Eternity

First published Fri Jan 20, 2006; substantive revision Thu Feb 4, 2010

Concepts of eternity have developed in a way that is, as a matter of fact, closely connected to the development of the concept of God in Western thought, beginning with ancient Greek philosophers; particularly to the idea of God's relation to time, the idea of divine perfection, and the Creator-creature distinction. Eternity as timelessness, and eternity as everlastingness, have been distinguished. Following the work of Boethius and Augustine of Hippo divine timelessness became the dominant view. In more recent times, those who stress a more anthropomorphic account of God, or God's immanence within human history, have favored divine everlastingness. The debate has been sharpened by the use of McTaggart's distinction between A-series and B-series accounts of temporal sequence.


1. Etymology

The English word ‘eternal’ comes from aeturnus in Latin, itself a derivation from aevum, an age or time. So ‘eternity’ means everlastingness. However, in the course of philosophical discussion the idea of everlastingness has been further refined, and two contrasting concepts can be denoted by it. It is usual to make the contrast clear by calling one of these ‘eternity’ or ‘atemporality’ and the other ‘sempiternity’ or ‘everlastingness'.

2. The loci classici

The richest and longest discussions of eternity have been in connection with the manner of God's life. The loci classici of this discussion, which makes the contrast between everlastingness and eternity clearer, and at the same time establishes what came to be the dominant account of eternity in western philosophy and theology, are to be found in Book XI of the Confessions of Augustine (354–430) and Book V of Boethius's (480–c.525) The Consolation of Philosophy. (The extent to which the platonism of Philo of Alexandria (c. 25 B.C.–40 A.D.), particularly applied to the idea of creation (for example, in his De opificio mundi) was influential is not clear.) However, the styles of these two thinkers are very different. Boethius presents the idea of divine eternity as straightforward and relatively problem-free, while Augustine wrestles with the idea and expresses continual puzzlement and indeed amazement at the idea of time itself and with it the contrasting idea of divine eternality.

In Boethius the contrast (which Boethius believes to be a ‘common judgement’) is drawn between timeless eternity which only God enjoys, and the sempiternity which (according to Plato) the world itself possesses.

It is the common judgement, then, of all creatures that live by reason that God is eternal. So let us consider the nature of eternity, for this will make clear to us both the nature of God and his manner of knowing. Eternity, then, is the complete, simultaneous and perfect possession of everlasting life; this will be clear from a comparison with creatures that exist in time.

…for it is one thing to progress like the world in Plato's theory through everlasting life, and another thing to have embraced the whole of everlasting life in one simultaneous present. (Boethius Consolation, V.VI.)

God has life, so eternity in this sense cannot also be possessed by abstract ideas or numbers. God's life is ‘at once’, simultaneous. Boethius invokes this idea in order to resolve the problem of providence. If God knows beforehand what I shall do then how can I be free not to do it? His answer is that this problem dissolves in the face of the fact that God does not know anything beforehand but has an immediate, atemporal knowledge of all things.

In Augustine the connection is made between divine eternity and divine fullness, and of God, existing timelessly, being the cause of all times.

What times existed which were not brought into being by you? Or how could they pass if they never had existence? Since, therefore, you are the cause of all times, if any time existed before you made heaven and earth, how can anyone say that you abstained from working? (Augustine, Confessions, XI. xiii (15)).

It is not in time that you precede times. Otherwise you would not precede all times. In the sublimity of an eternity which is always in the present, you are before all things past and transcend all things future, because they are still to come. (Augustine Confessions XI. xiii (16)).

In you it is not one thing to be and another to live: the supreme degree of being and the supreme degree of life are one and the same thing. You are being in a supreme degree and are immutable. In you the present day has no ending, and yet in you it has its end: ‘all these things have their being in you’ (Rom.11.36). They would have no way of passing away unless you set a limit to them. Because ‘your years do not fail’ (Ps.101.28), your years are one Today. (Augustine Confessions, I. vi (10)),

3. The Eternalist View

So, beginning with Augustine and Boethius, many thinkers have held the view that God exists apart from time, or outside time. He possesses life all at once. But the expression ‘all at once’ is not meant to indicate a moment of time, but the absence of temporal sequence, though not, in the view of some, the absence of duration. So it is not that God has always existed, for as long as time has existed, and that he always will exist, but that God does not exist in time at all. He is apart from his creation, transcendent over it. Eternalists such as Augustine and Boethius deliberately reject the idea that God is everlasting, or sempiternal, that for any time t God exists at that time.

On this view there is a radical and sharp distinction between the Creator and his creation. Among the marks of the Creator is that he exists necessarily, and is timeless and changeless, while his creation is contingent, and its changes are marked by time. Some, such as Augustine, suggest that God created the universe with time and if time is what you get when things change, then this seems an attractive proposal. Time is not a substance or a thing, but a relation between things, or more exactly a relation between changes in things.

What helps to form the thought that God is timeless (and spaceless) is the idea, surely a basic intuition of ‘Abrahamic’ theism, that God has fullness or self-sufficiency or perfection. Part of God's perfection is that he is changeless; he cannot change for the worse, and does not need to change for the better. He exists as a complete, entire unity, together. His existence is not spread out in time or in space, as the existence of material objects is, but his existence is all at once.

Those in time are bound by it, in this sense, that they cannot stop the process of change and therefore of time. They are the subjects of time, not its masters. In a sense, they are more the masters of space than they are of time, for they can choose to remain at the same physical location for a time, but they cannot choose to remain at some particular time. In this respect the hymn-writer Isaac Watts was perfectly correct when he compared time to an ‘ever-rolling stream’ which ‘bears all its sons away’.

Another feature of time is that those who exist in time have lives which are successive. Their memories are of parts that existed earlier, present awareness is of that part that exists now, (or perhaps a short time earlier) and hopes and expectations concern those parts that exist later. If God is in time in the sort of way that human beings are in time it follows that he has earlier and later phases. At any time, a part of his life is earlier than other parts. On the reasonable supposition that he has always existed there is a series of parts that is backwardly everlasting. There never was a time when God was not. Nevertheless it follows from the supposition that God is in time that there are segments of his life which together constitute a part of God's life that are presently inaccessible to him except by memory. And the eternalist will say that such an idea is incompatible with God's fullness and self-sufficiency. For how could God be restricted in this way?

4. Sources in antiquity

As noted, Boethius found the source of the idea of eternity which he attributes to God in Plato. In the Timaeus (37E6–38A6) Plato contrasts the eternal forms with the time-bound created world, the world of mutation and becoming, for time was created along with the heaven (38B5), meaning at least that time is the measure of change, and perhaps that it is identical with the movements of the heavenly bodies, a view later critiqued by Augustine (Confessions, Book XI. xxiii) Plato's idea of eternity in the Timaeus seems to be that of timeless duration, for the Forms endure in the temporal order in which ‘time is the moving image of eternity’. It is possible to trace a similar idea of timeless eternity back to Parmenides, though exactly what he means is the subject of scholarly dispute.

While in some places at least Plato connected the necessary character of the Forms, including mathematical objects, to eternity, in Aristotle the connection is between necessity and sempiternity. What is necessary is what exists for all times. What is contingent is what at some time might not be. God, being necessary, is sempiternal. Nevertheless it may be said that the sempiternal is not bounded by time (in a weaker sense than Plato ascribes to the Forms) in that what exists sempiternally cannot age. (Physics 221b30) Philo of Alexandria is reckoned to be the first to ascribe timelessness to God, to the God of the Jewish Scriptures. In Plotinus (ca. 185–254) timeless eternity and life are for the first time identified together. Nous is eternal and beyond time, enjoying duration without succession.

5. Eternality in theology and religion

The importance of Augustine and Boethius for developing the idea of eternality has already been noted. Anselm (c. 1033–1109) presents a similar view.

Suppose, on the other hand, that it exists as a whole in individual times severally and distinctly. (A human being, for instance, exists as a whole yesterday, today and tomorrow.) In this case we should, properly, say that it was, is and will be. In which case its time-span is not simultaneously a whole. Rather it is stretched out in parts through the parts of time. But its time-span is its eternity and its eternity is precisely itself. The supreme essence, therefore, would be cut up into parts along the divisions of time. (Anselm Monologion, Ch. 21)

In the Proslogion Anselm articulates for the first time a ‘grammar’ of the divine powers, what it makes sense to say of the most perfect being, including that being's timelessness.

6. Medieval thinkers

It is in the medieval period that discussion of eternity embraces not only Christian but Jewish and Islamic thinkers, often in controversy among themselves. In keeping with the sharp line drawn between the Creator and all that is created, medieval thinkers such as Thomas and the Jewish thinker Moses Maimonides (1131–1204) (who greatly influenced Aquinas) thought that God's timeless eternity ought to be understood primarily in negative terms. For Aquinas God's eternity is unending, lacking both beginning and end, and an instantaneous whole lacking successiveness) It is a correlate of divine simplicity, and so incapable of being defined or fully grasped by a creature. Part of what it means to say that God is incomprehensible is to say that though we believe that God is timeless we do not and cannot have a straightforward understanding of what his timeless life is, of what it is like to be timeless. For Aquinas also timeless eternity constituted part of the ‘grammar’ of talking about God. Since God is eternal it does not make any sense to ask how many years God has existed, or whether he is growing old, or what will he be doing later on in the year. And he is immutable: it does not make sense to ask whether God could change.

Despite differences with Thomas Aquinas regarding the nature of God's relation to time, Duns Scotus (c.1266–1308) upheld divine timelessness. In general, it would seem that commitment to divine simplicity, widespread if not universal in the medieval period, entails a commitment to divine eternality.

7. Modern philosophical debates

Modern discussion of the notion of eternity in a theological context has followed the trajectory set by this historical pattern, dividing itself into (broadly) eternalist and sempiternalist approaches to understanding God's relation to time. Debate has been sharpened and clarified by the use of the distinction propounded by J.M.E. McTaggart (1866–1925) between an A–series view of time, (in which the temporal series is characterised as if from some point within it, using temporal indexicals such as ‘tomorrow, ‘now’, ‘then’, ‘past’ and ‘future’) and a B-series view, in which the temporal series is characterised simply by the ‘earlier than’, ‘later than’, ‘simultaneous with’ relations between events, from a standpoint that is indifferent to its own temporal position. (McTaggart, 1908)

7.1 Eternalism

Laying aside theological arguments drawn from Scripture, the central argument for eternalism derives from a consideration of the implications of divine fullness and perfection.

A number of contemporary thinkers such as Paul Helm, in Eternal God, and Katherin Rogers, in Perfect Being Theology, argue that for God, who exists timelessly, the temporal order is a B-series, all times being equally present to his mind. On the eternalist view of creation, God creates the universe as a temporally ordered B-series, according to which every event in that universe is, tenselessly, either before, after or simultaneous with every other event in the universe. But God is in no temporal relation to this B series, not even in the tenseless relation that, according to the B theory, any event in the universe is to any other event in it.

How does thinking of time as a B-series help in our understanding of creation by a timeless God? On that view, as we have seen, each event is tenselessly related to each other. The Battle of Hastings has a fixed, tenseless but nonetheless temporal relation with the Battle of Waterloo. How does this help? By enabling us to think of the temporal series from a standpoint that is indifferent to any point within it. From this it is a short step to thinking of God as occupying a standpoint outside that series, a timeless standpoint that entails a tenseless relation between all events but which is not entailed by it.

Some Jewish and Christian writers read off God's eternality from the requirements of the Commandment forbidding the making and worshipping of graven images, which imply the falsity of any depiction of God using materials drawn from any aspect of the creation. (See the discussion of the variety of Jewish responses to the idea of the representation of God by artefacts in Moshe Halbertal and Avishai Margolit,(1992, Ch.2. For a classic Christian response, see John Calvin, (1960 II.8) More philosophically, God lacks potential, and cannot fail to exist his existence, nor is there anything about God that is accidental, or composite, for then God would depend on what is (logically) prior to him, and would be caused to be, and so not be the first cause.

A critic may say that such a sharp distinction between the Creator and the creature does not do justice to the idea that the creation may bear the character of the Creator and so in some respects resemble him. It may also be argued that the idea of perfection is a flexible one and that though it may be reasonable to interpret perfection in Anselmic fashion, other conceptions of perfection in which God is understood temporally are not unreasonable.

Certain contemporary writers, such as Eleonore Stump, Norman Kretzmann, and Brian Leftow, who have defended the idea of divine timelessness, have sought to modify this stark picture by insisting that God's timeless eternity has some of the features of temporal duration. In this they have followed an important strand in the tradition going back to Boethius.

However it has been argued (e.g. by Sir Anthony Kenny and Richard Swinburne) that for all its distinguished theological pedigree eternalism is straightforwardly incoherent. For if God exists all at once, then he exists simultaneously with all the events that occur in the universe. What else does the denial that God has a past and a future mean but that everything is present at the same moment to God? Kenny claims that on the eternalist view

my typing of this paper is simultaneous with the whole of eternity. Again, on this view, the great fire of Rome is simultaneous with the whole of eternity. Therefore, while I type these very words, Nero fiddles heartlessly on. (Kenny, 1979, 38–9)

Whatever else we may think we know about time and eternity we know that if one event is later than another then they cannot both occur at the same time.

In an effort to respond to Kenny-type claims that eternal existence is incoherent, and to do justice to Boethius' (and others') idea that God's eternity has duration, albeit a duration that is nonsequential, Stump and Kretzmann (1981) have constructed the notion of ET-simultaneity, a simultaneity that may exist between what is temporal and what is eternal, or more exactly between an eternal reference frame and a temporal reference frame. On this view, for someone occupying an eternal reference frame two temporal events at different times can both be present, being ET-simultaneous, while not being simultaneous with each other.

But the introduction of ET-simultaneity seems entirely ad hoc, (Swinburne, 1994, 248–9) and the reason for introducing it seems to be based on a confusion. For if divine timelessness is a duration, or has essential durational aspects, then it makes sense to ask duration-type questions of the divine life, and the very purpose of, or one central purpose, of introducing the idea of divine timelessness must be abandoned. Further, it is not at all clear what is safeguarded by insisting on God's eternality being durational provided that it is understood that he has created whatever exists in time and has unique access to it in virtue of this fact.

However, constructing a hybrid concept, ET-simultaneity, is also unnecessary. For Kenny's objection rests upon a misunderstanding. The idea of divine timelessness is only incoherent in this sense if it is supposed that timeless eternity is a kind of time, having a kind of eternal duration, a duration which could be simultaneous with some event occurring in truly temporal time. But there is no compelling reason to think that timeless eternity is a kind of time, or that it has aspects of duration, as will be seen. To say that everything is present to God is not to suppose that everything is temporally present to God, that God has an experience of everything happening at once.

Another view, which combines features of both B-series and A-series views of the temporal series, though not to produce a 'hybrid' view, is noted by Katherin Rogers. In discussing Anselm's view on divine eternity, she argues that it is necessary to distinguish between the divine, timelessly eternal perspective, and the human temporal, perspective. (Rogers, 2008, 181f). From the divine perspective everything is simply 'there',and so, as on the B-series view, no event is nearer in time than anything else. By contrast, human actions must necessarily be guided by reference to the past, present or the future time, and so the indexicality of the A-series view of time is necessary. Such indexicality has a pragmatic or instrumental justification, enabling human beings to locate themselves in the temporal series and so to act effectively.

7.2 Temporalism

Temporalist views largely rest on the supposed adverse consequences of eternalism, though some theological views e.g. process thought, or Hegelian historicism, must reject eternalism as a matter of theological definition. Temporalism regards God as existing in a temporal sequences having the characteristics of an A-series, God being situated at a particular moment in time, the present, and having a past and a future. However, temporalism is compatible with a range of A-series views. For example, a temporalist may hold that only the present is real, or that past and present are each real, though it would be less common to hold that past, present and future are all equally real. Several philosophical arguments for temporalism may be identified.

First, that eternalism depends upon a demonstrably false view of time, the B-series view. Were it the case that it could be demonstrated that the A-series view is the true account, then this would severely handicap, if not provide a refutation of, eternalism. But the nature of time is a matter of a long-standing and inconclusive debate.

Second, that eternalism portrays a God who is ‘lifeless’ (Swinburne, 1977, Ch.12), “If we are to characterize God at all, we must say that He is personal, and if personal then temporal, and if temporal then in some sense in time, not outside it” (Lucas, 1989, 213). A God who is living must be affectable by the goings-on of the temporal universe, and so be in time. But a God who creates and sustains the universe can hardly be described in this way.

Third, some hold that nothing that existed outside of time could be the cause of temporal changes, and therefore, since God is a causal agent who brings about changes in the world, he must be in time. This is the view of William Lane Craig who says

Imagine God existing changelessly alone without creation, with a changeless and eternal determination to create a temporal world. Since God is omnipotent, his will is done, and a temporal world begins to exist…. Once time begins at the moment of creation, God either becomes temporal in virtue of his real, causal relation to time and the world or else he exists as timelessly with creation as he does sans creation. But this second alternative seems quite impossible. At the first moment of time, God stands in a new relation in which he did not stand before…this is a real, causal relation which is at that moment new to God and which he does not have in the state of existing sans creation. (Craig, 1998, 222)

Craig argues against the idea of divine timelessness on the grounds that, since the creation is contingent, God must have relations with his creation that he would not have had had there been no creation. As Craig understands matters there are two alternatives. One is that at the moment of creation, God becomes temporal in virtue of coming to possess a real, causal relation to his creation of the world, a relation that previously he did not have. Alternatively, God exists as timelessly with creation as he does sans creation. But, says Craig, this second alternative seems quite impossible. This is because he believes that it is impossible for what is timelessly eternal to bring about temporal changes.

The chief problem with this hybrid view is over the way in which the argument is set up, the coming into existence of the world being represented as an A-series temporal event for God. Craig has the idea that it is possible that God exists in a timelessly eternal fashion and then enters time upon creating a temporal universe. But this seems confused. There can be no temporal ‘and then’ for a timelessly eternal God. Even if the universe is created in time, and even if a timelessly eternal God eternally creates the universe by willing a temporal succession of events without changing his will, he has a timeless relation to each of these.

Another objection to timeless divine eternity is that these ideas, of God outside time and the universe as created with time, are crude and pre-scientific. The modern physical view of the universe is that time and space are linked in fundamental ways. There is therefore no such thing as absolute time, and the debate as to whether God is in time or timeless is over an outdated issue. But the theory of relativity is generally taken to support the idea that the universe is a 4-dimensional space-time block, that time is a matter of perspective and that an ideal knower outside the universe would observe it ‘all at once’.

Let us suppose that this theory of the relationship between time and space is the correct view. Even so, this cannot be taken to be a serious objection to the idea of divine eternality, for the following reason. We can say that whatever the true scientific view of the relation between time and space is, such a view is but an account of some fundamental aspect of created reality. But the very point of asserting divine timeless eternity is to say something about how God transcends the creation. His timelessness is one eloquent way of expressing this transcendence. God transcends the entire space-time universe, however we are finally to understand this. We may even say that modern physical theory potentially presents more difficulties for the temporalist position than it does for divine eternalism.

To many philosophers the most attractive modern reason for holding to sempiternity is that it alone seems able to provide for the libertarian freedom of human beings and of the Creator himself. In the case of Richard Swinburne, for instance, so strong is the commitment to such freedom that it leads him to tailor his idea of divine omniscience so that God limits himself with regard to what he knows about the future, both in order to safeguard the reality of his own libertarian freedom, and also that of his human creatures.

If the theist is to maintain that there is a ‘perfectly free’ person, omnipresent, omnipotent, creator of the universe, who is also ‘omniscient’, he has to understand either ‘perfectly free’ or ‘omniscient’ in more restricted ways than those which I have outlined. It seems to me clear that he would prefer a restriction on ‘omniscient’…. I therefore suggest the following understanding of omniscience. A person P is omniscient at a time t if and only if he knows of every true proposition about t or an earlier time that it is true and also he knows of every true proposition about a time later than t, such that what it reports is physically necessitated by some cause at t or earlier, that it is true. (Swinburne, 1977, 175)

Nicholas Wolterstorff is also explicit that God must be in time in order to be able to interact with free human actions, though less explicit than Swinburne that God's actions must also be indeterministically free. He says

Some of God's actions must be understood as a response to the free actions of human beings—that what God does he sometimes does in response to what some human being does. I think this is in fact the case. And I think it follows, given that all human actions are temporal, that those actions of God which are “response” actions are temporal as well. (Wolterstorff, 1975, 197)

God's free interactivity with human creatures possessed with libertarian freedom is a core value which is to be preserved at all costs in our efforts to think with philosophical responsibility about the idea of God. As we have noted, however, from Boethius onward there have been those who have held that eternalism solves the problem of human libertarian freedom and divine foreknowledge, and in any case such an argument has no appeal to non-libertarians.

8. A basic difference

We might interpret the words of Sir Anthony Kenny, discussed earlier, in a different way, not as providing a straightforward demonstration of the absurdity of divine timeless eternity, but as issuing a challenge to anyone who is tempted to uphold the idea of divine eternality. The challenge is to say clearly what divine timeless eternity is like. If it does not have elements of temporal duration, and so does not have the absurd consequences which Kenny suggests, then what exactly is divine timeless eternity? What is the life of the timelessly eternal God like? What is God's experience of the temporal universe like?

As we saw in the case of Aquinas, it is natural and warranted by the nature of things to exercise a little caution in attempting to speak about the very nature of God. How could minds fashioned to function in space and time come to understand the nature of the one who allegedly exists outside space and time?

It is true that we can gain some positive understanding by the use of analogies. For instance it has been said that the relation between God and time is like that between the centre of a circle and its circumference. The relation of the centre of the circle to one point on its circumference is exactly similar to its relation to any other point on it. Another analogy is that between God's eternal vision and someone at the summit of a hill taking in at a glance what is taking place beneath her. But the hilltop analogy (which Boethius was the first to use) has been shown to be, strictly speaking, unsatisfactory. For the person at the summit is herself in time. And the idea of God as the centre of a circle with time being represented by the circumference is also defective because of the temporal order is linear and not circular. So these analogies remain, as all analogies do, rather unsatisfactory if offered as explanations. Others have been much more reserved in the use of analogies, even skeptical about their usefulness. So Augustine toys with the idea that God's atemporal knowledge of events in time is like the voice producing a sequence of sounds as it recites a familiar psalm. But ‘You know them (viz. the sequence of sounds) in a much more wonderful and much more mysterious way’. (Augustine Confessions, XI. xxxi.)

Augustine hints that it is not a reasonable requirement for a satisfactory articulation of a doctrine such as timeless eternality that one must be able accurately to describe what it is like to be timeless. Part of what it means to say that God is incomprehensible, ‘mysterious', is to recognize that even if we say that God is timeless we do not and cannot have a straightforward understanding of what his timeless life is, or of what it is like to be timeless.

9. Other issues

This article has concentrated on eternity as a metaphysical notion with two contrasting understandings. But besides this central metaphysical use there is also a sense in which certain sentences are timeless. For example, sentences which express necessary truths or falsehoods, or certain matters which are true by definition or essential. In saying that copper is a metal, or that the sum of the internal angles of a triangle is equal to two right angles, there is no implicit contrast to a time when what is asserted was not true or false. Here it is best to distinguish between the terms ‘tensed’ and ‘tenseless’, properties of sentences, and ‘timeless’ and ‘temporal’, properties of individuals and events

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Anselm, Saint [Anselm of Bec, Anselm of Canterbury] | Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Augustine, Saint | Boethius, Anicius Manlius Severinus | Christian theology, philosophy and | God: and other necessary beings | time

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