# Quantum Gravity

*First published Mon Dec 26, 2005; substantive revision Wed Feb 23, 2011*

Quantum Gravity, broadly construed, is a physical theory (still
‘under construction’) incorporating both the principles of
general relativity and quantum theory. Such a theory is expected to be
able to provide a satisfactory description of the microstructure of
spacetime at the so-called Planck scale, at which all fundamental
constants of the ingredient theories, *c* (the velocity of light
in vacuo), ℏ (Planck's constant), and G (Newton's constant),
come together to form units of mass, length, and time. This scale is
so remote from current experimental capabilities that the empirical
testing of quantum gravity proposals along standard lines is rendered
near-impossible.

In most, though not all, theories of quantum gravity, the gravitational field itself is also quantized. Since the contemporary theory of gravity, general relativity, describes gravitation as the curvature of spacetime by matter and energy, a quantization of gravity seemingly implies some sort of quantization of spacetime geometry. Insofar as all extant physical theories rely on a classical spacetime background, this presents not only extreme technical difficulties, but also profound methodological and ontological challenges for the philosopher and the physicist. Though quantum gravity has been the subject of investigation by physicists for over eighty years, philosophers have only just begun to investigate its philosophical implications.

- 1. Introduction
- 2. Gravity Meets Quantum Theory
- 3. Theoretical Frameworks
- 4. Methodology
- 5. Philosophical Issues
- 6. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction

Dutch artist M.C. Escher's elegant pictorial paradoxes are prized by
many, not least by philosophers, physicists, and mathematicians. Some
of his work, for example *Ascending and Descending*, relies on
optical illusion to depict what is actually an impossible situation.
Other works are paradoxical in the broad sense, but *not*
impossible: *Relativity* depicts a coherent arrangement of
objects, albeit an arrangement in which the force of gravity operates
in an unfamiliar fashion. (See the
Other Internet Resources
section below for images.) Quantum gravity itself may be like this: an
unfamiliar yet coherent arrangement of familiar elements. Or it may
be more like *Ascending and Descending*, an impossible
construction which looks sensible in its local details but does not
fit together into a coherent whole when using presently existing
building materials. If the latter is true, then the construction of a
quantum theory of gravity may demand entirely unfamiliar
elements. Whatever the final outcome, the situation at present is one
of flux, with a great many competing approaches vying for the
prize. However, it is also important to note that the prize is not
always the same: string theorists seek a unified theory of all four
interactions that has the power of explaining such things as the
numbers of generations of elementary particles and other previous
inexplicable properties. Other approaches are more modest, and seek
only to bring general relativity in line with quantum theory, without
necessarily invoking the other interactions. Hence, the *problem*
of quantum gravity can mean very different things to different
researchers.

Given that quantum gravity does not yet exist as a working physical
theory, one might legitimately question whether philosophers have any
business being involved at this stage. Certainly the philosopher's
task will be somewhat different from that faced when dealing with a
more-or-less settled body of theory such as classical Newtonian
mechanics, general relativity, or quantum mechanics. In such cases,
one typically proceeds by assuming the physical soundness of the
theory or theoretical framework and drawing out the ontological and
perhaps epistemological consequences of the theory, trying to
understand what it is that the theory is telling us about the nature
of space, time, matter, causation, and so on. Theories of quantum
gravity, on the other hand, are bedeviled by a host of technical and
conceptual problems, questions, and issues which make them largely
unsuited to this kind of approach. In the case of string theory, there
isn't even really a ‘theory’ to speak of, so much as
several clues pointing to what many hope will some day be an
applicable, consistent physical theory. However, philosophers who
have a taste for a broader and more open-ended form of inquiry will
find much to think about, and it is entirely possible that future
philosophers of physics will be faced with problems of a very
different flavour as a result of the peculiar nature of quantum
gravity. Indeed, Tian Cao argues that quantum gravity offers up
a *unique* opportunity for philosophers of physics, leaving them
“with a good chance to make some positive contributions, rather
than just analysing philosophically what physicists have already
established” (Cao, 2001, p. 138). This sentiment has in fact been
echoed by several physicists, not least by Carlo Rovelli (a central
architect of the approach known as loop quantum gravity), who
complains that he wishes philosophers would not restrict themselves to
“commenting and polishing the present fragmentary physical
theories, but would take the risk of trying to look *ahead*”
(Rovelli, 1997, p. 182). This raises an important point: though we
think of general relativity and quantum theory as ‘nice’
theories from the point of view of philosophical investigation, in a
very real sense they are not the whole story and break down at extreme
scales.

## 2. Gravity Meets Quantum Theory

The difficulties in reconciling quantum theory and gravity into some
form of quantum gravity come from the *prima facie*
incompatibility of general relativity, Einstein's relativistic theory
of gravitation, and quantum field theory, the framework for the
description of the other three forces (electromagnetism and the strong
and weak nuclear interactions). Whence the incompatibility? General
relativity is described by Einstein's equations, which amount to
constraints on the curvature of spacetime (the Einstein tensor on the
left-hand side) due to the presence of mass and other forms of energy,
such as electromagnetic radiation (the stress-energy-momentum tensor on
the right-hand side). (See John Baez's webpages in
Other Internet Resources
for an excellent introduction.) In doing so,
they manage to encompass traditional, Newtonian gravitational phenomena
such as the mutual attraction of two or more massive objects, while
also predicting new phenomena such as the bending and red-shifting of light by these
objects (which have been observed) and the existence of gravitational
radiation (which has to date only been indirectly observed via the
decrease in the period of binary pulsars). (For the latter
observation, see the
1993 Physics Nobel Prize presentation speech by Carl Nordling.)

In general relativity, mass and energy are treated in a purely
classical manner, where ‘classical’ means that physical
quantities such as the strengths and directions of various fields and
the positions and velocities of particles have definite values. These
quantities are represented by tensor fields, sets of (real) numbers
associated with each spacetime point. For example, the stress, energy,
and momentum
*T _{ab}*(

*,*

**x***t*) of the electromagnetic field at some point (

*,*

**x***t*), are functions of the three components

*E*,

_{i}*E*,

_{j}*E*,

_{k}*B*,

_{i}*B*,

_{j}*B*of the electric and magnetic fields

_{k}*and*

**E***at that point. These quantities in turn determine, via Einstein's equations, an aspect of the ‘curvature’ of spacetime, a set of numbers*

**B***G*(

_{ab}*,*

**x***t*) which is in turn a function of the spacetime metric. The metric

*g*(

_{ab}*,*

**x***t*) is a set of numbers associated with each point which gives the distance to neighboring points. A model of the world according to general relativity consists of a spacetime manifold with a metric, the curvature of which is constrained by the stress-energy-momentum of the matter distribution. All physical quantities — the value of the

*x*-component of the electric field at some point, the scalar curvature of spacetime at some point, and so on — have definite values, given by real (as opposed to complex or imaginary) numbers. Thus general relativity is a classical theory in the sense given above.

The problem is that our fundamental theories of matter and energy,
the theories describing the interactions of various particles via the
electromagnetic force and the strong and weak nuclear forces, are all
*quantum* theories. In
quantum theories,
these physical quantities do not in general *have* definite
values. For example, in quantum mechanics, the position of an electron
may be specified with arbitrarily high accuracy only at the cost of a
loss of specificity in the description of its momentum, hence its
velocity. At the same time, in the quantum theory of the
electromagnetic field known as quantum electrodynamics (QED), the
electric and magnetic fields associated with the electron suffer an
associated uncertainty. In general, physical quantities are described
by a quantum state which gives a probability distribution over many
different values, and increased specificity (narrowing of the
distribution) of one property (e.g., position, electric field) gives
rise to decreased specificity of its canonically conjugate property
(e.g., momentum, magnetic field). This is an expression of
Heisenberg's
Uncertainty Principle.
In the context of quantum gravity the fluctuating geometry is
known as “spacetime foam”.

On the surface, the incompatibility between general relativity and
quantum theory might seem rather trivial. Why not just follow the model
of QED and quantize the gravitational field, similar to the way in
which the electromagnetic field was quantized? Just as we associate a
quantum state of the electromagnetic field with the quantum state of
electrically charged matter, we should, one might think, similarly just
associate a quantum state of the gravitational field with the quantum
state of both charged and uncharged matter. This is more or less the
path that was taken, but it encounters extraordinary difficulties.
Some physicists consider these to be technical difficulties, having to
do with the non-renormalizability of the gravitational interaction and
the consequent failure of the perturbative methods which have proven
effective in ordinary quantum field theories. However, these technical
problems are closely related to a set of daunting *conceptual*
difficulties, of interest to both physicists and philosophers.

The conceptual difficulties basically follow from the nature of the
gravitational interaction, in particular the equivalence of
gravitational and inertial mass, which allows one to represent gravity
as a property of spacetime itself, rather than as a field propagating
*in* a (passive) spacetime background. When one attempts to
quantize gravity, one is subjecting some of the properties of
spacetime to quantum fluctuations. For example, in canonical
quantizations of gravity one isolates and then quantizes geometrical
quantities (roughly the intrinsic and extrinsic curvature of three
dimensional space) functioning as the position and momentum
variables. Given the uncertainty principle and the probabilistic
nature of quantum theory, one has a picture involving fluctuations of
the geometry of space, much as the electric and magnetic fields
fluctuate in QED. But ordinary quantum theory presupposes a
well-defined classical background against which to *define*
these fluctuations (Weinstein, 2001a, b), and so one runs into trouble
not only in giving a mathematical characterization of the quantization
procedure (how to take into account these fluctuations in the
effective spacetime structure?) but also in giving a conceptual and
physical account of the theory that results, should one succeed. For
example, a fluctuating metric would seem to imply a fluctuating causal
structure and spatiotemporal ordering of events, in which case, how is
one to define equal-time commutation relations in the quantum
theory?

Cao (2001) believes that the conceptual nature of the problem demands
a conceptual resolution. He advocates what he calls ‘ontological
synthesis’. This approach asks for an analysis of the
ontological pictures of the two ingredient theories of quantum
gravity, so that their consistency (the consistency of the resulting
synthesis) can be properly assessed. Ontology for Cao refers to the
primary, autonomous structures from which all other properties and
relations in a theory are constructed. A fairly simple inspection of
the respective ontological constraints imposed by general relativity
and quantum field theory reveals serious tension: general relativity
discards the fixed kinematical structure of spacetime, so that
localization is rendered relational, but in quantum field theory a
fixed flat background is part of its ontological basis, from which the
standard features of the theory are derived. On the other hand, as we
have seen, quantum field theory involves quantum fluctuations in the
vicinity of a point, while general relativity involves the use of a
smooth point neighbourhood. Either way, in order to bring the two
ontological bases together, some piece of either edifice must be
demolished. Cao proposes that the tension can best be resolved by
focusing firmly on those *sine qua non* principles of the
respective theories. Cao views the gravitational property of universal
coupling as essential, but notes that this does not require
continuity, so that the former could be retained while discarding the
latter, without rendering the framework inconsistent, thus allowing
for quantum theory's violent fluctuations (Cao's prime candidate for
an essential quantum field theoretic concept). Likewise, he argues
that quantum field theory requires a fixed background in order to
localize quantum fields and set up causal structure. But he notes that
a relational account of localization could perform such a function,
with fields localized relative to each other. In so doing, one could
envisage a diffeomorphism covariant quantum field theory (i.e. one
that does not involve reference to fields localized at points of the
spacetime manifold). The resulting synthesized entity (a violently
fluctuating, universally coupled quantum gravitational field) would
then be what a quantum theory of gravity ought to describe.

While such an approach sounds sensible enough on the surface, to
actually put it into practice in the constructive stages of
theory-building (rather than a retrospective analysis of a completed
theory) is not going to be easy—though it has to be said, the
method Cao describes bears close resemblance to the way loop quantum
gravity has developed. Lucien Hardy (2007) has developed a novel
approach to quantum gravity that shares features of Cao's suggestion,
though the principles isolated are different from Cao's. The causaloid
approach is intended to provide a *framework* for quantum gravity
theories, where idea is to develop a general formalism that respects
the key features of both general relativity, which he takes to be the
dynamical (nonprobabilistic) causal structure, and quantum theory,
which he takes to be the probabilistic (nondynamical) dynamics. The
causaloid (of some theory) is an entity that encodes all that can be
calculated in the theory. Part of the problem here is that Cao's (and
Hardy's) approach assumes that the ontological principles hold at the
Planck scale. However, it is perfectly possible that both of the input
theories break down at higher energies. Not only that, the technical
difficulties of setting up the kind of (physically realistic)
diffeomorphism-invariant quantum field theory he suggests have so far
proven to be an insurmountable challenge. One crucial aspect that is
missing from Cao's framework is a notion of what
the *observables* might be. Of course, they must be relational,
but this still leaves the problem very much open.

We will look in more detail at how various conceptual and methodological problems arise in two different research programs below. But first, we introduce some key features of the leading research programs.

## 3. Theoretical Frameworks

All approaches to the problem of quantum gravity agree that something must be said about the relationship between gravitation and quantized matter. These various approaches can be catalogued in various ways, depending on the relative weight assigned to general relativity and quantum field theory. Some approaches view general relativity as in need of correction and quantum field theory as generally applicable, while others view quantum field theory as problematic and general relativity as having a more universal status. Still others view the theories in a more even-handed manner, perhaps with both simply amounting to distinct limits of a deeper theory. It has often been suggested, since the earliest days of quantum gravity research, that bringing quantum field theory and general relativity together might serve to cure their respective singularity problems (the former resulting from bad high frequency behaviour of fields; the latter resulting from certain kinds of gravitational collapse). This hope does seem to have been borne out in many of the current approaches. Roger Penrose has even argued that the joint consideration of gravitation and quantum theory could resolve the infamous quantum measurement problem (see Penrose 2001; see also the entry on Measurement in Quantum Theory). The basic idea of Penrose's proposal is fairly simple to grasp: when there is wave-packet spreading of the centre of mass of some body, there results a greater imprecision in the spacetime structure associated with the spreading wave-packet, and this destroys the coherence of the distant parts of the wave-function. There are difficulties in distinguishing the gravitationally induced collapse that Penrose proposes from the effective collapse induced by quantum theory itself, thanks to decoherence—Joy Christian (2005) has suggested that by observing oscillations in the flavor ratios of neutrinos originating at cosmological distances one could eliminate the confounding effects of environmental decoherence.

By far the two most popular approaches are string theory and loop quantum gravity. The former is an example of an approach to quantum gravity in which the gravitational field is not quantized; rather, a distinct theory is quantized which happens to coincide with general relativity at low energies. The latter is an approach involving (constrained) canonical quantization, albeit of a version of general relativity based on a different choice of variables than the usual geometrodynamical, metric-based variables. We cover the basic details of each of these in the following subsections.

### 3.1 String Theory

Known variously as string theory, superstring theory, and M-theory,
this program (qua theory of quantum gravity) has its roots,
indirectly, in the observation, dating back to at least the 1930s,
that classical general relativity looks in many ways like the theory
of a massless ‘spin-two’ field propagating on the flat
Minkowski spacetime of special relativity. [See Cappelli *et
al*. (eds.), forthcoming, and Gasperini and Maharana (eds.) 2008,
for collections of essays covering the early history of string theory;
Rovelli 2001b (Other Internet Resources section below) and 2006 offer
a capsule history, and Greene 2000 provides a popular account.] This
observation led to early attempts to formulate a quantum theory of
gravity by “quantizing” this spin-two theory. However, it
turned out that the theory is not perturbatively renormalizable,
meaning that there are ineliminable infinities. Attempts to modify the
classical theory to eliminate this problem led to a different problem,
non-unitarity, and so this general approach was moribund until the
mid-1970s, when it was discovered that a theory of one-dimensional
“strings” developed around 1970 to account for the strong
interaction, actually provided a framework for a unified theory which
included gravity, because one of the modes of oscillation of the
string corresponded to a massless spin-two particle (the
‘graviton’).

The original and still prominent idea behind string theory was to replace the point particles of ordinary quantum field theory (particles like photons, electrons, etc) with one-dimensional extended objects called strings. (See Weingard, 2001 and Witten, 2001 for overviews of the conceptual framework.) In the early development of the theory, it was recognized that construction of a consistent quantum theory of strings required that the strings “live” in a larger number of spatial dimensions than the observed three. String theories containing fermions as well as bosons must be formulated in nine space dimensions and one time dimension. Strings can be open or closed, and have a characteristic tension and hence vibrational spectrum. The various modes of vibration correspond to various particles, one of which is the graviton. The resulting theories have the advantage of being perturbatively renormalizable. This means that perturbative calculations are at least mathematically tractable. Since perturbation theory is an almost indispensable tool for physicists, this is deemed a good thing.

String theory has undergone several mini-revolutions over the last
several years, one of which involved the discovery of various duality
relations, mathematical transformations connecting, in this case, what
appear to be mathematically distinct string theories — type I,
type IIA, type IIB, (heterotic) SO(32) and (heterotic)
E_{8}×E_{8} — to one another and to
eleven-dimensional supergravity (a particle theory). The discovery of
these connections led to the conjecture that all of the string
theories are really aspects of a single underlying theory, which was
given the name ‘M-theory’ (though M-theory is also used
more specifically to describe the unknown theory of which
eleven-dimensional supergravity is the low energy limit). The
rationale is that one theory at strong coupling (high energy
description) is physically equivalent (in terms of correlation
functions and observable content) to another theory at weak coupling
(lower energy, more tractable description), and that if all the
theories are related to one another by dualities such as this, then
they must all be aspects of some more fundamental theory. Though
attempts have been made, there has been no successful formulation of
this theory: its very existence, much less its nature, is still
largely a matter of conjecture.

### 3.2 Canonical and Loop Quantum Gravity

Whereas string theory views the curved spacetime of general relativity
as an effective modification of a flat (or other fixed) background
geometry by a massless spin-two field, the canonical quantum gravity
program treats the spacetime metric itself as a kind of field, and
attempts to quantize it directly. Technically, work in this camp
proceeds by writing down general relativity in so-called
‘canonical’ or ‘Hamiltonian’ form, since there
is a more-or-less clearcut way to quantize theories once they are put
in this form (Kuchar, 1993; Belot & Earman, 2001). In a canonical
description, one chooses a particular set of configuration
variables *x _{i}* and canonically conjugate momentum
variables

*p*which describe the state of a system at some time. Then, one obtains the time-evolution of these variables from the Hamiltonian

_{i}*H*(

*x*,

_{i}*p*). Quantization proceeds by treating the configuration and momentum variables as operators on a quantum state space (a Hilbert space) obeying certain commutation relations analogous to the classical Poisson-bracket relations, which effectively encode the quantum fuzziness associated with Heisenberg's uncertainty principle.

_{i}
When one attempts to write general relativity down in this way, one
has to contend with the existence of constraints on the canonical
variables that are inherited from the diffeomorphism invariance of the
spacetime formulation of the theory. The single tensorial equation
that we see in standard presentations of the Einstein field equations
is translated into 10 scalar equations in the canonical formulation,
with constraints accounting for four of these equations (the remaining
six are evolutionary equations). Three of the constraints (known as
the momentum or diffeomorphism constraints) are responsible for
shifting data tangential to the initial surface and, thus, are related
to the shift vector field. The remaining constraint, known as the
Hamiltonian constraint, is responsible for pushing data off the
initial surface, and thus is related to the lapse function. If the
constraints are not satisfied by the canonical initial data then the
development of the data will not generate a spacetime for choices of
lapse and shift. However, when the constraints *are* satisfied
then the various choices of lapse and shift will always grow the same
4D spacetime (that it, the same spacetime metric). However, to extract
a notion of time from this formulation demands that one first solve
for the spacetime metric, followed by a singling out of a specific
solution. This is a kind of classical problem of time in that since
the spacetime geometry is a dynamical variables, time is something
that also must be solved for. Further, there is arbitrariness in the
time variable as a result of the arbitrariness encoded in the
constraints. However, one *can* extract a time for each solution
to the Einstein equations by deparametrizing the theory. Below we see
that things become more problematic in the shift to quantum theory.

Although advocates of the canonical approach often accuse string
theorists of relying too heavily on classical background spacetime,
the canonical approach does something which is arguably quite similar,
in that one begins with a theory that conceives time-evolution in
terms of evolving some data specified on an *a priori* given
spacelike surface, and then quantizing the theory. However, this does
not imply any breaking of spacetime diffeomorphism invariance (or
general covariance) since the constraints that must be satisfied by
the data on the slice mean that the physical observables of the theory
will be independent of whatever foliation one chooses. However, the
problem is that if spacetime is quantized along these lines, the
assumption (of evolving then quantizing) does not make sense in
anything but an approximate way. That is, the evolution does not
generate a classical spacetime! Rather, solutions will be
wave-functions (solutions of some Schrödinger-type
equation). This issue in particular is decidedly neglected in both the
physical and philosophical literature (but see Isham, 1993), and there
is more that might be said. We return to the issue of time in quantum
gravity below.

#### 3.2.1 Geometric variables

Early attempts at quantizing general relativity by Dirac, Wheeler,
DeWitt and others in the 1950s and 1960s worked with a seemingly
natural choice for configuration variables, namely geometric variables
*g _{ij}* corresponding to the various components of the
‘three-metric’ describing the intrinsic geometry of the
given spatial slice of spacetime. One can think about arriving at this
via an arbitrary slicing of a 4-dimensional “block”
universe by 3-dimensional spacelike hypersurfaces. The conjugate
momenta π

_{ij}then effectively encode the time rate-of-change of the metric, which, from the 4-dimensional perspective, is directly related to the extrinsic curvature of the slice (meaning the curvature relative to the spacetime in which the slice is embedded). This approach is known as ‘geometrodynamics’ since it views general relativity as describing the dynamics of spatial geometry.

As mentioned above, in these geometric variables, as in any other
canonical formulation of general relativity, one is faced with
constraints, which encode the fact that the canonical variables cannot
be specified independently. A familiar example of a constraint is
Gauss's law from ordinary electromagnetism, which states that, in the
absence of charges,
∇·** E**(

**) − 4πρ = 0 at every point**

*x***. It means that the three components of the electric field at every point must be chosen so as to satisfy this constraint, which in turn means that there are only two “true” degrees of freedom possessed by the electric field at any given point in space. (Specifying two components of the electric field at every point dictates the third component.) Thus, not all components of the Maxwell equations propagate the fields.**

*x*
The constraints in electromagnetism may be viewed as stemming from
the *U*(1) gauge invariance of Maxwell's theory, while the
constraints of general relativity stem from the diffeomorphism
invariance of the theory.
Diffeomorphism invariance
means, informally, that one can take a solution of Einstein's equations and
drag it (meaning the metric and the matter fields) around on the
spacetime manifold and obtain a mathematically distinct but physically
equivalent solution. The three ‘supermomentum’ constraints
in the canonical theory reflect the freedom to drag the metric and
matter fields around in various directions on a given
three-dimensional spacelike hypersurface, while the
‘super-Hamiltonian’ constraint reflects the freedom to
drag the fields in the “time” direction, and so to the
“next” hypersurface. (Each constraint applies at each
point of the given spacelike hypersurface, so that there are actually
4 × ∞^{3} constraints, four for each point.) In
the classical (unquantized) canonical formulation of general
relativity, the constraints do not pose any particular conceptual
problems (though one does face a problem in defining suitable
observables that commute with the constraints, and this certainly has
a conceptual flavour). One effectively chooses a background space and
time (via a choice of the lapse and shift functions) “on the
fly”, and one can be confident that the spacetime that results
is independent of the particular choice. Effectively, different
choices of these functions give rise to different choices of
background against which to evolve the foreground. However, the
constraints pose a serious problem when one moves to quantum
theory.

#### 3.2.2 Problem of time

All approaches to canonical quantum gravity face the so-called “problem of time” in one form or another (Kuchař (1992) and Isham (1993) are still excellent reviews; Rickles, 2006, offers a more philosophical guide). The problem stems from the fact that in preserving the diffeomorphism-invariance of general relativity — depriving the coordinates of the background manifold of any physical meaning — the “slices” of spacetime one is considering inevitably include time, just as they include space. In the canonical formulation, the diffeomorphism invariance is reflected in the constraints, and the inclusion of what would ordinarily be a ‘time’ variable in the data is reflected in the existence of the super-Hamiltonian constraint. The difficulties presented by this latter constraint constitute the problem of time.

Attempts to quantize general relativity in the canonical framework
proceed by turning the canonical variables into operators on an
appropriate state space (e.g., the space of square-integrable functions
over three-metrics), and dealing somehow with the constraints. When
quantizing a theory with constraints, there are two possible
approaches. The approach usually adopted in gauge theories is to deal
with the constraints *before* quantization, so that only true degrees of
freedom are promoted to operators when passing to the quantum theory.
There are a variety of ways of doing this so-called ‘gauge
fixing’, but they all involve removing the extra degrees of
freedom by imposing some special conditions. In general relativity,
fixing a gauge is tantamount to specifying a particular coordinate
system with respect to which the “physical” data is
described (spatial coordinates) and with respect to which it evolves
(time coordinate). This is difficult already at the classical level,
since the utility and, moreover, the very tractability of any
particular gauge generally depends on the properties of the solution to
the equations, which of course is what one is trying to find in the
first place. But in the quantum theory, one is faced with the
additional concern that the resulting theory may well not be
independent of the choice of gauge. This is closely related to the
problem of identifying true, gauge-invariant observables in the
classical theory (Torre 2005, in the Other Internet Resources
section).

The preferred approach in canonical quantum gravity is to impose the
constraints after quantizing. In this ‘constraint
quantization’ approach, due to Dirac, one treats the constraints
themselves as operators *A*, and demands that
“physical” states ψ be those which are solutions to the
resulting equations *A* ψ = 0. The problem of time is
associated with the super-Hamiltonian constraint. The super-Hamiltonian
*H* is responsible for describing time-evolution in the
classical theory, yet its counterpart in the constraint-quantized
theory, *H* ψ = 0, would *prima facie* seem to
indicate that the true physical states of the system do not evolve at
all. Trying to understand how, and in what sense, the quantum theory
describes the time-evolution of something, be it states or observables,
is the essence of the problem of time (on which, more below).

#### 3.2.3 Ashtekar, loop, and other variables

In geometrodynamics, all of the constraint equations are difficult to solve (though the super-Hamiltonian constraint, known as the Wheeler-DeWitt equation, is especially difficult), even in the absence of particular boundary conditions. Lacking solutions, one does not have a grip on what the true, physical states of the theory are, and one cannot hope to make much progress in the way of predictions. The difficulties associated with geometric variables are addressed by the program initiated by Ashtekar and developed by his collaborators (for a review and further references see Rovelli 2001b (Other Internet Resources), 2001a). Ashtekar used a different set of variables, a complexified ‘connection’ (rather than a three-metric) and its canonical conjugate, which made it simpler to solve the constraints. This change of variables introduces an additional constraint into the theory (the Gauss law constraint generating SO(3) transformations) on account of the freedom to rotate the vectors without disturbing the metric. The program underwent further refinements with the introduction of the loop transform, and further refinements still when it was understood that equivalence classes of loops could be identified with spin networks. One is able to recover all the standard geometrical features of general relativity from this formulation. (See Smolin (2001, 2004) for a popular introduction; Rovelli, 2004, offers a physically intuitive account; Thiemann, 2008, provides the mathematical underpinnings; Rickles, 2005, offers a philosophically-oriented review.) Note that the problems of time and observables afflict the loop approach just as they did the earlier geometrodynamical approach. The difference is that one has more (mathematical) control over the theory (and its quantization), in terms of a definable inner product, a separable state space, and more. There is still a question mark over the construction of the full physical Hilbert space, since the solution of the Hamiltonian constraint remains a problem. However, some progress is being made in various directions, not least via Thomas Thiemann's master constraint programme (see Thiemann, 2006).

### 3.3 Other Approaches

Though the impression often painted of the research landscape in
quantum gravity is an either/or situation between string theory and
loop quantum gravity, in reality there are very many more options on
the table. Some (e.g., Huggett 2001, Wüthrich 2004 (Other
Internet Resources section); J. Mattingly 2005) have argued that
semiclassical gravity, a theory in which matter is quantized but
spacetime is classical, is a viable alternative (we discuss this
below). Other approaches include twistor theory (currently enjoying a
revival in conjunction with string theory), Bohmian approaches
(Goldstein & Teufel, 2001), causal sets (see Sorkin 2003, in the
Other Internet Resources section) in which the universe is described
as a set of discrete events along with a stipulation of their causal
relations, and other discrete approaches (see Loll, 1998). Also of
interest are arguments to the effect that gravity itself may play a
role in quantum state reduction (Christian, 2001; Penrose, 2001; also
briefly discussed below). A fairly comprehensive overview of the
current approaches to quantum gravity can be found in Oriti (2009). In
this entry we have chosen to focus upon those approaches that are both
the most actively pursued *and* that have received most attention
from philosophers. Let us now turn to several methodological and
philosophical issues that arise quantum gravity research.

## 4. Methodology

Research in quantum gravity has always had a rather peculiar flavor,
owing to both the technical and conceptual difficulty of the field and
the remoteness from experiment. Yoichiro Nambu (1985) wryly labels
research on quantum gravity “postmodern physics” on
account of its experimental remoteness. Thus conventional notions of
the close relationship between theory and experiment have but a
tenuous foothold, at best, in quantum gravity. However, since
there *is* a rudimentary 'pecking order' amongst the various
approaches to quantum gravity, and since the history of quantum
gravity contains various fatalities, there clearly are *some*
methods of theory evaluation in operation, there are constraints
functioning in something like the way experiment and observation
function. Investigating these methods and constraints constitutes an
open research problem for philosophers of science—for initial
investigations along these lines, see James Mattingly (2005a and 2009)
and Rickles (forthcoming). Audretsch (1981) argues that quantum
gravity research conflicts with Kuhn's account of scientific
development since it stems from the desire to unify (for reasons not
based on any empirical tension) multiple paradigms, both of which are
well-confirmed and both of which make claims to universality. One
might easily question Audretsch's focus on direct empirical tensions
here. Given, as he admits, both general relativity and quantum theory
claim to be *universal* theories, any conceptual or formal
tension that can be found to hold between them must point to either or
both theories being in error in their claims to
universality—this is an empirical claim of sorts. In the context
of string theory, Peter Galison (1995) argues that mathematical
constraints take the place of standard empirical constraints. James
Cushing (1990) also considers some of the potential methodological
implications of string theory (though he deals with string theory in
its earliest days, when it underwent a transition from the dual
resonance model of hadrons into a theory of quantum gravity).

### 4.1 Theory

As remarked in the introduction, there is no single, generally
agreed-upon body of theory in quantum gravity. The majority of the
physicists working in the field focus their attention on string
theory, an ambitious program which aims at providing a unified theory
of all four interactions. A non-negligible minority work on what is
now called loop quantum gravity, the goal of which is simply to
provide a quantum theory of the gravitational
interaction *simpliciter*. There is also significant work in
other areas, including approaches that don't really involve the
quantization of a theory at all. [Good recent reviews of the
theoretical landscape include Carlip 2001, Smolin 2001 (Other Internet
Resources section below), 2003, Penrose 2004, and Oriti, ed, 2009.]
But there is no real consensus, for at least two reasons.

The first reason is that it is extremely difficult to make any concrete predictions in these theories. String theory, in particular, is plagued by a lack of experimentally testable predictions because of the tremendous number of distinct ground or vacuum states in the theory, with an absence of guiding principles for singling out the physically significant ones. Though the string community prides itself on the dearth of free parameters in the theory (in contrast to the nineteen or so free parameters found in the standard model of particle physics), the problem arguably resurfaces in the huge number of vacua associated with different compactifications of the nine space dimensions to the three we observe. These vacua are either viewed as distinct string theories, or else as solutions of one and the same theory (though some deeper, unknown theory). Attempts to explain why we live in the particular vacuum that we do have recently given rise to appeals to the infamous anthropic principle (Susskind, 2003), whereby the existence of humans is invoked to, in some sense, “explain” the fact that we find ourselves in a particular world. (See Weinstein, 2006, for a philosophical discussion of the usage of anthropic reasoning in string theory.)

Loop quantum gravity is seemingly less plagued by a lack of
predictions, and indeed it is often claimed that the discreteness of
area and volume operators are concrete predictions of the theory, with
potentially testable consequences. Proponents of this approach argue
that this makes the theory more susceptible to falsification, and thus
more scientific (in the sense of Popper; see the entry on
Karl Popper)
than string theory (see Smolin 2006 for this line of
argument). However, it is still quite unclear, in practice and even in
principle, how one might actually observe these quantities. There have
been recent suggestions that in order to probe the effects of the
Planck scale (discreteness, or minimal length in particular) one needs
to look to the cosmological level for tiny violations of Lorentz
invariance. Rovelli and Speziale (2003) have argued that, in fact, the
existence of a minimal length does not imply a violation of the
Lorentz symmetry (a conclusion seconded by the proponents of the
causal set programme). Their argument turns on the fact that in the
context of quantum theory, symmetries act on states (and so on mean
values) rather than eigenvalues (representing the discrete quantities
in the theory). However, in any case, there remains a question mark
over the theoretical status of the discreteness result which has been
shown to hold only for operators on the kinematical Hilbert space,
that is, for gauge-variant quantities. It is still an open question
whether this result transfers to genuine observables (i.e. operators
that satisfy all of the constraints and are defined on
the *physical* Hilbert space). See Dittrich and Thiemann (2009)
for a detailed investigation of the problem and a possible resolution
employing suitably gauge-fixed (by matter) Dirac observables. Even if
one overcomes this problem, and could observe evidence of the
discreteness of space, so many approaches involve such discreteness
that one would face a further problem in using the data to decide
between the approaches. For a philosophical discussion of this and
related issues (including the question of whether the proposed
discreteness breaks Lorentz invariance), see Hagar (2009).

### 4.2 Experiment

The second reason for the absence of consensus is that there are no
experiments in quantum gravity, and little in the way of observations
that might qualify as direct or indirect data or evidence. This stems
in part from the lack of theoretical *predictions*, since it is
difficult to design an observational test of a theory if one does not
know where to look or what to look at. But it also stems from the fact
that most theories of quantum gravity appear to predict departures
from classical relativity only at energy scales on the order of
10^{19} GeV. (By way of comparison, the proton-proton
collisions at Fermilab have an energy on the order of 10^{3}
GeV.) Whereas research in particle physics proceeds in large part by
examining the data collected in large particle accelerators,
accelerators which are able to smash particles together at
sufficiently high energies to probe the properties of atomic nuclei,
gravity is so weak that there is no physically realistic way to do a
comparable experiment that would reveal properties at the energy
scales at which *quantum* gravitational effects are expected to
be important—it would take a particle accelerator of galactic
size to approach the required energies. (In a little more detail, the
weakness of gravity can be compared to the strength of the
electromagnetic interaction — cf. Callender and Huggett (eds.) 2001,
p. 4. An electron couples to the electromagnetic field with a strength
of 10^{−2}, while the coupling of a mass to the gravitational
field is 10^{−22}. Feynman (1963, p. 697) gives an example
that highlights this difference in magnitudes more dramatically by
showing how the gravitational coupling between a proton and an
electron in a hydrogen atom would shift the wave-function of an
electron by just 43 arcseconds over a time period of 100 times the age
of the Universe!)

Though progress is being made in trying to at least draw
observational consequences of loop quantum gravity, a theory of quantum
gravity which arguably *does* make predictions (Amelino-Camelia,
2003, in the Other Internet Resources section below; D. Mattingly,
2005), it is remarkable that the most notable “test” of
quantum theories of gravity imposed by the community to date involves a
phenomenon which has never been observed, the so-called Hawking
radiation from black holes. Based on earlier work of Bekenstein (1973)
and others, Hawking (1974) predicted that black holes would radiate
energy, and would do so in proportion to their gravitational
“temperature,” which was in turn understood to be
proportional to their mass, angular momentum, and charge. Associated
with this temperature is an entropy (see the entry on
the philosophy of statistical mechanics),
and one would expect a theory of quantum gravity to allow one to
calculate the entropy associated with a black hole of given mass,
angular momentum, and charge, the entropy corresponding to the number
of quantum states of the gravitational field having the same mass,
charge, and angular momentum. (See Unruh, 2001, and references
therein.) In their own ways, string theory and loop quantum gravity
have both passed the test of predicting an entropy for black holes
which accords with Hawking's calculation. String theory gets the
number right for a not-particularly physically realistic subset of
black holes called near-extremal black holes, while loop quantum
gravity gets it right for generic black holes, but only up to an
overall constant. More recently, the causal set approach has managed
to derive the correct value. *If* the Hawking effect is real,
then this consonance could be counted as evidence in favor of either
or both theories.

Erik Curiel (2001) has argued against the manner in which the ability
to derive the Bekenstein-Hawking result as a theorem of an approach is
used as *evidence* for that approach in much the same way that
empirical evidence is used to justify a theory in normal
circumstances, say predicting the value of a well-confirmed
experimental result. It is true that black hole physics is used as
testing ground for quantum gravity and the Bekenstein-Hawking result
does not have the status of an empirical fact. However, it is a strong
deduction from a framework that *is* fairly mature, namely
quantum field theory on a curved spacetime background. In this sense,
although it does not provide a constraint as strong as an
experimentally observed phenomenon, it might legitimately function as
a constraint on possible theories. Constraints on theory construction
come in a variety of shapes and sizes, and not all take the form of
empirical data. In the context of quantum gravity it is especially
important that one have some agreed upon constraints to guide the
construction. Without them, work would halt. It also seems reasonable
to insist that a full theory of quantum gravity be able to reproduce
predictions of the semi-classical theory of gravity, since this will
be one of its possible limits.

Curiel goes on to question, more generally, the ranking of approaches
to quantum gravity given what he views as the absence of demonstrated
scientific merit in any of them: elegance and consistency might well
be merits of a scientific theory, but that they do not count
as *scientific*. (ibid, p. S437). However, this claim hinges on
the alignment of scientific merit and empirical clout; but this
requires an argument, for it is far from obvious: from whence this
prescription? Surely if a theory is mathematically inconsistent that
says something about its physical status too? Moreover, the
relationship between experimental and observational data and theories
is not a simple matter. Finally, it is perhaps too quick to say that
approaches do not have empirical consequences. Already known empirical
data can confirm the predictions of a theory; therefore, it is clear
that we can judge the extent to which the various contenders satisfy
this old evidence, and how they do so. For example, string theory at
least has the potential of explaining why there are three generations
of elementary particles by invoking the Euler characteristic of the
compact spaces it employs—the Euler characteristic is equal to
twice the number of generations (see Seifert, 2004, for
details). Whatever one might think about string theory's relationship
with anthropic reasoning, we do have here a potential explanation of a
previously inexplicable piece of old empirical data, which ought to
lend some credence to the theory. There is also the not inconsiderable
fact that string theory is able to derive general relativity (and all
the physically observed facts that are associated with this theory) as
a low energy feature. This is not a *novel* fact, but it is an
physical, empirical consequence of the theory.

However, it should be noted, finally, that to date neither of the main research programs has been shown to properly reproduce the world we see at low energies. Indeed, it is a major challenge of loop quantum gravity to show that it indeed has general relativity as a low-energy limit, and a major challenge of string theory to show that it has the standard model of particle physics plus general relativity as a low-energy limit. There are promising indications that both theories might be able to overcome this challenge (see Thiemann for the loop quantum gravity case; for the string theoretic case, see Graña, 2006). A similar problem faces causal set theory in the form of the ‘inverse problem’, which roughly amounts to the difficulty of getting continuous manifolds (with their corresponding symmetries) from a fundamentally discrete theory (see Wallden, 2010, for a good recent review of causal sets, including a discussion of this problem).

## 5. Philosophical Issues

Quantum gravity raises a number of difficult philosophical questions. To date, it is the ontological aspects of quantum gravity that have attracted the most interest from philosophers, and it is these we will discuss in the first five sections below. In the final section, though, we will briefly discuss further methodological and epistemological issues which arise.

First, however, let us discuss the extent to which ontological questions are tied to a particular theoretical framework. In its current stage of development, string theory unfortunately provides little indication of the more fundamental nature of space, time, and matter. Despite the consideration of ever more exotic objects — strings, p-branes, D-branes, etc. — these objects are still understood as propagating in a background spacetime. Since string theory is supposed to describe the emergence of classical spacetime from some underlying quantum structure, these objects are not to be regarded as truly fundamental. Rather, their status in string theory is analogous to the status of particles in quantum field theory (Witten, 2001), which is to say that they are relevant descriptions of the fundamental physics only in situations in which there is a background spacetime with appropriate symmetries.

The duality relations between the various string theories suggest that they are all perturbative expansions of some more fundamental, non-perturbative theory known as ‘M-theory’ (Polchinski, 2002, see the Other Internet Resources section below). This, presumably, is the most fundamental level, and understanding the theoretical framework at that level is central to understanding the underlying ontology of the theory. ‘Matrix theory’ is an attempt to do just this, to provide a mathematical formulation of M-theory, but it remains highly speculative. Thus although string theory purports to be a fundamental theory, the ontological implications of the theory are still very obscure.

Canonical quantum gravity, in its loop formulation or otherwise, has to date been of greater interest to philosophers because it appears to confront fundamental questions in a way that string theory, at least in its perturbative guise, does not. Whereas perturbative string theory treats spacetime in an essentially classical way, canonical quantum gravity treats it as quantum-mechanical entity, at least to the extent of treating the geometric structure (as opposed to, say, the topological or differential structure) as quantum-mechanical.

### 5.1 Time

As noted in
Section 3.2.2
above, the treatment of time presents special difficulties in
canonical quantum gravity, though they easily generalise to many other
approaches to quantum gravity. These difficulties are connected with
the special role time plays in physics, and in quantum theory in
particular. Physical laws are, in general, laws of motion, of change
from one time to another. They represent change in the form of
differential equations for the evolution of, as the case may be,
classical or quantum states; the state represents the way the system
is at some *time*, and the laws allow one to predict how it
will be in the future (or retrodict how it was in the past). It is not
surprising, then, that a theory of quantum spacetime would have a
problem of time, because there is no classical time against which to
evolve the “state”. The problem is not so much that the
spacetime is dynamical; there is no problem of time in classical
general relativity. Rather, the problem is roughly that in quantizing
the structure of spacetime itself, the notion of a quantum state,
representing the structure of spacetime at some instant, and the
notion of the *evolution* of the state, do not get any
traction, since there are no real “instants”. (In some
approaches to canonical gravity, one fixes a time *before*
quantizing, and quantizes the spatial portions of the metric
only. This approach is not without its problems, however; see Isham
(1993) for discussion and further references.)

One can ask whether the problem of time arising from the canonical program tells us something deep and important about the nature of time. Julian Barbour (2001a,b), for one, thinks that it tells us that time is illusory (see also Earman, 2002, in this connection). It is argued that the fact that quantum states do not evolve under the super-Hamiltonian means that there is no change. However, it can also be argued (Weinstein, 1999a,b) that the super-Hamiltonian itself should not be expected to generate time-evolution; rather, one or more “true” Hamiltonians should play this role. (See Butterfield & Isham (1999) and Rovelli (2006) for further discussion.)

Bradley Monton (2006) has argued that a specific version of canonical
quantum gravity – that with a so-called *constant mean
extrinsic curvature* [CMC] (or fixed) foliation – has the
necessary resources to render presentism (the view that all and only
presently existing things exist) a live possibility
(see the section on Presentism, Eternalism, and The Growing Universe Theory
in the entry on time
for more on presentism). The reason is
that with such a fixed foliation one has at one's disposal some
spacelike hypersurface that contains a set of well-defined events that
one can view through the lens of presentism, such that this set of
events at this particular instant (or thin-sandwich) changes over
time. Though he readily admits that CMC formulations are outmoded in
the contemporary theoretical landscape, he nonetheless insists that
given the lack of experimental evidence one way or the other, it
stands as a viable route to quantum gravity, and therefore presentism
remains as a possible theory of time that is compatible with frontier
theoretical physics.
Christian Wüthrich (2010) takes Monton to task on a variety of
both technical and non-technical grounds. He rightly questions
Monton's claim that the CMC approach really is an *approach* to
quantum gravity, in the same sense as string theory and loop quantum
gravity. It is more of a piece of machinery that is used *within*
a pre-existing approach (namely, the canonical approach). He also
questions Monton's claim, inasmuch as it does constitute an approach
of sorts, that it is *viable*. Simply not being ruled out on
experimental grounds does not thereby render an approach
viable. Besides, if anything has the prospect of saving presentism,
then surely it is Julian Barbour's position mentioned above. This has
the added benefit of being a research programme that is being actively
pursued.

A common claim that appears in many discussions of the problem of time
(especially amongst philosophers) is that it is *restricted* to
canonical formulations of general relativity, and has something to do
with the Hamiltonian formalism (see Rickles 2008a, pp. 340–1 for more
details). The confusion lies in the apparently very different ways
that time is treated in general relativity as standardly formulated,
and as it appears in a canonical, Hamiltonian formulation. In the
former there is no preferred temporal frame, whereas the latter
appears to *demand* such a frame in order to get off the ground
(cf. Curiel, 2009, p. 59; Tim Maudlin (2004) tells a broadly similar
story).

However, this encodes several pieces of misinformation making it hard to make sense of the claim that general relativity and canonical theories cannot be “reconciled”. The canonical framework is simply a tool for constructing theories, and one that makes quantization an easier prospect. As a matter of historical fact the canonical formulation of general relativity is a completed project, and has been carried out in a variety of ways, using compact spaces and non-compact spaces, and with a range of canonical variables. Of course, general relativity, like Maxwell's theory of electromagnetism, possesses gauge symmetries, so it is a constrained theory that results, and one must employ the method of constrained Hamiltonian systems. However, there is no question that general relativity is compatible with the canonical analysis of theories, and the fact that time looks a little strange in this context is simply because the formalism is attempting to capture the dynamics of general relativity. In any case, the peculiar nature of general relativity and quantum gravity, with respect to the treatment of time, resurfaces in arguably the most covariant of approaches, the Feynman path-integral approach. In this case that central task is to compute the amplitude for going from an initial state to a final state (where these states will be given in terms of boundary data on a pair of initial and final hypersurfaces). The computation of this propagator proceeds à la sum-over-histories: one counts to the number of possible spacetimes that might interpolate between the initial and final hypersurfaces. However, one cannot get around the fact that general relativity is a theory with gauge freedom, and so whenever one has diffeomorphic initial and final hypersurfaces, the propagator will be trivial, and there will be no change.

A similar confusion can be found in discussions of the related problem of defining observables in canonical general relativity. The claim gets its traction from the fact that it is very difficult to construct observables in canonical general relativity, while (apparently) it is relatively straightforward in the standard Lagrangian description. (See, e.g., Curiel, 2009, pp. 59–60, for an explicit statement of this claim. Curiel cites a theorem of Torre, 1993, to the effect that there can be no local observables in compact spacetimes, to argue that the canonical formulation is defective somehow.) Again, this rests on a misunderstanding over what the canonical formalism is and how it is related to the standard spacetime formulation of general relativity. That there are no local observables is not an artefact of canonical general relativity. The notion that observables have to be non-local (in this case, relational) is a generic feature that results precisely from the full spacetime diffeomorphism invariance of general relativity (and is, in fact, implicit in the theorem of Torre mentioned earlier). It receives a particularly transparent description in the context of the canonical approach because one can define observables as quantities that commute with all of the constraints. The same condition will hold for the four-dimensional versions, only they will have to be spacetime diffeomorphism invariant in that case. This will still rule out local observables since any quantities defined at points or regions of the spacetime manifold will clearly fail to be diffeomorphism invariant. Hence, the problems of observables (and the result that they must be either global or relational in general relativity) is not a special feature of the canonical formulation, but a generic feature of theories possessing diffeomorphism invariance. As Ashtekar and Geroch point out, “[s]ince time is essentially a geometrical concept [in general relativity], its definition must be in terms of the metric. But the metric is also the dynamical variable, so the flow of time becomes intertwined with the flow of the dynamics of the system” (1974, p. 1215).

### 5.2 Ontology

The problem of time is closely connected with a general puzzle about
the ontology associated with “quantum spacetime”. Quantum
theory in general resists any straightforward ontological reading, and
this goes double for quantum *gravity*. In quantum mechanics,
one has particles, albeit with indefinite properties. In quantum field
theory, one again has particles (at least in suitably symmetric
spacetimes), but these are secondary to the fields, which again are
things, albeit with indefinite properties. On the face of it, the only
difference in quantum gravity is that spacetime itself becomes a kind
of quantum field, and one would perhaps be inclined to say that the
properties of spacetime become indefinite. But space and time
traditionally play important roles in individuating objects and their
properties—in fact a field is in some sense a set of properties
of spacetime points — and so the quantization of such raises real
problems for ontology.

One area that philosophers might profit from is in the investigation of the relational observables that appear to be necessitated by diffeomorphism invariance. For example, since symmetries (such as the gauge symmetries associated with the constraints) come with quite a lot of metaphysical baggage attached (as philosophers of physics know from the hole argument), such a move involves philosophically weighty assumptions. For example, the presence of symmetries in a theory would appear to allow for more possibilities than one without, so eradicating the symmetries (by solving the constraints and going to the reduced, physical phase space) means eradicating a chunk of possibility space: in particular, one is eradicating states that are deemed to be physically equivalent, despite having some formal differences in terms of representaton. Hence, imposing the constraints involves some serious modal assumptions. Belot and Earman (2001) have argued that since the traditional positions on the ontology of spacetime (relationalism and substantivalism) involve a commitment to a certain way of counting possibilities, the decision to eliminate symmetries can have serious implications for the ontology one can then adopt. Further, if some particular method (out of retaining or eliminating symmetries) were shown to be successful in the quest for quantizing gravity, then, they argue, one could have good scientific reasons for favouring one of substantivalism or relationalism. (See Belot, forthcoming, for more on this argument; Rickles, 2008c, explicitly argues against the idea that possibility spaces have any relevance for spacetime ontology.)

In the loop quantum gravity program, the area and volume operators
have *discrete* spectra. Thus, like spins, they can only take
certain values. This suggests (but does not imply) that space itself
has a discrete nature, and perhaps time as well (depending on how one
resolves the problem of time). This in turn suggests that space does
not have the structure of a differential manifold, but rather that it
only approximates such a manifold on large scales, or at low
energies. A similar idea, that classical spacetime is
an *emergent* entity, can be found in several approaches to
quantum gravity (see Butterfield and Isham, 1999 and 2001, for a
discussion of emergence in quantum gravity). The possibility that a
continuous structure (with continuous symmetries) could emerge from a
fundamentally discrete structure is a problem with a clear
philosophical flavour.

### 5.3 Status of quantum theory

Whether or not spacetime is discrete, the quantization of spacetime entails that our ordinary notion of the physical world, that of matter distributed in space and time, is at best an approximation. This in turn implies that ordinary quantum theory, in which one calculates probabilities for events to occur in a given world, is inadequate as a fundamental theory. As suggested in the Introduction, this may present us with a vicious circle. At the very least, one must almost certainly generalize the framework of quantum theory. This is an important driving force behind much of the effort in quantum cosmology to provide a well-defined version of the many-worlds or relative-state interpretations. Much work in this area has adopted the so-called ‘decoherent histories’ or ‘consistent histories’ formalism, whereby quantum theories are understood to make probabilistic predictions about entire (coarse-grained) ‘histories’. Almost all of this work to date construes histories to be histories of spatiotemporal events, and thus presupposes a background spacetime; however, the incorporation of a dynamical, quantized spacetime clearly drives much of the cosmology-inspired work in this area.

More generally, one might step outside the framework of canonical, loop quantum gravity, and ask why one should only quantize the metric. As pointed out by Isham (1994, 2002), it may well be that the extension of quantum theory to general relativity requires one to quantize, in some sense, not only the metric but also the underlying differential structure and topology. This is somewhat unnatural from the standpoint where one begins with classical, canonical general relativity and proceeds to “quantize” (since the topological structure, unlike the metric structure, is not represented by a classical variable). But one might well think that one should start with the more fundamental, quantum theory, and then investigate under which circumstances one gets something that looks like a classical spacetime.

One final issue we might mention here is whether there is a conflict
between the superposition principle and general relativity. Curiel
claims that “[t]here exists no physical phenomenon well
characterized by experiment that cannot be accurately described by one
of the two theories, and no physical phenomenon that suggests that one
of the two is correct to the detriment of the other's accuracy”
(2001, p. S432). However, Roger Penrose (2004, Chapter 30) has
forcefully argued that the superposition principle can, in some
circumstances, threaten the principle of general covariance, surely a
core principle of general relativity! The idea is that if we prepare a
lump of matter in a superposition of two position states (stationary
in their ambient spacetime), χ and φ, a state Penrose labels
a “Schrödinger's Lump” state, then the superposition
is represented by: |Ψ⟩ = *w*|χ⟩
+ *z*|φ⟩. Penrose then shows that a stationary
gravitational field does nothing to affect the fact that any
superposition of the (stationary) position states χ and φ
will also be stationary. But then introducing the gravitational field
of the lump itself raises a problem. By themselves, the components of
the superposition would not seem to raise problems, and we can simply
think of the field around the location associated with the lump's
states individually as being nearly classical. Given the stationarity
of the states χ and φ, there will be a distinct Killing
vector (i.e. a metric preserving vector field) associated with each
them. The problem then arises: what of superpositions of these lump
states? Are they stationary? Since the Killing vector fields of the
two component stationary states live on different spacetimes, with
different structures, it seems we don't have the invariant
spatiotemporal structure needed to answer the question. To try and say
that the spacetime is really the same (the obvious answer) would
conflict with general covariance since then one would be supposing a
robust notion of spacetime points which enables one to match up the
two spacetimes. As we have seen above, Penrose's proposed solution is
to consider such superpositions as generating a kind of geometric
instability which causes the collapse of the superposition.

Of course, one might question various moves in Penrose's reasoning here (especially as regards the nature of the gravitational fields of stationary quantum states), so there is clearly more to be said. But there is potentially a conflict (and a measurable one at that: see Penrose, 2002) between the superposition principle and principles of general relativity. Those with experience of the standard quantum measurement problem will find much to interest them in this problem.

### 5.4 The Planck Scale

It is almost Gospel that quantum gravity is what happens when you
reach the Planck scale. The standard refrain is that ‘something
peculiar’ happens to our concepts of space, time, and causality
at such such scales requiring radical revisions that must be described
by the quantum theory of gravity (see, e.g., Rovelli, 2007,
p. 1287). However, the arguments underlying this orthodoxy have not
been rigorously examined. The usual motivation involves a dimensional
analysis argument. The scales at which theories make their mark are
set by the values of the fundamental constants. In this way the
constants demarcate the domains of applicability of theories: *c*
tells us when specially relativistic effects will become apparent,
ℏ tells us when quantum effects will become apparent, and G
tells us when gravitational effects will become apparent. As Planck
was able to demonstrate in 1899, these constants can be combined so as
to uniquely determine a natural, absolute family of units that are
independent of all human and terrestrial baggage. The Planck length
can be written as (*Gℏ*/*c*^{3})^{½}
and has the value 10^{−33} in centimeters. Planck was not
aware of their relevance of the scale set by the constants to the
applicability of general relativity of course, but Eddington seems to
have been aware, writing in the March edition of *Nature* in
1918:

From the combination of the fundamental constants,G,c, andhit is possible to form a new fundamental unit of length L_{min}= 7 × 10^{−28}cm. It seems to be inevitable that this length must play some role in any complete interpretation of gravitation. ... In recent years great progress has been made in knowledge of the excessively minute; but until we can appreciate details of structure down to the quadrillionth or quintillionth of a centimetre, the most sublime of all the forces of Nature remains outside the purview of the theories of physics. (Eddington, 1918, p. 36)

The idea that the Planck length amounts to a *minimal* length
in nature follows from the argument that if distances smaller than
this length are resolved (say in the measurement of the position of a
mass), then it would require energies concentrated in a region so
small that a mini-black hole would form, taking the observed system
with it – see Rovelli (2007, p. 1289) for this
argument. Meschini (2007) is not convinced by such arguments, and
doesn't see that the case for the relevance of the Planck scale to
quantum gravity research has been properly made. He is suspicious of
the claims made on behalf of dimensional analysis. There is something
to Meschini's claims, for if the dimensional argument were true then,
without realising it, Planck would have stumbled upon the beginnings
of quantum gravity before either quantum field theory or general
relativity were produced! However, Meschini speculates that the final
theory of quantum gravity “has nothing to do with one or more of
the above-mentioned constants” (p. 278). This seems too strong a
statement, since a core condition on a theory of quantum gravity will
be to reduce to general relativity and quantum field theory as we know
it, according to limits involving these constants. Nonetheless,
Meschini is surely right that the details of these dimensional
arguments, and the role of the Planck scale are calling out for a
closer analysis.

### 5.5 Background Structure

In non-generally relativistic theories the spacetime metric is
frozen to a single value assignment for all times and all solutions:
it is model independent. Of course, in general relativity the metric
is what one solves for: the metric is a dynamical variable, which
implies that the geometry of spacetime is dynamical. This intuitive
notion is bundled into the concept of background freedom, or
background independence. In general, background independence is
understood to be the freedom of a theory from background structures,
where the latter amount to some kind of absolute, non-dynamical
objects in a theory. The extent to which their respective theories
incorporate background structures has recently proven to be a divisive
subject amongst string theorists and loop quantum gravity theorists
and others. It is often claimed that the central principle that
distinguishes general relativity from other theories is its (manifest)
background independence. But background independence is a slippery
notion meaning different things to different people. We face a series
of questions when considering background independence: What, exactly,
is it (beyond the simple intuitive notion)? Why is it considered to be
such an important principle? What theories incorporate it? To
what *extent* do they incorporate it?

The debate between strings and loops on this matter is severely
hampered by the fact that there is no firm definition of background
independence on the table and, therefore, the two camps are almost
certainly talking past each other when discussing this issue. It
seems *prima facie* reasonable to think that in order to
reproduce a manifestly background independent theory like general
relativity, a quantum theory of gravity should be background
independent too, and so background independence has begun to function
as a constraint on quantum gravity theories, in much the same way that
renormalizability used to constrain the construction of quantum field
theories. Advocates of loop quantum gravity often highlight the
background independence of their theory as a virtue that it has over
string theory. However, there is no proof of this implication, and
aspects of the so-called ‘holographic principle’ seem to
suggest that a background independent theory could be dual to a
background dependent theory (see the constructions to Biquard, ed.,
2005). Furthermore, depending on how we define the intuitive notion of
background independence, and if ‘clues’ from the duality
symmetries of M-theory are anything to go by, it looks like string
theory might even be *more* background independent than loop
quantum gravity, for the dimensionality of spacetime becomes a
dynamical variable too (cf. Stelle, 2000, p. 7).

Indeed, various string theorists claim that their theory is background independent. In many cases it seems that they have a different understanding of what this entails than loop quantum gravity researchers—this takes us to the first, definitional, question. In particular they seem to think that the ability to place a general metric in the Lagrangian amounts to background independence. This falls short of the mark for how the majority of physicists understand it, namely as a reactive dynamical coupling between spacetime and matter else. Though one can indeed place a variety of metrics in the stringy Lagrangian, one does not then vary the metric in the action. There is no interaction between the strings and the ambient spacetime. Indeed, this is not really distinct from quantum field theory of point particles in curved spacetimes: the same freedom to insert a general metric appears there too.

There is an alternative argument for the background independence of string theory that comes from the field theoretic formulation of the theory: string field theory. The idea is that classical spacetime emerges from the two dimensional conformal field theory on the strings worldsheet. However, in this case one surely has to say something about the target space, for the worldsheet metric takes on a metric induced from the ambient target spacetime. Yet another argument for the background independence of string theory might point to the fact that the dimensionality of spacetime in string theory has to satisfy an equation of motion (a consistency condition): this is how the dimensionality comes out (as 26 or 10, depending on whether one imposes supersymmetry). One contender for the definition of background independence is a structure that is dynamical in the sense that one has to solve equations of motion to get at its values. In this case we would have extreme background independence stretching to the structure of the manifold itself. However, the problem with this is that this structure is the same in all models of the theory; yet we intuitively expect background independent theories to be about structures that can vary across a theory's models.

The issues here are clearly subtle and complex, and philosophers have
only just begun to consider them. The central problem faced, as a
philosopher, when trying to make sense of claims such as these is that
there is no solid, unproblematic definition of background structure
(and therefore background independence and dependence) on the
table. Without this, one simply cannot decide who is right; one cannot
decide which theories are background independent and which are
not. Hence, an urgent issue in both physics and the philosophy of
physics is to work out exactly what is meant by ‘background
independence’ in a way that satisfies all parties, that is formally
correct, and that satisfies our intuitive notions of the
concept. Until this is achieved, background independence cannot be
helpfully used to distinguish the approaches, nor can we profitably
discuss its merits. A serious attempt to define background
independence in such a way as to make these tasks possible has been
made by Domenico Giulini (2007). But Giulini admits that a general
definition still eludes us. The stumbling block might be that
background independence simply isn't a formal property of theories at
all. Gordon Belot (2007) has recently argued that background
independence is partly an *interpretive* matter, and that one can
have varying levels of background independence (the latter notion is
also defended by Lee Smolin, 2006). Rickles (2008b) argues that the
place to seek a notion of background independence that can be put to
use in the quantum gravitational context is by focusing on the kinds
of *observables* that an approach employs, rather than squarely
on properties of the equations of motion.

### 5.6 Necessity of Quantization

In earlier research on quantum gravity it was often supposed that
if there was at least one quantum field in the world together with the
gravitational field, then given the universal coupling of the
gravitational field, it must follow that the quantization of the one
field somehow infects the gravitational field, implying that it must
necessarily have quantum properties too. The arguments basically
involve the consideration of a mass prepared in a superposition of
position eigenstates. If the gravitational field remained classical
(and, therefore, not constrained by the uncertainty relations) then
one could violate the uncertainty relations by simply making
measurements of the gravitational field, discovering the properties of
the quantized matter to which it was coupled. However, all attempts at
making this argument stick have so far failed, meaning that there is
no logical necessity demanding that we quantize the gravitational
field. Given that we also seemingly lack experimental reasons for
quantization of the gravitational field (since we have not observed
evidence of its quantum properties), several physicists (and
philosophers) have questioned the programme as it stands. It is, they
argue, a matter for experiment to decide, not logic. Note, however,
that this does not mean that the project of quantum gravity itself
rests on unsteady ground: if there are quantum fields and
gravitational fields in the world, then given the nature of gravity,
we need to say *something* about the manner in which they
interact. What is being questioned is whether this means that gravity
cannot itself remain fundamentally classical while interacting with
quantum fields. After all, as far as all our experiments show: gravity
is classical and matter is quantum. This pessimistic argument is
usually traced back to Rosenfeld, though he wavered somewhat on the
matter (see DeWitt and Rickles, 2011, p. 164 and p. 170, for
Rosenfeld's arguments).

If it is to remain fundamentally classical, then there is the simple question of what such a classical gravitational field would couple to: the quantum properties? That seems problematic for the reasons given above. Moreover, given the form of the Einstein field equations, with a classical c-number on the left hand side, that would mean equating a c-number with a q-number (i.e. a quantum operator). The standard way out of this problem is to couple the gravitational field instead to the expectation value of the stress-energy tensor of some quantized matter field. The expectation value is a c-number. There have been a variety of arguments and no-go theorems against this so-called semi-classical gravitational theory, most of which replay the kind of argument invoking violations of the uncertainty relations sketched above (see Eppley and Hannah 1977, and Page and Geilker 1981). Basically, the upshot of the Eppley and Hannah paper is that, given the coexistence of classical gravity and quantum fields, two things can happen upon a gravitational field measurement: on the one hand the quantum wavefunction could collapse, in which case there momentum non-conservation. On the other hand, the measurement could leave the quantum wavefunction in a coherent state, in which case signals can be sent faster than light. Mattingly (2006) argues that, when properly analyzed, the thought experiments employed by Eppley and Hannah violation basic physical principles involving the construction of the equipment that would be needed to make the necessary field measurements.

A batch of new approaches based on analogies with condensed matter physics and hydrodynamics point to another way in which gravity can escape quantization, though not in a truly fundamental sense. According to such approaches, gravity is emergent in the sense that the metric (or connection) variables, and other variables representing gravitational features, are collective variables that only appear at energies away from the Planck scale. In other words, gravity is a purely macroscopic, low energy phenomenon and general relativity is an effective field theory. This leaves the task of actually filling in the details of the microscopic structure of spacetime (the ‘atoms of spacetime’) out of which the low energy collective variables emerge (see Hu, 2009, for a conceptually oriented review of such approaches). As Rovelli notes (2007, p. 1304), the mere fact that the gravitational field is an emergent, collective variable does not thereby imply an absence of quantum effects, and it is possible that collective variables too are governed by quantum theory.

Wüthrich (2005, pp. 779–80) has argued that the very existence of
approaches to quantum gravity that do not involve the quantization of
the gravitational field means that quantization of the gravitational
field has to be a *contingent* matter. However, this seems to
rest on a mistake. It might still be the case that there are reasons
of logical consistency forbidding the union of a classical and quantum
field even though there are entirely distinct non-quantization
approaches. For example, string theory does not quantize the
gravitational field; however, it is clearly wrong to say that the
existence of this position would be ruled out if the various no-go
theorems outlawing hybrid classical-quantum theories were true. The
fact that one can isolate states corresponding to gravitons in the
string spectrum stands quite independent from issues over the
interaction of classical and quantum field. The question of the
necessity of quantization (as a result of coupling a classical
gravitational field to quantum fields) should be held separate from
the prospect of producing a quantum theory of gravity that does not
involve gravitational field quantization, for both input theories, for
describing the classical and quantum fields, could be fundamentally
wrong at high energies, requiring entirely new principles. However, a
stronger argument against the impossibility hybrids is provided by
James Mattingly, who points out that since there are satisfiable
axioms for semiclassical theories, inconsistency cannot be established
in general (2009, p. 381).

## 6. Conclusion

Research on quantum gravity is beset by a combination of formal, experimental, and conceptual difficulties. It is inevitable that the quest for a quantum theory of gravity will continue – whether for reasons of necessity or not – and it seems that the resolution of the problem will require an equivalent combination of formal, experimental, and conceptual expertise. Given this, and given the central position quantum gravity research occupies in theoretical physics, it makes good sense for philosophers of physics (and general philosophers of science) to do their best to acquaint themselves with the central details of the problem of quantum gravity and the main approaches that are seeking to crack the problem. Beyond this, quantum gravity research has the potential to invigorate several standard areas of philosophical inquiry, including our standard notions of theory construction, selection and justification; the nature of space, time, matter, and causality, and it also introduces a new case study in emergence, with entirely novel features.

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## Other Internet Resources

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### Useful Web Resources

- Ascending and Descending, M.C. Escher.
- Relativity, M.C. Escher.
- The Meaning of Einstein's Equations, by John Baez (University of California, Riverside).
- General relativity tutorial, also by John Baez (University of California, Riverside)
- Detection of gravitational radiation, 1993 Nobel prize presentation to Russell Hulse and Joseph Taylor.
- The official string theory website, maintained by Patricia Schwarz.
- Gravity In The Quantum World And The Cosmos (online videos), 33rd SLAC Summer Institute on Particle Physics.
- Quantum Gravity Videos, Perimeter Institute Recorded Seminar Archive.
- Luca Bombelli's quantum gravity reading list.