Assertion

First published Mon Jan 22, 2007

An assertion is a speech act in which something is claimed to hold, e.g. that there are infinitely many prime numbers, or, with respect to some time t, that there is a traffic congestion on Brooklyn Bridge at t, or, of some person x with respect to some time t, that x has a tooth ache at t. The concept of assertion has often occupied a central place in the philosophy of language, since it is often thought that making assertions is the use of language most crucial to linguistic meaning, and since assertions are the natural expressions of cognitive attitudes, and hence of importance for theories of knowledge and belief.

The nature of assertion and its relation to other categories and phenomena have been subject to much controversy. Various accounts of assertion are presented in the sections below. For instance, the knowledge account is presented in section 6. (There is no section dedicated to assertion accounts generally.) The accounts presented include Stalnaker's rules of assertion (section 2.1, supplement on pragmatics); principles directly relating truth and assertion (section 5.2); norms of truth—accounts centering on the aim of truth (section 5.4); the principle of correctness (section 5.5); norms of belief or sincerity (section 6); norms of knowledge (section 6.2); Gricean or Neo-Gricean accounts (section 7); Searle's account (section 7); and assertibility of conditionals (section 8).

The article is also organized into a main part for the basic material and supplementary parts for more specialized or advanced material. The main part constitutes a self-contained presentation and is sufficient for readers with a general interest in assertion. There are links to supplementary material at the ends of sections and subsections.


1. Speech acts

As indicated with the initial examples, in an assertion it is asserted that so-and-so. Grammatically, the verb ‘assert’ takes that-clause complements, i.e. expressions of the form that s, where s is replaced by a declarative sentence. Something that can be asserted can also be believed, known, doubted, hoped, and vice versa. I can doubt that Mars will be colonized, and I can also assert that Mars will be colonized. In other words, what we assert are propositions.[1] The so-called propositional attitudes, like believing, knowing and hoping, are said to relate a thinker to a proposition, or at least to be instantiated by mental states that have propositional content. Similarly, assertion is a propositional act in that it relates the speaker to a proposition, or is an act with propositional content.

On the other hand, an assertion is made by means of an utterance. I utter the sentence

(1) The cat is on the mat

and by means of the utterance of that sentence, I have (for some time, cat and mat) asserted that the cat is on the mat.[2] Typically, we make an assertion by means of uttering a declarative sentence, but not any utterance of a declarative sentence is an assertion. For instance, I can well utter ‘The curfew tolls the knell of parting day’ merely for the sake of its poetic quality.

Something is added to an utterance that makes it into a means for asserting something. Gottlob Frege (1918, 22) characterized the assertoric quality of an utterance as an assertoric force (‘Behauptende Kraft’) of the utterance. That is, the speaker makes an utterance in an assertoric (or assertive) mode or with an assertoric force, and that is the difference between just uttering and also asserting. This idea was later taken over by J. L. Austin (1975, 99–100), the founding father of the general theory of speech acts. Austin distinguished between several levels of speech act, including these: the locutionary act, the illocutionary act and the perlocutionary act. The locutionary act is the act of ‘“saying something” in the full normal sense’ (1975, 94), which is the utterance of certain words with certain meanings in a certain grammatical construction, such as uttering ‘I like ice’ as a sentence of English.

The notion of an illocutionary act was introduced by Austin by means of examples (1975, 98–102), and that is the normal procedure. Illocutionary acts are such acts as asserting, asking a question, warning, threatening, announcing a verdict or intention, making an appointment, giving an order, expressing a wish, making a request. An utterance of a sentence, i.e. a locutionary act, by means of which a question is asked is thus an utterance with interrogative force, and when an assertion is made the utterance has assertoric force. Each type of illocutionary act is a type of act with the corresponding illocutionary force.

The perlocutionary act is made by means of an illocutionary act, and depends entirely on the hearer's reaction. For instance, by means of arguing the speaker may convince the hearer, and by means of warning the speaker may frighten the hearer. In these examples, convincing and frightening are perlocutionary acts.

The illocutionary act does not depend on the hearer's reaction to what has been said. Still, according to Austin (1975, 116–17), it does depend on the hearer's being aware of the utterance and understanding it in a certain way. For instance, I haven't warned someone unless he heard and understood what I said. In this sense the performance of an illocutionary act depends on the ‘securing of uptake’ (1975, 117). However, although Austin's view is intuitively plausible for speech acts verbs with speaker-hearer argument structure (like x congratulates y) or speaker-hearer-content argument structure (x requests of y that p), it is not obviously as plausible when the structure is speaker-content (x declares that p). ‘Assert’ is of the latter kind, as opposed to e.g. ‘tell’. It may be said that I failed to tell him that the station was closed, since he had already left the room when I said so, but that I still asserted that it was closed, since I believed he was still there. As we shall see, several theories of assertion focus on hearer-directed beliefs and intentions of the speaker, without requiring that those beliefs are true or the intentions fulfilled.

Part of the tasks of general theory of speech acts is to provide a systematic taxonomy of speech acts. Austin had earlier (1956) initiated the development of speech act taxonomy by means of the distinction between constative and performative utterances. The purpose then was more polemical than systematic, since Austin thought that the philosophy of language at the time had neglected to note other uses of language than the assertoric. Roughly, whereas in a constative utterance you report an already obtaining state of affairs—you say something—in a performative utterance you create something new: you do something (Austin 1956, 235). Paradigm examples of performatives were utterances by means of which actions such as baptizing, congratulating and greeting are performed. Assertion, by contrast, is the paradigm of a constative utterance.

However, when developing his general theory of speech acts, Austin abandoned the constative/performative distinction, the reason being that it is not so clear in what sense something is done e.g. by means of an optative utterance, expressing a wish, whereas nothing is done by means of an assertoric one. Austin noted e.g. that assertions are subject to infelicities, just like performatives (Austin 1975, 13–66). For instance, an assertion is insincere in case of lying as a promise is insincere when the appropriate intention is lacking (Austin 1975, 40). This is an infelicity of the abuse kind. Also, an assertion is, according to Austin, void in case of referential presupposition, such as in Russell's

(2) The present King of France is bald

(Austin 1975, 20). This is then an infelicity of the same kind—flaw-type misexecutions—as the use of the wrong formula in a legal procedure (Austin 1975, 36), or of the same kind—misinvocations—as when the requirements of a naming procedure aren't met (Austin 1975, 51), or when I try to sell you something that isn't mine (Austin 1975, 137).

Further, Austin noted that when it comes to appraisals, there is not a sharp difference between acts that are simply true and false, and acts that are assessed in other respects (Austin 1975, 140–47). On the one hand, a warning can be objectively proper or improper, depending on the facts. On the other hand, assertions (statements) can be assessed as suitable in some contexts and not in others, and are not simply true or false. An example is

(3) France is hexagonal[3]

As an alternative to the performative–constative dichotomy, Austin suggested five classes of illocutionary types (or illocutionary verbs): verdictives, exercitives, commissives, behabitives and expositives (Austin 1975, 151–64). You exemplify a verdictive e.g. when as a judge you pronounce a verdict; an exercitive by appointing, voting or advising; a commissive by promising, undertaking or declaring that you will do something; a behabitive by apologizing, criticizing, cursing or congratulating; an expositive by acts appropriately prefixed by phrases like ‘I reply’, ‘I argue’, ‘I concede’ etc., of a general expository nature.

In this classification, assertion would best be placed under expositives, since the prefix ‘I assert’ is or may be of an expository nature. However, an assertion need not in itself be expository. As a classification of illocutionary types Austin's taxonomy is thus not completely adequate.

Other taxonomies have been proposed, e.g. by Stephen Schiffer (1972), John Searle (1975b), Kent Bach and Robert M. Harnich (1979), and François Recanati (1987). One leading idea, for instance in Searle's taxonomy, is to distinguish between speech acts according to direction of fit. An assertion has word-world direction of fit, since an assertion is correct if what is said agrees with what the world is like. By contrast, a command has a world-word direction of fit, since a command is satisfied if the addressee of the command subsequently performs what is ordered.

For some further points on taxonomy and the special status of assertion, see the supplementary text on speech acts.

2. Pragmatics

Assertion is generally thought of being open, explicit and direct, as opposed e.g. to conveying something indirectly, without explicitly saying it. In this respect assertion is contrasted with presupposition and implicature. The contrast is, however, not altogether sharp, partly because of the idea of indirect speech acts, including indirect assertions.

2.1 Presupposition

A sentence such as

(4) Kepler died in misery

is not true unless the singular term ‘Kepler’ has reference. Still, Frege argued that a speaker asserting that Kepler died in misery, by means of (4) does not also assert that ‘Kepler’ has reference (1892, 574). That ‘Kepler’ has reference is not part of the sense of the sentence. Frege's reason was that if it had been, the sense of its negation,

(5) Kepler did not die in misery

would have been that Kepler did not die in misery or ‘Kepler’ does not have reference, which is absurd. According to Frege, that ‘Kepler’ has reference is rather presupposed, both in an assertion of (4) and in an assertion of its negation.

The modern treatment of presupposition has followed Frege in treating survival under negation as the most important test for presupposition. That is, if it is implied that p, both in an assertion of a sentence s and in an assertion of the negation of s, then it is presupposed that p in those assertions. Other typical examples of presupposition (cf. Levinson 1983, 178–81) include

(6) John managed [didn't manage] to stop in time

implying that John tried to stop in time, and

(7) Martha regrets [doesn't regret] drinking John's home brew

implying that Martha drank John's home brew.

In the case of (4), the presupposition is clearly of a semantic nature, since the sentence ‘Someone is identical with Kepler’, which is true just if ‘Kepler’ has reference, is a logical consequence both of (4) and of (5). By contrast, in the negated forms of (6) and (7) the presupposition can be canceled by context, e.g. as in

(8) John didn't manage to stop in time. He didn't even try.

This indicates that in this case the presupposition is a pragmatic phenomenon. It is the speaker or speech act rather than the sentence or the proposition expressed that presupposes something. The presupposing should still be kept distinct from asserting. One further reason is that the presupposition occurs in other illocutionary types as well. For instance, in asking

(9) Did John [didn't John] manage to stop in time?

the speaker normally assumes that John tried and is only asking about the success.

For further connections between assertion and presupposition, see the supplementary text on pragmatics.

2.2 Implicature

Frege noted (1879, 20) that there is no difference in truth evaluable content, between sentences such as

(10)   a. John works with real estate and likes fishing
b. John works with real estate but likes fishing

‘And’ and ‘but’ contribute the same way to truth and falsity. However, when using (10a), but not when using (10b) the speaker indicates that there is a contrast of some kind between working with real estate and liking fishing. The speaker is not asserting that there is a contrast. For instance, forming a conditional with (10b) in the antecedent preserves the contrast rather than make it hypothetical:

(11) If John works with real estate but likes fishing, I think we can bring him along

In an utterance of a conditional like (11) the content of the antecedent is not asserted. The speaker may sincerely assert the conditional while denying or being agnostic about the antecedent. Since the contrast indicated by ‘but’ survives in the antecedent context, it is natural to say that the contrast is not part of the asserted content in (10b) either, and therefore not part of what ceases to be asserted.

It is usually said that the speaker in cases like (10b) and (11), implies that there is a contrast. These are then examples of implicature. H. Paul Grice (1975, 1989) developed a general theory of implicature. Grice called implicatures of the kind exemplified conventional, since it is a standing feature of the word ‘but’ to give rise to them. Most of Grice's theory is concerned with the complementing kind, the conversational implicatures. These rely on general conversational maxims, not on features of expressions. These maxims are thought to be in force in ordinary conversation. For instance, the maxim Be orderly! requires of the speaker to recount events in the order they took place. This is meant to account for the intuitive difference in content between

(12)   a. John took off his shoes and sat down
b. John sat down and took off his shoes

According to Grice's account, the speaker doesn't assert, only implicates that the events took place in the order recounted. What is asserted is just that both events did take place.

Real or apparent violations of the maxims generate implicatures, on the assumption that the participants obey the over-arching Co-operative Principle. For instance, in the following conversation

(13)   A: Where does John spend the summer?
B: Somewhere in Canada.

B implies that he doesn't know where in Canada John spends the summer. The reasoning is as follows. B violates the Quantity principle to be as informative as required. Since B is assumed to be co-operative, one can infer that he cannot satisfy the Quantity principle without violating the Quality principle not to say anything for which one lacks sufficient evidence. Hence, one can infer that he doesn't know. Again, B has not asserted that he doesn't know, but still managed to convey it in an indirect manner.

2.3 Indirect speech acts

This clear distinction between assertion and implicature is to some extent undermined by acknowledging indirect assertion as a kind of assertion proper. A standard example of an indirect speech act is given by

(14) Can you pass the salt?

By means of uttering an interrogative sentence the speaker requests the addressee to pass the salt. The request is indirect. The question, concerning the addressee's ability, is direct. As defined by Searle (1975a, 59–60), and also Bach and Harnich (1979, 70), an indirect illocutionary act is subordinate to another, more primary act and depends on the success of the first. An alternative definition given by Sadock (1974, 73) is that an act is indirect just if it has a different illocutionary force from the one standardly correlated with the sentence-type used.

Examples of indirect assertions by means of questions and commands or requests are given by

(15) May I tell you that, obviously, the square root of a quarter is a half.
(16) Let me tell you that, obviously, the square root of a quarter is a half.

(Levinson 1983, 266). Rhetorical questions also have the force of assertions:

(17) Is not Switzerland a peace-loving nation?

Another candidate type is irony:

(18) Switzerland is known for its aggressive foreign policy.

assuming the speaker does mean the negation of what is literally said. However, although in a sense the act is indirect, since the speaker asserts something different from what she would do on a normal direct use of the sentence, and relies on the hearer to realize this, it is not an indirect assertion by either definition. It isn't on the first, since the primary act (the literal assertion) isn't even made, and it isn't on the second, since there is no discrepancy between force and sentence type.

Irony does, however, qualify as indirect assertion on the definition given by Recanati (1987, 125). According to Recanati, an indirect speech act is a special kind of conversational implicature, where the speaker not only implicates some proposition p, but also that she intends to convey that p. In the case of (18), there is an apparent flagrant violation of the Quality principle to say only what is true. On the assumption that the speaker is co-operative, together with background knowledge of her political awareness, the hearer can infer that she does not mean what she literally says, but rather the opposite, i.e. that what she wants to communicate is the negation of what she says. For Recanati, the communicative intention is what brings this act under the category of assertion proper (see section 7).

Although Searle's definition of indirect speech acts is different, Searle too thinks that they work by means of an inferential mechanism, including that of conventional implicature. The hearer is supposed to understand that the speaker cannot merely be performing the primary act, since that would violate conversational principles, and then again conclude by conversational reasoning what other act has been performed.

So, if indirect assertions are assertions proper as well as conversational implicatures, the idea that assertions in general are explicit and direct has to be given up. An alternative is to simply deny that indirect assertions are assertion proper, and to distinguish between implicatures according to whether they are assertoric, imperative, or interrogative, or perhaps quasi-assertoric, quasi-imperative etc.

The very idea of indirect speech acts is, however, controversial. It is not universally agreed that an ordinary utterance of (14) is indirect, since it has been denied e.g. by Levinson (1983, 273–76) that a question has really been asked, over and above the request. Similarly, Levinson have questioned the idea of a standard correlation between force and sentence type, by which a request would count as indirect on Sadock's criterion. This brings us to the topic of conventionality.

3. Convention

Austin held that illocutionary acts as opposed to perlocutionary acts are conventional, in the sense that they can be made explicit by the so-called performative formula (Austin 1975, 103). According to Austin one can say ‘I argue that’ or ‘I warn you that’ but not ‘I convince you that’ or ‘I alarm you that’. Presumably, the idea was that a speech act type is conventional just if there exists a convention by which an utterance of a sentence of a certain kind ensures (if uptake is secured) that a speech act of that type is performed. Austin probably thought that in virtue of the performative formulas this condition is met by illocutionary but not by perlocutionary act types.

The more general claim that illocutionary force is correlated by convention with sentence type has been advocated by Michael Dummett (1981, 302, 311). On this view, it is a convention that declarative sentences are used for assertion, interrogative for questions and imperative for commands and requests. Similar views have been put forward by Searle (1969) and Petr Kotatko (1998). According to Searle (1969, 38, 40), illocutionary acts are conventional, and the conventions in question govern the use of so-called force-indicating devices (Searle 1969, 64) specific to each language. Searle does not claim that the standard sentence types are force indicating devices (but speculates that a representation of illocutionary type would be part of the syntactic deep structure).

However, the view that illocutionary acts types are conventional in this sense has met with much opposition. Peter Strawson (1964, 153–54) objected early on that ordinary illocutionary acts can be performed without relying on any convention to identify the force, e.g. when using a declarative sentence like ‘The ice over there is very thin’ for a warning. This kind of criticism, now directed against Dummett, has later been reinforced by Robert J. Stainton (1997), stressing that in appropriate contexts sub-sentential phrases like ‘John's father’ (pointing at a man) or ‘very fast’ (looking at a car) can be used to make assertions, and gives linguistic arguments why not all such uses can be treated as cases of ellipsis, i.e. as cases of leaving out parts of a well-formed sentence that speaker and hearer tacitly aware of. If Strawson and Stainton are right, convention isn't necessary for making assertions.

Moreover, Donald Davidson (Davidson 1979, Davidson 1984b) stressed that no conventional sign could work as a force indicator in this sense, since any conventional sign could be used (and would be used) in insincere utterances, where the corresponding force was missing, including cases of deception, jokes, impersonation and other theatrical performances. Basically the same point is made by Bach and Harnich (1979, 122–27). If Davidson, and Bach and Harnich are right, then conventions are also not sufficient.

For more on the conventionality of illocutionary types, see the supplementary text on convention.

4. Content

We said above that what is asserted is a proposition. Although this sounds fairly uncontroversial (unless you object to use of the term ‘proposition’), it has in fact been challenged in several respects. To see the issue, we must look at the relation between the linguistic meaning of the sentence or other linguistic expression uttered and the content of the assertion.

The most immediate idea is that the meaning of the sentence used is identical with the content of the assertion. This seems natural when considering sentences like

(19) Goldbach's conjecture is true

which, if true, is necessarily true, and true at all times. But when considering a typically indexical sentence like

(20) It is raining

it seems clear that when normally uttered, the speaker is saying something about the weather at a certain time and at a certain (limited) location. Clearly, the meaning of (20) does not contain reference to any particular time or location.

So we must distinguish between sentence meaning and assertion content. It is often assumed that the assertoric content nevertheless systematically depends on the meaning of the sentence. Typically, the meaning of the sentence is described so as to provide a proposition as determined by the context of utterance of the sentence. Within his truth-theoretic program in semantics (cf. Davidson 1984a, Larson and Segal 1995), Davidson proposed the following so-called T-sentence for characterizing the meaning of (20)

(21) ‘It is raining’ is true as uttered by a speaker S at a time t if, and only if, it is raining near S at t.

(1973, 135). By Davidson's T-sentence, the speaker asserts that it is raining near her at the time (provided the following holds: if her utterance is true iff p, then what she asserts is that p). In his different framework David Kaplan (1989) calls the meaning of a context dependent sentence like (20) its character. The character is a function from contexts of utterance to content, and the content of an assertoric utterance in a context is a proposition. The effect is that what a speaker asserts with a sentence s in a context c is the value of the character of s for the argument c.

It seems plausible, then, to revise the original equation of assertoric content with sentence meaning, and instead equate assertoric content with the kaplanian content of the sentence in the context, or again with the davidsonian truth conditions of the utterance in that context. That such an equation holds has been affirmed by e.g. by John McDowell (1980, 120) and by Jason Stanley (2000, 395).

But even this revised equation is problematic. In the pragmatics literature of recent decades it has been pointed out that the content of what is asserted usually (at least) goes beyond the proposition expressed by the sentence in the context. One of the standard examples is due to Geoffrey Nunberg (1979). The sentence

(22) The ham sandwich left without paying

can be used, e.g. when uttered by one waiter to another at a restaurant, to assert that

(23) The guest that had ordered the ham sandwich left the restaurant without paying.

This does not seem to be an indirect speech act or implicature. It is the primary act, but has a content different from anything that would be specified by a meaning theory, truth theoretic or other.

How does one draw the line between linguistic meaning in context and content that is added because of further factors of various sorts? This is currently a topic of much dispute. One view in particular has consequences for the general theory of speech acts. Cappelen and Lepore (2005) have argued that the boundary of semantics must be drawn very narrowly: if we freely follow intuitions about what is said by means of some sentence in different scenarios, we are on a slippery slope and cannot in the end draw any line at all. However, Cappelen and Lepore still claim that the semantic content is asserted, since this is what connects speech act content with sentence meaning. This holds even in cases where the speaker intuitively wants to communicate something different. In the case of (20), the correct semantic description according to Cappelen and Lepore (2005, 61–63) is not (21) but rather

(24) ‘It is raining’ express the proposition that it is raining and is true iff it's raining

(when disregarding the time indexicality). Here, no location is mentioned. The speaker of (20) therefore asserts that it is raining (simpliciter) at t, for some contextually salient time t. However, over and above this, the speaker typically also asserts that it is raining at l at t, for some contextually salient location l and some contextually salient time t. That the speaker performs both assertions by means of the same utterance is part of Cappelen's and Lepore's doctrine of Speech Act Pluralism (2005, 4). According to this doctrine, by means of a single utterance a speaker performs indefinitely many assertions, in fact every assertion that can reasonably be attributed to her on the basis of the utterance.

This doctrine is very controversial. A similar but less radical thesis is advanced by Scott Soames (2002). Soames also wants to combine an austere semantic theory (in this case the thesis that proper names are rigid designators) with intuitions that the contents of assertions are richer than can be accounted for by the semantics.

For more on pragmatic enrichment and discourse content, see the supplementary text on content.

5. Truth

It has often been noted that there is a close relation between the concepts of assertion and truth. Connections between assertion and truth have sometimes been appealed to for defining the concept of assertion, and sometimes for defining the concept of truth. Four different connections with assertion have been especially emphasized: with the use of the truth predicate, with truth as the aim or norm of assertion, with the role of truth in meaning theory, and with truth as related to correctness of assertions.

5.1 The truth predicate

As often noted in discussion of the truth predicate, there is a close connection between using a sentence like

(25) Kafka wrote many letters to Milena

for making an assertion, and saying of it that it is true, e.g. by means of

(26) ‘Kafka wrote many letters to Milena’ is true

or by means of

(27) That's true

with reference to (25), or to an utterance of (25). Strawson (1949; 1950, 205) claimed that using (27) is not to make a new assertion, but to endorse a previous one. Similarly, W. V. Quine (1970, 12) said that to call the sentence ‘snow is white’ true is to call snow white. In Strawson's case in particular, the idea was that this use of ‘true’ for signaling agreement is basic, and the key to understanding the truth predicate. This has been called the reassertion theory of truth (Price 1987, 207).

In Quine's case it is less clear that the endorsement signaling function is basic. Rather, Quine emphasized that the truth predicate is a disquotational device (Quine 1970, 12). That is, applying the truth predicate to the quotation of a sentence, as in (26), has the same effect as removing the quotes. That is, in general an expression occurring within quotes is mentioned, not used, but when the truth predicate is applied to a quoted sentence, what is within quotes is effectively brought from mention to use.

For more on assertion and the truth predicate, see the supplementary text on truth.

5.2 Assertion as truth-claim

The simple connection between truth and assertion that Strawson and Quine pointed to for characterizing truth, can also be used for characterizing assertion. According to Crispin Wright (1992, 23–24), the principle

(TA) Asserting a proposition is claiming that it is true.

is a platitude and its correctness is ‘partly constitutive’ of the concepts of assertion and truth. So, according to Wright, (TA) serves both to partly characterize truth in terms of assertion, and assertion in terms of truth.

It is natural to understand ‘claim that’ as pretty much synonymous with ‘assert that’. So understood, (TA) seems to say that to assert that p is the same as to assert that p is true. However, if they are the same, then it seems that what is asserted must be the same: that is, the proposition that p and the proposition that p is true are one and the same. Such a view belongs in the family of deflationary views about truth, and it was Frege's view (Frege 1892, 203). If it is correct, however, (TA) does not say anything more about assertion than that asserting that p is the same as asserting that p, and that does not really characterize assertion.

It is better, then, to understand ‘claim that’ in some other way. Wright uses one formulation (Wright 1992, 34) that is fairly common:

(PT) To assert is to present as true.

This natural-sounding phrase presumably suggests the idea be that in uttering a sentence one presents a proposition, and in uttering it with assertoric force one present it as having some particular property, that of being true. Analogously, when a speaker utters a sentence with imperative force, she presents a proposition as having the property that the addressee is to make it true. But already when it comes to the interrogative force, it is not clear what property I present the proposition as having. It cannot really be the property that its truth value is desired by the speaker to be known, for that would fail to make a distinction between (28a) and (28b) or (28c):

(28)   a. Is Elsa at home?
b. I would like to know whether Elsa is at home.
c. Inform me whether Elsa is at home!

So it is not so easy to see in general that the illocutionary force corresponds to some property ascribed to the proposition expressed. This makes it less clear what the locution ‘present as’ amounts to. (PT) is then not as illuminating as it might at first seem.

Frege had a more specific idea about judgment: to judge is to advance from sense (Sinn) to reference (Bedeutung) (Frege 1892). According to Frege, judging cannot be the same as ascribing to a proposition (a Thought, in Frege's sense) the property of being true, since moving from the proposition that p to the proposition that p is true is just moving from a proposition to a proposition: adding judgmental force must be something else (Frege 1892, 203; this can be construed as a regress argument). In Frege's view, the truth value of a (sentence expressing a) proposition is its referent. In a judgment the thinker acknowledges the truth of the proposition considered, and thereby advances from the proposition to the acknowledgment that the referent is the truth value The True. So Frege's idea is that in judging the thinker in a distinct way relates a proposition to a particular object, The True. On this point Frege has not been followed by many.

Since judging that p or asserting that p clearly is different from just thinking the thought that p is true, we must characterize the relation between assertion, or judgment, and truth in other terms than ascribing truth as a property, just as Frege observed. But it is difficult do to this in clear and convincing way. One might therefore suspect that the relation between truth and assertion simply derives from the equivalence schema

(ES) It is true that p iff p

(according to Wright, this is entailed by (TA)): asserting that p is by (ES) equivalent to asserting that p is true. But that equivalence derives from the equivalence of the contents, and need not say much about assertion as such.

A more complex version of this connection between truth and assertion is suggested by Michael Dummett (1959, 8). According to this suggestion, the truth of an assertion is like the winning of a game: this is not just a classification of an outcome, but something the speaker or the player aims at. In this sense, an assertion (a statement) is false if one of the state of affairs that the speaker meant to exclude with the assertion obtains. If no such state of affairs obtains, the statement is true. This introduces the theme of truth as an aim, here as means of characterizing truth in terms of assertion.

5.3 Truth as aim: fact-stating

It is a commonly held idea, mainly used for characterizing assertion in terms of truth, that assertion aims at truth. This is stated e.g. both by Bernard Williams (1966) and by Michael Dummett (1981). It can be understood in two rather different ways, the one intended by Williams and the other by Dummett (for some ways of understanding what it could be for belief to aim at truth, see Engel 2004).

On Williams's view, the property of aiming at truth is what characterizes fact-stating discourse, as opposed to e.g. evaluative or directive discourse. It is natural to think of

(29) The moon is about 384,000 km from the Earth

as stating a fact, and of

(30) Bardot is good

as expressing an evaluation, not corresponding to any fact of the matter. On Williams's view, to regard a sincere utterance of

(31) It is wrong to steal

as a moral assertion, is to take a realistic attitude to moral discourse: there are moral facts, making moral statements objectively true or false. This view again comes in two versions. On the first alternative, the existence of moral facts renders the discourse fact-stating, whether the speaker thinks so or not, and the non-existence renders it evaluative, again whether the speaker thinks so or not. On the second alternative, (31) is an assertion if the speaker has a realistic attitude towards moral discourse and otherwise not.

On these views, it is assumed that truth is a substantial property (Williams 1966, 202), not a concept that can be characterized in some deflationary way. As a consequence, the sentence

(32) ‘Bardot is good’ is true

is to be regarded as false, since (30) is objectively neither true nor false; there is no fact of the matter.

For more on assertion and fact-stating, see the supplementary text on truth.

5.4 Truth as aim: norms of speakers' intentions

The other idea of truth as an aim for assertion is that this is what the speaker aims at in making an assertion. The speaker tries to say something true. Statistically, it is no doubt the case that speakers usually believe what they assert to be true, and usually this belief is no doubt part of the reason for making the assertion. However, we cannot go from there to take a speaker's having this aim as necessary for her utterance to be assertoric, for lies are assertions as much as honest utterances. The relation between assertion and the aim of truth has then to be indirect.

There are basically two ways of effecting such an indirect connection. One is to complicate speaker intentions. For instance, instead of aiming to say something true, we could say that

(A1) The speaker of an assertion aims at making the hearer believe that she aims at saying something true.

We might then want to say that if the speaker does not have this primary, hearer oriented intention, she is not really making an assertion, and if she does have it, it is an assertion whether she is honest or not.

The other way is to appeal to the notions of rule, norm or convention. For instance, we might try

(A2) It is a norm for making an assertion that the speaker aims at saying something true.

On this alternative, an utterance is assertoric just in case it is governed by this norm, whatever the speaker in fact aims at in the particular case.

These two ideas have complementary problems. The problem with (A1) is that utterances are made, even if infrequently, that are intuitively assertoric, but where the speaker does not have the required intention. The speaker may be fully aware that she will be taken as a liar, whether she aims at the truth or not, and whether or not she tries to make the addressee believe she does aim at the truth. Being convinced that this hearer oriented aim is unreachable, she will not even have it, but is nonetheless making an assertion (for a testimony of conversations of this kind, see Levi 1958, chapter 8). One may try to overcome this by complicating the speaker intentions even further, but it hard to see that any necessary condition of this kind could be immune to counterexamples.

The problem with (A2) is that it needs a supplementary criterion for when the assertion norm is in force. If we don't know how to tell whether the norm applies to an utterance, we cannot tell whether it was an assertion or not.

Dummett has combined the two strategies. He has suggested the following definition (Dummett 1981, 300):

(MD) A man makes an assertion if he says something in such a manner as deliberately to convey the impression of saying it with the overriding intention of saying something true.

Dummett's proposal is presumably intended to give necessary as well as sufficient conditions. There are problems of sufficiency with this proposal of the kind that will be discussed in section 7. There are also problems of necessity of exactly the same kind as afflicts (A1) above. However, Dummett can overcome these necessity problems by his appeal to convention. That is, it can be a convention that when uttering a declarative sentence, unless there are explicit indications to the contrary (such as a theater setting), the speaker counts as conveying that he has the overriding intention of speaking truly. Then it is no longer required that the speaker tries to convey it, as long as the circumstances make her count as doing so.

This proposal has the problems that afflict convention theories in general (see section 3). But there is a further point. Once the burden of determining assertionhood is shifted to a convention about means and ways of expressing oneself (setting aside the problems with this idea), we need to check whether assertion is adequately characterized in the convention. In Dummett's case, it is not, because of a problem with the very idea of appealing to the aim of truth.

For it is not only in assertions that we normally aim at saying something true. We have that aim also in guesses, presumptions, conjectures and and the like, all normally aimed at saying something true, but all somehow falling short of being assertions. Similarly, if I believe in the truth of, say, Goldbach's conjecture, I will deliberately convey the impression of pronouncing it with the intention of saying something true, but because of my low degree of certitude, I don't want to outright assert it. Assertoric force can be said to differ in kind from interrogative and imperative force, but only in degree or intensity from e.g. conjectural force. Conventions of the aiming kind don't discriminate between assertion and weaker forms of propounding.

We would therefore need a more demanding norm:

(T) Say only what is true!

The idea is again that an utterance is an assertion just if it is governed by this norm. Guesses aren't, for guesses are, in some sense (in need of clarification), allowed to be wrong. A speaker trying to comply with (T) will not only avoid asserting what she believes to be false, but she will also try to make sure that what she says isn't false unbeknownst to her. Because of this she will assert only that for which she has adequate evidence. She can even be blamed for asserting something which was in fact true, if she didn't have good enough reasons for believing it was. This is in accordance with Grice's supermaxim of Quality: Try to make your contribution one that is true (Grice 1989, 27).

From this standpoint of the norm of (T), assertion is characterized by the way assertions are evaluated. There are several ideas of how to assess assertions as correct or incorrect. This theme will be pursued in the present section and the next.

5.5 Truth and correctness

There is a family of questions about the conditions for an assertion to be correct. As has often been noted, an assertion can be correct in different respects. E.g., a speaker can say something true but be impolite in saying it, thereby making an assertion that is incorrect with respect to etiquette. Also, even if we disregard such social aspects on a speech act, an assertion may have e.g. an implicature that is incorrect, even though the primary act is correct.

Let's for now concentrate on the semantic/epistemic correctness of the primary act. For that respect, the principle

(EC) An assertion that p is correct if, and only if, the speaker has good evidence that it is true that p

is almost universally accepted (for problems concerning conditionals, see section 8). In the case of mathematics, for instance, an assertion it thought of as correct if the speaker knows a proof of what is asserted (see Prawitz 1998a, 45, and many other places). There is room for doubt that there is anything like reasonably sharp and stable standards of assertoric correctness in ordinary linguistic practice, and in fact speakers pretty rarely engage in evaluating utterances in these terms, beyond assessing them for truth or falsity, or blaming the speaker for breach of confidence and the like. There is therefore not much evidence from actual practice that the intended notions of correctness play any important role. They can nevertheless belong in the linguistic or philosophical enterprises of reflecting over that practice.

A second preliminary issue concerns the status of the notion of correctness involved. Is it an inherently normative notion, or is it just descriptive? According to e.g. (an earlier view of) Paul Boghossian (1989, 513) the mere fact that we can evaluate assertions as correct or incorrect show that words are governed by norms of use. According to Kathrin Glüer (2001, 60–65; cf. Wikforss 2001, and Boghossian 2003), on the other hand, there is no reason to see in the notions of correctness and incorrectness anything more than a descriptive classification, which may then be coupled with certain a preference for correct assertions over incorrect ones, both in making and in taking. Those preferences may then be explained e.g. by appeal to social psychology, or the desire for knowledge.

Setting these questions aside, we can note that the (EC) biconditional has been used in two different ways: as a way of characterizing assertoric correctness in terms of truth and evidence, or as a way of characterizing truth in terms of correctness and evidence. It is the second alternative that has been most important. We shall return to the first alternative in the next section.

When using (EC) to account for truth it is crucial how ‘good evidence’ is understood. Typically, it is the best possible evidence, i.e. the best evidence that can be had or could be had (as opposed to something that only could have been had but cannot anymore), that is relevant. There is also a question of how to understand ‘has’, as we shall see.

John Dewey (1938) seems to have been the first to characterize truth in terms of assertoric correctness, with his notion of warranted assertibility, even though this idea had a clear affinity with the verifiability principle of Moritz Schlick (1936). Dewey was later followed by, notably, Michael Dummett (1976) and Hilary Putnam (1981). Common to them is the position that there cannot be anything more to truth than being supported by the best available evidence. Dewey, following C. S. Peirce, regarded truth as the ideal limit of scientific inquiry (Dewey 1938, 345), and a proposition warrantedly asserted when known in virtue of such an inquiry. Warranted assertibility is the property of a proposition for which such knowledge potentially exists (1938, 9).

Putnam (1981, 54–56) operated with an idea of assertibility under ideal epistemic conditions. Under normal conditions, a speaker can be justified in making an assertion even though what she asserts is false. The evidence is enough for truth under normal circumstances, but because of abnormal interference the evidence falls short. For instance, improbable changes, say because of a fire, may have taken place after the speaker's observation. However, in ideal epistemic conditions evidence that is sufficient for justifying an assertion also is conclusive. Spelling out what the ideal epistemic conditions are, in a non-circular fashion, has of course been a main problem for this view.

Dummett's views are more complex, but in general focus on actual evidence rather than idealized conditions.

For more on assertion, truth and correctness, see the supplementary text on truth.

6. Belief and knowledge

Two common ideas about assertion are that the speaker says what she believes and that she says what she knows. Given that assertions often are made that don't fit these descriptions, the question is how those ideas can be worked out.

6.1 Belief

According to Frege (1918, 22), an assertion is an outward sign of a judgment (Urteil). The term ‘judgment’ has been used in several ways (cf. section 5.2). If it is used to mean either belief, or act by which a belief is formed or reinforced, then Frege's view is pretty much equivalent with the view that assertion is the expression of belief.

How should one understand the idea of expressing here? It is natural to think of a belief state, i.e. a mental state of the speaker, as causally co-responsible for the making of the assertion. For instance, a speaker has a belief and wants to communicate it. This motivates an assertoric utterance. The having of the belief, i.e. the belief state, together with the desire to communicate, motivate the action, and jointly cause it (if reasons are causes; cf Davidson 1963). The assertion therefore gives evidence that the speaker has a belief suitably related to the meaning of the sentence uttered. On this conception, an assertion is the expression of belief like a running nose is the expression of a virus infection, or groaning is the expression of pain.

However, assertion is intentional and groaning can be. I can intentionally groan to make my pain known to others, and my belief that there are black swans can motivate my intention to assertorically utter

(33) There are black swans

(Cf. Owens 2006.) On the other hand, I can also pretend to be in pain by groaning, and pretend to believe that there are black swans by means of an assertoric utterance of (33). In this case the utterance isn't caused or motivated by the corresponding belief, but since it is an assertion nonetheless, not all assertions are expressions of belief in the sense suggested.

The utterance may still be evidence for the existence the belief state. No doubt, a speaker will not try mislead the addressee about the facts, by means of an assertion, unless she assumes (tacitly, for the most part) that her assertion does count as evidence for the addressee that the she does have the belief in question. This idea, of intending the addressee to take the utterance as evidence for belief of is a key idea in Bach's and Harnich's understanding of what expressing is. They say

(E) For S to express an attitude is for S to R-intend the hearer to take S's utterance as reason to think S has that attitude

(Bach and Harnich 1979, 15; italics in the original.) ‘R-intend’ is short for ‘reflexively intend’, a notion we will return to in the next section. On this view, expressing is wholly a matter of hearer-directed intentions. Cf. section 7.

However, a speaker can clearly make an assertion even if the addressee has a prior conviction that the speaker is dishonest and will not treat the assertion as evidence for belief, and intuitively she can also make an assertion even if she is convinced that that is so. It can happen e.g. in interrogation situations, where the speaker officially insists on an account of what has happened, knowing full well she will be taken as a liar. She will not then intend the interrogators to take her utterance as evidence for belief. Insisting can be a conversational strategy, whether she is lying or not.

Intuitions are surely debatable here, but the possibility of such situations makes it problematic to treat the existence of such hearer-directed intentions as a necessary condition for an utterance to be an assertion.

A more neutral way of trying to capture the relation between assertion and believing was suggested both by Max Black (1952) and by Davidson (1984b, 268): in asserting that p the speaker represents herself as believing that p. This suggestion appears to avoid the difficulties with the appeal to hearer-directed intentions, because representation belongs more to semantics than to personal psychology. However, it is not so clear what representing oneself amounts to. It must be a sense different from that in which one represents the world as having black swans by means of a normal assertoric utterance of (33). The speaker does claim that there are black swans but does not also claim that she believes that there are black swans. It must apparently be some weaker sense of ‘represent’, since it is not just a matter of being, as opposed to not being, fully explicit. By means of answering the question what I believe with an utterance of (33) I do represent myself as believing that there are black swans, equivalently with asserting it. What I assert then is wrong if I don't have the belief, despite the existence of black swans.

On the other hand, it must also be stronger than the sense of ‘represent’ by which an actor can be said to represent himself as believing something on stage. The actor says

(34) I'm in the biology department

thereby representing himself as asserting that he is in the biology department, since he represents himself as being a man who honestly asserts that he is in the biology department. By means of that he in one sense represents himself as believing that he is in the biology department. But the hearer is no way invited to believe that the speaker, i.e. the actor, has that belief.

Apparently, the relevant sense of ‘represent’ is not easy to specify. An alternative is again to go normative, with the rule

(B) Assert only what you believe!

This accords with but is stronger than Grice's first submaxim of Quality: Do not say what you believe to be false (Grice 1989, 27). An immediate objection to this is that (B) is a moral rule rather than a rule that accounts for assertion as such. Speakers may be subject to this rule, but as moral agents more than as speakers. But this objection can be met. It can be agreed that being honest, or sincere, indeed is something required by a moral rule. However, you can be insincere in many different ways. What (B) specifies is what kind of insincerity, and thereby sincerity, is specific to assertion. That is, you can regard the appeal to (B) as equivalent with a statement about what counts as being sincere:

(SB) An act of type X is sincere if, and only if, the speaker believes what she says

Then you can go on to claim that assertion is a value of X, or even the unique value of X, that makes (SB) come out true. This idea is part of Searle's account, as we shall in the next section.

For more on assertion, belief and Moore's paradox, see the supplementary text on belief and assertion.

6.2 Knowledge

The belief rule (B) relates the appropriateness of an assertion to the sincerity of the speaker. However, if we compare this idea with traditional notions of the correctness of assertion, it may seem that sincerity is not enough. According to the traditional ideas, an assertion is correct only if the speaker has good evidence for what she asserts (cf. section 5.5). This fits well with the intuition that the speaker who makes an assertion typically wants to come across not only as sincere, but also as being right, and as having some authority on the particular topic.

This suggests that the belief rule should be replaced by something stronger, a knowledge rule:

(K) Assert only what you know!

In a slightly different format (‘one must: assert p only if one knows p’) this rule has in fact been proposed by Timothy Williamson (2000, 243; cf. Martin-Löf 1998, DeRose 2002, Hawthorne 2004). The idea of a knowledge rule is one among several related ideas of connecting asserting with the speaker's knowledge of what she asserts (for a version concerned with transfer of knowledge to the audience, see Garcia-Carpintero 2004). The general idea has come to be called ‘the knowledge account of assertion’. The idea that assertion is governed by the rule (K) can be strengthened into the claim that assertion is uniquely governed by such a rule. That is, we would have

(KU) Assertion is the unique value of X for which the schema ‘X only what you know!’ gives a valid rule.

The general idea of the knowledge account was suggested, or at least anticipated by G. E. Moore himself (1912) with the claim that the speaker implies that she knows that p (Moore 1966, 63). Many years later, Peter Unger (1975, 253–70), and Michael Slote (1979, 185) made the stronger claim that in asserting that p the speaker represents herself as knowing that p.

One argument for this view comes from conversational patterns. As a response to an assertion you can ask ‘How do you know that?’, or criticize it by means of ‘You don't know that’. Such responses, it is argued, would not be appropriate if the speaker did not automatically represent herself as knowing what she asserts. One problem with this argument is that it is not so clear that in such reactions to an assertion the speaker is really taken to have claimed to know, in some implicit way. For instance, the question ‘How do you know that?’ might simply be a way of inquiring about the grounds for the assertion.

With respect to the question of the correctness of assertions (section 5.5), the position of the knowledge account is that an assertion is incorrect if the speaker doesn't know that the proposition asserted is true.

For more on knowledge and assertion, see the supplementary text on belief and knowledge.

7. Social character

The social character of a speech act can be of two kinds. On the one hand, there can be an institutional change of relation between speaker and addressee occurring because of a characteristic property of the act. For instance, by means of a sincere utterance of

(35) I promise to call the repair shop

the speaker has committed herself, in relation to the addressee, to do something. Both speaker and hearer will regard the speaker as having incurred an obligation to the addressee. The first to view assertion from this angle was probably C. S. Peirce, who said that ‘to assert a proposition is to make oneself responsible for its truth’ (1934, 384).

On the other hand, there can be hearer-directed intentions which the speaker has in performing a speech act. The speaker may intend the hearer to come to believe something or other about the speaker, or about something else, or intend the hearer to come to desire or intend to do something. Such intentions can concern institutional changes, but need not. Intentions that are immediately concerned with communication itself, as opposed to ulterior goals, are called communicative intentions.

The distinction between these two kinds of social character does not coincide with the distinction between conventional and non-conventional. For instance, you can hold that there is a form-force convention in English without accepting any institutional theory about illocutionary types.

Most social accounts have tended to focus either on the conventional/institutional or on the intentional features (Searle, as we shall see, combines them). An example of the former is Brandom (1994). According to Brandom (1994, 173–75), the nature of assertion consists in the fact that in assserting the speaker achieves two different normative/institutional results at the same time: on the one hand she authorizes the hearer to claim anything that follows from what is asserted and on the other she undertakes the responsibility of justifying it. Brandom has recently been followed by John MacFarlane (2003, 2005) in the context of semantic relativism. Other examples include Kotatko (1998, 236–39), who like Searle stresses the importance of social conventions about what counts as making a commitment or undertaking, and Gary Watson (2004). Also, Green (1999, 2000) has worked out the idea of assertoric commitment in the setting of conversational score.

The idea of communicative intentions derives from Grice's 1957 article ‘Meaning’, where Grice defined what it is for a speaker to non-naturally mean something. Grice's idea can be set out as follows:

(NN) S non-naturally means something by an utterance u if, and only if, there is a hearer H such that
(i) S intends u to bring about a response R in H
(ii) S intends H to recognize that (i)
(iii) S intends H's reason for R to be that (i).

(Here ‘that (i)’ is short for ‘that S intends u to bring about a response R in H’.) That is, the speaker intends the hearer to react in a certain way because of recognizing that the speaker wants him to react in that way. Often, and in Grice's original examples, the intended reaction is one of coming to believe something, and that is a reaction that typically fits the speaker's intention or at least desire when making an assertion. Although Grice did not explicitly attempt to define assertion, the idea can be straightforwardly applied to provide one:

(PG) S asserts that p by the utterance u iff there is a hearer H such that
(i) S intends u to produce in H the belief that p
(ii) S intends H to recognize that (i)
(iii) S intends H to believe that p for the reason that (i)

In the early to mid 1960s Austin's speech act theory and Grice's account of communicative intentions began to merge. The connection is discussed in Strawson 1964. Strawson inquired whether illocutionary force could be made overt by means of communicative intentions. He concluded that when it comes to highly conventionalized utterances communicative intentions are largely irrelevant, but that on the other hand convention does not play much role for ordinary illocutionary types. Strawson also pointed out a dfficulty with Grice's analysis: it may be the case that all three conditions are fulfilled, but that the speaker intends the hearer to believe that they aren't, e.g. by intending the hearer to believe that the speaker wants him to believe that p for an entirely different reason.

Such intentions to mislead came to be called sneaky intentions (Grice 1969), and they constituted a problem for speech act analyses based on communicative intentions. The idea was that genuine communication is essentially open: the speaker's communicative intentions are meant to be fully accessible to the hearer. Sneaky intentions violate this requirement of openness, and therefore apparently they must be ruled out one way or another. Strawson's own solution was to add a fourth clause about the speaker's intention that the hearer recognize the third intention. However, that solution only invited a sneaky intention one level up (cf Schiffer 1972, 17–42).

Another solution was to make the intention reflexive. This was proposed by Searle (1969), in the first full-blown analysis of illocutionary types made by appeal to communicative intentions. Searle combined this with an appeal to institutional relations as created by rules. Such rules are the so-called constitutive rules, as opposed to regulative rules (the terminology is taken from Kant). Roughly, whereas regulative rules regulate a pre-existing activity, such as traffic regulations regulate traffic, constitutive rules in a sense create a new activity. Paradigm examples are rules of games as defining games, and thus making it possible to play them. The distinction was introduced by Rawls (1955), and also suggested by C. G. J. Midgley (1959) in the same terms and format as later by Searle (1969, 33–42; cf. Glüer and Pagin 1999).

Searle suggests five rules for the use of force indicating devices. In the case of assertion, they are as follows. S is the speaker and H the hearer:

(JS1) (1) The propositional content rule: what is to be expressed is any proposition p.
(2) First preparatory rule: S has evidence (reasons etc.) for the truth of p.
(3) Second preparatory rule: It is not obvious to both S and H that H knows (does not need to be reminded of, etc.) p.
(4) Sincerity rule: S believes p.
(5) Constitutive rule: Counts as an undertaking to the effect that p represents an actual state of affairs.

The fifth rule is constitutive. That is, according to Searle, without this rule the practice of assertion would not exist. The existence of the undertaking is an institutional fact created by the utterance. According to Searle (1969, 65), the speaker expresses the state required by the sincerity rule, i.e. in the case of assertion, expresses belief. Also, the speaker implies that the preparatory conditions are met.

The making of an assertion also involves the speaker's communicative intentions. Searle critcized Grice for requiring the speaker to intend perlocutionary effects, such as what the speaker shall come to do or believe, pointing out that such intentions aren't essential (1969, 46–47). Instead, according to Searle, the speaker intends to be understood, and also intends to achieve this by means of the hearer's recognition of this intention. Moreover, if the intention is recognized, it is also fulfilled: ‘we achieve what we try to do by getting our audience to recognize what we try to do’ (Searle 1969, 47).

For more about assertion and social analysis of assertion, see the supplementary text on social character.

8. Logic

Frege introduced the turnstile, ‘⊢’, as a so-called assertion sign. It first appeared in the Begriffsschrift (Frege 1879). According to Frege, it serves to express a judgment (1879, 11). The sign was meant to be composed from the horizontal part, the so-called content stroke, and the vertical part, the so-called judgment stroke. The content stroke would mark that what follows it is a judgeable content.

Frege demanded that what follows the content stroke must have a content that can become a judgment, which is to say a propositional content. With the content stroke attached, but not the judgment stroke, we have an expression of the kind ‘the circumstance that …’, or ‘the proposition that …’ (1879, 11). He also characterized ‘⊢’ as a common predicate for all judgments, like the predicate ‘is a fact’ as occurring in sentences such as

(36) The violent death of Archimedes at the capture of Syracuse is a fact.

Here the argument is a noun phrase denoting an event rather than a state of affairs. This difference in syntactic format between that-clauses and event terms is of less significance than the basic idea that there really is just one kind of judgment. There are not e.g. any hypothetical or disjunctive judgments, only conditional or disjunctive contents. The contents vary, the nature of the judgment remains the same (Frege 1879, 13).

This view was retained in the Grundgesetze der Arithmetik (Frege 1893). The assertion sign is here still composed of the vertical part, the judgment stroke, and the horizontal, now called the horizontal (der Wagerechte). While the judgment stroke is more or less the same, Frege's conception of the horizontal has changed. The horizontal is now part of the expression of content. It denotes a function from objects to truth values (1893, 9): it maps the True on the True and any other object on the False. It can occur in the interior of formulas. Remember that on Frege's view at the time, truth values are among the objects of the universe.

Since the judgment stroke is always followed by a horizontal, this construction has the effect that what is judged always denotes a truth value, at least if what follows the horizontal is a meaningful closed expression (not containing gaps or free variables). On the view that Frege had developed since the Begriffsschrift, and which he argued for in ‘Über Sinn und Bedeutung’, judging is passing from the level of sense (Sinn) to the level of reference (Bedeutung). Judging that p is passing from the mere thought that p, to acceptance of the truth of the thought that p. Thus, in judging you advance from a sense to a truth value. Conversely, advancing from a sense to a truth value constitutes judging. Therefore, we have a well-formed judgment, correct or incorrect, if what follows the judgment stroke denotes a truth value. With the new conception of the horizontal, the judgment is guaranteed to be well-formed.

Frege's conception of his assertion sign fits well in with his own system of deduction. Every sentence occurring in a deduction in the Begriffschrift or the Grundgesetze is either asserted or a proper constituent of a sentence that is asserted. Each sentence asserted is either an axiom or is derived from axioms by means of accepted rules of deduction. There is no such thing as an unasserted assumption occurring as a premise of a deduction step, and a fortiori no conclusion of a deduction step that depends on an assumption. Correspondingly, the judgment stroke itself only occurs initially in each expression of judgment. There is no such thing as a complex judgment with other judgments as proper parts. In particular, there are no hypothetical judgments, in the sense of a judgment that is the consequent of a conditional.

Several interesting connections between logical issues and the notion of assertion have arisen because of transcendence of these Fregean limitations. The first was crossed by Gerhard Gentzen in the mid-1930s, and, depending on interpretation, maybe the second, too. With Gentzen's Natural Deduction system (1934–35), a system of deduction was formulated with the possibility of making assumptions, making inferences from these assumptions, and also of discharging assumptions in certain deduction steps (e.g. ⊃-Introduction). With Gentzen's work, and the later developments by Dag Prawitz (1965), Natural Deduction has become a well-established and almost standard system of deduction. However, there is still a question of how to understand the act of inferring from an assumption, since it seems itself to be neither an assumption, nor an assertion proper.

It might be natural to think of such an act as a kind of conditional assertion. Ideas about conditional assertion have been proposed, but then chiefly in connection with natural language indicative conditionals, i.e. sentences of the form

(37) If p, then q

(in English). Problems with interpreting such sentences as material conditionals,

(38) pq

led to the suggestion, first in Quine 1952, that an assertoric utterance of an indicative conditional really is a conditional assertion, in the following sense: If the antecedent is true, then the speaker has asserted the proposition expressed by the consequent, and if the antecedent is false, no assertion has been made. This idea has been rather controversial.

Finally, generalizing the idea that there are forms of judgment with assertions as proper parts, there has been a development of so-called logics of assertion, and even more generally, illocutionary logic, with complex speech act types, having themselves speech act types as proper parts. In the assertion logic case, there is special logical constant (‘A’) denoting assertion, and the system is the logic of that constant. In the case of Nicholas Rescher (1968), the basic form of sentence studied is that of

(39) x asserts that p

which is abbreviated as

(39′) Axp

A similar system as is developed by Ingemund Gullvåg (1978). In illocutionary logic, as e.g. in Searle and Vanderveken 1985, the study concerns in general logical relations between speech acts. In this case the idea is that each speech act has a particular array of characteristics, and two speech acts may then be so related that the characteristics of the one are implied by, or inconsistent with, the characteristics of the other. Cf. the entry on Speech Acts.

For more on assumptions, conditionals and assertion logic, see the supplementary text on logic and assertion.

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Austin, John Langshaw | convention | Davidson, Donald | defaults in semantics and pragmatics | Frege, Gottlob | Grice, Paul | Peirce, Charles Sanders | pragmatics | Quine, Willard van Orman | speech acts | Strawson, Peter Frederick

Acknowledgments

I have been greatly helped by comments on the first version from an anonymous referee. I am also grateful for comments from Herman Cappelen, and from participants in a seminar on the first version in Stockholm, especially to Kathrin Glüer, Per Martin-Löf, Dag Prawitz and Åsa Wikforss.

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