Supplement to The Problem of Evil

An Alternate Formulation of the Argument

One feature of the above formulation of the argument is that the predicate \(\textit{PreventsExistence}\) introduces intensional contexts, since \(\textit{PreventsExistence}(x,y)\) entails the non-existence of \(y\). One might very well prefer to avoid this. If so, the argument could be recast by talking instead of preventing the existence of states of affairs of a given type. The argument might then be formulated as follows:

  1. Any state of affairs in which animals die agonizing deaths in forest fires, or where children undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer is (a) intrinsically bad or undesirable, and (b) such that an omniscient and omnipotent person could have prevented the existence of that state of affairs without thereby either allowing an equal or greater evil, or preventing an equal or greater good.
  2. If a person prevents the existence of all states of affairs of type \(S\), and all states of affairs of type \(T\) are also states of affairs of type \(S\), then that person also prevents the existence of all states of affairs of type \(T\).

Therefore, from (1) and (2):

  1. If a person prevents the existence of any state of affairs that is (a) intrinsically bad or undesirable,and (b) such that an omniscient and omnipotent person could have prevented the existence of that state of affairs without thereby either allowing an equal or greater evil, or preventing an equal or greater good, then that person also prevents the existence of all state of affairs in which animals die agonizing deaths in forest fires, or where children undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer.
  2. Any omniscient and morally perfect person prevents the existence of any state of affairs that is both (a) intrinsically bad or undesirable, and (b) such that he could prevent its existence without either allowing an equal or greater evil, or preventing an equal or greater good.

Therefore, from (3) and (4):

  1. Any omniscient, omnipotent, and morally perfect person prevents the existence of any state of affairs in which animals die agonizing deaths in forest fires, or where children undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer.
  2. If a person prevents the existence of all states of affairs of type \(S\), than there are no states of affairs of type \(S\)

Therefore, from (5) and (6):

  1. If there is an omniscient, omnipotent, and morally perfect person, there are no states of affairs in which animals die agonizing deaths in forest fires, or where children undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer.
  2. There exist states of affairs in which animals die agonizing deaths in forest fires, or where children undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer.

Therefore, from (7) and (8) by modus ponens:

  1. There is no omniscient, omnipotent, and morally perfect person.
  2. If God exists, then he is an omniscient, omnipotent, and morally perfect person.

Therefore, from (9) and (10):

  1. God does not exist.

This alternative formulation seems to me preferable. But it does require quantifiers that range over both individuals and types of states of affairs.

Return to Footnote 2 to The Problem of Evil

Copyright © 2015 by
Michael Tooley <Michael.Tooley@Colorado.edu>

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