The Unity of Consciousness
Human consciousness usually displays a striking unity. When one experiences a noise and, say, a pain, one is not conscious of the noise and then, separately, of the pain. One is conscious of the noise and pain together, as aspects of a single conscious experience. Since at least the time of Immanuel Kant (1781/7), this phenomenon has been called the unity of consciousness. More generally, it is consciousness not of A and, separately, of B and, separately, of C, but of A-and-B-and-C together, as the contents of a single conscious state.
Historically, the notion of the unity of consciousness has played a very large role in thought about the mind. Indeed, as we will see, it figured centrally in some of the most influential arguments about the mind from the time of Descartes to the 20th century. In the early part of the 20th century, the notion largely disappeared for a time, but since the 1960s, analytic philosophers and others have begun to pay attention to it again.
- 1. History
- 2. Characterizations and Taxonomies
- 3. Is Consciousness Unified?
- 4. Disorders of Unified Consciousness
- 5. Unity at a Time and Across Time
- 6. Theories of Unity
- 7. Neural Architecture of Unified Consciousness
- 8. Conclusions
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
The unity of consciousness was a main concern of most philosophers in what is often called the ‘classical modern era’ (roughly, 1600 to 1900), including Descartes, Leibniz, Kant, Hume (in a way; see below), Reid, Brentano, and James.
Consider a classical argument of Descartes' for mind-body dualism. It starts like this:
When I consider the mind, that is to say, myself inasmuch as I am only a thinking thing, I cannot distinguish in myself any parts, but apprehend myself to be clearly one and entire. [Descartes, 1641, p. 196]
Descartes then asserts that if the mind is not made of parts, it cannot be made of matter because anything material has parts. He adds that this by itself would be enough to prove dualism, had he not already proven it elsewhere. Notice where it is that I cannot distinguish any parts. It is in “myself inasmuch as I am only a thinking thing” (ibid.); that is, in myself as a whole — which requires unified consciousness of myself as a whole. The claim is that this subject, the target of this unified consciousness, is not a composite of parts.
In Kant (1781/7), the notion that consciousness is unified is central to his ‘transcendental deduction of the categories’ (see the entry on Kant's view of the mind and consciousness of self for a fuller treatment of Kant). There Kant claims that in order to tie various objects of experience together into a single unified conscious experience of the world, we must be able to apply certain concepts to the items in question. In particular, we have to apply concepts from each of four fundamental categories of concept: quantitative, qualitative, relational, and what he called ‘modal’ concepts. Kant's attempt to link the unity of consciousness to the structure of knowledge continues to capture the imaginations of philosophers: Arguments of this form can be found in P. F. Strawson (1966), Cassam (1996), Hurley (1994,1998) and Revonsuo (2003), and are examined critically in Section 6.3 and in Brook (2005).
Kant was familiar with arguments of the kind that we just saw Descartes mount (chiefly from similar reasoning in Leibniz and Mendelssohn) but he was not impressed. For Kant, that consciousness is unified tells us nothing about what sorts of entity minds are, including whether or not they are made out of matter (1781, chapter on the Paralogisms of Pure Reason). He argues that the achievement of unified consciousness by a system of components acting together would be no more or less mysterious than its being achieved by something that is simple, i.e., has no components (1781, A352).
Leibniz, Hume, Reid, Brentano, and James held a variety of positions on unity. Briefly, for Leibniz (see the entry on Leibniz's philosophy of mind) unified consciousness and the noncompositeness, the indivisibility that he took to be required for it seem to have served as his model of a monad, the building block of all reality. With Hume (1739), things are more complicated. It should have followed from his atomism that there is no unified consciousness, just “a bundle of different perceptions” (p. 252). Yet, in a famous appendix, he says that there is something he cannot render consistent with his atomism (p. 636). He never tells us what it is but it may have been that consciousness strongly appears to be more than a bundle of independent ‘perceptions’. Reid (1785), almost an exact contemporary of Kant's, made extensive use of the unity of consciousness, among other things to run Descartes' argument from unity to indivisibility the other way around. Brentano (1874) argued that all the conscious states of a person at a time will and perhaps must be unified with one another. (He combined this view with another strong thesis, that all mental states are conscious.) Finally, late in the 19th century James developed a detailed treatment of synchronic (or ‘at a time’) unity of consciousness. We will discuss his view later.
Early in the 20th century, the unity of consciousness almost disappeared from the research agenda. Logical atomism in philosophy and behaviourism in psychology had little to say about the notion. Logical atomism focussed on the atomic elements of cognition (sense data, simple propositional judgments, protocol sentences, etc.), rather than on how these elements are tied together to form a mind. Behaviourism urged that we focus on behaviour, the mind being either a myth or at least something that we cannot and do not need to study in a science of the human person.
One exception to this pattern of neglect was Gestalt psychology. Indeed, Gestalt psychology was sufficiently influential in its time for some positivists to try to make their systems compatible with it (Smith, 1994, p. 23). For instance, Carnap chose to avoid any commitment to atoms of experience as the elements of his system, opting instead for ‘total experiences’. His notion of irreducible experiential wholes can, as we will see in Section 6.4, be usefully developed. However, Carnap's own motivation seems to have been a desire to make his system compatible with Gestalt psychology (Smith 1994, p. 23) and he had something rather different in mind from what philosophers now have in mind when they speak of the unity of consciousness. Gestalt unity is a unity in a structure of which one is conscious, where the way in which each part appears is derived from the structure of the whole (Tye 2003, pp. 11–5; Bayne and Chalmers 2003, p. 27). This is distinct from the unity in one's consciousness of objects, objects that need not themselves exhibit the qualities of gestalt structures.
After decades of neglect, the last third of the 20th century saw a resurgence of interest in unified consciousness among analytic philosophers. It began with influential commentaries on Kant in the 1960s (Strawson, 1966, Bennett, 1966; see also his 1974), as well as discussions by Nagel (1971) and Parfit (1971, 1984). More recently, quite a number of philosophers and a few psychologists have written on the subject, including Marks (1981), Trevarthen (1984), Lockwood (1989, 1994), Hill (1991), Brook (1994), Marcel (1994), Hurley (1994, 1998), Shoemaker (1996, 2003), O'Brien and Opie (1998 and 2003). The first decade of the 21st century has seen a lot of important new work on the subject: Dainton (2000), Stevenson (2000), Bayne and Chalmers (2003), Hurley (2003), Kennett and Matthews (2003), Rosenthal (2003), Radden (2003), Tye (2003), Zeki (2003), Nikolinakos (2004), Brook and Raymont (2006), LaRock (2007), and Bayne (2008). Cleeremans (2003) is an excellent collection containing papers by philosophers such as Bayne, Chalmers, Hurley, Shoemaker, Cotterill, and Thompson and psychologists such as Triesman, Humphreys, Engel, Diennes, Perner, and Varela. Tim Bayne (2010) has done a full-length study (not available at time of writing). Blackmore (2004), Ch. 17, is a good, scientifically-oriented introduction.
What characterizes the unity of consciousness? Note that this question can be asked and answered whether or not there is any such thing as unified consciousness. Indeed, we need to know what the unity of consciousness is like even to address the question of its existence. (For ease of exposition, we will write as though there is unified consciousness, even though the question really remains open until the next section.)
That said, it should also be noted that it is difficult to say much about the unity of consciousness that is both non-question-begging and more than a thinly disguised synonym, a point that Dainton (2000) emphasizes. Even as great a theorist of the subject as Immanuel Kant threw up his hands. He observed that this unity is “not the category of unity” (B131) — and said no more.
Underlying the various attempts to identify what is characteristic about the unity of consciousness are two opposing views of the structure of a unified conscious experience. On what we will call the experiential parts view, a unified conscious experience is a composite of other experiences. The no experiential parts view denies this, asserting that while a unified conscious experience will have a complex object or content, it has no experiential parts. On this view, when the objects of particular experiences get incorporated into a ‘bigger’ unified experience, the new experience replaces the particular experiences rather than containing them as parts. It would be premature to discuss the two views here (see Sections 6.1 and 6.2) but we need to know about them to understand the attempts that have been made to characterize unity. The first two way of characterizing the unity of consciousness that we will examine are within the experiential parts approach.
One increasingly prominent attempt to characterize the unity of consciousness holds that in unified consciousness, particular experiences are subsumed in a more complex experience. For example, Bayne and Chalmers (2003) say that when particular experiences are unified, they are “aspects of a single encompassing state of consciousness”. More precisely, two experiences are what they call ‘subsumptively unified’ “when they are both subsumed by a single state of consciousness” (p.27). This yields a distinctive phenomenology. Two subsumptively unified states will have what they call a conjoint phenomenology: a phenomenology of having both states at once that subsumes the phenomenology of the individual states: “there is something it is like for the subject to be in [two conscious] states simultaneously” (p. 32).
One feature of subsumption is that it requires that there be experiential parts. Thus, those who wish a characterization of unified consciousness to be neutral on this issue will look for a different one.
A second attempt to characterize unified consciousness claims that a relation among local conscious states is the crucial element, a relation usually called co-consciousness. James originated the term. As he put it, in synchronic unified consciousness, we are co-conscious of A, B, and C (1909, p. 221). Others who centre their analysis on the notion include Parfit (1984) and Hurley (1998). Theorists generally do not try to define the term. They treat the notion of co-consciousness as being intuitively clear and let it function as a primitive in their analysis.
Like subsumption, most versions of co-consciousness require experiential parts. In addition to the problem of lack of neutrality, this requirement faces the problem that some forms of unified consciousness do not seem to involve multiplicity of items, unified consciousness of self for example. If not, in these cases there would not be anything to enter into a ‘co’-relationship.
A number of theorists combine the two approaches. Many of the people who use the term ‘co-consciousness’ in fact seem to have subsumption in mind as the underlying notion. Dainton, for example, embraces the language of co-consciousness, but cashes the notion in terms such as “being experienced together” (2000, p. 236). Or Lockwood (1989, p. 88): co-consciousness is “the relation in which two experiences stand, when there is an experience of which they are both parts.” Similarly Shoemaker (2003, p. 65): “The experiences are co-conscious … by virtue of the fact that they are components of a single state of consciousness … .”
Like subsumption, co-consciousness would require that there be experiential parts. In addition, even if some forms of unified consciousness might exhibit a ‘co-‘ relationship, it seems that some do not, including unified consciousness of self. Here there does not seem to be any multiplicity of items, therefore nothing to enter into a ‘co’-relationship.
2.1.3 Joint Consciousness
There are at least two approaches to what characterizes unified consciousness that are compatible with the no experiential parts view. One we find in Tye. In unified conscious states, the things that we experience are “experienced together”, “enter into the same phenomenal content” (p. 36, his emphasis) — which phenomenal content could be the content of a single non-composite experience.
Another has been advanced by Brook and Raymont (Brook 1994, p. 38; Brook 2000; Brook and Raymont 2006; Brook and Raymont forthcoming). The key idea is what they call joint consciousness. Joint consciousness is present when the following holds: if an experience that one is having provides consciousness of any item, then it provides consciousness of other items and of at least some of the items as a group. Likewise for consciousness of acts of experiencing.
This notion tries to capture something distinctive about unified consciousness in a way that is neutral with respect to the experiential parts/no-parts debate and at least mildly informative. The notion is related to the phenomenal side of the Bayne/Chalmers notion of subsumption, there being something it is like to be in two conscious states simultaneously (p. 32), but in a way that is free of the non-neutral notion of subsumption. It is not clear whether joint consciousness is really an alternative to Tye's notion of same phenomenal content or an attempt to say something about what yields such content.
Most contemporary theorists agree that unified consciousness can take a number of forms. Many schemes for dividing it up exist in the literature. Tye (2003, pp. 11–5), for example, distinguishes object unity, neurophysiological unity, spatial unity, subject unity, introspective unity, and, finally, phenomenal unity. The latter is the notion that he explicates in terms of contents being experienced together, entering into the same phenomenal content, and is the notion on which he focuses.
Similarly, Bayne and Chalmers (2003, pp. 24–7) distinguish objectual unity (a matter of two conscious experiences of one object, so different from Tye's object unity), spatial unity, subject unity, and subsumptive unity, the last a matter of two or more conscious states becoming aspects of a single conscious state. Then within subsumptive unity, they distinguish between access unity and phenomenal unity. Their definition of the latter, as with Tye their main interest, we just examined: two conscious states are phenomenally unified “if there is something it is like for the subject to be in both conscious states simultaneously.”
Kant and philosophers in the Kantian tradition break phenomenal unity down. The division they use usually follows the traditional division of experience into subject, representation, and object or content, assigning to each its own form of unified consciousness. Thus there will be unified consciousness of individual objects, of multiples of objects, of acts of experiencing, and of oneself as the subject of such experiencing. (A fifth form can be distinguished, too, as we will see.) Few contemporary theorists break phenomenal unity down at all, so this division is of some interest.
The first three forms of unified consciousness in the Kantian tradition can be expressed in terms of the notion of joint consciousness just introduced. First, unified consciousness of individual objects. This is Tye's object unity; Bayne and Chalmers' objectual unity is at least a related notion. The process at work here is now commonly called binding (Hardcastle 1998; Revonsuo 1999). Binding is the process of tying various features of a visual scene such as colour, shape, edges, and contours, features detected in various places in the visual cortex, together into an experience of a unified, three-dimensional object. Binding may be necessary for consciousness of individual objects but it does not seem to be sufficient. We must, it seems, also be jointly conscious of the various elements to have unified consciousness of an object.
Next, unified consciousness of contents. In unified consciousness of contents, if an experience that one is having provides consciousness of any object or content, then it provides consciousness of other objects or contents and of at least some of the items as a group. Here ‘object’ and ‘item’ cover objects, properties, events — anything of which one can be conscious. (We speak of experiences rather than representations in deference to those who doubt that we experience in representations, or need to do so: we wish to be neutral on this issue.)
This distinction between unified consciousness of individual objects and of multiples of objects corresponds closely to two kinds of synthesis distinguished by Kant (1781/7, First Division, Book 1, Chapter 2). Kant distinguishes between the kind of acts of synthesis needed to attain consciousness of individual objects and the kind of acts of synthesis needed to attain consciousness of a number of objects at the same time as a single array of objects experienced by a single subject (Brook 1994, p. 123). He builds his argument for necessary causal connectedness on the latter.
Unified consciousness of contents appears to be central to our kind of consciousness. For example, suppose that I am conscious of the computer screen in front of me and also of the car sitting in my driveway. If consciousness of these two items were not unified, an important, indeed probably the most important, way of comparing them as they appear to me would not be available. I could not answer questions such as, As it appears to me, is the car the same colour as the WordPerfect icon?, or even, From where I stand, is the car to the left or to the right of the computer screen? That is what unified consciousness does for us: it allows us to make such comparisons. Since relating item to item in this and related ways is fundamental to our kind of cognition, unified consciousness is fundamental to our kind of cognition. As we will see in Section 4.1, there are disorders of consciousness in which this ability to compare seems to be lost. Such people have a massive cognitive impairment.
Most theorists outside of philosophy and many within accept that there is a second form of conscious unity related to unified consciousness of contents, namely, unified consciousness of acts of experiencing. It is present when, for the current acts of experiencing that one is doing, consciousness of one act of experiencing (consciousness of how one is experiencing something, for example seeing it, imagining it, ...) provides consciousness of other acts of experiencing. (This explication is structured to be neutral as to whether unified conscious states include a multiplicity of conscious states. We speak of ‘consciousness of acts of experiencing’ rather than ‘consciousness of an experience’ for the same reason.)
Not all theorists accept that this second form of unified consciousness exists. Those who promote the so-called transparency thesis, the claim that we are not directly conscious of our own experiencings, deny that we have any such form of consciousness (Dretske 1995, Tye 2003). Tye, for example, says that when we hear something, we cannot be conscious of the auditory experience, just what it represents. If one tries to be conscious of the experience, at best one is aware only of “the auditory qualities that the experience represents” (2003, p. 33).
Many theorists have also had a fourth thing in mind when they speak of the unity of consciousness, namely, unified consciousness of oneself, the thing that has the experiences. Here, one is or certainly seems to be (see the discussion of Rosenthal in Section 3.1) conscious of oneself not just as subject but, in Kant's words (A350), as the ‘single common subject’ of many or all the aspects of the unified experience that one is now having and of a number of similar experiences past and, in anticipation, still to come. (Mutatis mutandis, the same holds for the single common agent of various bits of deliberation and action.) One has unified consciousness of self when one is conscious of oneself as the single common subject of experiences of many items in many acts of experiencing.
Since Hume (1739, p. 252) and Rosenthal (2003) deny that we have such unified consciousness of self and Dennett (1991, 1992) says at minimum that we have much less of it than we think, it is perhaps pertinent to say again that in this section we are merely trying to say what the various forms of unity would be like if they exist. Whether they do exist is the topic of the next section.
The unified consciousness here seems not to be a matter of joint consciousness. When one is conscious of oneself as the common subject of one's current unified acts of experiencing and of unified acts of experiencing past and to come, one is not conscious of a number of objects, nor a number of acts of experiencing either. (Indeed, if Kant is right, when one is conscious of oneself as subject, one need not be conscious of oneself as an object at all (A382, A402, B429).) However, something similar might be at work. One seems to be conscious of one and the same thing as one and the same thing, namely, oneself, via a number of acts of experiencing.
Unified consciousness of self has been argued to have some very special properties, for example that the reference to oneself as oneself by which one achieves consciousness of oneself as subject must be indexical and cannot make use of ‘identification’ (Castaneda, 1966; Shoemaker, 1968; Perry, 1979). Generalizing the latter notion, it has been claimed that reference to self does not proceed by way of attribution of properties or features to oneself at all (Brook 2001). One argument for this view is that one is or could be conscious of oneself in the same way as the subject of each and every one of one's conscious experiences. If so, one would not be conscious of oneself as one kind of thing rather than another. As Bennett (1974, p. 80) once put it, consciousness of self would not be ‘experience-dividing’ — statements expressing it would have “no direct implications of the form ‘I shall experience C rather than D.’” And if that is so, one's consciousness of self might not be gained via being conscious of features of oneself at all
Some theorists especially in the empirical literature hold that a fifth form of phenomenal experience should attract the label, ‘unified consciousness’. We might call it unity of focal attention. It differs from the other forms of unified consciousness that we have delineated. In the others, consciousness ranges over either many experienced items (unified consciousness of contents), experiencings of many objects (unified consciousness of experiencing), or multiple acts of access to oneself as subject of many experiencings (unified consciousness of self). Unity of focus picks out something within these unified ‘fields’. Wilhelm Wundt captured what we have in mind in his distinction between the field of consciousness (Blickfeld) and the focus of consciousness (Blickpunkt) (Wundt 1874, Vol. II, p. 67). The consciousness of a single item on which one is focussing is unified because one is conscious of many aspects of the item in one state or act of consciousness (especially relational aspects, e.g., any dangers it poses, how it relates to one's goals, etc.), and of many different considerations with respect to that item (one's goals, how well one is achieving them with respect to this object, etc.), in the same state or act of consciousness. In unified focal attention, one integrates a number of cognitive abilities and applies them to an object. Bayne and Chalmers' objectual unity is a related notion (2003, pp. 24–5). Note that, if there are forms of unified consciousness different from focal attention, then, contrary to Posner (1994) and some others, attention is not a component of all forms of consciousness (Hardcastle 1997).
All five of the forms of phenomenal unity can, to one degree or another, be attributed to Kant. The first four are clearly Kantian but there is a connection to him even with respect to the fifth. He didn't speak of attention very often but he did speak of it. See, for example, B156n.
We will close this section by noting that the forms of unified consciousness distinguished above are not the only kinds of mental unity. Earlier we mentioned Gestalt unity. There is also unity in the exercise of our cognitive capacities, unity that consists of integration of motivating factors, perceptions, beliefs, etc., and there is unity in the outputs, unity that consists of integration of behaviour.
Human beings bring a strikingly wide range of factors to bear on a cognitive task such as seeking to characterize something or trying to reach a decision about what to do about something. For example, we can bring to bear: what we want; what we believe; our attitudes to self, situation, and context; input from each of our various senses; information about the situation, other people, others' beliefs, desires, attitudes, etc.; the resources of however many languages we have available to us; various kinds of memory; bodily sensations; diverse problem-solving skills; and so on. Not only can we bring all these elements to bear, we can integrate them in a way that is highly structured and ingeniously appropriate to our goals and the situation(s) before us. This form of mental unity could appropriately be called unity of cognition. It is plausible to hold that unity of cognition is required for unity of focal attention. However, there is at least some measure of unified cognition in many situations of which we are not conscious, as is attested by our ability to balance, control our posture, maneuver around obstacles while our consciousness is entirely absorbed with something else, and so on.
At the other end of the cognitive process, we find an equally interesting form of unity, what we might call unity of behaviour: our ability to coordinate our limbs, eyes, bodily attitude, etc. The precision and complexity of the behavioural coordination we can achieve would be difficult to exaggerate. Think of a concert pianist performing a complicated work. However, this capacity to unify behaviour, though doubtless a product of unified consciousness, does not figure in what unified consciousness is.
Now that we know what we are talking about when we talk about unified consciousness, the next question to ask is: Does it exist? Does consciousness have the properties that it would need to have to be unified? If this division of questions looks peculiar, notice that it can apply to Santa Claus, too. We can develop an account of what Santa Claus would be like without committing ourselves on the question of whether such a being exists. However, the division may look peculiar in another way, too: How could anyone deny that consciousness is unified? That it is seems just obvious.
In fact there has been a good deal of skepticism on the matter recently, and not so recently. As we saw, Hume (1739, p. 252) famously doubted, or tried to doubt, that we have unified consciousness of self at least. More recently, Nagel (1971), Davidson (1982), Dennett (1991, 1992), O'Brien and Opie (1998), and Rosenthal (2003) have all urged in one way or another that the mind's unity has been greatly overstated. The point these people make is not just that the mind works mostly out of the sight and often out of the control of consciousness. Virtually everyone agrees to that and the point would in no way tell against there being a real unity of some kind in the part that does enter consciousness. Rather, they rely on the fact that even states and acts of ours that are conscious can fail to cohere. We act against what we clearly know to be our own most desired course of action, or do things while telling ourselves that we must avoid doing them, and so on.
Some will urge that before we ask whether unified consciousness exists, we should first ask, Does consciousness exist? There now seems to be a wide consensus that the answer to this question is, Yes, there is in us something appropriately called ‘consciousness’. Even those who hold that the long-standing idea that intentionality is a matter of attitudes to propositions is false and ripe for elimination, Paul and Patricia Churchland for example, allow that consciousness exists, though they urge that the concept be trimmed a bit (see, for example, P. S. Churchland 1983). Some writers have taken Dennett (1991) to deny that consciousness exists, either directly or by implication. He himself has said repeatedly that consciousness is real, however (1995, pp. 135, 146 are two examples). A few writers, Wilkes (1984) and Rey (1988) for example, have espoused true eliminativist about consciousness but they are a tiny minority.
To assess whether or not consciousness is unified, three claims need to be distinguished: that fewer of our conscious states are unified than we think, that our consciousness is less unified than we think, and that none of our conscious states are unified. Many of the writers sceptical about unity argue only for one or the other of the first two claims. Neither of them entails the third. Even if we have conscious states that are not unified or fully unified in consciousness, the most that that could force us to do is to shrink the range of states over which consciousness is unified or fully unified. From the fact that not all of one's conscious contents are unified, it does not follow that none is.
Those who hold that the extent to which consciousness is unified has been overrated still owe us an account of what has been overrated. Even deniers owe us an account of what is being denied. When theorists claim that a lot of intentional life is out of conscious grasp and/or control, not coherent with conscious thoughts and wishes, one should ask: Out of the sight or control of what? One plausible answer would be: The unified conscious mind. Here is one way to view the matter. Once upon a time, some theorists held that all conscious states are unified and indeed that all mental states are consciousness. As we saw, Brentano is an example. The main difference between this pre-twentieth century vision of unified consciousness as ranging over everything in the mind and the post-Freudian vision that we are not conscious of most of what goes on in our mind and that when we are, consciousness is less unified than we think, is that the range of psychological phenomena over which unified consciousness ranges has shrunk. There is still something there, unified consciousness, for which we need to account, there is merely less of it than we thought.
Dennett is interesting in this regard. He is thoroughly sceptical about the traditional picture of unified consciousness. Yet even he can invoke unity. He says, “What is it like to be an ant colony? Nothing, I submit … What is it like to be a brace of oxen? Nothing (even if it is like something to be a single ox)” (Dennett 2005). Why is the answer nothing? In such cases, “there is no functional unity … — no unity to distinguish an I from a we” (Dennett 2005).
Among recent writers, perhaps the most sceptical about unity of consciousness existing at all is Rosenthal. Rosenthal is convinced that all we have is a “sense of the unity of consciousness” (1986, p. 344, emphasis added). Why merely a sense? On his view, “Mental states are conscious, when they are, in virtue of their being accompanied by HOTs [higher-order thoughts] and each HOT represents its target as belonging to the individual who also thinks the HOT in question” (Rosenthal 2002, p. 15). Across a range of such self-ascriptions, one develops a sense of being their common subject. However, this sense could be wrong. The experiences thus ascribed, says Rosenthal, could be supported by or located in a diversity of subjects. It is because of this possibility that Rosenthal asserts that all we have is a sense of consciousness being unified.
It is arguable that even when theorists deny that consciousness is unified, sometimes some sort of unity is still at work in their models. Rosenthal says, “A mental state is conscious just in case it is accompanied by a … thought to the effect that one is in the state in question” (2003, p. 325, our emphasis). If so, in addition to a HOT being about another psychological state, it is also about oneself, the thing that has the state (‘that one is in the state in question’). Now, this consciousness of oneself is not consciousness of any old object, it is consciousness of oneself, oneself as the bearer of conscious states. But this is consciousness of oneself as, to use Kant's phrase, the single common subject of one's experience (1781/7, A350). If so, the HOT model makes use of one kind of unified consciousness.
On the other side, there are theorists who maintain not only that conscious states in a subject are unified but that they must be unified. Bayne and Chalmers (2003, p. 24) call this the unity thesis: necessarily, any set of conscious states of a subject at a time is unified. As we saw, Brentano probably held this view. Hill (1991) does, too. Bayne and Chalmers express sympathy for the thesis on the grounds that, “It is difficult or impossible to imagine a subject having two phenomenal states simultaneously, without there being a conjoint phenomenology for both states.” (p. 37) Merely having phenomenal states might seem too little but Bayne and Chalmers are talking about phenomenal states where, for them, to have the state is for the state to be like something. If we recast to make this element explicit, we get a claim of some real intuitive appeal: If A is like something to S and B is like something to S, it must be the case that the combination, A and B, is like something to S. Interestingly, Kant seems to have believed something similar: “[Experiences] can represent something to me only insofar as they belong with all others to one consciousness” (A116). A and B having conjoint phenomenology is exactly what unity consists in, according to Bayne and Chalmers. Put this way, the unity thesis has some real appeal.
Are there presumptive counter-examples to the unity thesis? Spelled out as we have spelled it out, we do not know of any. Bayne and Chalmers consider brain bisection cases to be putative counter-examples because, on some concepts of the subject of experience, we can think of there still being one subject in these cases even though not all the conscious states are unified. There are at least three ways to respond. The simplest is just to deny that there is one subject, at least for the period of the split. A second would be to note that, however one counts subjects during the period of the split, there is evidence that many conscious experiences in that body are not like anything to some subject. If so, the apparent lack of conjoint consciousness of them will not be a problem. A third (advocated by Bayne and Chalmers, pp. 38–9) would be to urge that while there is clearly a breach in the unity of access consciousness (access to information for purposes of belief formation, behavioural control, and so on) during the period of the split, phenomenal unity may still extend across all the conscious experience.
The unity thesis is a very strong thesis. Theorists could hold both that consciousness is unified and that this unity is important and yet deny that the unity thesis is true.
One of the most interesting ways to study psychological phenomena is to see what happens when they take an abnormal form or break down. Phenomena that look simple and seamless when functioning smoothly often reveal all sorts of structure when they begin to malfunction. The unity of consciousness can be damaged and/or distorted in both naturally-occurring and experimental situations. What can we learn from these cases?
Many of the disorders that we will consider are fairly directly a result of changes to the brain. Neuropsychology is the study of the relationship between the two. The best-known objects of such study in connection with unified consciousness are brain bisection operations (commissurotomies). Other neuropsychological studies relevant to unified consciousness have examined blindsight (Weiskrantz 1986), blindsight with visual agnosia (van Gulick 1994), and hallucinations and thought insertion (Stephens and Graham 2000).
4.1.1 Brain Bisection Operations
No medical procedure to do with consciousness has received as much philosophical attention in recent times as commissurotomies, more commonly known as brain bisection operations. Nagel (1971) was perhaps the first philosopher to write on them; his paper continues to be influential. Since then, Puccetti (1973, 1981), Marks (1981), Hirsch (1991), Lockwood (1989), Hurley (1998), Bayne (2008), Schechter (2009) and many, many other philosophers have written on these operations. Indeed, the strange results of these operations in certain controlled conditions was one of the things that brought the unity of consciousness back onto the cognitive research agenda.
In these operations, the corpus callosum is cut. The corpus callosum is a large strand of about 200,000,000 neurons running from one hemisphere to the other. When present, it is the chief channel of communication between the hemispheres. These operations, done mainly in the 1960s but recently reintroduced in a somewhat modified form, are a last-ditch effort to control certain kinds of severe epilepsy by stopping the spread of seizures from one lobe of the cerebral cortex to the other lobe. For details, see Sperry (1984), Bogen (1993), or Gazzaniga (2000).
In normal life, these patients show little effect of the operation. In particular, their consciousness of their world and themselves appears to remain as unified as it was prior to the operation. How this can be has puzzled a lot of people (Hurley 1998). Even more interesting for our purposes, however, is that, under certain laboratory conditions, these patients behave as though two ‘centres of consciousness’ have been created in them. The original unity seems to be gone and two centres of unified consciousness seem to have replaced it, each associated with one of the two cerebral hemispheres.
Here are a couple of examples of the kinds of behaviour that prompt that assessment. The human retina is split vertically in such a way that the left half of each retina is primarily hooked up to the left hemisphere of the brain and the right half of each retina is primarily hooked up to the right hemisphere of the brain. Now suppose that we flash the word TAXABLE on a screen in front of a brain bisected patient in such a way that the letters TAX hit the left side of the retina, the letters ABLE the right side, and we put measures in place to ensure that the information hitting each half of the retina goes only to one lobe and is not fed to the other. If such a patient is asked what word is being shown, the mouth, controlled usually by the left hemisphere, will say TAX while the hand controlled by the hemisphere that does not control the mouth (usually the left hand and the right hemisphere) will write ABLE. Or, if the hemisphere that controls a hand (usually the left hand) but not speech is asked to do arithmetic in a way that does not penetrate to the hemisphere that controls speech and the hands are shielded from the eyes, the mouth will insist that it is not doing arithmetic, has not even thought of arithmetic today, and so on — while the appropriate hand is busily doing arithmetic!
Because brain bisection operations have attracted so much attention outside of psychiatry and neurology, we have included references to some important writings. For accounts of the rest of the phenomena we will sketch, consult any general textbook of psychiatry. Here we are interested in them only for the vicissitudes of unified consciousness that they display, or might be thought to display.
4.1.2 Hemi-neglect and Anosognosia
In hemi-neglect, one loses all sense of one side of one's body or sometimes one half (divided vertically) of everything spatial in one's experience. Whatever is going on in hemi-neglect, unified consciousness seems to remain. It is just that its ‘range’ has been bizarrely circumscribed. It encompasses an experience of only half the body or half of objects seen, not of the whole body or whole objects. Where we expect perception and proprioception of the whole body and whole objects, these patients perceive and propriocept only one-half of the body and/or objects in general. So hemi-neglect is another phenomenon in which there may be a major change in the phenomena over which unified consciousness with unified consciousness itself changing (otherwise).
Another phenomena in which unified consciousness seems to remain but with a bizarrely circumscribed range is anosognosia. In this condition, a person who has suffered loss of function (often as a result of a stroke) is unaware of the deficits. Thus, a person now blind will insist that she can see — and will stumble about in a room bumping into things. A person whose limbs are now paralysed will insist that his limbs are moving — and will become furious when family and caregivers say that they are not. And so on.
4.1.3 Dissociative Identity Disorder
Another candidate phenomenon is what used to be called Multiple Personality Disorder, now, more neutrally, Dissociative Identity Disorder (DID). Everything about this phenomenon is controversial, including whether there is any real multiplicity of consciousness at all (Hacking 1995, Dennett 1998). DID can take two forms. The more common form is often described as the units (persons, personalities, sides of a single personality, or whatever one decides to call them) ‘taking turns’, usually with pronounced changes in personality. When one is active, the other(s) usually is(are) not. Here the most prominent symptoms are usually strange memory gaps (amnesias) in each ‘unit’ for periods when the body in question was clearly conscious and active. In the other, less common form, both ‘units’ are present at the same time. Here, for example, the unit in control of speech will report that another ‘person’ inside her is, say, giving her orders, these orders being experienced not from the standpoint of giving them but as coming from another person. This form of DID is called the co-conscious form in the literature but the term names something very different here from what either James or Parfit had in mind when they used the term. Among other things, me and the ‘little person inside me’ are not unified in one consciousness. In fact, sometimes the dissociation in both forms of DID is behaviourally as complete as it is in brain bisection patients in the lab.
In some particularly severe forms of schizophrenia, the victim seems to lose the ability to have an integrated, interrelated experience of his or her world and self altogether. The person speaks in ‘word salads’ that never get anywhere, indeed sometimes never become complete sentences. The person is unable to put together perceptions, beliefs and motives into even simple plans of action or act on such plans if formed, even plans to obtain sustenance, tend to bodily needs, escape painful irritants, and so on. Here, it is plausible to suggest that the unity of consciousness has shattered rather than split. The behaviour of these people seems to express what we might call mere experience-fragments, the contents of which are so narrow and unintegrated that the subject is unable to cope and interact with others in the ways that even split brain subjects can.
4.1.5 Dysexecutive Syndrome
In schizophrenia of the severe sort just described, the shattering of consciousness is part of a general breakdown or deformation of mental functioning: affect, desire, belief, even memory all suffer massive distortions. In another kind of case, the normal unity of consciousness seems to be just as absent but there does not seem to be the same sort of general cognitive or affective disturbance. This is true of what some researchers call dysexecutive syndrome (Dawson, 1998, p. 215, for example). What indicates breakdown in the unity of consciousness is that these subjects are unable to consider two things together, even things directly related to one another. For example, such people cannot figure out whether a piece of a puzzle fits into a certain place even when the piece and the puzzle are both clearly visible and the piece obviously fits. They cannot crack an egg into a pan. And so on.
Trevarthen (1984) reports a similar syndrome in a few patients. In the cases he reports, commissurotomy patients are conscious of some object seen in the right side of the visual field by the left hemisphere (controlled so that the information is received by only that hemisphere) until an intention is formed to reach for it with the left hand, controlled by the right hemisphere. Somehow the intention to reach for it seems to obliterate consciousness of it in the hemisphere that controls speech, presumably the left hemisphere. However, if the object is slid over to the left visual field, then the speech-controlling hemisphere reports that it can see the object again — even though the object can now be seen only by the right hemisphere and the left still controls speech!
A disorder presenting similar symptoms is simultagnosia or Balint's syndrome (Balint was an early 20th century German neurologist). In this disorder, patients see only one object located at one ‘place’ in the visual field at a time. Outside of a few degrees of arc in the visual field, these patients say they see nothing but an “undifferentiated mess” and seem to be receiving no information about objects (Hardcastle, 1997, p. 62).
What is common to dysexecutive disorder, Trevarthen's cases, and simultagnosia is that subjects seem not to be conscious of even two objects in a single conscious state. They cannot, for example, compare the objects (in Trevarthen's cases, the object of a perception with the object of an intention). Unlike commissurotomy cases, it is not the case that a conscious experience of the second item exists within another unified consciousness. If there is any experience of the second item at all, it is not conscious. Rather than consciousness being split into two discrete parcels, there is just one diminished parcel. The rest of the conscious experiencing that is typical of normal consciousness has disappeared.
There are of course many different theories about what is going on in the conditions we have just sketched, severe schizophrenia, dysexecutive syndrome, simultagnosia and Balint's syndrome. Some hold that the deficits are not in unified consciousness at all; they are in the capacity to process perceptual information. On this view, consciousness remains unified but patients can no longer can take in what is happening. Here we will restrict ourselves to the idea that the problem is with unified consciousness. If it is even possible that this is where the problem is, we can learn interesting things about unified consciousness.
In addition to cases in which it appears to some theorists that one body may have two centres of unified consciousness, some believe that there has been at least one case in which one centre of unified consciousness spanned two bodies. There are problems with the case but the idea that such a thing is even possible is so interesting that we want to say a few words about it. The case we have in mind is the case of Greta and Freda Chaplin, who drew themselves/herself to the attention of authorities in Yorkshire beginning in the 1970s due to having an unfortunate erotomania. Two bodies were involved and they were identical twins. On this, all agreed. However, the bodies acted in some respects as though a single instance of unified consciousness spanned them. Each body could finish sentences started by the other. There is some suggestion that, say, the left body could report on scenes that only the right body could see. The two bodies could speak spontaneously constructed sentences in perfect unison. The two did everything they could together, even wanting to have both right hands on a frying pan. When separated by more than a few metres, they complained bitterly, each body reporting that it felt like a part of itself was being ripped out. And so on. We know of no professional writeup of the case (it was widely reported in the press at the time, for example in Time, Apr. 6, 1981) but some of the health professionals treating the case came to the view that what was presented to them was a her, not a them.
Can a single structure account for what is going on in all these phenomena? The Kantian taxonomy of forms of unified consciousness considered in Section 2.2 can give us a way into this issue.
One natural way to think of the conditions just sketched is to break them into two groups. In one group, however drastic the change in unified consciousness, unified consciousness remains in a largely complete form. Arguably, this group would include brain bisection cases, hemi-neglect, anosognosia, and DID. In the second group, schizophrenia of the severe kind we sketched, dysexecutive disorder, and simultagnosia, it is more natural to think that unified consciousness has been damaged or even destroyed.
Brain bisection cases first. In these cases, the key evidence for a duality of some kind is that there are situations in which whatever is conscious of some items being experienced in the body in question is not conscious of other items being experienced in that same body at the same time. We looked at two examples of the phenomenon in Section 4.1, the word TAXABLE and the doing of arithmetic. With respect to these experienced items, there is a significant and systematically extendable situation in which to be conscious of some of these items is not to be conscious of others of them in a single unified consciousness where we would expect such consciousness. If so, brain bisection patients fail to meet the conditions for unified consciousness of contents. This seems to be what motivates the judgment that these patients have two centres of consciousness.
Let us describe the case a bit more precisely. A brain bisection patient could be conscious that both TAX and ABLE are being seen. But nothing in the patient would be conscious that both items are being seen on the basis of seeing them. For at least one of the two items, something in the patient could have only the same kind of behavioural and other ‘outside’ evidence that any other observer of the situation could have.
There is more going on here, however. Between the two hemispheres there seems to be a clear split in unified consciousness of experiencing, too: Consciousness of doing some experiencing goes with lack of consciousness of doing other experiencing that are being done in the same body. To use a useful metaphor first coined, so far as we know, by Shoemaker, something is not conscious of acts of experiencing going on in its body ‘from the inside’, i.e., on the basis of doing them, while something else is conscious of them on this basis. There seems to be a split in unified consciousness of self, too: Consciousness of oneself as subject on the basis of doing acts of experiencing in that body goes with lack of consciousness of oneself as subject on the basis of other acts of experiencing being done in that body. If so, for many conscious states in these patients, there two instances of joint consciousness, not the normal one. (This assessment is not universally accepted. As we saw, Bayne and Chalmers (2003) urge that while access unity is split in these patients, phenomenal unity might not be.)
Next, DID. (We will come back to neglect and anosognosia at the end of this section.) In cases of DID, a central feature is either some pattern of reciprocal amnesia or a strong sense that another is inside (and yet still separate). This again seems to be a situation in which being conscious of some experienced objects by having the experience goes with not being conscious of others in the same body in the same way. The main difference is that the breach is always at a time in brain bisection cases, but can be either across time or at a time in DID cases. If so, the breakdown in unity will again consist in failures of joint consciousness. The amnesia in diachronic DID has this character, clearly, but so does synchronic DID. The person and the ‘little person inside’ have no access from the inside to one another, so no common unified consciousness of experiencing, and the objects of their experience are not unified, so no common unified consciousness of contents.
Now the second group. For severe schizophrenia, dysexecutive syndrome, simultagnosia, and Balint's syndrome — the cases where consciousness seems to be more shattered than split — the distinction of Kant's that we introduced in Section 2.2 between two kinds of synthesis is useful. As we saw, Kant distinguishes between two kinds of synthesis, being conscious of individual objects (Tye's object unity) and being conscious of a number of objects at the same time.
This distinction seems to shed some interesting light on the phenomena we sketched. Appearances would suggest that the first kind of synthesis continues to be available to dysexecutive and simultagnosia patients: they continue to be conscious of individual objects, events, etc. The damage seems to be with respect to the second kind, being conscious of multiple objects in a single act of consciousness. These people seem to achieve some measure of unified focal attention with respect to individual objects but unified consciousness of multiple objects is either restricted or missing.
With the severe forms of schizophrenia that we sketched, patients may lack even the ability to perform the first kind of synthesis. In a different jargon, these people may lack even the capacity for object constancy.
Hemi-neglect and anosognosia come out a bit different from the other conditions. In these conditions, there is no breach of joint consciousness. Neither a split nor a breakdown in unified consciousness is evident. Rather, in both conditions, there appears to be a shrinking of the range of phenomena over which otherwise intact joint consciousness can range. Half of one's body and/or half of all perceived objects are excluded in the first condition, the actual situation with respect to sight, limbs, etc., in the second.
To sum up, it appears that there is some prospect of placing all the conditions we have considered within a single structure of Kantian distinctions, first between unified consciousness of contents and unified consciousness of experiencing, then between conscious experience of individual objects and unified conscious experience of multiple objects. Thought insertion might pose a problem for this scheme. Patients experience thought insertion when they believe that some of their thoughts, experiences, emotions, and so on are not their own and have been ‘inserted’ into them from without. People suffering it are still aware of the ‘alien’ thoughts from the point of view of having them. The deficit is in something to do with unifying these thoughts with the rest of conscious life. Normally, we think of ourselves as the subject and agent of all ours experiences. In thought insertion, the victim fails to appear to himself as either subject or agent of some of the experiences of which he is in fact the subject and agent.
Some fairly exotic claims have been made about brain bisection cases and related conditions. Here we will consider two of them.
4.3.1 How Many Centres of Consciousness?
The first is a claim that in brain bisection patients, there is no whole number of persons. So far, we have talked as though in brain bisection we always end up with some clear number of instances of unified consciousness. Nagel (1971), one of the early philosophers to write about these cases, rejects that result. For him, there is no whole number of ‘centres of consciousness’ in brain bisection patients: there is too much unity (for example in life outside the laboratory and even in behaviour within) to say “two”, yet too much separation in the specially contrived laboratory situations to say “one”.
Not being happy with so counterintuitive a result, philosophers have responded. A response favoured by many is this. For any precise ‘one or two?’ question, there will be a precise answer. Behavioural control system? One. Groups of experienced objects unified in consciousness? Two. And so on. If so, while the one's and the two's wouldn't line up as tidily as they do most of the time in people who have not had this operation, it is not obvious that the mixed answers support Nagel's conclusion that there may be no whole number of centres of consciousness in these patients.
4.3.2 Is Partial Unity Possible?
The ‘in some respects one, in some respects two’ situation at the centre of Nagel's analysis is related to a question about transitivity. Is it possible, for a given instance of experienced objects p, q, and r, for there to be unified consciousness of p and q, unified consciousness of q and r, but no unified consciousness of p and r? (The parallel in brain bisection cases? Call the ‘centres of consciousness’ in the two cerebral lobes A and C, the older unilateral brain below them B. Is it possible for a mental state in A to be unified in consciousness with one in B, one in B with one in C, and yet the state in A not to be unified with the state in C?)
Hurley (1998) examines this question in detail. She comes at the question of transitivity by considering some results reported by Sergent (1990). Since Sergent's work has not been replicable, let us look instead at how the research by Trevarthen that we examined throws up the same issue. In this research, as we said, brain bisection patients under certain conditions are conscious of some object seen by, say, the right hemisphere until the left hand, which is controlled by the right hemisphere, reaches for it. Somehow the act of reaching for it seems to obliterate the consciousness of it. Very strange — how can something pop into and disappear from unified consciousness in this way? This question leads Hurley to the notion of partial unity. Could two centres of consciousness, A and C, though not unified in consciousness with one another, nonetheless both be unified with some third thing, in this case the volitional system B (the system of intentions, desires, etc.)? If so, ‘being unified with’ is not a transitive relationship — A could be unified with B, and C could be unified with B, without A being unified with C. This idea is puzzling enough. Even more puzzling is how activation of the system B, with which both A and C are unified, could result in the loss of consciousness in A and/or C of an object aimed at by B.
Hurley never pronounces on the possibility of partial unity. Instead, she argues that none of the cases suspected of displaying it really do. She accepts that intention can obliterate consciousness — but then distinguishes time periods (1998, p. 216). In Trevarthen's cases, for example, the situation with respect to unity is clear at any given moment — one either is or is not conscious of the object. The picture over time does not conform to our usual expectations for diachronic singularity or transitivity of unity — but that is simply an artefact of the cases, not a problem.
Hurley considers another class of cases, what she calls Marcel's (1994) cases. Here subjects are asked to report the appearance of some item in consciousness in three ways at the same time — say, by blinking, pushing a button, and saying, ‘I see it’. Remarkably, in different trials each of these three acts are done without doing the other two. And the question is, What does this imply for unified consciousness? In a case in which the subject pushes the button but neither blinks nor says anything, for example, is the hand-controller aware of the object while the blink-controller and the speech-controller are not? How could the conscious system become fragmented in such a way?
Hurley's suggestion? They can't. What induces the appearance of incoherence about unity is the short time scale. Suppose that it takes some time to achieve unified consciousness, perhaps because some complex feedback processes are involved. If so, then Marcel's cases have not even got to a stable unity situation. The subjects were not given enough time (1998, p. 216).
Is partial unity possible? To date, this remains an unanswered question.
Hurley discusses more aspects of the unity of consciousness than partial unity. She argues, for example, that there is a normative dimension to unified consciousness — conscious states have to cohere semantically for unified consciousness to result (we will return to this issue in Section 6.3). She discusses most of the kinds of breakdown phenomena that we considered earlier, exploring the implications of a wide range of ‘experiments of nature’ and laboratory experiments for the presence or absence of unified consciousness. In particular, she considers acallosal people (people born without a corpus callosum). Even though the corpus callosum, when present, is the chief channel of communication between the hemispheres, acallosal people show all the behavioural signs of having fully unified consciousness.
If so, then the neurological/behavioural basis of unified consciousness would be very different in different people. And if that is so, a hypothesis to which many students of the relationship of consciousness to the brain are attracted is false. Hurley calls it the isomorphism hypothesis. It is the idea that a given kind of change in consciousness will always reflect, even be the result of, a given kind of change in the brain. Hurley's evidence suggests that often two instances of exactly the same change in consciousness go with very different changes in the brain. In the example at hand, unified consciousness is closely linked to an intact, functioning corpus callosum in people who have one. However, in acallosal people, there seems to be the same unity. If so, it has to be achieved by mechanisms (such as cuing activity) that are utterly different from communication though a corpus callosum. And the same can be true the opposite way. Different changes in consciousness can go with the same changes to structure and function in the brain.
Unified consciousness at a given time (synchronic unity) has mainly been our topic so far. We now turn, more briefly, to unified consciousness over time (diachronic unity). As was noted as long ago as Kant, unity across time is required even for such rudimentary mental operations as counting (1781, A103); unity across time is crucial for all cognition of any complexity. Now, unification in consciousness might not be the only way to unite earlier cognitive states (earlier thoughts, earlier experiences) with current ones but it is certainly a central way and the one best known to us.
In its synchronic form, we have suggested that a natural way to think of unified consciousness is in terms of joint consciousness. Diachronically, unified consciousness has an additional feature; it requires retention over time, specifically, retention of earlier experienced contents as one experienced them. What the retention crucial to diachronic unity consists in is a matter of some interest. It is tempting to assume that it is a kind of memory. However, as Husserl already told us, there is reason to be sceptical of this approach. There is a difference between experiencing a succession from time 1 to time 2 and merely remembering experiencing what happened at time 1 while experiencing something at time 2. Dainton captures Husserl's point by noting the difference between “immediate and represented experience — remembering or imagining hearing a tone is not the same as directly experiencing the tone” (Dainton 2000, p. 155; Dainton cites Husserl 1928).
Kelly (2005) raises a similar question. Suppose that one is listening to a melody. It has five notes and the final note is just being played. If one simply recollected the earlier notes, one should experience a chord, not five notes spread out and related to one another in time. Somehow, the earlier notes come ‘date-stamped’ but still available to be integrated with the current experience in a single, temporally-extended, unified experience. Whatever this process is like, it is clearly vital to our kind of unified consciousness. Without it, one could not hear any sequence as a sequence or so much as read a simple sentence. Though some theorists call this across-time process unity of consciousness, a more distinctive name for it would be the continuity of consciousness.
This sort of continuity of consciousness can span very short durations (such as the ‘specious present’). The central insight is that even a seemingly simple, current experience is in fact a continuous experience of more than one instant, and must be if one is to hear a sound or perceive (as opposed to remember) any temporally stretched phenomenon at all. How can one have a unified conscious experience (not just a memory) of duration?
Here again the debate that we mentioned earlier over whether a unified conscious experience is one experience or an assembly of many experiences rears its head. Dainton (2000, Chs. 5–7) takes a continuous, unified experience to include co-conscious experiences as parts. Tye (2003, Ch. 4) urges instead that a diachronically unified experience has multiple contents but no experiences as parts.
In the history of European philosophy at least since Locke, diachronic unified consciousness has been closely linked to personal identity in the philosopher's sense, i.e., continuing to be a single person, one and the same person, across time. (The point of the restriction to philosophy is that clinical psychologists use the term quite differently, as the name for certain aspects of personality and ‘self-conception’.) Whatever may be true of the kind of diachronic unity we just discussed, the kind of diachronic unity associated with personal identity is clearly a kind of memory, specifically, a kind of autobiographical memory. At least since Locke, philosophers have argued that as far back as unified consciousness via the right kind of autobiographical memory extends, there extends the person, one and the same person over all this time. The right kind of autobiographical memory is memory of the having, feeling, or doing of earlier experiences, emotions, actions, and so on. As Locke has it, being the same person just is having the ‘same consciousness’. We must be careful here. There is lots of autobiographical memory that is not memory from the point of view of experiencing. One can remember that so-and-so happened to her without remembering the event, the experience of it, or anything else ‘from the inside’, to use Shoemaker's useful metaphor again. Memory theorists' standard categories are not fine-grained enough for our purposes here.
Some important philosophers have urged that memory-carried diachronic unity is not sufficient for being one person over time. Kant, for example, argued for a dissociation here, in his famous critique of the third paralogism. In Kant's view, continuity sufficient to “retain the thought of the previous subject and so hand it over to the subsequent subject” (1781, A363), continuity sufficient therefore for diachronic unity of consciousness, is quite compatible with the ‘retained thoughts’ being passed from one subject to another, compatible therefore with an utter absence of personal identity. Diachronic unity is not sufficient for personal identity (Brook 1994, Ch. 8). (Note: Locke and Kant may be less far apart than this brief discussion would suggest. We are merely using them to illustrate the two positions, not discussing either of them fully.)
Phenomena relevant to identity in things other than persons can be a matter of degree. This is well illustrated by the famous ship of Theseus. Suppose that over the years, a certain ship was rebuilt, board by board, until every bit of it has been replaced. Is the ship at the end of the process the ship that started the process? Now suppose that we take all those rotten, replaced boards and reassemble them into a ship. Is this ship the original ship? It seems that there is no determinate answer to these questions. Say what you like, and what you like may vary depending on whether you are an insurance adjuster or a history buff. Many philosophers have insisted that such indeterminacy can never be the case for persons. Identity in persons is always completely unambiguous, not something that could ever be a matter of degree (Bishop Joseph Butler  is a well-known example).
Brain bisection cases (described in Section 4.1) in which, some urge, unified consciousness splits in two may be relevant here (Parfit 1971, 1984). As Parfit argues, the possibility of persons (or at any rate minds) splitting and re-fusing puts real pressure on intuitions about our specialness. Perhaps the continuity of persons can be just as tangled and just as much a matter of degree as the continuity of any other middle-sized object.
Two final comments. As we saw, Nagel (1971) argues that there can be indeterminacy in synchronic unity, too. One can sympathize with Parfit about diachronic unity and yet have reservations about Nagel on synchronic unity. Likewise, one should distinguish the question of whether diachronic unity can be intransitive from the question discussed in Section 4.3 of whether synchronic unity can be intransitive.
In the literature, there are quite a range of theoretical claims about unified consciousness. We have looked at some of them. The first group concerned diverging models: the subsumption, co-consciousness, single phenomenal content, and joint consciousness models. Then we looked at the unity thesis, the claim that partial unity is possible, and the claim that there need not be a whole number of centres of consciousness. And we looked, more briefly, at the claim that for unified consciousness, there must be links among conscious states (links that go beyond co-consciousness).
In Section 2, we said that we'd return to the issue of whether or not unified experiences have experiential parts, the issue that underlays subsumption and the other claims that we examined there. It is the topic of Sections 6.1 and 6.2. Near the end of Section 4, we said that we would return to the claim about links. We will do so in Section 6.3. In addition, we will examine a claim that we have not discussed so far, usually called the co-ownership thesis (Section 6.4)
How is unified conscious experience structured? As we mentioned in Section 2.1, two incompatible models have some currency at the moment. On the experiential parts view (EP), unified conscious experience includes simpler experiences as parts or something like parts; unified consciousness has a mereological aspect. On this view, when I have a unified experience of a pain and a noise, this unified experience includes an experience of just the pain, and an experience of just the noise. These simpler experiences are the relata of unified consciousness; they are joined as parts of the unified experience of the pain and noise together. Experiences a and b are united in a third experience, c, which is their joint occurrence. On the no experiential parts (NEP) account, the conscious mental act through which diverse contents are presented does not have other conscious states, experiences, as parts. On the first view, when I have unified consciousness of experiencing, I am conscious of many experiences. On the second view, I am conscious of just one experience.
To clarify the two, let us use the notation ‘E(o1)’ for an experience that is the conscious experience of just the intentional object o1. A conscious experience of just o2 is E(o2). What is the nature of an experience that takes the bigger content in which o1 and o2 are presented together? On NEP, it has the structure of E(o1, o2), where this introduces a single experience that has both contents as its object. To be conscious of o1 by means of this experience is to be conscious of it with o2. (See the concept of joint consciousness introduced in Section 2.) According to NEP, this is what the subject's conscious unity at the time amounts to (if we oversimplify by supposing her to be conscious of nothing but o1 and o2). No ‘smaller’ or simpler conscious states figure as parts. This experience might be realized in a brain state that has parts, but these parts are not further conscious states. By contrast, in EP E(o1) and E(o2) persist as parts of an encompassing experience by means of which one is conscious of o1 and o2 together.
Proponents of EP include Lockwood, Dainton, Shoemaker, and Bayne and Chalmers. As we saw in Section 2.2, theorists as otherwise different as Dainton, Lockwood, and Shoemaker use the term ‘co-consciousness’ as the name for the relationship that ties the experiential parts together. Not only are most versions of EP built on some notion of co-consciousness; most notions of co-consciousness assume EP and are incompatible with NEP.
EP faces a difficulty. James describes the problem in his example of the twelve-word sentence. Suppose each word in the sentence is known by just one of twelve people. It is hard to see, James says, how these twelve thoughts could be combined to yield a unified consciousness of the sentence. As he says,
Take a sentence of a dozen words, take twelve men, and to each one word. Then stand the men in a row or jam them in a bunch, and let each think of his word as intently as he will; nowhere will there be a consciousness of the whole sentence. (James, 1890, p.160)
What EP needs is a way of combining experiences that does not simply conjoin them into an experiential aggregate, for a mere combination of experiences is not the experience of a combination. EP needs, then, a way of putting together experiences that also puts together their contents. Without any specification of how this combining of contents is to be achieved, we are left with a mere aggregate of experiences, each member of which is oblivious to the contents of the other states in the aggregate. As James puts it, “Idea of a + idea of b is not identical with idea of (a + b)” (1890, p. 161).
Proponents of EP may reply that they never intended to give an account of conscious unity. Instead, EP should be taken to provide a description of the structure of unified conscious states. In other words, it is a characterization, not an explanation, of such states and how they are individuated. It may be held that the only good way to individuate conscious states is on the basis of contents. Hence, since one is aware of many contents via a conscious state, that state must itself consist of several simpler conscious states that have (somehow) come to be unified. At the very least, then, those who advocate NEP owe us an alternative basis for individuating conscious states. We will return to this issue in the next section.
As we saw, the notion of a unified experience subsuming simpler experiences is central to Bayne's and Chalmers' (2003) account of the unity of consciousness. This may appear to be a version of EP and Tye treats it so (without using that label) (2003, p. 21). However, Bayne and Chalmers hedge their bet. While they do speak of the encompassing conscious state as involving “at least a conjunction of each of many more specific conscious states” (2003, p. 27), and of a “complex phenomenal state and a simpler state that is intuitively one of its ‘components’” (2003, p. 40), they also caution that thinking here in terms of “a mereological part/whole relation among phenomenal states” should be regarded only as an “aid to intuition rather than as a serious ontological proposal” (2003, p. 40). So how their view stacks up with respect to EP is not entirely clear.
Searle and Tye are leading current advocates of NEP. Searle (2002, p. 56) ventures that “maybe it is wrong to think of consciousness as made up of parts at all.” For I have a “single, unified, conscious field containing visual, auditory, and other aspects” and “there is no such thing as a separate visual consciousness” (2002, p. 55). Do “visual experiences stand to the whole field of consciousness in the part-whole relation?” (2002, p. 54). No, says Searle (though he may do some backsliding later in the article).
Tye offers a similar view, which he dubs the ‘one-experience view’ (Tye 2003, chap. 1). Considering the polymodal nature of our experience, he says, “There are not five different … experiences somehow combined together to produce a new unified experience”. Instead, “there is just one experience here” (2003, p. 27).
Part of what is at stake in this dispute is how to individuate (how to count) experiences. EP theorists think that experiences go one to an object: if you experience two things, you have two experiences. Or even finer: if you experience one thing in two ways, you have had two experiences, some hold. NEP theorists hold that some experiences can be individuated differently; a unified act of conscious experiencing is a single experience, experientially non-composite, no matter how many objects it has.
So what are the arguments for the two views like? Theorists who accept EP usually just assert or even assume it (we saw some examples of this in Section 6.1). The idea just seems intuitively plausible to its adherents and they tend not to argue for it. NEP is not intuitively obvious — even people such as Searle who advocate it can find themselves sliding into EP — and its adherents do argue for it.
James was the first champion of NEP. He endorsed it in the course of repudiating the ‘mind-stuff theory’, according to which “our mental states are composite in structure, made up of smaller states conjoined” (1890, p. 145). Against this James says that, while our experience is complex, this complexity is not a matter of there being several experiences (or ‘feelings’) present in an encompassing experience. This is because “we cannot mix feelings as such, though we may mix the objects we feel, and from their mixture get new feelings” (1890, p. 157). If one's experience appears to become more complex, that is a matter of a single experience's content being more complex, and is not the addition of more experiences (of the diverse contents). Indeed, he says, “We cannot even … have two feelings in mind at once” (1890, p. 157).
Here is how this is supposed to work. If we say that experiences a and b are fused to form experience c, we should treat ‘fused’ as referring to a process in which a and b are superseded by c, not included in it. They have been replaced by c, in which their contents are connected, and they (a and b) no longer exist. As James (1909, p. 189) put it, contrasting the unified consciousness of the whole alphabet with the several states involved in consciousness of each letter taken singly, “It is safer … to treat the consciousness of the alphabet as a twenty-seventh fact, the substitute and not the sum of the twenty-six simpler consciousnesses.” This view clearly avoids the problem of how to combine experiences that faces EP.
Since James had a concept of co-consciousness and we have linked co-consciousness closely to EP, we should say a word about his concept. It is not the same as the concept that we find in Parfit, Lockwood, Hurley, Shoemaker et al. For James, co-consciousness relates only to a multiplicity of items of which one is conscious. In unified conscious experience of them, there is no multiplicity of conscious states to enter a ‘co’-relationship. Indeed, the contents are made co-conscious by being presented together in a single, noncomposite experience.
We will close this discussion with two notes about the relationship of the dispute between EP and NEP to the transparency thesis that we discussed earlier. This is the thesis that we are not directly conscious of our own experiences. (‘Transparent’ here means that while I am conscious via conscious states, I am not conscious of them. I ‘see through’ them, as it were; hence ‘transparency’.) First, all claims for both EP and NEP that we have considered would seem to go through even if the transparency thesis is true. So transparency would not undermine this debate. Secondly, even Tye (2003), who accepts both NEP and transparency, also accepts that NEP does not require or entail transparency. Rather, he seems to think that the transparency thesis is true and, since it is true, this constrains what could be unified in phenomenal unit. Accepting the constraint, he has to say that, “Phenomenal unity is a relation between qualities represented in experience, not between qualities of experiences” (Tye 2003, p. 36), however unintuitive this claim may be. Certainly there are approaches that can both accept NEP and reject transparency. That is true, for example, of those who hold that conscious states are self-representing states, states of which one becomes conscious just by having them. These theorists will hold that one can be directly conscious of one's own acts of representing, yet they could still hold that these acts have an NEP structure.
Now we turn to the idea that unified consciousness of contents and experiencing requires some kind of phenomenally evident relation among the contents of the unified conscious state (in addition to the contents being aspects of a single unified act of consciousness) and some attempts to model this relationship. We might call this the relational model of unified consciousness. It is a descendent of Kant's claim examined in Section 1 that unified consciousness requires conceptual interconnectedness in the objects of consciousness; as he put it, “all appearances stand in a thoroughgoing connection according to necessary laws, and hence stand in a transcendental affinity of which the empirical affinity is the mere consequence” (1781/1787, A113–114). Kant's argument for this claim seems to have been that synthesis of represented objects experienced together into a single complex object is a necessary condition of consciousness of self as single common subject. Without represented objects being tied together in a single complex object, one might be aware of the subject of an individual representation but one could not be aware of the subject of one such representation as the subject of other such representations. Rather, I should have “as many-coloured and diverse a self as I have representations of which I am conscious ...” (B134) — as are in fact had by me, for I would not, of course, be aware that it was me.
One recent expression of the idea is Hurley's (1998) claim that conscious states must satisfy a normative requirement if unified consciousness is to result: they must ‘cohere semantically’. Even more recently, Revonsuo (2003) has urged that phenomenal contents must be situated in the same ‘phenomenal space’ in order to be unified, adding that, “I am inclined to treat phenomeno-spatiality as the basic unifying feature of human consciousness.”
For theorists of this persuasion, these phenomenally evident spatial, causal, etc., relations among contents explain why my perceptual states typically present one coherent world in which, for instance, a wall at one end of my visual field continues across that field. Are such connections among the contents of an experience necessary for their being presented together in experience? Some recent theorists have argued that they are not (Bayne 2004; Brook 2005). I can have unified consciousness of a siren that I am hearing, an average grade that I am calculating, and a fictitious landscape that I am visualizing. In what possible way would items as diverse as these have to be connected to one another? They are not all in space, are not continuous with one another, are certainly not causally interconnected, yet I can experience all three in a single act of unified consciousness.
Doesn't there have to be at least logical coherence among the contents? As we just saw, Hurley (1998) makes this claims, as does Baars (1988). Hurley, for example, argues that we cannot believe mutually inconsistent things both of which we are conscious of in a single unified experience. Could the disconnect among unified conscious states extend to them actually being inconsistent with one another? Contrary to Hurley and Baars, the evidence suggests that it could. Suppose that one sees a stick immersed in water as being bent but feels it to be straight or knows that this is an illusion. Here, one's conscious perception conflicts with one's conscious belief that it is not bent, yet these states are unified in one consciousness (Bayne 2000). Tye (2003, p. 38) does not consider this illusion to be an example of incoherence. He holds that here touch corrects vision, making the stick appear to be straight, and so belief renders the appearance mere appearance. Bayne (2004, p. 227) discusses another example, inverting spectacles. They render one's visual contents inconsistent with one's tactile contents. Yet consciousness of the visual contents remains unified with consciousness of the tactile contents.
In fact, it would seem that there can be incompatibilities even within a perceptual modality. Thus, Tye (2003, pp. 38–39) notes that some pictures depict impossible circumstances. He also discusses the waterfall effect, in which, after staring at a waterfall for some time, if one looks at the adjacent rock face, a portion of the rock surface will appear to be moving, but will also appear not to be moving (relative to the area around it) (see Crane 1988; not everyone accepts that both elements are simultaneously present in the waterfall illusion). These examples suggest that we can have unified consciousness of pretty much any collection of items whatsoever, no matter how they are related to one another. It is not easy to specify any relation among unified contents or acts of experiencing (beyond their being unified) that is required for them to be unified. If so, Hurley's (1998) suggestion that meeting a normative requirement is necessary for unified consciousness, specifically, a requirement that the experienced properties of things in unified consciousness cohere semantically, is in trouble.
Finally, there is a model that holds that unity of conscious states consists in their ownership by a single subject, Bayne's (2004) co-ownership. Is co-ownership meant to be necessary, or sufficient, or both? The idea that unified conscious experience must be had by a single subject could be trivially true, as it would be if the subject at a time is just defined as a set of unified contents. For the thesis to become interesting, advocates of it would have to offer a richer conception of the subject than that. On such a conception, the claim that experiences are had by the same subject would involve their attribution to the same extra-phenomenal substrate or bearer of experiences, one that can be individuated independently of what is to be found in experience, and thus independently of the notion of a unified field of conscious contents. Stated thus, the thesis would not be trivial and may well state a necessary condition of unified consciousness.
However, if co-ownership is necessary, is it also sufficient? It seems that is is possible for items that are not unified with one another to be simultaneously presented to one and the same subject. This seems to happen, for example, in split brain cases, or fictional variations thereof — e.g., Parfit's example of a single subject who is able simultaneously to try out two alternative approaches to solving a math problem (1984, pp. 246–248). This state of affairs would seem to be a case of parallel but nonunified sets of conscious states had by the same subject, in some good sense of the term ‘same subject’. If so, co-ownership would not be sufficient for unity. A fortiori, co-ownership would not capture what is distinctive about unified consciousness. Put differently, if there is a requirement here of any kind, more than co-ownership seems to be needed. The subject must have a certain kind of relationship to the material. As Kant put it, the material must be something to the subject (A116) — and this requires a subject to whom things can be something. Mere ownership by itself would appear to fall short (Brook 1993, pp. 135–9, discusses these issues in connection with Kant).
Thought insertion may pose another problem for the co-ownership thesis. In thought insertion, the alien states are unquestionably co-owned but there is arguably less than full unity of consciousness.
Earlier we saw that instances of diachronic unified consciousness seem to be able to extend beyond one person (by any criterion for being one person other than unified consciousness). The brain bisection cases described earlier suggest roughly the reverse claim about synchronic unity; where there seem to be two instances of unity in one body, by many criteria there is just one person (remember, there is no question about singleness of person outside the laboratory). If so, synchronic unity is not necessary for singleness of person.
We will conclude this article with a brief look at some philosophical speculations about what the neural architecture of unified consciousness might be like. One of the hottest issues in current consciousness research is the issue of how brains achieve consciousness and what parts of the brain are most involved in doing do, what the ‘neural correlates of consciousness’ (NCC) are. Any real insights into the NCCs of consciousness in general are also likely to contain insights into the NCCs of unified consciousness. This literature is so vast that it would take a whole additional article to discuss the topic. (Koch 2004 is an excellent review of the empirical neuroscience and Chalmers 2000 is the most extensive exploration of the conceptual issues to date.) Because of space limitations, here we will restrict ourselves to two of the most influential philosophical approaches to what the neural architecture of consciousness might be like, those of Paul and Patricia Churchland (see for example P. M. Churchland 1995, p. 214) and Daniel Dennett (1991).
The Churchlands' view flows from a radical picture of neural architecture in general. They urge that the architecture of the processes underlying cognition and consciousness consists not of transformations of symbolically encoded representations, as most philosophers have believed, but of vector transformations in what are called phase spaces. Dennett articulates an even more radical view, on both unity and the underlying architecture. For him, unified consciousness of ‘self’ is simply a short-lasting ‘virtual captain’ coming to be as a result of a small group of information- parcels gaining temporary dominance in a struggle with other such groups for control of such cognitive activities as self-monitoring and self-reporting. We take these transient phenomena to be more than they are because each of them is the ‘me’ of the moment and they are tied to earlier transient selves by the special form of autobiographical memory identified earlier. If the temporary coalition of conscious states that is winning at the moment is what I am, is the self, each temporal chunk of ‘self’ is likely to be found in different parts of the brain from other such chunks and there will be many NCCs of unified consciousness in many different places. If so, there would be further reason for scepticism about what Hurley calls the isomorphism hypothesis.
Dennett's and the Churchlands' views fit naturally within a dynamic systems view of the neural implementation of cognition and consciousness, the view that unified consciousness is a result of certain self-organizing activities in the brain. Dennett thinks that given the nature of the brain, nothing more than neurons sending and receiving signals to and from other neurons, cognition could not take any form other than something like a pandemonium of competing bits of content. The Churchlands don't agree with Dennett about this. They see consciousness as a state of the brain, the ‘wetware’, not a result of information processing, of ‘software’. They also advocate a picture of neurological processes different from his. They think that transformations of complex vectors in a multi-dimensional phase space are the crucial processes, not competition among bits of content. Both sides in this debate agree that it is unlikely that the processes that subserve unified consciousness are sentence-like or language-like.
A great deal of work has been done on the unity of consciousness in the past few decades. Our introduction to it has been grouped around the following themes:
- The unity of consciousness is a pervasive, cognitively important feature of our kind of mind.
- Even phenomenal unity at a time comes in a number of forms and consciousness is also unified across time.
- The ways in which unified consciousness can break down raise interesting questions and throw important light on its structure.
- The topic connects to a number of important issues concerning consciousness and cognition, including whether unified consciousness across time plays a role in personal identity (the philosophers' concept of personal identity).
- The state of theorizing on the topic suggests that there is still room for further work.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- Bibliography on the unity of consciousness, maintained by David Chalmers & David Bourget. The most comprehensive bibliography on the topic. The bibliography for the present entry contains references that Chalmers and Bourget do not include but they refer to many works to which no reference is made here.
- Downloadable papers on the unity of consciousness and related topics, maintained by David Chalmers.
- Brain bisection operations (commissurotomies), maintained by Paul Pietsch (Indiana University).