Gertrude Elizabeth Margaret Anscombe

First published Tue Jul 21, 2009; substantive revision Sat Nov 19, 2011

Gertrude Elizabeth Margaret Anscombe was one of the most gifted philosophers of the twentieth century. Her work continues to strongly influence philosophers working in action theory and moral philosophy. Like the work of her friend Ludwig Wittgenstein, Anscombe's work is marked by a keen analytic sensibility.


1. Life

She was born in Limerick, Ireland 18 March 1919 to Allen Wells Anscombe and Gertrude Elizabeth Anscombe (née Thomas). At the time of her birth her father was serving in the British Army. The family later returned to England where Allen Anscombe resumed his career as a schoolmaster.

Anscombe attended the Sydenham School, graduating in 1937, and went on to St. Hugh's College, Oxford. She received a First in Literae Humaniores (Classics and Philosophy) in 1941. After her graduation in 1941 she remained for a while at St. Hugh's as a research student, later moving to Newnham College, Cambridge in 1942. In 1946 she was offered a Research Fellowship at Somerville College, Oxford and then was appointed to a teaching Fellowship there in 1964. She moved from Oxford to Cambridge in 1970 when she was awarded a Chair of Philosophy at Cambridge—the Chair formerly occupied by Ludwig Wittgenstein. She remained at Cambridge until her retirement in 1986.

In 1938, at Oxford, she met the philosopher Peter Geach. They were both receiving instruction from the same Dominican priest. They were married in 1941. They had three sons and four daughters.

Anscombe did not avoid controversy. In 1956 she publicly opposed Oxford University's decision to award an honorary degree to Harry Truman, whom she considered a mass murderer for his decision to use atomic weapons against the cities of Hiroshima and Nagasaki, Japan. She also courted controversy with some of her colleagues by coming out in print against contraception (see below).

Anscombe continued to produce original work beyond her retirement. Peter Geach, for example, reported in Analysis that she had constructed a novel paradox (Geach 2006, 266–7).

Anscombe died in Cambridge on 5 January 2001.

2. Wittgenstein's Influence

Anscombe met Wittgenstein at Cambridge, after her graduation from Oxford. She attended his lectures and became one of his most devoted students. She believed that it was Wittgenstein's lectures, for example, that freed her from the trap of phenomenalism (MPM, ix). When she returned to Oxford she continued to travel to Cambridge to study with Wittgenstein.

Anscombe also became one of Wittgenstein's good friends and then, after his death in 1951, one of the executors of his literary work. Ray Monk wrote that Anscombe was “…one of Wittgenstein's closest friends and one of his most trusted students, an exception to his general dislike of academic women and especially of female philosophers. She became, in fact, an honorary male, addressed by him affectionately as ‘old man’.” (Monk 1991, 498).

Anscombe translated Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations (1953), and wrote an introduction to the Tractatus in 1959 (the work had originally been published in 1921). She organized major publications of Wittgenstein's later work in, for example, Remarks on Color and Zettel. She also translated a number of his other works.

3. Metaphysics

Some of Anscombe's most influential work was on the nature of causation. The relation between cause and effect has been notoriously difficult to analyze. Anscombe's work in “Causality and Determination” challenged some of the empiricist orthodoxy of Hume's account. For example, she challenged the view that the causal relation is characterized by constant conjunction in discussing Feynman's Geiger counter case:

An example of a non-necessitating cause is mentioned by Feynman: a bomb is connected to a Geiger counter, so that it will go off if the Geiger counter registers a certain reading; whether it will or not is not determined, for it is so placed near some radioactive material that it may or may not register that reading. (255)

And yet, if the bomb explodes it was caused by the Geiger counter arrangement. Causation does not involve determination, or necessity. Since the radioactive decay was not sufficient for this effect, the case tells against viewing causes as sufficient conditions. There is no general causal connection between cause and effect.

This challenge to the Humean account would turn out to be very influential—it helped push philosophers towards the development of probabilistic accounts of causation to account for the above type of case.

In terms of categorization, she falls into the singularist camp on causation, since she further rejected the Humean view that causation is not observable in a single instance. On her view the particular cause produces the particular effect. Anscombe produced examples from ordinary language that seemed to show that we do perceive causation. Such examples are abundant. “I saw her clean the dishes” reports the perception of a causal process. The critic could point out that when we utter expressions such as this we are speaking loosely. Hume certainly wouldn't deny that we say things like this. Rather, the close, probing, examination of a process alone cannot account for causation.

Her work on causation demonstrated reliance on ordinary language methodology. Anscombe also directly contributed to the development of key themes in ordinary language philosophy itself—she influenced its content, not simply reliance on it methodologically. This is evident in her work on first-person expression. In her paper “The First Person” she focuses on Descartes' use of ‘I’ in developing his philosophical arguments regarding the existence of the self. On the same grounds as Descartes argues that he can doubt ‘I have a body’ but cannot doubt ‘I exist’ he can doubt ‘I am Descartes’ but not ‘I exist.’ ‘I am Descartes’, then, is not an identity statement. ‘I’ does not refer like a name. In doubting “I am Descartes” he must have the thought “I am not Descartes.” So, in using “I,” in this context he is not referring to himself.

We do tend to think of ‘I’ as simply being that expression people use to refer to themselves. However, again,

“When John Smith spoke of James Robinson he was speaking of his brother, but he did not know this.” That's a possible situation. So similarly is “When John Smith spoke of John Horatio Auberon Smith (named in a will perhaps) he was speaking of himself, but he did not know this.” If so, then ‘speaking of’ or ‘referring to’ oneself is compatible with not knowing that the object one speaks of is oneself. (47)

The problem with the reference view of ‘I’ is that when someone is ignorant of his or her own identity, ‘I’ does not capture what the person has in mind. When a person ‘speaks of himself’ when he says ‘John drank the poison’ not knowing that he himself is John, then he speaks of himself in a purely external way, devoid of self-consciousness that we associate with ‘I’ utterances. So ‘John drank the poison’ does not come off as the same as ‘I drank the poison’—John would affirm the first but not the second.

Again, this discussion of self-expression would have a great deal of influence in philosophy of language and mind. How indexicals work and function in language, the nature of self-knowledge and self-consciousness, and self-identity.

4. Action Theory

Anscombe's Intention (1957) is one of the classics of 20th century philosophy. Indeed, it continues to be a standard point of reference for those working in action theory and philosophical psychology. Like Wittgenstein, Anscombe presented her ideas in succinct points and numbered sections. However, Anscombe developed her own distinctive approach to philosophical analysis. Her writing is more direct and argumentative than Wittgenstein's.

Intention is a work on the nature of agency through an understanding of intention. Anscombe notes that ‘intention’ figures into our language in a variety of ways, through different locutions. The three she notes are:

  1. A is xing intentionally. [Adverb]
  2. A is xing with the intention of doing y. [Noun]
  3. A intends to do y. [Verb]

Locution (3) has to do with intention, and one of Anscombe's concerns was to articulate the distinction between intention “simpliciter” and acting intentionally. One of the really interesting questions she considers has to do with the difference between intentions and predictions. Both are future directed. Both seem to require a belief that a future state of affairs will occur. Yet, a crucial difference, it seems, is that when we justify a prediction—such as “It will rain tomorrow” we use evidence. On the other hand when we justify an intention, such as “I will go to the ice cream shop tomorrow,” we give reasons, i.e., “…reasons why it would be useful or attractive if the description came true, not by evidence that it is true.” (Intention, 6)

This passage raises some very deep issues regarding the nature of intention. For example, Anscombe seems to indicate that one kind of reason relates to the agent's desires for a certain state of affairs. If I intend to do y must it be the case that I, all things considered, want y to come about; or merely that I all things considered want to do y? Michael Bratman (1987) would query this by noting that the belief/desire model of intention fails to adequately model the organizational role intentions play in practical deliberation.

Another of her insights is that when we describe intentional action we are pointing to something for which reasons can be given, and by ‘reasons’ we do not mean ‘causes.’ So, her example is that when someone knocks a glass off of a table he may give an explanation that he saw a face in the window and that made him jump. This provides a causal explanation for why he knocked the glass off the table, but it doesn't give a reason. The knocking of the glass off the table was not intentional, though it was caused by his being startled.

On Anscombe's view a particular action can be intentional under one description, but not intentional under another. When I turn on the coffee machine in the morning it is intentional under the description of ‘turn on the coffee machine’ that's what I intend to do. I will also, let's say, as a side effect, get my husband to come into the kitchen when he hears the coffee machine go on. That is not intentional though. The movement of my hand that turns on the coffee machine is not intentional under the description ‘get husband to come into the kitchen.’ For a bodily movement to be an action it must be intentional under some description.

Further, on her view intentional action is prior to intention to act. That is, to understand what it is to intend to act one must understand intentional action. In performing an intentional act we act on reasons (specified by ‘why?’ questions, as described above). Anscombe herself uses the example of someone who is sawing a plank. In sawing the plank his action is intentional under one description, that of ‘sawing the plank,’ though not under the description ‘making noise.’ So, he is intentionally sawing the plank, though not intentionally making noise since he has no intention to make the noise (his reasons for performing the action have nothing to do with making noise). We get the claim that intentions are necessary for intentional action. Nonetheless there can be unintentional action, but it will be intentional under some other description.

Anscombe's account of intention and intentional action has informed much of the subsequent literature on the topic. Donald Davidson (1980) expanded on her claims regarding act identification and agreed that:

If a person Fs by Ging, then her act of Fing = her act of Ging.

This is known as the Davidson/Anscombe thesis (Wilson, 1989; see also the entry on action). Davidson, however, disagreed with Anscombe on the issue of reasons as causes. Davidson, unlike Anscombe, argued that reason explanation of an action is also a kind of causal explanation of the action. When one explains an action one cites the belief and the desire that caused the action. The reason, in the sense cited by Anscombe, corresponds to what the agent desired. When I go to the ice cream shop to get an ice cream cone I desire an ice cream cone and I believe that I can get one at the ice cream shop. This is what causes the intentional action of going to the ice cream shop.

George Wilson follows Anscombe in that he too believes that an explanation of an action in terms of the reasons for the action is grounded in the intention behind the action (Wilson 1989). This will prove problematic when we look at the connection between philosophy of psychology and moral psychology.

One of the most significant ideas elaborated on in Intention is ‘direction of fit.’ Though the notion seems to have originated with J.L. Austin, Anscombe is credited with a clear explication of it. ‘Direction of fit’ was how John Searle referred to Anscombe's idea that there are two things that we can do with words—sometimes we try to get the words to match, or fit with, what's in the world, and other times we try to get the world to fit with the words. This turned out to be important in speech act theory since speech acts exemplify one direction of fit. When one utters a command, for example, one is not trying to describe the world or make an assertion that is supposed to match with what is in the world. Rather, the point is to bring about a state of affairs in the world.[1]

Consider this famous passage from Intention:

Let us consider a man going round a town with a shopping list in his hand. Now it is clear that the relation of this list to the things he actually buys is one and the same whether his wife gave him the list or it is his own list; and that there is a different relation where a list is made by a detective following him about. If he made the list itself, it was an expression of intention; if his wife gave it to him, it has the role of an order. What then is the identical relation to what happens, in the order and the intention, which is not shared by the record? It is precisely this: if the list and the things that the man actually buys do not agree, and if this and this alone constitutes a mistake, then the mistake is not in the list but in the man's performance (if his wife were to say: “Look, it says butter and you have bought margarine”, he would hardly reply: “What a mistake! we must put that right” and alter the word on the list to “margarine”); whereas if the detective's record and what the man actually buys do not agree, then the mistake is in the record. (section 32).

'Direction-of-fit' has proven useful to understanding the difference between mental states like belief and desire. Beliefs describe the world, desires are not descriptive. Desires effect change in the world. Thus, desires themselves are not true or false, though they may be based on beliefs which are true or false. Thus intuitive way of demarcating the function of belief and desire helps to clarify different theories of normativity and what is at stake between those theories. A desire based theory, for example, might not be committed to truth or falsity of moral claims. This is important, too, in accounting for differences between speculative, or theoretical, knowledge and reasoning and practical knowledge and reasoning.

Anscombe applied her views on intention to clarify her own positions on controversial claims, such as the condemnation of contraception. One puzzle in Catholic doctrine condemning contraception, and yet allowing for the ‘rhythm method’ of avoiding pregnancy, is to reconcile the rationales in a consistent way. Many charged the Church with inconsistency, since the intention to not get pregnant during intercourse is present in both cases. Anscombe claims the intentions differ.

The reason why people are confused about intention, and why they sometimes think there is no difference between contraceptive intercourse and the use of infertile times to avoid conception, is this: They don't notice the difference between “intention” when it means the intentionalness of the thing you're doing—that you're doing this on purpose—and when it means a further or accompanying intention with which you do the thing. (CC, 135)

Her claim is that the further intentions that accompany these actions are the same, but that the kind of intentional act one is performing in each case differs in a very significant way. Her claim is that use of contraception, unlike timing intercourse to coincide with infertile periods, is a bad sort of action because in the case of sexual intercourse “…to intend such an act is not to intend a marriage act at all, whether or no we're married” (CC, 136). When one engages in sexual intercourse using contraceptives one has the intention of rendering oneself infertile, one is not acting with the intention of engaging in normal sexual intercourse, just at an infertile time. Even though both types of action have the further aim of limiting family size, the basic intentions are different. That is, the intentions that define the acts themselves are different. The perversion of the sex act in marriage is, in this one way, like writing a forged check for a good cause, she claims. The further intention of, let's say, helping the needy is a worthy one but does not vindicate the action of forging the check. Needless to say, this view was enormously controversial.

Bernard Williams and Michael Tanner criticized her argument for failing to consider one of her own theses—that actions, including sorts of actions, can fall under a variety of descriptions. On their view, she is picking and choosing descriptions of actions in order to get the outcome she wants—a distinction between rhythm method and contraception that isn't just a trivial distinction. But, they argue, she cannot do this convincingly. They argue that couples who employ the rhythm method are taking steps to achieve infertility just as those who take contraception are. Those steps are central to understanding the acts themselves, not simply the further purpose of the acts. (Williams and Tanner 1972)

Anscombe's views on intention also figured largely in her defense and articulation of the Doctrine of Double Effect, which will be discussed in more detail below.

5. Moral Philosophy

5.1 Virtue Ethics

Anscombe's article “Modern Moral Philosophy” stimulated the development of virtue ethics as an alternative to Utilitarianism, Kantian Ethics, and Social Contract theories. Her primary charge in the article is that, as secular approaches to moral theory, they are without foundation. They use concepts such as ‘morally ought,’ ‘morally obligated,’ ‘morally right,’ and so forth that are legalistic and require a legislator as the source of moral authority. In the past God occupied that role, but systems that dispense with God as part of the theory are lacking the proper foundation for meaningful employment of those concepts.

There are two ways to read this article. The first is to read it straightforwardly as an indictment of the moral theories prevalent in the 1950s and a subsequent argument for the development of an alternative theory of morality that does not postulate a legislator, but then also does not try to keep the defunct legislative structure that naturally falls out of religiously based ethics. On this view we need to develop an alternative that is based on moral psychology, moral virtue, facts of human nature, and an account of the good for humans based on this approach. A major mistake made by modern moral philosophers is that they try to provide an account of ‘morally right or morally wrong’ that really has no content outside of the legislative arena provided by the divine. Anscombe writes: “It would be most reasonable to drop it. It has no reasonable sense outside a law conception of ethics; they are not going to maintain such a conception; and you can do ethics without it, as is shown by the example of Aristotle. It would be great improvement if, instead of ‘morally wrong,’ one always named a genus such as ‘untruthful’, ‘unchaste’, ‘unjust’ ” (MMP, 8–9).

Thus, many take her to be arguing for this alternative—the alternative that, like Aristotle's account, relies on richer, or ‘thick’ concepts such as ‘just’ as opposed to ‘thin’ concepts such as ‘morally wrong’ which—outside of a certain metaphysical perspective—lacks content.

This quite naturally then leads to an emphasis on developing a virtue ethics that would be distinct from the modern approaches Anscombe attacks in MMP.

This is the prevalent reading of MMP and the reason why it is widely interpreted as encouraging a virtue ethical approach to moral theory. For example, Crisp and Slote note that Anscombe suggests the alternative that “…ethics can be based, instead, on the idea of a virtue…”, but, as they also note, this idea itself is also not clear and that what we need to be doing is some basic moral psychology to get clarity on notions such as ‘intention,’ ‘desire,’ ‘action,’ and so forth (1997, 4). Yet another crucial notion, for the sake of understanding virtue, is ‘human flourishing.’ Anscombe is doubtful we will be able to reach a satisfactory understanding of this notion.

An alternative reading is as a modus tollens argument intended to establish the superiority of a religious based ethics. (For more on a skeptical reading of MMP, see Crisp 2004.) Assume for the sake of argument there is no God, and religiously based moral theory is incorrect. On Anscombe's view modern theories such as Kantian ethics, Utilitarianism, and social contract theory are sorely inadequate for a variety of reasons, but one major worry is that they try to adopt the legalistic framework without the right background assumptions to ground it. An alternative would be to develop a kind of naturalized approach where we carefully consider moral psychology as it relates to the human good. However, this approach itself is problematic. The prospect of articulating a complete and plausible account of the human good along these lines is dim.

Here is the straightforward interpretation in simple modus ponens form:

(1) If religiously based ethics is false, then virtue ethics is the way moral philosophy ought to be developed.
(2a) Religious based ethics is false (at least for her interlocutors)
(3a) Therefore, virtue ethics is the way moral philosophy should be developed.

But one person's modus ponens is another person's modus tollens:

(1) If religiously based ethics is false, then virtue ethics is the way moral philosophy ought to be developed.
(2b) It is not the case that virtue ethics is the way to develop moral philosophy
(3b) Therefore, it is not the case that religiously based ethics is false.

Thus, according to the alternative reading, one can conclude that Anscombe is arguing that the only suitable and really viable alternative is the religiously based moral theory that keeps the legalistic framework and the associated concepts of ‘obligation.’ This interpretation is more in keeping with Anscombe's religious views and with her other ethical views regarding absolute prohibitions. There were plenty of actions she took to be morally wrong, so it seems clear—as Simon Blackburn noted—that she herself was not out to jettison these terms. But one can defend an even stronger claim. MMP is a carefully crafted argument intended to show the absurdity of rejecting the religious framework—along with it's metaphysical underpinnings—when it comes to moral authority.[2] But many readers simply stuck to the straightforward modus ponens reading of the argument. Support for (2b) is provided by her doubts that virtue ethics can really get off the ground as a normative theory using a distinctly ‘moral’ ought. In MMP she writes about pursuing the project of ethics as Plato and Aristotle pursued it, along virtue ethical lines:

…but it can be seen that philosophically there is a huge gap, at present unfillable as far as we are concerned, which needs to be filled by an account of human nature, human action, the type of characteristic a virtue is, and, above all of human ‘flourishing’. And it is the last concept that appears the most doubtful. (MMP, 41)

But, by and large, MMP was read against a backdrop in which a religious basis for ethics had been discredited. Thus many writers took up the challenge to develop a psychologically rich virtue ethics rather than abandon secular morality.

The article has clearly had an impact on the development of virtue ethics. Part of its influence can be traced to its negative assessment of the leading theories of the day, particularly Utilitarianism and Kantian Ethics. On her view, Utilitarianism commits one to endorsing evil deeds, and Kantian ethics, with its notion of ‘self-legislation’ is just incoherent. If the main choices are either evil or incoherent, that's a serious problem and calls for the development of some alternative approach. Unfortunately, perhaps, for Anscombe's overall project, her audience regarded the supernaturalized approach as more problematic than the naturalized . If we are to go back to very early approaches, such as Aristotle's, then the natural approach to developing the alternatives is as a ‘virtue ethics’ and digging into the messy issue of human flourishing and good.

MMP also touched a nerve with philosophers who advocated one or the other of the condemned views. One reason for this was the rather dismissive or moralistic tone she took in some of her criticisms. Perhaps one of the more well known is given in the following passage when she condemns Utilitarianism—or, more generally—Consequentialism, for leaving open the possibility that it may be morally right in some context to advocate the execution of an innocent person.

She wrote:

But if someone really thinks, in advance, that it is open to question whether such an action as procuring the judicial execution of the innocent should be quite excluded from consideration—I do not want to argue with him; he shows a corrupt mind. (MMP, 17)

Anscombe is not making a subtle point here, and this comment prodded philosophers such as Jonathan Bennett to defend the view that consequences certainly mattered in determining the moral quality of an action—indeed, he questions the adequacy of accounts that rely on a dubious act/consequence distinction. This does not by itself get one to Consequentialism. Indeed, Anscombe's comment here goes beyond a mere condemnation of Consequentialism to a further condemnation of any view in which consequences are weighed in determining moral rightness or wrongness. She is a moral absolutist. Some things are wrong and ought not to be done, whatever the consequences. So, for example, Bennett was concerned to undercut a popular distinction between killing versus letting die which was made on the basis that killing is just the sort of act that is wrong, period, no matter what the consequences, whereas letting die is not as bad as killing, even if the consequences were the same and were known to be the same.

When the killing/letting-die distinction is stripped of its implications regarding immediacy, intention etc.—which lack moral significance or don't apply to the example—all that remains is a distinction having to do with where a set of movements lies on the scale which has ‘the only set of movements which would have produced that upshot’ at one end and ‘movements other than the only set which would have produced that upshot’ at the other. (Bennett 1966, 95)

Thus, a person's doing a results in an upshot x and at one end of the action scale a is the one action that can result in x; refraining from a is compatible with a whole range of alternative actions—walking to the grocery store, weeding in the garden, reading a book—all of which have x as a result. But there is no morally relevant difference, here. There is nothing in the ‘act itself’ of killing that distinguishes it, in a morally relevant way, from letting die when things like immediacy, intention, and so forth are held constant.

Anscombe's comment on Bennett's criticism comprises one of the briefest philosophical essays, which I quote in its entirety here:

The nerve of Mr. Bennett's argument is that if A results from your not doing B, then A results from whatever you do instead of doing B. While there may be much to be said for this view, still it does not seem right on the face of it. (Anscombe, 1966)

Aside from the profound problem of commending vicious acts, Anscombe also believed that consequentialism failed to capture, indeed, must fail to capture, crucial elements of moral psychology. The theory cannot account for backward looking justifications, or reasons, for performing certain actions. Teichmann notes, in his work on Anscombe, that, though it seems superficially intuitive that reasons are understood in causal terms, this does not, in Anscombe's opinion, withstand scrutiny. In response to “Why did you kill him?” (using Anscombe's own example), Teichmann holds that though one intuitive reason might be “In order to get revenge”, it is also the case, in Anscombe's view, “…the sense of ‘In order to get revenge’ in fact presupposes the force of such reasons as ‘Because he killed my brother’, and not vice versa” (Teichmann, 124).

The absolutist stance informed a good deal of her other work in moral philosophy. In her famous pamphlet Mr. Truman's Degree (1958), Anscombe protested Oxford's decision to award Harry Truman an honorary doctorate. Her view was that Truman murdered large numbers of innocent persons, civilians, with nuclear weapons in order to get Japan to surrender. On her view, the end does not justify the means. It is not permissible to kill innocents for the sake of some greater good to be realized as a consequence of such action. Some, though it is worth pointing out not all, consequentialists will disagree that such cases are just out of the question (and many straightforward consequentialists could well agree that Truman was not an example of someone using means/end reasoning in a justifiable way). Anscombe's discussion, though, informed later discussions of absolute prohibitions in wartime such as Thomas Nagel's discussion of the attractive features of the absolutist position in “War and Massacre” (1972).

5.2 Double Effect

Anscombe also defended a version of the doctrine of double effect, and her commitment to this Doctrine provided a principle she used to try to show what was corrupt about Truman's action. The basic idea is that there is a morally relevant distinction between intended versus merely foreseen outcomes. To intend harm is worse than to merely foresee harm as a result of one's action. This can sometimes be combined with a kind of absolutism to hold that intended harms are forbidden whereas the merely foreseen may not be. It is frequently used to try to underwrite a moral distinction between a strategic bomber and a terror bomber. What a strategic bomber does in dropping a bomb may be permissible because he does not intend to kill innocent civilians even though he foresees that they will die as a result of the bombing. A terror bomber, on the other hand, does intend to kill innocent civilians as a way to achieve his aims.

Anscombe's own position varied somewhat over the course of her career.

In “War and Murder,” published in 1961, Anscombe notes that the moral permissibility of coercive authority requires a principle that can be used to differentiate the just imposition of harms from the unjust. The Doctrine of Double Effect is one such principle. At the root of the principle is the distinction between intended and foreseen consequences of an action. While there is some debate on the correct specification of the Doctrine, the basic idea is that it is worse to intend harm than to merely foresee it. In Anscombe's opinion, some actions are absolutely forbidden because they involve intentions to harm whereas if the harm in question was merely foreseen the action would not be forbidden.

But she was also concerned that the Doctrine of Double Effect was often abused. For example, one constraint on the Doctrine holds that one cannot intend the means to the desired end. So, a doctor may administer a drug to alleviate pain though knowing that another effect of the drug will be the death of the patient. This is permitted. One way to understand how this works is by employing a counterfactual test—if the doctor could alleviate the pain of the patient without administering such strong medication she would. What is not permitted by Double Effect is using the bad effect as a means to achieving one's goal.

Some have held the view that one can direct one's intentions a certain way to achieve the desired result with moral impunity. If, for example, one tells oneself that one is only intending x by doing y, then one is off the hook even if y is immoral—and this strikes Anscombe as quite absurd. Her example is that of a servant who holds the ladder for his master who is a thief and justifies it by telling himself that his intention is simply to avoid getting fired. Holding the ladder is his means of avoiding the loss of his job. It is still immoral. Because of the means/end constraint on Double Effect, holding the ladder is not justified. And this misunderstanding of Double Effect was at the basis of Anscombe's problem with wartime bombing and the flagrant misuse of Double Effect to justify it.

The devout Catholic bomber secures by a “direction of intention” that any shedding of innocent blood that occurs is “accidental.” I know a Catholic boy who was puzzled at being told by his schoolmaster that it was an accident that the people of Hiroshima and Nagasaki were there to be killed; in fact, however absurd it seems, such thoughts are common among priests who know that they are forbidden by the divine law to justify the direct killing of the innocent. (WM, 59)

Again, in order to employ DDE one needs the distinction between intended and merely foreseen consequences of the ‘act itself.’ On Anscombe's view some actions are in and of themselves immoral, regardless of the consequences one intends to bring about in the performance of the action, and certainly regardless of what one foresees as a result of the action. But many consequentialists don't recognize a morally relevant distinction between intention and foresight. Jonathan Bennett, for example, was highly critical of this distinction.

There's no doubt that it can be extremely difficult to parse double effect. It is often presented in the following way. There is an action that the agent performs which has two effects, one good, one bad. The action may still be permissible given that the intended effect that is desired by the agent is good, and given that the bad effect is merely foreseen, and not intended. It appears that the agent voluntarily chooses both effects, but is only fully accountable for one. And this strikes some as odd, since it just seems obvious that foreseen consequences have to be weighed—it would be irresponsible not to weigh them. So surely they count too?

But Joseph Boyle makes a maneuver that might help Anscombe here. He argues that the unintended effect is not voluntarily chosen (in the morally relevant sense of ‘chosen’ for which we hold people responsible) even though the agent knows that it will occur as a result of his actions. The reason for Boyle is that the foreseen consequences—though definitely factored into deliberation—are not factored in the right way to count as voluntarily chosen. The foreseen effects are not reasons for action; rather, as Boyle notes, “…they are sometimes conditions in spite of which one acts” (1980, 535). We can consider another of Anscombe's famous cases to illustrate this. Anscombe publicly protested Oxford University's awarding to an honorary degree to Harry Truman. Truman, on her view, was a mass murderer. As we noted earlier, she was disgusted by the attempts of some individuals to excuse Truman by using double effect. Truman, she argued, dropped the bomb on those cities, not in spite of the civilian population, but at least in part because of that population. He could have chosen an isolated location for a demonstration. There was evidence that the Japanese did want to negotiate. On Anscombe's view Truman was using the innocent civilians of Hiroshima and Nagasaki to achieve his ends. She believed that their presence entered into his deliberation as a positive factor, not as a detracting factor. This, then, would be a case of terror bombing, and of outright murder.

While it is true that there is a big difference between terror bombing and strategic bombing, some question, however, that DDE accounts for that difference. One might argue that to the extent Truman desired the evil outcome of the deaths of innocent civilians what he did was murder. This does not rely on acceptance of DDE to account for a difference. Jonathan Bennett points out that it can be really difficult to parse a meaningful difference using DDE. For example, the counterfactual test so many proponents of DDE use doesn't work to distinguish the terror from the strategic cases. As Bennett notes, “The tactical bomber's wish for the civilian deaths is a reluctant one: if he could, he would destroy the factory without killing civilians. But the terror bomber too, if he could, would drop his bombs in such a way as to lower enemy morale without killing civilians” (Bennett 1995, 222). If Truman wanted to kill civilians, what he did was wrong, but not because of a violation of DDE. It was wrong because he intentionally and knowingly caused immense suffering that could have been avoided through an alternative course of action. Of course, one could still argue that DDE is a very useful heuristic—it tracks justification even if it doesn't itself underwrite that justification. However, even this picture of DDE has been attacked by researchers studying our reactions to moral dilemma cases, who hold that we do not consciously employ anything like DDE in making moral decisions (Greene, et al., 2009).

6. Conclusion

G. E. M. Anscombe's work ranged over many years and many different areas in philosophy. The breadth of her work is impressive. She was systematic in her thinking, seeing and developing connections between metaphysics, moral psychology, and ethics that exhibited not simply a grasp of one particular problem, but a world view. Her legacy is one of the broadest and deepest left by a 20th century philosopher.

Bibliography

Primary Literature

When abbreviations are used to cite Anscombe's works in the text, the abbreviation begins the bibliographic item below.

Anscombe's principal essays are collected in the following four volumes.

[FPW] From Parmenides to Wittgenstein (The Collected Philosophical Papers of G. E. M. Anscombe, Volume 1), Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1981.
[MPM] Metaphysics and the Philosophy of Mind (The Collected Philosophical Papers of G. E. M. Anscombe, Volume 2), Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1981.
[ERP] Ethics, Religion and Politics (The Collected Philosophical Papers of G. E. M. Anscombe, Volume 3), Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1981.
[HAE] Human Life, Action, and Ethics (St. Andrews Studies in Philosophy and Public Affairs, Volume IV), M. Geach and L. Gormally (eds.), Exeter: Imprint Academic, 2005.

Her monographs include the following:

  • An Introduction to Wittgenstein's Tractatus, London: Hutchinson, 1959.
  • Intention, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1957; 2nd edition, 1963.
  • Three Philosophers: Aristotle, Aquinas, Frege, with Peter Geach, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 2002.

Individual essays by Anscombe cited in the text:

[CAC] “Contraception and Chastity,” The Human World, 9 (1972): 41–51. This essay has been reprinted numerous places. The page references cited in this text are from the version reprinted in Why Humanae Vitae was Right, Janet E. Smith (ed.), Ignatius Press, 1993, 121–146.
[WAM] “War and Murder,” in Nuclear Weapons: a Catholic Response, Walter Stein (ed.), London: Merlin, 1961, 43–62.
[MMP] “Modern Moral Philosophy,” Philosophy, 33 (1958): 1–19; reprinted in [ERP], 26–42.
[NOB] “A Note on Mr. Bennett,” Analysis, 26 (6) (1966): 208.
[CAD] Causality and Determination: An Inaugural Lecture, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1971; reprinted in [MPM], 133–47.
[MAL] “The First Person,” in Mind and Language: Wolfson College Lectures 1974, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975, 45–64; reprinted in [MPM], 21–36.

Translations by Anscombe

Major translations by Anscombe include the following:

  • Descartes, René, Philosophical Writings, translated by G. E. M. Anscombe and Peter Geach, London: Thomas Nelson and Sons, 1954.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig, Philosophical Investigations, translated by G. E. M. Anscombe, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1953.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig, Notebooks 1914–1916, translated by G. E. M. Anscombe, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1961.
  • –––. On Certainty, translated by Denis Paul and G. E. M. Anscombe and edited by G. H. von Wright and G. E. M. Anscombe, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1969.
  • –––. Remarks on the Foundation of Mathematics, translated by G. E. M. Anscombe and edited by G. H. von Wright and R. Rhees, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1956.
  • –––. Zettel, translated by G. E. M. Anscombe, Oxford: Blackwell, 1967.

Secondary Literature

  • Bennett, Jonathan, 1966. “Whatever the Consequences,” Analysis, 26 (2): 83–102.
  • –––, 1995. The Act Itself, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Boyle, Joseph, 1980. “Toward Understanding the Principle of Double Effect,” Ethics, 90: 527–38.
  • Bratman, Michael, 1987. Intention, Plans, and Practical Reason, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Crisp, Roger and Michael Slote, 1996. Introduction to Virtue Ethics, Roger Crisp and Michael Slote (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Crisp, Roger, 2004. “Does Modern Moral Philosophy Rest on a Mistake?,” in Modern Moral Philosophy (Royal Institute of Philosophy, Supplement 54), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 75–94.
  • Davidson, Donald, 1963. “Actions, Reasons, and Causes,” Journal of Philosophy, 60: 685–700.
  • Ford, Anton, Jennifer Hornsby, and Frederick Stoutland,(eds.) 2011. Essays on Anscombe's Intention, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Geach, Peter, 1996. “The Labels,” Analysis, 66: 266–67.
  • Greene, Joshua, Fiery A. Cushman, Lisa E. Stewart, Kelly Lowenberg, Leigh E. Nystrom,and Jonathan D. Cohen, 2009. Cogniton, 111: 364–371.
  • Monk, Ray, 1991. Ludwig Wittgenstein: The Duty of Genius, London: Vintage.
  • Nagel, Thomas, 1979. “War and Massacre,” in Mortal Questions, New York: Cambridge University Press, 53–74.
  • O'Grady, Jane, 2001. “Elizabeth Anscombe,” The Guardian, January 11, 2001.
  • Passmore, John, 1966. A Hundred Years of Philosophy, 2nd edition, New York: Basic Books.
  • Searle, John R., 1985. Expression and Meaning: Studies in the Theory of Speech Acts, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Teichman, Jennie, 2002. “Gertrude Elizabeth Margaret Anscombe: 1919–2001,” in Biographical Memoirs of Fellows I (Proceedings of the British Academy, Volume 115), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 31–50.
  • Teichmann, Roger, 2008. The Philosophy of Elizabeth Anscombe, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Williams, Bernard and Michael Tanner, 1972. “Comment on Contraception and Chastity,” The Human World, 9: 41–51.
  • Wilson, George, 1989. The Intentionality of Human Action, Stanford: Stanford University Press.

Academic Tools

sep man icon How to cite this entry.
sep man icon Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society.
inpho icon Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO).
phil papers icon Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

abortion | action | consequentialism | Davidson, Donald | double effect, doctrine of | ethics: natural law tradition | ethics: virtue | moral psychology: empirical approaches | war | Wittgenstein, Ludwig

Acknowledgments

I would like to thank an editor for the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy for his or her extremely helpful comments on earlier drafts. I would also like to thank Simon Blackburn and Roger Crisp for their very helpful feedback on this essay.

Copyright © 2011 by
Julia Driver <jdriver@artsci.wustl.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free