Franz Brentano

First published Wed Dec 4, 2002; substantive revision Tue Aug 26, 2014

Franz Clemens Brentano (1838–1917) is mainly known for his work in philosophy of psychology, especially for having introduced the notion of intentionality to contemporary philosophy. He made important contributions to many fields in philosophy, especially to metaphysics and ontology, ethics, logic, the history of philosophy, and philosophical theology. Brentano was strongly influenced by Aristotle and the Scholastics as well as by the empiricist and positivist movements of the early nineteenth century. Due to his introspectionist approach of describing consciousness from a first person point of view, on one hand, and his rigorous style as well as his contention that philosophy should be done with exact methods like the natural sciences, on the other, Brentano is often considered a forerunner of both the phenomenological movement and the tradition of analytic philosophy. A charismatic teacher, Brentano exerted a strong influence on the work of Edmund Husserl, Alexius Meinong, Christian von Ehrenfels, Kasimir Twardowski, Carl Stumpf, and Anton Marty, among others, and thereby played a central role in the philosophical development of central Europe in the early twentieth century.

1. Life and Work

Franz Brentano was born on January 16, 1838 in Marienberg am Rhein, Germany, a descendent of a strongly religious German-Italian family of intellectuals (his uncle Clemens Brentano and his aunt Bettina von Arnim were among the most important writers of German Romanticism and his brother Lujo Brentano became a leading expert in social economics). He studied mathematics, poetry, philosophy, and theology in Munich, Würzburg, and Berlin. Already at high school he became acquainted with Scholasticism; at university he studied Aristotle with Trendelenburg in Berlin, and read Comte as well as the British Empiricists (mainly John Stuart Mill), all of whom had a great influence on his work. Brentano received his Ph.D. in 1862, with his thesis On the Several Senses of Being in Aristotle.

After graduation Brentano prepared to take his vows; he was ordained a Catholic priest in 1864. Nevertheless he continued his academic career at the University of Würzburg, where he presented his Habilitationsschrift on The Psychology of Aristotle in 1867. Despite reservations in the faculty about his priesthood he eventually became full professor in 1873. During this period, however, Brentano struggled more and more with the official doctrine of the Catholic Church, especially with the dogma of papal infallibility, promulgated at the first Vatican Council in 1870. Shortly after his promotion at the University of Würzburg, Brentano withdrew from the priesthood and from his position as professor.

After his Habilitation, Brentano had started to work on a large scale work on the foundations of psychology, which he entitled Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint. The first volume was published in 1874, a second volume (The Classification of Mental Phenomena) followed in 1911, and fragments of the third volume (Sensory and Noetic Consciousness) were published posthumously by Oskar Kraus in 1928.

Shortly after the publication of the first volume, Brentano took a job as a full professor at the University of Vienna, where he continued a successful teaching career. During his tenure in Vienna, Brentano, who was very critical towards his own writing, no longer wrote books but turned instead to publishing various lectures. The topics range from aesthetics (Das Genie [The Genius], Das Schlechte als Gegenstand dichterischer Darstellung [Evil as Object of Poetic Representation]) and issues in historiography to The Origin of the Knowledge of Right and Wrong, in which Brentano laid out his views on ethics. The latter was Brentano's first book to be translated into English in 1902.

When in 1880 Brentano and Ida von Lieben decided to wed, they had to confront the fact that the prevailing law in the Austro-Hungarian Empire denied matrimony to persons who had been ordained priests – even if they later had resigned from priesthood. They surmounted this obstacle by temporarily moving to and becoming citizens of Saxony, where they finally got married. This was possible only by temporarily giving up the Austrian citizenship and, in consequence, the job as full professor at the University. When Brentano came back to Vienna a few months later, the Austrian authorities did not reassign him his position. Brentano became Privatdozent, a status that allowed him to go on teaching – but did not entitle him to receive a salary or to supervise theses. For several years he tried in vain to get his position back. In 1895, after the death of his wife, he left Austria disappointed; at this occasion, he published a series of three articles in the Viennese newspaper Die neue freie Presse entitled Meine letzen Wünsche für Österreich [My Last Wishes for Austria] (which soon afterwards appeared as a self-standing book), in which he outlines his philosophical position as well as his approach to psychology, but also harshly criticized the legal situation of former priests in Austria. In 1896 he settled down in Florence where he got married to Emilie Ruprecht in 1897.

Brentano has often been described as an extraordinarily charismatic teacher. Throughout his life he influenced a great number of students, many of who became important philosophers and psychologists in their own rights, such as Edmund Husserl, Alexius Meinong, Christian von Ehrenfels, Anton Marty, Carl Stumpf, Kasimir Twardowski, as well as Sigmund Freud. Many of his students became professors all over the Austro-Hungarian Empire, Marty and Ehrenfels in Prague, Meinong in Graz, and Twardowski in Lvov, and so spread Brentanianism over the whole Austro-Hungarian Empire, which explains the central role of Brentano in the philosophical development in central Europe, especially in what was later called the Austrian Tradition in philosophy.

Brentano always emphasized that he meant to teach his students to think critically and in a scientific manner, without holding prejudices and paying undue respect to philosophical schools or traditions. When former students of his took a critical approach to his own work, however, when they criticized some of his doctrines and modified others to adapt them for their own goals, Brentano reacted bitterly. He often refused to discuss criticism, ignored improvements, and thus became more and more isolated, a development that was reinforced by his increasing blindness.

Due to these eye-problems Brentano could not read or write any longer, but had his wife read to him and dictated his work to her. Nonetheless, he produced a number of books in his years in Florence. In 1907 he published Untersuchungen zur Sinnespsychologie, a collection of shorter texts on psychology. In 1911 he presented not only the second volume of his Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint, but also two books on Aristotle: in Aristotle and his World View he provides an outline and interpretation of Aristotle's philosophy. In Aristoteles Lehre vom Ursprung des menschlichen Geistes Brentano continues a debate with Zeller. This debate had started already in the 1860s, when Brentano criticized Zeller's interpretation of Aristotle in his Psychology of Aristotle and became quite intense and aggressive in the seventies and eighties of the nineteenth century.

When Italy entered war against Germany and Austria during World War I, Brentano, who felt himself a citizen of all three countries, moved from Florence to neutral Switzerland. He passed away in Zurich on March 17, 1917.

Brentano left a huge number of unpublished manuscripts and letters on a wide range of philosophical topics in his last domicile in Zürich and in his summer-residence in Schönbühel bei Melk; some manuscripts were probably left behind in Florence. After his death, Alred Kastil and Oskar Kraus, who were students of Brentano's former student Anton Marty in Prague, worked on the Nachlass. Their attempt to set up a Brentano-archive in Prague was supported by Tomas Masaryk, a former student of Brentano who had become founder and first President (from 1918 to 1935) of the Republic of Czechoslovakia. Alas, due to the political turbulences that were to came over central Europe the project was doomed to fail. Substantial parts of the Nachlass were transferred to different places in the United States, some of it has later been brought back to Europe, especially to the Brentano-Forschungsstelle at the University of Graz, Austria, and the Brentano family archive in Blonay, Switzerland. (For a detailed history of Brentano's Nachlass, cf. Binder (2013)).

Kastil and Kraus did succeed, however, to begin to publish posthumously some of the lecture notes, letters, and drafts he had left. They tried to present Brentano's work as best as they could, putting together various texts to what they thought were rounded, convincing works, sometimes following questionable editorial criteria. Their work was continued by other, more careful editors, but has by far not yet been completed: a much needed critical edition of his complete œuvre is still to be waited for.

2. Philosophy as a Rigorous Science and the Rise of Scientific Psychology

One of Brentano's main principles was that philosophy should be done with methods that are as rigorous and exact as the methods of the natural sciences. This standpoint is clearly mirrored in his empirical approach to psychology. It is noteworthy here that Brentano's use of the word “empirical” deviates substantially from what has become its standard meaning in psychology today. He emphasized that all our knowledge should be based on direct experience. He did not hold, however, that this experience needs to be made from a third-person point of view, and thus opposes what has become a standard of empirical science nowadays. Brentano rather argued a form of introspectionism: doing psychology from an empirical standpoint means for him to describe what one directly experiences in inner perception, from a first-person point of view.

Brentano's approach, like that of other introspectionist psychologists of the late nineteenth century, was harshly criticized with the rise of scientific psychology in the tradition of logical positivism, especially by the behaviorists. This should not obscure the fact that Brentano did play a crucial role in the process of psychology becoming an independent science. He distinguished between genetic and empirical or, as he later called it, descriptive psychology, a distinction that is most explicitly drawn in his Descriptive Psychology. Genetic psychology studies psychological phenomena from a third-person point of view. It involves the use of empirical experiments and thus satisfies the scientific standards we nowadays expect of an empirical science. Even though Brentano never practiced experimental psychology himself, he very actively supported the installation of the first laboratories for experimental psychology in the Austro-Hungarian Empire, a development that was continued by his student Alexius Meinong in Graz. Descriptive psychology (to which Brentano sometimes also referred as “phenomenology”) aims at describing consciousness from a first-person point of view. Its goal is to list “fully the basic components out of which everything internally perceived by humans is composed, and … [to enumerate] the ways in which these components can be connected” (Descriptive Psychology , 4). Brentano's distinction between genetic and descriptive psychology strongly influenced Husserl's development of the phenomenological method, especially in its early phases, a development of which Brentano could not approve for it involved the intuition of abstract essences, the existence of which Brentano denied.

3. Brentano's Theory of Mind

Brentano's main goal was to lay the basis for a scientific psychology, which he defines as “the science of mental phenomena” (Psychology, p. 18). In order to give flesh to this definition of the discipline, he provides a more detailed characterization of mental phenomena. He proposes six criteria to distinguish mental from physical phenomena, the most important of which are: (i) mental phenomena are the exclusive object of inner perception, (ii) they always appear as a unity, and (iii) they are always intentionally directed towards an object. I will discuss the first two criteria in this section, and the third in a separate section below.

All mental phenomena have in common, Brentano argues, “that they are only perceived in inner consciousness, while in the case of physical phenomena only external perception is possible” (Psychology, 91). According to Brentano, the former of these two forms of perception provides an unmistakable evidence for what is true. Since the German word for perception (Wahrnehmung), literally translated, means “taking-true”, Brentano says that it is the only kind of perception in a strict sense. He points out that inner perception must not be mixed up with inner observation, i.e., it must not be conceived as a full-fledged act that accompanies another mental act towards which it is directed. It is rather interwoven with the latter: in addition to being primarily directed towards an object, each act is incidentally directed towards itself as a secondary object. As a consequence, Brentano denies the idea that there could be unconscious mental acts: since every mental act is incidentally directed towards itself as a secondary object, we are automatically aware of every occurring mental act. He admits, however, that we can have mental acts of various degrees of intensity. In addition, he holds that the degree of intensity with which the object is presented is equal to the degree of intensity in which the secondary object, i.e., the act itself, is presented. Consequently, if we have a mental act of a very low intensity, our secondary consciousness of this act also will have a very low intensity. From this Brentano concludes that sometimes we are inclined to say that we had an unconscious mental phenomenon when actually we only had a conscious mental phenomenon of very low intensity.

Consciousness, Brentano argues, always forms a unity. While we can perceive a number of physical phenomena at one and the same time, we can only perceive one mental phenomenon at a specific point in time. When we seem to have more than one mental act at a time, like when we hear a melody while tasting a sip of red wine and enjoying the beautiful view from the window, all these mental phenomena melt into one, they become moments or, to stick with Brentano's terminology, divisives of a collective. If one of the divisives ends in the course of time, e.g., when I swallow the wine and close my eyes, but continue to listen to the music, the collective goes on to exist. Brentano's views on the unity of consciousness entail that inner observation, as explained above, is strictly impossible, i.e., that we cannot have a second act which is directed towards another mental act which it accompanies. One can remember another mental act one had a moment earlier, or expect future mental acts, but due to the unity of consciousness one cannot have two mental acts, one of which being directed towards the other, at the same time.

Brentano points out that we can be directed towards one and the same object in different ways and he accordingly distinguishes three kinds of mental phenomena: presentations, judgments, and phenomena of love and hate. These are not three distinct classes, though. Presentations are the most basic kind of acts; we have a presentation each time when we are directed towards an object, be it that we are imagining, seeing, remembering, or expecting it, etc. In his Psychology Brentano held that two presentations can differ only in the object, towards which they are directed. Later he modified his position, though, and argued that they can also differ in various modes, such as temporal modes. The two other categories, judgments and phenomena of love and hate, are based on presentations. In a judgment we accept or deny the existence of the presented object. A judgment, thus, is a presentation plus a qualitative mode of acceptance or denial. The third category, which Brentano names “phenomena of love and hate,” comprises emotions, feelings, desires and acts of will. In these acts we have positive or negative feelings towards an object.

4. Intentionality

Brentano is probably best known for having introduced the notion of intentionality to contemporary philosophy. He first characterizes this notion with the following words, which have become the classical, albeit not completely unambiguous formulation of the intentionality thesis:

Every mental phenomenon is characterized by what the Scholastics of the Middle Ages called the intentional (or mental) inexistence of an object, and what we might call, though not wholly unambiguously, reference to a content, direction toward an object (which is not to be understood here as meaning a thing), or immanent objectivity. Every mental phenomenon includes something as object within itself... (Brentano, Psychology, 88)

[Jedes psychische Phänomen ist durch das charakterisiert, was die Scholastiker des Mittelalters die intentionale (auch wohl mentale) Inexistenz eines Gegenstandes genannt haben, und was wir, obwohl mit nicht ganz unzweideutigen Ausdrücken, die Beziehung auf einen Inhalt, die Richtung auf ein Objekt (worunter hier nicht eine Realität zu verstehen ist), oder die immanente Gegenständlichkeit nennen würden. Jedes enthält etwas als Objekt in sich… (Brentano, Psychologie, 124f)]

This quotation must be understood in context: in this passage, Brentano aims at providing one (of six) criteria to distinguish mental from physical phenomena with the aim to define the subjekt matter of scientific psychology – and not to develop a systematic account of intentionality. The passage clearly suggests, however, that the intentional object towards which we are directed is part of the psychological act. It is something mental rather than physical. Brentano, thus, seems to advocate a form of immanentism, according to which the intentional object is “in the head,” as it were. Some Brentano scholars have recently argued that this immanent reading of the intentionality thesis is too strong. In the light of other texts by Brentano from the same period they argue that he distinguishes between intentional correlate and object, and that the existence of the latter does not depend on our being directed towards it.

When Brentano's students took up his notion of intentionality to develop more systematic accounts, they often criticized it for its unclarity regarding the ontological status of the intentional object: if the intentional object is part of the act, it was argued, we are faced with a duplication of the object. Next to the real, physical object, which is perceived, remembered, thought of, etc., we have a mental, intentional object, towards which the act is actually directed. Thus, when I think about the city of Paris, I am actually thinking of a mental object that is part of my act of thinking, and not about the actual city. This view leads to obvious difficulties, the most disastrous of which is that two persons can never be directed towards one and the same object.

If we try to resolve the problem by taking the intentional object to be identical with the real object, on the other hand, we face the difficulty of explaining how we can have mental phenomena that are directed towards non-existing objects such as Hamlet, the golden mountain, or a round square. Like my thinking about the city of Paris, all these acts are intentionally directed towards an object, with the difference, however, that their objects do not really exist.

Brentano's initial formulation of the intentionality-thesis does not address these problems concerning the ontological status of the intentional object. The first attempt of Brentano's students to overcome these difficulties was made by Twardowski, who distinguished between content and object of the act, the former of which is immanent to the act, the latter not. This distinction strongly influenced other members of the Brentano School, mainly the two students for who the notion of intentionality had the most central place, Meinong and Husserl.

Meinong's theory of objects can best be understood as a reaction to the ontological difficulties in Brentano's account. Rather than accepting the notion of an immanent content, Meinong argues that the intentional relation is always a relation between the mental act and an object. In some cases the intentional object does not exist, but even in these cases there is an object external to the mental act towards which we are directed. According to Meinong, even non-existent objects are in some sense real. Since we can be intentionally directed towards them, they must subsist (bestehen). Not all subsisting objects exist; some of them cannot even exist for they are logically impossible, such as round squares. The notion of intentionality played a central role also in Husserlian phenomenology. Applying his method of the phenomenological reduction, however, Husserl addresses the problem of directedness by introducing the notion of ‘noema.’

Brentano was not very fond of his students' attempts to resolve these difficulties, mainly because he rejected their underlying ontological assumptions. He was quick to point out that he never intended the intentional object to be immanent to the act. Brentano thought that this interpretation of his position was obviously absurd, for it would be “paradoxical to the extreme to say that a man promises to marry an ens rationis and fulfills his promise by marrying a real person” (Psychology, 385). In later texts, he therefore suggested to see intentionality as an exceptional form of relation. A mental act does not stand in an ordinary relation to an object, but in a quasi-relation (Relativliches). For a relation to exist, both relata have to exist. A person a is taller than another person b, for example, only if both a and b exist (and a is, in fact, taller than b). This does not hold for the intentional quasi-relation, Brentano suggests. A mental phenomenon can stand in a quasi-relation to an object independent of whether it exists or not. Mental acts, thus, can stand in a quasi-relation to existing objects like the city of Paris as well as non-existing objects like the Golden Mountain. Brentano's later account, which is closely related to his later metaphysics, especially to his turn towards reism, i.e., the view that only individual objects exist, can hardly be considered a solution of the problem of the ontological status of the intentional object. He rather introduces a new term to reformulate the difficulties.

5. Time-Consciousness

According to Brentano's theory, mental acts cannot have duration. This brings up the question of how we can perceive temporally extended objects like melodies. Brentano accounts for these cases by arguing that an object towards which we are directed does not immediately vanish from consciousness once the mental act is over. It rather remains present in altered form, modified from ‘present’ to ‘past.’ Every mental phenomenon triggers an ‘original association’ or ‘proteraesthesis,’ as he calls it later, a kind of memory which is not a full-fledged act of remembering, but rather a part of the act that keeps lively what was experienced a moment ago. When I listen to a melody, for example, I first hear the first tone. In the next moment I hear the second tone, but am still directed towards the first one, which is modified as past, though. Then I hear the third tone, now the second tone is modified as past, the first is pushed back even further into the past. In this way Brentano can explain how we can perceive temporally extended objects and events. The details of Brentano's account of time-consciousness changed over the time, owing to changes in his overall position. At one point he thought that the temporal modification was part of the object, later he thought that they belonged to judgments, and even later he argued that they were modes of presentations.

Brentano's account of time consciousness greatly influenced his students, especially Edmund Husserl, whose notion of ‘retention’ bears close resemblances to Brentano's notion of ‘original association.’

6. Logic, Ethics, Aesthetics, and Historiography

According to Brentano, psychology plays a central role in the sciences; he considers especially logics, ethics, and aesthetics as practical disciplines that depend on psychology as their theoretical foundation. Brentano's conception of these three disciplines is closely related to his distinction between the three kinds of mental phenomenon: presentations, judgments, and phenomena of love and hate, i.e., emotions.

Logic, according to Brentano, is the practical discipline that is concerned with judgments; i.e. with the class of mental phenomena in which we take a positive or a negative stance towards the (existence of the) object by affirming or denying it. In addition, judgments are correct or incorrect; they have a truth-value. According to Brentano, a judgment is true when it is evident, i.e., when one perceives (in inner perception that is directed towards the judgment) that one judges with evidence. Brentano, thus, rejects the correspondence theory of truth, suggesting that “a person judges truly, if and only if, his judgment agrees with the judgment he would make if we were to judge with evidence” (Chisholm 1986, 38). Notwithstanding this dependence on the notion of judgment, however, truth, for Brentano, is not a subjective notion: if one person affirms an object and another person denies the same object, only one of them judges correctly. (For a more detailed discussion of Brentano's contributions to logic, cf. the entry Brentano's Theory of Judgement.)

Ethics, on the other hand, is concerned with phenomena of love and hate. When experiencing a phenomenon of this class, we take an emotional stance towards an object, i.e., a stance that can be positive or negative. Moreover, phenomena of this class can be correct or incorrect. In these two aspects we have a formal analogy between judgments and emotions. An emotion is correct, according to Brentano, “when one's feelings are adequate to their object — adequate in the sense of being appropriate, suitable, or fitting” (Brentano, Origins, 70). If it is correct to love an object, we can say that it is good; if it is correct to hate it, it is bad. The question of whether or not it is correct to have a positive emotion towards an object is not a subjective one; according to Brentano it is impossible that one person correctly loves an object and another person correctly hates it.

Aesthetics, finally, is based on the most basic class of mental phenomena: on presentations. According to Brentano, every presentation is in itself of value; this holds even for those that become the basis of a correct, negative judgment or a correct negative emotion. Thus, while judgments and emotions consist in taking either a positive or a negative stance, the value of a presentation is always positive, but comes in degrees: some presentations are of higher value than others. Not every presentations is of particular aesthetic value, though; in order to be so, it has to become the object of an emotion in which one correctly takes a positive stance towards it. In short, according to Brentano, an object is beautiful if a presentation that is directed at it arouses a correct, positive emotion, i.e., a form of pleasure; it is ugly, on the other hand, if a presentation that is directed at it arouses a correct, negative emotion, a form of displeasure.

This discussion shows that Brentano's philosophy has strong psychologistic tendencies. Whether or not one is to conclude that he does adopt a form of psychologism depends on the exact definition of the latter term: Brentano vehemently rejects the charge of psychologism, which he takes to stand for a subjectivist and anthropocentric position. At the same time, however, he explicitely defends the claim that psychology is the theoretical science on which practical disciplines of logic, ethics, and aesthetics are based. Hence, he does adopt the form of psychologism Husserl seems to have had in mind in the Prolegomena to his Logical Investigations, where he defines logical psychologism as a position according to which:

… [T]he essential theoretical foundations of logic lie in psychology, in whose field those propositions belong — as far as their theoretical content is concerned — which give logic its characteristic pattern. … Often people talk as if psychology provided the sole, sufficient, theoretical foundation for logical psychology (Husserl 2001, 40).

Die wesentlichen theoretischen Fundamente liegen in der Psychologie; in deren Gebiet gehören ihrem theoretischen Gehalt nach die Sätze, die der Logik ihr charakteristisches Gepräge geben. … Ja nicht selten spricht man so, als gäbe die Psychologie das alleinige und ausreichende theoretische Fundament für die logische Kunstlehre. (Husserl, 1900, 51)

Brentano's interest in the history of philosophy is not only reflected by his extensive work on Aristotle, but also by his historiographical considerations – and also in this context psychology is to play a fundamental role. In his text The Four Phases of Philosophy and Its Current State (1998) he defended the metaphilosophical thesis that progress in philosophy can be explained according to principles of cultural psychology. In philosophy progress takes place in circles: each philosophical period, Brentano holds, can be subdivided in four phases. The first is a creative phase of renewal and ascending development; the other three are phases of decline, dominated by a turn towards practical interests, by scepticism, and finally by mysticism. After the fourth phase, a new period begins with a creative phase of renewal. With this scheme Brentano succeeds in giving his philosophical preferences an intellectual justification; it allows him to explain his fascination for Aristotle, the Scholastics, and Descartes as well as his dislike of Kant and the German idealists.

7. Brentano's Metaphysics

Even though Brentano worked on problems in metaphysics and ontology throughout his life, he hardly published on these topics during his lifetime. The impact of his views is due to the fact that from his early lectures at the University of Würzburg on he discussed them with his students, both in class and (especially in later years) in correspondence.

Even though Brentano's views have underwent considerable changes over the years, his general attitude can be characterized as sober, parsimonious, and (in the current use of the term) nominalistic; at no point did he admit the existence of universals, he rather relied on mereological principles to account for classical problems in ontology.

Brentano's early metaphysics, which is the result of his critical reading of Aristotle, is a form of conceptualism. He does distinguish between substance and accidents, but argues that both are but fictions cum fundamentum in re. With this, he wants to suggest that they do not have actual existence, but that we can make judgments about real things that are correct and contain references to substances and accidents. This view is closely connected to his epistemic notion of truth, according to which the question of whether a judgment is true does not depend on its corresponding to reality, but rather on whether it can be judged with evidence. Brentano elucidates the relation between a thing and its properties on the basis of the mereological notions of “logical part” and “metaphysical part,” the former of which account for abstract, repeatable properties, the latter for the concrete properties of a thing. Both are not considered to be denizens of reality in a narrow sense, but rather fictions that have a foundation in reality. (For a reconstruction and discussion of the details of Brentano's early ontology, cf. Chrudzimski 2004).

After the introduction of the notion of intentionality in his Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint (1874), Brentano struggled to account for the ontological status of the intentional object. When he first introduces the notion, suggesting, as we have seen above, that “[e]very mental phenomenon includes something as object within itself” (Brentano, Psychology, 88), he seems to be interested primarily in presenting a psychological thesis and does not seem to be overly worried with its ontological implications; at this point, the talk of an “immanent object” might have been a mere façon de parler(cf. Chrudzimski and Smith, 2003, 205). Soon Brentano finds himself in the need, however, to address this question and, as a result, to enrich the domain of objects in his ontology. He seems to admit that next to concrete things there are irrealia, that is, objects that to not really exist but have the status of thought-objects or, as he puts it, entia rationis, that do not have an essence and do not stand in causal relations. Brentano does not systematically elaborate his ontological position in this period, we rather find a bundle of ideas of which he did not seem to be fully convinced. This underlines that the formulation of these views was not made with the intention to make a contribution to ontology, but rather to reply to concerns that have emerged from his introduction of the notion of intentionality.

In his late philosophy, from 1904 on, Brentano rediscovers the virtue of ontological parsimony and takes up the main insights of his conceptualist period, developing (and radicalizing) them to a form of reism, according to which the only items that exist are individual things (res). “While young Brentano tried to ontologically play down certain ways of speaking, late Brentano tried to eliminate them from philosophical discourse” [“Der junge Brentano versuchte gewisse Redeweisen ontologisch zu bagatellisieren, der späte Brentano versuchte sie aus dem philosophischen Diskurs zu eliminieren”] (Chrudzimski 2004, 177). He abandons the notion of irrealia, which he now regards as linguistic fictions, and continues to deny the existence of universals or abstract entities. Instead, he conceives both substances and accidents as real things that are related to one another by a particular mereological relation: an accident does not only ontologically depend on the substance, it also contains the substance as a part without, however, containing any supplementary part. A white table, accordingly, is an accident that contains the table as a part. If we were to paint it red, the white table would cease to exist and the red table would come into existence – the continuity between the two being guaranteed by the table, which was part of the white table and is now part of the green table.

Brentano's ontology is known to a broader audience only through posthumously published works that were edited by his late students Oskar Kraus and Alfred Kastil, who considered his late position most important and accordingly put less emphasis on Brentano's earlier phases. Only recently the development of Brentano's views on ontology has gained more attention, mainly through the work of scholars who were able to study unpublished manuscripts in the archives (cf., for example, Chrudzimski 2004). This underlines once more the need of a critical edition of Brentano's entire Nachlass, which would make it possible for a broader audience to critically assess the development of Brentano's views in ontology.

8. The Impact of Brentano's Philosophy

Brentano's contributions to philosophy were widely discussed among philosophers and psychologists at the end of the nineteenth and the beginning of the twentieth century. After some time his influence was eclipsed by the work of his students, some of who founded philosophical traditions on their own: Husserl started the phenomenological movement, Meinong the Graz school, Twardovski the Lvov-Warsaw School. As a result, in the second half of the twentieth century Brentano was often mentioned as the philosopher who had (re-)introduced the notion of intentionality, as “grandfather” of the phenomenological movement, or for his influence on early analytic philosophy, but his philosophical views and arguments were hardly discussed.

There are notable exceptions to this tendency, though. Roderick Chisholm, for example, made a continuous effort to show Brentano's significance to contemporary philosophy by adopting his results in his own contributions to the philosophy of mind, but also in presentations of various aspects of Brentano's thought (cf. Chisholm 1966, 1982, and 1986). Moreover, in recent decades the tradition that is often referred to as “Austrian philosophy” has gained increasing interest in a broader philosophical audience, which is due mainly to the work of Rudolf Haller, Barry Smith, Peter Simons, and Kevin Mulligan, among others. By showing the systematic relevance of Brentano's (and other Austrian philosophers') contributions to problems discussed in ontology, logic, the theory of emotions, or consciousness, they could counteract the tendency to reduce Brentano's contributions to philosophy to the notion of intentionality.

In recent years an increasing number of philosophers from different fields have rediscovered and elaborated on different themes from Brentano's philosophy. Brentano's views on ethics, for example, (which have gained more attention in English-speaking countries than in central Europe, probably because of the early English translation of Brentano's lecture on ethics (1902)), have been taken up in fitting attitude theories of value, which analyze ethical value in terms of correct or incorrect forms of approval or disapproval. His theory of mind has inspired neo-Brentanian accounts of consciousness that aim to do justice to the systematic nature of Brentano's theory of mind, where the notion of intentionality is closely intertwined with the conception of secondary consciousness and the thesis of the unity of consciousness.

In particular, it has been suggested that Brentano's notion of secondary consciousness (i.e., the thesis that every mental phenomenon is incidentally directed also towards itself as a secondary object) can provide the means to overcome higher-order theories of consciousness that have been widely discussed in the late twentieth century. Brentano, who argued that every mental phenomenon is object of inner perception, has sometimes been regarded as an early proponent of a higher-order perception theory of consciousness (cf., for example, Güzeldere 1997, 789). This interpretation, however, does not pay due attention to the fact that according to Brentano, inner perception is not a self-standing mental phenomenon of a higher level, but rather a structural moment of every mental phenomenon. Moreover, Brentano explicitly rejects the basic assumption of all higher-order perception theories of consciousness, i.e., the idea that we can have two mental phenomena (of distinct levels) at the same time, one of them being directed towards the other: higher-order perception theories postulate what Brentano calls ‘inner observation’ (as opposed to inner perception), which he retains impossible, as we have seen above.

Accordingly, a number of recent interpreters have suggested that Brentano was an advocate of a one-level account of consciousness: “Since the features that make an act conscious are firmly located within the act itself rather than bestowed on it by a second act, this locates Brentano's view as a one-level view of consciousness” (Thomasson, 2000, 192). This reading has given place to neo-Brentanian theories such as Thomasson's adverbial account (cf. Thomasson 2000) or self-representational approaches (cf., for example, Krigel 2003a,b) that build on the thesis that “every conscious state has a dual representational content. Its main content is the normal content commonly attributed to mental representations. But it also has a (rather peripheral) special content, namely, its own occurrence” (Kriegel 2003a, 480), which they take as Brentano's central thesis. Moreover, Kriegel suggests that for Brentano this self-representational aspect is a necessary condition for having a presentation (Kriegel 2013).

Other interprets have taken more cautious lines. Mark Textor (2006), for example, has relied on Brentano's thesis of the unity of consciousness to account for the relation between primary and secondary consciousness. A mental phenomenon, according to Textor's interpretaion of Brentano's theory, does not become conscious by representing itself, but rather by its being unified or fused with an immediately evident cognition of it. Also Dan Zahavi has insisted that Brentano does distinguish two levels of perception, which sheds doubts on the one-level interpretation: “It could be argued that Brentano's claim that every conscious intentional state takes two objects, a primary (external) object and secondary (internal) object, remains committed to a higher-order account of consciousness; it simply postulates it as being implicitly contained in every conscious state” (Zahavi, 2006, 5). In short, Brentano's distinction between primary and secondary consciousness “introduces some kind of level-distinction into the structure of experience” (Brandl 2013, 61) but does not conceive of higher-perception as a full-fledged mental phenomenon at its own, which is why Brandl has recently proposed to regard it a ‘one-and-a-half-level theory’ (Brandl 2013, 61f).


Works (in German)

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Works (English Translations)

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  • Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint, transl. by A.C. Rancurello, D.B. Terrell, and L. McAlister, London: Routledge, 1973. (2nd ed., intr. by Peter Simons, 1995).
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  • The True and the Evident, transl. by Roderick Chisholm, Ilse Politzer, and Kurt Fischer. London: Routledge, 1966.

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