The problem of other minds is the problem of how to justify the almost universal belief that others have minds very like our own. It is one of the hallowed, if nowadays unfashionable, problems in philosophy. Various solutions to the problem are on offer. It is noteworthy that so many are on offer. Even more noteworthy is that none of the solutions on offer can plausibly lay claim to enjoying majority support.
- 1. What is the Problem of Other Minds?
- 2. History
- 3. Solutions to the Problem
- 4. Who Has the Problem?
- 5. The Problem of Other Minds in Continental Philosophy
- 6. Private Language and Other Minds
- 7. Conclusion
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That other human beings are mostly very like ourselves is something about which almost all of us, almost all of the time, are certain. There are exceptions, among them philosophical sceptics, and perhaps those suffering from some abnormal mental condition. We do not, of course, believe that we always or even mostly know about others' inner lives in detail, but we do not doubt that they have an inner life, that they experience the physical world much as we do, rejoice, suffer, have thoughts, beliefs, feelings, emotions, and so on. But what, if anything, justifies our certainty? Philosophers cannot agree on what underpins this most basic of human beliefs.
Unsurprisingly, given that human beings are social, if not all necessarily sociable beings, this lack of agreement is more than a case of philosophers engaging in some abstractly theoretical controversy and contestation. The different positions taken affect our view of what it is like to be the kind of creature we are, and possibly are affected by our view of who we are and our human situation.
There is general agreement among philosophers that the problem of other minds is concerned with the fundamental issue of what entitles us to our basic belief that other human beings do have inner lives rather than whether we are able in specific cases to be sure what is happening in those inner lives.
However, there are (at least) two problems of other minds. There is the epistemological problem, concerned with how our beliefs about mental states other than our own might be justified. There is also a conceptual problem: how is it possible for us to form a concept of mental states other than our own. It is generally thought that the materials used to fashion the epistemological problem are the very same materials that produce the conceptual problem. The conceptual problem is generally raised in the context of solving the epistemological problem. One view here is that there can only be an epistemological problem if the conceptual problem is solved, but solving the conceptual problem solves the epistemological problem (Malcolm 1962a). That would be just as well since otherwise the epistemological problem would still be with us. More straightforwardly, some have thought that the conceptual problem is the difficult one without, tantalizingly, showing how easy it is to solve the epistemological problem (Nagel 1986, 19–20).
Despite the above proposals, and allowing for philosophy's notorious lack of common agreement, it remains worth noting that philosophy provides no generally agreed solution to the problem of other minds.
The epistemological problem is produced by the radical difference that holds between our access to our own experience and our access to the experience of all other human beings. We often know directly that we are in a certain mental state. Typical cases would be where we are in serious pain, are itching, are smelling a rose, seeing a sunflower, are depressed, believe that today is Tuesday, and so forth. We do not always know directly that we are in the mental state we are in but what is striking is that we never have direct knowledge that other human beings are in whatever mental state they are in. It is this stark asymmetry that generates the epistemological problem of other minds.
The asymmetry is a matter of what is known directly and not known directly, and the specific kind of knowledge. It is not a matter of what can be observed, perceived, felt, as opposed to what cannot be observed, perceived, felt. Were I able to observe the mental states of another human being that would not mean that I did not have a problem of other minds. I would still lack what I needed. What I need is the capacity to observe those mental states as mental states belonging to that other human being. They would have to be experienced by me as someone else's mental state. My experience of the other would have to come accompanied by that guarantee, attached as it were to an epistemological label. The situation would only then be as it is in my own case. I would only then be in possession of the direct knowledge that I and all of us forever lack.
It should be noted that just as direct observation is not what we relevantly lack (though most of us mostly do) neither is it direct knowledge as such that is crucial. If we take telepathy, then were it to be accepted that some have this supposed gift, they might be allowed to have the capacity to have direct knowledge of (some of) the inner lives of others. They still would not know directly that those others have any inner life at all. Even if they were to be as it were “plugged in” to another's mental states, they would need what they do not have, direct knowledge that what they are “plugged in” to is, indeed, the inner life of another. They would know directly that there is a pain that they are experiencing but that would not give them the knowledge, the guarantee, that indeed someone else is experiencing that pain. So, the asymmetry that generates the epistemological problem of other minds is that each of us sometimes knows directly that we are in the mental state we are in and we never know directly that someone other than ourself is in the mental state they are in.
It should also be noted that the fact that direct knowledge of whatever sort is lacking does not mean that knowledge is lacking. It means only that direct knowledge is lacking. No more, without supporting argument, does it mean that the best kind of knowledge is lacking.
Three solutions to the other minds problem in its epistemological form seem to be the most popular. Arguably the most common view among those philosophers who have interested themselves in the problem is that the solution takes the form of an inference to the best explanation: that other human beings have inner lives is seen as the best explanation of their behavior. The guiding thought is that the mental states of human beings are what cause them to behave as they do. So, the inference to their having minds is one based on that being the best explanation for the way they behave.
Ordinary persons are most likely to believe in the traditional analogical inference, appealing to the similarity that holds between ourselves and others, as the basis for our certainty about the inner lives of other human beings. The traditional solution to the problem of other minds has been this analogical inference to other minds. Other human beings are very like me. They behave very much as I do in similar circumstances and they are made of the same stuff. When I burn myself it hurts and I cry out and wince. When other people are burned they do the same. I can thus infer that they are in pain too. There are multifarious such similarities. Put more generally, I know directly that I have beliefs, emotions, feelings, sensations and the like. So I am enabled to infer, on the basis of these multifarious similarities, that other people also have beliefs, emotions, experiences and the like. In short, I am entitled to infer that other human beings have as I do, an inner life and that it is very like mine.
The criterial solution insists that the link between behavior and mental states is not an inference to the best explanation, and nor is it any kind of inductive inference. However, nor is the link an entailment (as in behaviorism). The relationship between mental states and behavior is claimed to be conceptual and characterized as criterial.
The conceptual problem follows the same route. If each of us has the kind of direct knowledge we have of our own experience only in the case of those experiences that are ours, by what means could we acquire the concepts we have of mental states belonging to human beings other than ourselves? All experience presents as ours and necessarily presents as ours. Once again, the problem is not that we cannot observe the pains of others. What would be needed for the problem not to arise would be observing such pains, experiencing such pains as, indeed, the pains of others.
The conceptual problem can arise from a different route: how can I extend my concept of pain beyond my own pain? If the response is to enquire what the difficulty is because surely others just are thought to have what I have when I am in pain, we have Wittgenstein's famous rejoinder “But if I suppose that someone has a pain, then I am simply supposing that he has just the same as I have so often had.” That gets us no further. It as if I were to say: “You surely know what ‘It is 5 o'clock here’ means; so you also know what ‘It's 5 o'clock on the sun means. It means simply that it is the same time there as it is here when it is 5 o'clock.” (Wittgenstein 1953, 350). Kripke thinks Wittgenstein's position on this issue can be linked with Hume and his failure, on looking inside himself, to find any self (Kripke 1982, Postscript). If there is no self to whom a pain belongs then there is no question of moving from my pain to that of others'.
A solution to the conceptual problem would seem to leave us with the epistemological problem. However, it should be noted that often the conceptual problem is claimed to arise only if the asymmetry outlined is accepted and then it is argued that once it has arisen the problem is insoluble because the supposed problem could not then even be articulated. The statement of the argument is claimed to result in a reductio. The conceptual problem has received much less attention than the epistemological problem and that will be the case here. There is a comprehensive treatment of the conceptual problem by Avramides (2001, particularly part three). Both McGinn (1984) and Nagel (1986, chapter 11, especially section 3) are essential reading; as is Wittgenstein (q.v.) who is responsible for the emergence of the conceptual problem as a significant issue in the problem of other minds. From here on my focus will be the epistemological problem rather than the conceptual problem.
It is noteworthy that the other minds problem came to prominence as a philosophical problem only as recently as the nineteenth century, when John Stuart Mill gave us what is generally regarded as a version of the analogical inference to other minds. Mill's version has as its centerpiece the causal link between our mental states and our behavior. The problem was clearly enough waiting to be noted as far back as Descartes and his separation of mind from body and his view that only human animals had minds. However, it does not seem that Descartes noticed it as a separate problem. A similar situation would seem to apply with John Locke, given his belief that the mind of another is invisible (Locke, 111.ii.1, 404–405).
Before Mill, it would seem that Thomas Reid should be credited with seeing that there was a serious philosophical issue concerning other minds (Avramides 2001, ch., VI). Indeed, it seems that the first frequent use of the words ‘other minds’ is to be credited to him (Somerville 1989, 249). However, those minds are not observable. Nor is our belief that they exist to be reached or supported by reasoning. For Reid it is self-evident, an innate belief, that there are minds other than one's own.
The analogical inference to other minds held sway until about the middle of the twentieth century. Increasingly argued to be problematic, the analogical inference lost ground within philosophy. It was widely thought to be inadequate because of two of its features. The first was that the conclusion was not only uncheckable but was such that it was logically impossible to check up on it. The second was that the argument seemed to be an inductive generalization based on only one case. This second feature was thought to be problematic in itself but was thought by many to have as a consequence that each of us learns only from our own case what it is to be in pain or some other mental state. This consequence was thought to be completely unacceptable.
The more favoured notion that emerged from these difficulties besetting the analogical inference (strongly influenced by Wittgenstein's writings on the nature of first and third person psychological statements) was that criterial evidence could deal with the problem in a way that avoided the problems besetting the analogical inference. An adjacent view, though distinct, was that we are able, at least in enough cases, to know directly that other human beings have minds.
Widespread dissatisfaction with the views outlined so far increasingly led Anglo-American philosophers to the view that the best explanation for how other human beings behave is that they behave as they do because their behavior is caused by (their) mental states. However, all of the views remain in play and (variously) contested.
This section provides a more detailed discussion of the proposed solutions to the epistemological problem.
The traditional solution to the problem of other minds has been the analogical inference to other minds. Other human beings are very like me. They behave very much as I do in similar circumstances and they are made of the same stuff. When I burn myself it hurts and I cry out and wince. When other people are burned they do the same. I can thus infer that they are in pain too. There are multifarious such similarities. Put more generally, I know directly that I have beliefs, emotions, feelings, sensations and the like. So I am enabled to infer on the basis of these multifarious similarities that other people also have beliefs, emotions, experiences and the like. In short, I am entitled to infer that other human beings have an inner life and that it is very like mine.
Defenders of the analogical inference to other minds now generally present it in a hybrid form incorporating an inference to the best explanation (scientific inference, hypothetic inference) (Melnyk 1994). That there are, inevitably, different hypotheses about human beings to which the present one is to be preferred requires that the argument incorporate a hypothetic inference. But the roles played by the similarities between ourselves and others and by the analogical arguer's own experience remain crucial in this hybrid analogical/hypothetic inference.
Given the asymmetry which is at the heart of the problem of other minds this inference is, however, an inference to a conclusion that cannot be checked up on. It is not a matter of contingent fact that it cannot be checked up on. It is logically impossible to do that. This is the first classical objection to the analogical inference. That it is logically impossible to check up on the conclusion has been viewed as a decisive objection to the inference (Ryle 1949, 15). However, hypotheses endemic in science are in practice such that they can never be directly checked up on. This impossibility is empirical, not logical, but the difference seems irrelevant to the evidential status of the respective inferences. So the objection in its present form fails.
A developed form of the objection argues that any acceptable analogical argument must rest on a correlation that has been established independently and that resulting from the impossibility of checking up on the analogical inference's conclusion there can be no such independently established correlation (Ryle 1949, 52). But this developed form fails because such a correlation is available to the analogical arguer, viz., one established in one's own case (between one's mental states and behavior).
Another form begins by noting that this analogical argument proceeds from what is known directly to what can be known only indirectly. It is then claimed that an indirect analogical argument is acceptable provided that it is possible to check up directly on its conclusion but, of course, this analogical argument cannot run that test. However, this version of the objection fails. That it is possible to get additional evidence to the evidence one has cannot alter the status of the evidence one has (Wellman 1961, 292–293)!
It is appropriate here to point out that comfort ought not to be taken from the possibility of directly verifying an analogical argument's conclusion. That possibility is inseparable from the possibility of directly refuting the conclusion (Hyslop and Jackson 1972, 169–170) . So if the former counts in favour of the argument the latter counts against. They neutralize one another, leaving the status of the argument untouched.
However, the analogical arguer's own experience is crucial to the analogical inference. This becomes the target of the classical and ongoing objection to this inference; that it is a generalization based on one case only and therefore fatally unsound (e.g., Malcolm, 1962a, 152). This feature is seen as so problematic that the one element common to all other responses to the problem of other minds is a desire to avoid having our own experience play the central role in the evidence.
Some of its supporters (most famously, A.J. Ayer) have sought to characterize the analogical inference to other minds in a form that avoids this objection. They have presented the analogical argument as based on the multitude of correlations between mental states and behavior that one has observed in one's own case rather than as a generalization proceeding from just one observed case (Ayer 1956, 219–222). It is then pointed out that though it is true that all the correlations are with the analogical arguer's own experience, it is often the case that sound inductive inferences proceed from an observational base having common properties (Melnyk 1994, 488). However, this attempt to avoid the objection fails. Despite the multitude of correlations it is just not true that all instances of human behavior in one's own case are observed to be accompanied by mental states. So the conclusion to be drawn, were we proceeding from this multitude of correlations, could only be that many instances of behavior are associated with mental states. But this is not the conclusion we need. Such a conclusion is compatible with some human bodies which behave just as one's own body does, not having any associated mental states. The conclusion we need is that for every human body which behaves much as one's own does, it is the case that many instances of its behavior are accompanied by mental states (Hyslop and Jackson 1972). Without such a conclusion each of us would have to live in the awareness that, for all each of us knows, our immediate contacts are entirely with non-persons.
Those defenders of the analogical inference who accept that it is an inference based on one case, obviously insist also that the analogical/hypothetic inference remains a sound inference. They claim that what is needed is a causal link between events, in this case between mental events and other events. The demand for more than one case is legitimate where more than one case is needed to establish a causal link between events. However, one case will be enough when that one case can establish that the link holds. It is argued that we have sufficient resources available from our own case to establish that the relevant causal link holds (Hyslop and Jackson 1972).
The standard view is that the relevant causal link is that holding between mental states and behavior (Mill 1865; Hyslop and Jackson; 1972). Mental states are seen as lying behind and explaining our behavior. However, it has been urged against this view that the relevant causal link needs to be that holding between bodily states (in fact, brain states) and mental states (Hyslop 1995, 36–39 and 53–54). That is the only way the analogical/hypothetic inference will give the desired result. Otherwise we are depending on the dubious principle that like effects have like causes.
The guiding thought here is that the mental states of human beings are what cause them to behave as they do. So the inference to their having minds is one based on that being the best explanation for the way they behave. It is appropriately referred to as a scientific inference in that, as standardly in science, no evidence depending on direct observation of mental states is used to support this inference. The evidence is indirect and does not bring in our own experience. We achieve success while depending, as far as the evidence is concerned, only on the external perspective. So the inference escapes the one case objection to the analogical inference to other minds (Pargetter 1984). At any rate, so it is believed. Of course it does not escape the other objection to that inference: it, too, is an inference to an uncheckable conclusion.
Pressure has been brought to bear against this approach by its opponents. They argue that beliefs about the intrinsic content of mental states cannot be supported by this method (Melynk 1994). The difficulty is seen most clearly in the case of phenomenal properties such as the hurtfulness of pain. Such content can only be obtained by bringing in evidence only available in one's own experience.
It is widely believed that packaging other minds as theoretical entities will present no problems if one has a functionalist (or some such) view of the mind. The two seem made for each other. However, as outlined later (section 4) it has been argued against this that no theory of mind has an advantage over any other in supporting belief in other minds (Hyslop 1995, chapter 3).
The criterial solution depends on the claim that the link between behavior and mental states is not an inductive inference. Nor is the link an entailment (as in behaviorism). The relationship between mental states and behavior is claimed to be conceptual and characterized as criterial (Malcolm 1962b). So behavior is regarded as a criterion for the presence of mental states. Wittgenstein (1953) is the philosopher most famously associated with criteria and there is a useful interpretation in Malcolm (1962b) of his use of the notion. However, it is not easy to be sure about Wittgenstein's views. They do not lend themselves to standard categorization. Some criterialists have argued that without such a non-inferential connection we would not be able to have any concept of another's experience (Malcolm 1962b). Criterialists have argued that they avoid the one case problem by avoiding the use of any form of inference.
The relationship that holds between itching and scratching is claimed to be an example of such a non-inferential link. Itching is claimed to be conceptually linked to scratching and not merely contingently correlated with scratching. Our concept of itching links itching with scratching. To itch causes the itcher to scratch or disposes the itcher to scratch. It is then urged that scratching is thereby evidence of itching (Aune 1963).
That there are such conceptual links has been a matter of some controversy. Even more controversial is the claim that they provide a sufficient basis for belief in the mental states of other people. It would not be enough to be provided with evidence. We need evidence that is sufficiently strong. In this case we need to be provided with evidence that entitles us to certainty.
Those who have taken issue with the use of criteria to support belief in other minds have argued that the claimed conceptual links fail to bridge the gap between observed behavior and the unobserved inner states to which they are conceptually linked (McDowell 1982). In the absence of any form of inductive inference, and with no entailment directly from the one to the other, it is argued that we are left with the gap. The gap cannot be crossed by fiat, as it were.
One way of understanding what Wittgenstein (1953, 178) called the attitudinal approach to other minds is to see it as a variant of the criterial solution (Hyslop 1995, chapter 8). But it goes beyond other uses of criteria in its insistence that our conception of other human figures is that they are souls and have experiences. That is, our attitude to them is built in, as it were. That is how we perceive them. It is immediate — not involving inference, preceding any belief, and deeper than any belief. This version of the criterial view seems, however, to inherit the criterial gap. It seems plausible that there are attitudes to things and people which are deeper and more immediate than inferential belief. However, it is unsurprising that whichever way we conceive of reality, those conceptions might be mistaken. Indeed, some would seem to be mistaken (such as racist and sexist attitudes).
One way of responding to a highly contested philosophical problem is to deny that there is, in fact, a problem. Another is to accept that there is, indeed, a problem, but one that is dealt with easily. The problem is tamed rather than put down.
Some have denied that there is a problem by claiming that the mental states of others are not hidden from us (Zemach 1966). We have a direct awareness of those mental states. So we have the direct knowledge that those arguing that there is a problem claim we lack. Thus the dreaded asymmetry supposedly holding between ourselves and others does not exist. This has generally been seen as implausible.
However, there is a strand of thinking within feminism that would seem to reject the asymmetry where that asymmetry is seen as typical of masculinist individualist thinking (Overall 1988). The thought is that it is experience alienated from others that allows the problem of other minds to seem, indeed, a problem, and such experience is typically men's experience. The claim is that women, typically, feel themselves to be at one with others, both men and women.
More recently, what has been characterized as a perceptual model for our knowledge of other minds has been put forward (Cassam 2007). However, this model accepts that we do not see another's anger. The central claim is that we can see that another is angry, know this on the basis of visual evidence, the displaying of anger. It is additionally claimed that this display provides us with a (non-inferential) reason for believing the other is angry. It is not obvious that this model can withstand the analogical arguer's skepticism about how the visual evidence can be supported as, indeed, evidence without bringing in at some stage our own experience. See also Section 5.
Though philosophical theories of mind tend to accept the asymmetry, and thus cannot escape the problem of other minds, it is not generally thought that those theories are faced with a uniformly difficult problem of other minds. Philosophical behaviorism in particular is a theory of mind that is believed to have no difficulty in solving the problem. Where it is thought that being in a mental state is a matter of how one behaves or is disposed to behave, there is no great difficulty in knowing about the behavior and even the behavioral dispositions of another human being.
Another theory of mind, functionalism, would seem to accept that there is a problem of other minds but one which presents little difficulty. Mental states are conceived of as inner states which are the means by which an organism responds to its surroundings. The different mental states are characterized by their various roles, their typical causes and effects. They are in this way alone distinguished one from another. So a burning pain is that inner state typically caused by being burned and typically leading to wincing and crying out and such like behavior. It follows that all that is required to reach the conclusion that other human beings have such inner states is merely careful observation of how they behave and in what circumstances.
Eliminative materialism boldly banishes mental states from existence and so the problem of other minds completely vanishes. If there are no minds there can be no problem of other minds.
However, as against this picture of various escape routes from the problem, it has been claimed that the problem cannot be avoided by a careful selection of a theory of mind or mind's non-existence (Hyslop 1995, chapter 2). The argument is that no theory of mind escapes the other minds problem and that all such theories have an equally difficult problem. Any theory of mind is a general theory, so is a theory of minds (or, in the case of eliminative materialism, their non-existence). So it has to embrace minds wherever they are found, or fail to be found. So it has to cover all human beings, oneself and others.
But how does the theorist know that minds exist, or do not exist? The theory is to hold of minds in general, to be inclusive of other hunan beings in particular, so it cannot legitimately be used to justify the claim that those other minds do, in fact, exist. That the theory is a true theory depends on some independent justification that such minds exist. To take a specific theory of mind: to argue that functionalism makes the other minds problem straightforwardly soluble is unacceptable. Functionalism cannot be known to hold of minds in general unless it holds of other minds and that cannot be known unless those minds have been shown to exist. Eliminative materialism transposes the issue to the negative.
Furthermore, it has been a particular focus in this line of argument that a theory of mind needs to fit the theorist's own mind as well as all other minds. So the evidence brought to bear (invariably only implicitly) on “testing” how successful the theory of mind is, will have been that the theory fits the evidence available to the theorist. That evidence will crucially involve the theorist's own experience. That is the only way direct evidence in its favour can be obtained. So the theorist's experience is crucial.
In Continental Philosophy, perhaps Husserl can be credited with establishing the problem of other minds as serious and challenging. However, its place within Continental Philosophy is not easy to characterize. The problem itself does not exist within Continental Philosophy as a named definable problem. Nor, insofar as it can be located, can it be claimed to be generally treated as an epistemological problem or as a conceptual problem. The relevant writings are found among those concerned with the human subject, human identity, our experience of selfhood, our experience of others, our relations with others, how others affect us, how others are essentially involved in our sense of ourselves. The distinction between the epistemological and the conceptual is not marked, and often in these writings philosophical and psychological matters seem deeply entangled.
Continental Philosophy has also in various ways taken positions that either insist on our capacity to directly experience the other, or take issue with the idea that there is a radical asymmetry between our experience of ourselves and our experience of others. Husserl can be seen as attached to the former. He seemed faced with the problem that his transcendental philosophy led to solipsism. His way out took the form of insisting that our experience of the objective world was at the same time an experience of others (Husserl 1931, Fifth Meditation).
Heidegger can be seen as embracing both views. He does not seek to establish that other human beings exist. His is an ontological rather an epistemological enterprise. Others are necessarily present in the kind of existence each of us has. They are there at the centre of our way of being. For him, too, we are in the world and that world is a world constituted with others. Our Being is with others rather than with knowing others.
Sartre seems to straddle both. He takes the view that other people are needed for us to acquire our own sense of ourselves as persons (1958, part 3, chapter 1). So our sense of others is seen as prior to our sense of self. Awareness of others would seem to precede full awareness of ourselves. If there is any significant asymmetry it would seem to be the reverse asymmetry (Hyslop 2000). Sartre did not think it was possible to “solve” the problem of other minds in that reasons were not to be found that would in the traditional way support our belief in the existence of other people. However, he was certain that others existed. We come across the Other in our experience and crucially in the experience of being looked at. The famous example is of my being, as I think, caught in some shameful act. In such a case, Sartre claims that I apprehend directly, in my very being, the other person. But in doing so, in being looked at in that situation, I am transformed. I become aware of my full being as a human subject. Our very being has others at its centre.
Merleau-Ponty addresses the problem of other minds in Part Two, Chapter 4 of the Phenomenology of Perception. He claims that each of us experiences the world as shared with others. Our experience of the world includes and is dependent upon experience of the social world. Fundamental to his treatment of other minds is his insistence that the human body is a psychophysical whole. To perceive a human body in action is to perceive, directly, a person. He also argues that I am not more certain of my own existence than I am certain of the existence of others.
Overgaard (2012), in considering a number of perceptual approaches, has channelled Merleau-Ponty in arguing that emotions can be visible. However, it seems accepted that there is a difference between a genuine expression of anger and mere pretence and that difference need not show up in behaviour. Nevertheless, it is argued that if it is genuine the anger will be visible. What seems problematic is that this falls crucially short of its being seen to be the case, and, thereby, its being known to be the case, that what is seen is, in fact, genuine anger.
Broadly, Continental philosophy often sees human beings as essentially social beings. We are thought to exist at our deepest level in and as a community. We depend on others not merely for our existence, but for our very sense of ourselves, and our awareness of others is claimed to be at the heart of our awareness of ourselves.
Opposed to this view are those who see each of us as aware of ourselves and our experience in a way that we can never be with respect to any other human being. Self enclosed, we are seen as needing to reach an understanding of the inner lives of others, somehow, on the basis of our own unique awareness of our inner lives. However, this denies us the comfort of a more direct closeness. We live forever with a gap between ourselves and others.
To have one or the other of these two diametrically opposed views is to differ profoundly on fundamental human experience. Each can lead to very different conceptions of human existence and interpersonal relationships, and, indeed, to different ways of living, and different relationships.
It has been universally accepted that natural languages are a communal, shared activity, a kind of public property. Some have insisted that they are essentially public. One way of understanding this claim is famously associated with Wittgenstein. A necessarily private language, one which is such that it can, in principle, be understood by only one person, is (logically) impossible.
The connection with the problem of other minds emerges out of the grounds advanced for the claim that a necessarily private language is impossible. The case made out for the impossibility threatens directly the analogical inference to other minds.
It is argued that a language has to be, in principle, subject to checking by someone other than an individual user of the language (Wittgenstein 1953, 258). A necessarily private language would be unable to meet this condition. Generally, a user of the analogical inference to other minds is in breach of this principle. That inference assumes that each of us knows what psychological terms mean (or,at any rate, some of them) from our own case, and only from our own case. Were such an assumption true, it would follow that the relevant usage would not then be, in principle, one that could be checked for consistency. Functionalists, by contrast, do not make such an assumption. So the private language argument connects with the problem of other minds only where a particular solution to that problem involves a dependence on such an assumption.
The argument that it must be possible in principle to check that a language user is using a term in that language correctly, has generally been that in the absence of that possibility no distinction can be made between its seeming to the language user that their usage is consistent, and its being so. They have nothing to go on other than how it seems to them. So error has no purchase. The issue has been vigorously contested (Blackburn 1974–75; Candlish 1980; Canfield 2001; Strawson 1954).
The impossibility of a private language has not generally been used directly as an argument for the existence of other minds. Nor should it be. After all, the claim is that a language has to be such that a user could in principle be checked up on, whether or not they could, in actual fact, be checked up on. So Robinson Crusoe can be allowed the comfort of language.
This article has been almost entirely concerned with the epistemological problem of other minds. What generates the problem has been carefully delineated. The standard solutions have been outlined and the various critical responses discussed. What is clear is that there does not seem to be what might be called a received solution to the problem. It has been argued that the problem cannot be removed, nor can it be made easier to solve, by embracing any particular philosophy of mind.
- Aune, B., 1963, Feelings, Moods and Introspection, Mind, 62: 187–208.
- Avramides, A., 2001, Other Minds, London: Routledge.
- Ayer, A.J., 1963, The Concept of a Person, London: Macmillan.
- Blackburn, S., 1974–75, “How to Refer to Private Experience”, Aristotelian Society Proceedings, 75: 201–213.
- Buford, T.O. (ed.), 1970, Essays on Other Minds, Chicago: University of Illinois Press.
- Candlish, S., 1980, “The Real Private Language Argument”, Philosophy, 55: 85–94.
- Canfield, J. V., 2001, “Private Language: the Diary Case”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 79: 377–394.
- Cassam, Q., 2007, The Possibility of Knowledge, Oxford, Clarendon Press. (See especially Chapter 5: Other Minds.)
- Gomes, A., 2009, “Other Minds and Perceived Identity”, Dialectica, 63: 219–230.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- Other Minds, Chapter 6 of Epistemology Notes, by Michael Tooley (Philosophy, U. Colorado/Boulder).
- MIT Course 24.500, Other Minds, Spring 2003, Instructor: Professor Alex Byrne (Linguistics and Philosophy/MIT), in the MIT OpenCourseWare project.
- Solipsism and the Problem of Other Minds by Stephen P. Thornton (Philosophy/U. Limerick), in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
The editors would like to thank Roger Eichorn for bringing a variety of phrasing and formatting infelicities to our attention.