can be assessed as appropriate independently of the effectiveness of one’s emotions as motivators of action. When we feel compassion for the suffering of a particular individual, that reaction is already justified; the suffering of another ought to elicit such a response simply because that is the appropriate reaction. Consider, as an analogy, the proper reaction to the death of a loved one; this calls forth grief and ought to do so, even though grief cannot undo one’s loss. In the same way, it could be said that altruistic feelings are the appropriate response to the good and ill of others, quite apart from whether those feelings lead to results. That does not imply that it does not matter whether one does anything for the good of others. One ought to alleviate their suffering and seek their well-being; that is because this is the proper behavioral expression of one’s feeling for them. If, in the face of the suffering of others, one feels nothing and offers no help, the fundamental flaw in one’s response is one’s emotional indifference, and a secondary flaw is the failure to act that flows from that emotional defect.

According to this “sentimentalist” approach to altruism, the question, “why should one act for the sake of others and not only for one’s own sake?” should not be answered by appealing to some notion of impartiality or some conception of well-being. That would be no better than trying to justify grief by way of impartiality or well-being. The sentimentalist simply asks us to recognize that the situation of this or that human being (or animal) rightly calls forth a certain emotional response, and the help we give is the proper expression of that sentiment.

5. Kant on sympathy and duty

To assess the role that sympathy should play in our relations with other human beings, it will be helpful to consider Kant’s discussion of this question in the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals (1785). He notes that

many souls are so compassionately disposed that, without any further motive of vanity or self-interest, they find an inner pleasure in spreading joy around them. (4:398)

He is by no means contemptuous of them—on the contrary, he says that they “deserve praise and encouragement” (4:398). But not the highest praise or the strongest encouragement.

What they do not deserve, he says, is our “esteem”, because their motivation “has no genuinely moral worth”. That is because the “maxim” of what they do “lacks the moral merit of such actions done not out of inclination but out of duty” (4:398). Kant means that these people are not following a rule when they help others—a rule, rationally acceptable to all, according to which all those who are in such and such circumstances ought to be helped because it is morally right to do so. (The term “such and such circumstances” is a place-holder for a phrase stating in general terms what those circumstances are.) These compassionate people act instead on an emotional basis: they are pained by the misfortunes of others, and they know that if they offer their help, they will give themselves pleasure. That is a good motive, Kant thinks, but it ought not to be one’s sole or primary reason for helping others.

Kant elaborates on his claim by imagining a transformation in one of these sympathetic and compassionate people: suppose someone’s misfortunes have brought him sorrows that extinguish his feeling for others. He retains his power to “assist others in distress” but now “their adversity no longer stir[s] him”. He feels no “inclination” to help them, but does so nonetheless, simply because he believes he has a moral duty to do so. Kant says that when this happens, this man’s character and his action have “moral worth”—whereas they had none before. His motive is now “incomparably the highest”—not only is it better than before, but, because it is now a moral motive, it has a kind of value that takes priority over every other kind (4:398).

What should we make of this? To begin with, we should acknowledge that if someone assists another person because he is aware of that person’s suffering and is distressed by it, he may not be acting for the most admirable of motives. For example, if you hear someone crying, and this leads you to help him, you may be motivated solely by your desire for a good night’s sleep, which you could not have had, had he continued to cry. Alleviating his pain was not your ultimate end –it was just a way to quiet him down, so that you could enjoy some peace. We might say that you “did a good thing”, but you don’t deserve any praise or admiration for doing so. But this falls far short of vindicating Kant’s claim. This is not really a case of acting compassionately, because it was not that other person’s suffering you cared about—only his crying, and only because this distressed you.

Before we move closer to the sort of case that Kant is discussing, it will be helpful to engage in a thought experiment due to Robert Nozick (1974: 42–5). He imagines an “experience machine” in which a neuroscientist manipulates your brain so that you can have any experiences of your choosing. Those experiences would be illusory, but they could be as lifelike, rich, and complex as you choose. You might, for example, enter the machine in order to have an experience exactly like that of climbing Mt. Everest; you would be lying on a table with your brain attached to the machine, but it would be exactly as though you were facing great danger, wind, cold, snow, and so on. Nozick claimed that we would not choose to plug into the machine, and rightly so, because there is much of value beyond the experiential component of our lives.

With this device in mind, let’s return to Kant’s compassionate souls who “without any further motive of vanity or self-interest, … find an inner pleasure in spreading joy around them”. We can offer them the opportunity to plug into the experience machine, and it would then seem to them as if they were “spreading joy around them”. They would not in fact be helping anyone, but it would seem to them as though they were, and that would fill them with joy. Clearly, there would be little or nothing to admire in those who would enter the machine on these terms. But what about a compassionate person who refuses this offer, and prefers to find joy in actually helping people—not merely in seeming to help them? To be more precise, we might offer someone the following choice: (a) You will experience great joy in the machine, imagining yourself to be helping others; (b) you will experience less joy outside the machine, but it will be joy taken in actually helping others. A genuinely compassionate person would choose (b). He would be giving up a certain amount of pleasure in order to be of use to others. And there is certainly something admirable about that.

According to Kant, however, there is still something of great worth that is missing in the motivation of this genuinely compassionate person, willing though he is to make some sacrifice in his own well-being for the sake of others. His reason for helping is not that it would be morally wrong to fail to do so—wrong because he would be violating a moral rule that makes it a duty for him to help them. What motivates him to aid others is simply that he is inclined to do so. If he did not take any pleasure in being of assistance, he would not do so.

We should agree with Kant that there are situations in which it would be morally wrong for one person to refuse to help another, whether that person has fellow feeling for others or not. For example, suppose a child needs to be taken to the hospital, and it so happens that you can do so at some small cost or inconvenience to yourself. Although this child is a stranger to you, you are someone who finds children adorable and likes to be with them. And so you willingly accompany the child to the hospital. Your love of children is admirable, but you would still be subject to criticism, if that were your sole motivation for assisting this child. By hypothesis, in the situation we are imagining, it would be wrong to refuse—and yet the wrongness of refusing, by hypothesis, is not one of your motives.

But Kant’s point is of limited application, for there are many other kinds of situation in which assisting others for their sake is admirable but not a moral duty. Suppose, for example, a novelist takes time away from her work each day in order to read to blind people in her community. She does not have a moral obligation to assist those people; she helps them because she loves books and she wants to spread the joy she takes in literature to others. Perhaps at some point in the future, her interests will change—she might no longer write novels, and she might get no pleasure from reading to others. She might then no longer volunteer to read to the blind. Kant must say that the help given by this writer does not deserve our “esteem” and “has no genuinely moral worth”, because she acts from inclination rather than duty. But it is implausible to withhold these words of praise. The author does not read to others merely as a means to advance her career or her own well-being. Although she enjoys reading to others, she may believe that it would be better for her to spend more of her time working on her own writing projects. She makes some sacrifices because she believes that other people’s lives will improve if she can instill in them the joy she takes in these books. Surely her motives have “moral worth” in the normal sense of that term: her reason for acting is to help others.

Recall Kant’s thought experiment in which a person full of sympathy and compassion suffers severe misfortunes that extinguish all of his feeling for others. He is still able to benefit others, and he still has a strong sense of duty. Kant seems to be implying that if such an individual continues to “assist others in distress” because he sees that he has a duty to do so, then there is no moral defect in him at all. His motivation, on the contrary, is exemplary, because it has “moral worth” (unlike the motivation of the individual who is moved by inclination and fellow feeling). Surely Kant is right that we ought not to lower our opinion of him merely because he has experienced severe misfortunes—assuming that he did not bring them on himself. He says that the adversity of others “no longer stir[s]” this poor soul, and presumably he would add that this emotional condition is not this unfortunate man’s fault either. But even if there is nothing blameworthy in this man’s emotional indifference to the good of others, it is also true that his relationship with others has been damaged. He cannot respond to others as he should. Lacking any inclination to spread joy to others, when he undertakes projects that fulfill his duty to promote their happiness or diminish their unhappiness, he will do so in a joyless, dutiful manner, thereby tarnishing the relationship he ought to have with them. If, for example, he volunteers to read to the blind, he will be unable to communicate to them a love of literature—for he himself feels no “inner pleasure” when he reads, and has no inclination to help others, due to his own suffering. When he receives news of his adult children’s misfortunes, he will not respond with sympathy or compassion—such news will simply leave him cold (although he will fulfill his parental duties, if his assistance is morally required). It would be appropriate, then, to say that this man exhibits significant moral defects. He lacks the motivation to act towards others as he should, and to feel for others as he should.

6. Sentimentalism revisited

We are now in a better position to sort through the package of ideas labeled “sentimentalism” in preceding sections, and to recognize that some are far more plausible than others.

First, we should accept the sentimentalist thesis that one’s feelings can be assessed as fitting or unfitting on grounds other than their causal effect on one’s actions. We should, for example, care about what happens to our children even when we can do nothing to help them; that emotional response is appropriate because it is part of what it is to be a good parent. This point allows us to concede that in certain situations one ought to try to suppress an emotional response that would normally be appropriate. If one has a duty to minister to many people who are suffering, one may be more effective in aiding them if one keeps oneself from feeling the emotions that are fitting. A nurse working in a war zone, for example, might save more lives if she trains herself, for now, to feel little emotion when she hears the moans and cries of the wounded. She has reason to feel compassion, but that is overridden by stronger reasons to act effectively to relieve their burden.

A closely related sentimentalist point that should be accepted is that aiding someone in need, but doing so in a manifestly cold, affectless, or hostile manner is, in many situations, a defective response.

A second idea associated with sentimentalism in section 4.4 was this:

what is most important in human relationships cannot be captured by an approach that begins with a general rule about how to treat others, and justifies a certain way of treating each particular individual simply by applying that general rule.

The kernel of truth in this statement is that some of the most valuable components of our lives are not available by following a rule. We do not fall in love with people by applying a general principle, standard, or criterion about whom we ought to fall in love with. We do not develop a passion for mathematics, or history, or tennis, by seeing these pursuits as specific instances of something more general that we care about. Some of the most valuable components of our lives are available to us only if they arise spontaneously from feelings that respond to the lovable features of the world or the people in it.

But that leaves a great deal of room for the project of treating people in accordance with rules that we accept because they survive our rational scrutiny. For example, it would be absurd to suggest that we should abstain from torturing someone if (but only if) we have an untutored and negative emotional reaction to torturing him. With respect to torture, we need to respond to a general question: are there circumstances in which it would be justified? (And to answer that question, we must first ask: what is torture?) The only way to address these questions is one in which we reason our way towards a general policy—a rule, however simple or complex, that governs the use of torture. And surely such a rule should be impartial—it should be a single rule that applies to all, not tailored to serve the interests of some nations or factions to which we belong.

The same point applies to questions about everyday rules that govern such acts as promise-keeping, lying, theft, and other kinds of suspect behavior. Here too we rightly expect each other to have a general policy, one that takes these sorts of actions to be wrong in normal circumstances. That a promise has been freely made is normally a decisive reason for keeping it; someone who keeps a promise only if he has a positive feeling about doing so would not be treating others as they rightly expect to be treated. (For opposing views, see Dancy 2004; Ridge and McKeever 2006.)

A third question about the relation between our sentiments and altruism arises when we ask about the proper basis for charitable giving. Consider, for example, someone who donates money to an organization devoted to fighting cancer, and chooses to do so because his mother has died of cancer. His gift is an expression of his love for her; it is meant, of course, to do good to others, but those others are chosen as beneficiaries because he takes the reduction of this disease to be an appropriate expression of his feelings for her. Utilitarianism cannot easily accept this form of altruism, since it begins with the premise that charitable acts, like everything else, are right only if they do the most good—and it could easily be the case that money allocated to cancer research would do more good if donated to some other humanitarian cause. But if one does not presuppose the truth of utilitarianism, it is not difficult to defend the practice of choosing one charity over another on the basis of one’s sentimental attachments. If friendships and other loving relationships have a proper place in our lives even if they do not maximize the good, then sentiment is an appropriate basis for altruism. (For an opposing view, see Singer 2015.)

That does not entail that it is always right to follow our feelings when we decide whether to help this person or organization rather than that. Suppose you belong to a group dedicated to reducing the number of people who die in drowning accidents, and you are on your way to an essential meeting of this organization. If you miss the meeting, let us suppose, the group will have to suspend its operations for many months—with the result that the number of drownings will remain high. On your way, you pass a child who is in danger of drowning, and cries for your help. You must choose: either you can save this one child, or you can attend the meeting and thereby save many more from drowning. When you hear the child’s cries for help, you cannot help responding emotionally; it would be cold and calculating to pass him by, even if in doing so you will be saving many more. What ought you to do?

The fact that your emotions are fully aroused by the child’s cries does not have the same bearing on this issue as does the love felt by a son for his departed mother in the previous example. The drowning child whose cries fill you with compassionate feeling is a stranger to you. So your alternatives in this case are whether to help one stranger (the one who is tugging at your heartstrings) or many (whom you do not see or hear at the moment). It would not be implausible to hold that sentiment plays an appropriate role in altruism when it is the expression of a long-term and meaningful bond, but not when it is a short-lived reaction to the cries of a stranger.

7. Conclusion

We have found no reason to doubt that we both can and should be altruistic to some extent. To what extent? Utilitarians and consequentialists have an exact answer to that question: one is to give equal weight to the good of every human being (or every sentient creature), counting oneself as just one small part of that universal good. If that is more altruism than can be required of us, the better alternative is not to retreat to the other extreme (egoism). Rather, how much altruism is appropriate for an individual varies according to that individual’s situation in life.

Altruism is not necessarily admirable. It is to be admired only in circumstances in which it is appropriate to act for another’s sake—and only when what one aims to do for another really does benefit that individual. If one seeks what one takes to be the good of others for their sake, but is mistaken about what is really good for them, one’s action is defective. Altruism is fully admirable only when combined with a correct understanding of well-being.

What is wrong with those who do not care about others for their sake? It could be the case that such individuals are themselves worse off for their lack of altruistic motivation. That is what a eudaimonist must say, and we have not objected to that aspect of eudaimonism. It could also be the case that there is a failure of rationality among those who are never altruistic or insufficiently altruistic. But it should not be assumed that there must be something else that goes awry in those who are not altruistic or not altruistic enough, beyond the fact that when they ought to have cared about some individual other than themselves, they failed to do so.


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