Notes to Aristotle

1. There are scholarly disputes about the number of works he produced and also about the authenticity of some of the works coming down to us under his name. For a fascinating account of the history of the transmission of Aristotle's works, see Shute (1888).

2. The general entry strives for such neutrality as may be possible. Notes along the way: (i) indicate controversial contentions; (ii) provide links to passages in the other entries where the relevant issues are taken up in greater detail; and (iii) cite relevant scholarship for further study.

3. Many of the details of Aristotle's life provided are speculative. Unfortunately, biographers need to rely on insecure, mainly late sources, with the result that sometimes thinly attested conclusions gain credence only by dint of repetition. For a brief overview of the historiography of Aristotle, see Grote (1880), who also provides an interesting glimpse into Aristotle's life as viewed from the vantage point of the late nineteenth century. For a brief and judicious late twentieth century perspective, see Pellegrin (1996). As regards Aristotle's character, two radically opposing traditions extend all the way back to antiquity. The first paints him as snide and arrogant, an ingrate who never appreciated the education gifted him by Plato; the second portrays him as an exuberant researcher, passionately devoted to his friends and fellow seekers, tirelessly interested in expanding the frontiers of human knowledge. Neither portrait is likely to be wholly correct, and in fact we have little basis for adjudicating between them. It is, however, noteworthy that these traditions intersect at one point: each in its own way regards Aristotle as formidable. For a brief recapitulation and assessment of this situation, see Shields (2007, 15-17).

4. To cite just four examples, which might easily be multiplied: (i) The Categories, as it is called now, but was not so-called in antiquity, contains three distinct components, not at all continuous and only dubiously connected with one another (for more detail, see the entry on Aristotle's Categories); (ii) the Metaphysics—again, not Aristotle's own title—comprises fourteen books, the last three of which many scholars believe to have been written at a stage earlier in Aristotle's development than those which precede them in our modern editions (for a succinct review of this issue, see Ross (1924, vol. i, xiii-xxxii); (iii) the Politics presents problems of internal continuity and consistency, as well as questions concerning the relative composition dates of its books (succinctly recounted in this Supplement to the entry on Aristotle's Political Theory); and (iv) the Nicomachean Ethics appears to many—though the matter is disputed—internally inconsistent on doctrinal grounds. This circumstance has induced Barnes (1997, 58-59), for instance, to conclude that the Nicomachean Ethics (EN) definitely is not a unified treatise: ‘EN is an absurdity, surely put together by a desperate scribe or an unscrupulous bookseller and not united by an author or an editor.’ He further contends that ‘our EN is not a unity is beyond controversy–the existence of two treatments of pleasure is enough to prove the fact. The only questions concern who invented our text, and when, and from what materials, and for what motives.’ For a brief overview of the status of Aristotle's ethical writings, see the entry on Aristotle's Ethics. In general, however, these scholarly controversies do not impair our ability to engage the lively philosophy in Aristotle's works; moreover, many of them are overblown.

5. Bakker (2007) provides a lively recapitulation of this controversy.

6. Owen (1961) provides a very good entry point into the literature on this topic. See also Irwin (1988, §§13, 16) and Cleary (1994) .

7. A lively introduction to the controversies surrounding the doctrine of nous in APo. ii 19 can be found in Barnes (1994) ad loc. For a more in-depth discussion, favouring a traditional interpretation given in terms of intellectual intuition, see Biondi (2004).

8. On the dominant modal approach to essentialism see the first section of the entry on essential vs. accidental properties.

9. Recent decades have seen renewed study of Aristotle's biology, in both its more empirical and more philosophical dimensions. For a comprehensive introduction to the results and controversies of this study, see the entry on Aristotle's Biology.

10. The term ‘focal meaning’ owes to Owen (1960), who was criticized by Irwin (1981), on the on the grounds that Aristotle's theory is not, or is not primarily, concerned with meanings. Irwin regarded ‘focal connexion’ as a more neutral term. Shields (1999) prefers ‘core-dependent homonymy’ in part because it reflects the asymmetry crucial to Aristotle's most striking uses of homonymy. See also Ward (2008).

11. For a brief introduction to the core-dependent homonymy of being, see the entry on Aristotle's Metaphysics. Shields (1999) surveys the scholarship on this topic in greater depth. For a critical alternative, see Lewis (2004); and for further developments, see Ward (2008), who rightly places a special emphasis on the relation between the core-dependent homonymy of being and Aristotle's conception of epistêmê.

12. For a philosophically rich exploration of this possibility, see Loux (1973).

13. For a brief introduction to this topic, see Aristotle: Metaphysics. For a review of the literature pertaining to the role of substance in the science of being qua being, see Shields (1999, 225-229) and Ward (2008). For a sustained defense of one kind of traditional interpretation, see Duarte (2007). Two seminal treatments include Patzig (1979) and Owens (1978).

14. Owens (1978, 137-154) devotes almost an entire chapter to the question of the correct rendering of ousia into English, concluding that ‘entity’ is to be preferred to ‘substance’. Although he adduces perfectly good and learned reasons for this conclusion, his recommendation has not gained traction in the scholarly community, which continues to prefer ‘substance’. There is no harm in this, provided that we bear in mind that ‘substance’ is a technical term for Aristotle, the meaning of which must be gleaned from its theoretical characterizations.

15. For a clear overview of the basic kinds of criticisms to which Aristotle's tenfold division of being has been subjected, see Section 2 of the entry on Aristotle's Categories.

16. For issues pertaining to Aristotle's treatment of time, see Bostock (2006) and Coope (2005).

17. The ontological status of mathematical objects in Aristotle introduces complexities now being ignored. For an introduction to some of these complexities, see Section 6 of the entry on Aristotle's Mathematics.

18. See, e.g., Hocutt (1975) and especially Annas (1982). Moravcsik (1974) prefers the more neutral term ‘generative factor’.

19. Not all scholars have regarded Aristotle's efficient cause as obviously continuous with a recognizably modern notion of causation, and so not all regard it as an uncontroversial instance of causation. So, for instance, Frede (1980, 218) raises doubts on this score. For a more conventional view of the efficient cause, see Ross (1923, 75).

20. Johnson (2005, 15-39) offers an instructive survey of some of Aristotle's most vocal detractors in this area.

21. Irwin (1988, 522 n. 18) crisply summarizes some of the main interpretations of Aristotle's argument for teleology in Phys. ii 8 198b36-199a5.

22. There has been a lively discussion of Aristotelian teleology in recent decades. For a first entrance into the relevant issues, see Section 4 of the entry on Aristotle on Causality. For more advanced study, see Sauvé Meyer (1992), Gotthelf (1997), Furley (1999), Charles (2001), and Johnson (2005).

23. For a brief introduction to some of the relevant issues, together with a bibliography for further reading, see Section 10 of the entry on Aristotle' Metaphysics. For an opposing view, see the following Supplement (“A Question about the Metaphyiscs of Soul”) to the entry on Aristotle's Psychology. For more detailed discussion, Gill (2005) provides an excellent overview of recent developments in Aristotle's metaphysics generally, with a special emphasis on questions pertaining to substance.

24. For the meaning of Aristotle's term eudaimonia, see Section 2 of the entry on Aristotle's Ethics. Kraut (1979) offers an illuminating discussion of subjective and objective approaches to happiness.

25. For a judicious overview of this question, see Halliwell (1986).

26. Halliwell (1986), Appendix 5 presents a succinct overview of the various scholarly approaches to Aristotle's notion of catharsis.

27. Halliwell (1986, 109-137) provides an excellent introduction to some of the scholarly and philosophical issues pertaining to Aristotle's concept of mimêsis.

Copyright © 2008 by
Christopher Shields <Christopher.Shields@lmh.ox.ac.uk>

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