‘Evolution’ in contemporary discussions denotes the theory of the change of organic species over time. Prior to the second half of the nineteenth century, the term was used primarily, if not exclusively, in an embryological sense to designate the development of the individual embryo. Since the writings of Herbert Spencer (1820–1903), and particularly since the publication of Darwin's Origin of Species in 1859, the term has been used to designate historical alterations of species. This meaning of the term also covers two primary forms of species evolution: (a) progressive linear historical changes of species from simple to complex forms, such as can be found in Jean-Baptiste Lamarck's theory of evolution (1809); (b) branching species change from common ancestors as formulated by Darwin in 1859. Since Darwin's work, evolution has been typically linked with the theory of natural selection as the primary cause by which such species change has occurred over historical time. This coupling of evolution and natural selection theory, and the claimed competence of natural selection theory to explain both micro and macro evolution has, however, formed one of the most commonly debated issues in the history of evolutionary biology since Darwin. Since this article will survey the broad history of these theories, the term ‘transformism’ will generally be used to designate the theory of species change prior to the shift in meaning of the term ‘evolution’ that occurs in the 1860s.
This entry intends to give a broad historical review of the topic through a combined historical and conceptual analysis. Other entries in this encyclopedia should be consulted for more limited discussions. The issues will be examined under the following headings:
- 1. Transformism Before Darwin
- 2. Darwinian Evolution
- 3. Post-Darwinian Evolution
- 4. Summary and Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Scientific transformism in the nineteenth century, associated traditionally with the names of Jean-Baptiste Lamarck (1744–1829), Charles Darwin (1812–1882), and to a lesser degree, Alfred Russel Wallace (1823–1913), was the product of a complex historical development of theories about the nature of organic life, the classification of forms, the relation of time to the world order, and the relation of the natural world to theories of origin. These inquiries were initiated by a series of natural philosophers in the middle of the seventeenth century, but, as a scientific research program with institutional foundations, the investigations of the transformation of species can be traced to the work of Enlightenment naturalists nearly a century before the publication of Darwin's Origin in 1859. It was particularly among the natural historians associated with the King's garden and natural history collection in Paris that these discussions took on a new form. Through the combination of theoretical reflection and institutional structure, these inquiries were given a precise development that they otherwise would not have attained. This explains, at least in part, why evolutionary theory emerged in the nineteenth century rather than in direct response to the transformations in natural philosophy of the seventeenth.
In many respects, the general idea of species transformism is an old concept. The reflections of Empedocles (ca. 495–35 BCE) and the views of the Greek Atomists among the Presocratic nature philosophers formed a historical resource for later speculations. These Presocratic speculations combined naturalistic myths of origins with the workings of chance-like processes to create a naturalistic account of the origins of existing forms of life.
However, these accounts were also opposed on several levels by the subsequent mainstream Greek philosophical tradition. The writings of Plato (427–327 BCE) included his long creation myth, Timaeus, the one Platonic dialogue available continuously in the Latin Western tradition. This presented a locus classicus for the notion of an externally-imposed origin of living beings through the action of a Craftsman (demiourgos) who created the cosmos and all living beings in accord with eternal archetypes or forms, realizing through this both aesthetic and rational ends. Plato's account initiated the long tradition of reflection that later interacted with the Jewish, Christian, and Islamic Biblical concepts of creation. These formed the foundation for the conclusion that organic beings were the product of external creative design. One common meaning of “teleology” as encountered in discussions of evolution since Darwin—that of externally imposed design by an intelligent agency (demiurge, nature, God)—dates from Plato's account.
In Aristotle's (384–322 BCE) seminal biological writings, the external teleology of a designer-creator was replaced by an internal teleological purposiveness associated with the immanent action of an internal cause—in living beings the soul (psuche)— which functioned as the formal, final and efficient cause of life (De anima II:415b 10–30). Aristotle did not endorse the concept of an historical origin of the world, affirming instead the eternity of the world order. The metaphysical requirement that the soul-as-form (eidos) be permanent and enduring through the process of the generation of “like by like” also seemed for much of the subsequent tradition to amount to a denial of the possibility that natural species could change over time in their essential properties, even though local adaptation in “accidental” properties was fully possible. Since individual beings were dynamic composites of a material substrate and an immaterial and eternal form (eidos), the accidental differentiation of the substantial form in individuals did not affect the metaphysical endurance of the species. In living beings, the soul-as-form is serially passed on through time in the act of generation to create an eternal continuity of the form. This supplied a metaphysical foundation for the notion of species permanence without reliance on an external creative agency (De anima II: 415b 1–10). Challenges have, however, been raised to the claim that Aristotle was such a strong “essentialist” in his biology as this might seem to imply (Lennox 1987).
One interpretive issue in the exegesis of Aristotle's conception of species concerns the degree to which he was committed to asserting more than the eternity of the three main “genera” —plants, animals and humans—rather than the eternity of each individual kind (De generatione animalium II. 731b 32–732a5). As Aristotle's views were developed in the West following the textual recoveries of the late Middle Ages, however, it was assumed that Aristotle's commitment was to an essential fixity of each definable substantial form. Furthermore, to reconcile Aristotle with the theological doctrine of creation, this required denial of the eternity of species. As I shall develop below, however, the species concept itself was only “hardened” in the early modern period with the rise of the mechanical philosophy and preformationist embryology.
The immediate “pre-history” of evolutionary theory can be conveniently dated from the first efforts of natural philosophers of the seventeenth century to conceptualize a naturalistic history of the earth (Bowler 2003, chp. 2; Oldroyd 1996; Greene 1959). Although the recovery in the fifteenth century of Titus Lucretius's (94?–55 BCE) Epicurean poem, De rerum natura, introduced ancient atomist reflections on origins into early modern discussion, the systematic reflections on relevant issues date specifically from the synthesis of natural philosophy and metaphysics put forth by René Descartes (1596–1650) in his Principia philosophiae (1st ed. 1644). This developed and summarized issues developed in fuller detail in the Le Monde (The World, or Treatise on Light) published posthumously in 1664, with an improved edition appearing in 1677.
It is significant for the subsequent history of this question that these Cartesian speculations were introduced in the form of a counter-factual hypothesis that explicitly sought to avoid conflict with accepted religious doctrines of origin (Descartes 1983,1647, 181). In this hypothetical account, Descartes derived the earth from a cooled star “formerly…like the Sun” (ibid.). By its gradual solidification in a great celestial vortex, the Earth took form. Subsequent drying and cracking formed the ocean basins, the continents and the mountain ranges.
An outstanding issue in Descartes's account was his failure to incorporate the origins of living beings into this naturalistic story of creation by natural laws. Although manuscripts display the degree to which Descartes attempted on several occasions to work out some linkage between his general natural philosophy and the embryological formation of living beings, this was not discussed in print during his lifetime. Both in the published Principles, as well as in the posthumously published Treatise on Man (1662, 1664) and the The World, Descartes skipped over the issue of a naturalistic account of either the individual embryo or the species, and dealt with the issues of the living state by positing a hypothetical statue-machine created directly by divine action, and possessed immediately of all human functions and structures (Descartes 1983, 1647, 275–76; idem., 1972, 1664, 1–5).
These Cartesian speculations conveyed to Descartes's successors at least two issues. First, by presenting this historical account as a counterfactual hypothesis, a means of understanding the history of nature that was adapted to the limitations of the human mind, rather than as a literally true account, Descartes provided the option of a purely fictionalist reading of historical science that persisted into the nineteenth century. Second, the integration of living beings into the new natural philosophy of mechanistic naturalism was left unresolved. If anything, it accentuated the problem of providing a naturalistic explanation of the origins of living beings.
At least two traditions can be traced out in the wake of Descartes's reflections. Beginning with the De solido intra solidum naturaliter contento dissertationis prodromus of 1669 by the Danish Cartesian Nicholas Steno (1638–86), efforts commenced to draw the origins of living beings into the Cartesian cosmology, in this case primarily by granting that fossils were the remains of once existing organisms on an earth that had formed historically. There was, however, no effort made to account for the origins of these beings on Cartesian principles (Rudwick 1972).
A second interpretation created a series of reflections that came to be known generically as “theories of the earth” in subsequent literature. This tradition commenced with the Telluris theoria sacra, published in 1681 (English edition 1684) by the English clergyman, Thomas Burnet (1635–1715). Burnet sought to reconcile a Cartesian-derived historical account of the origins of the Earth with the creation account of the Mosaic tradition. In Burnet's account, the Earth began from an original chaos fashioned by divine action into the existing Earth through a series of changes that involved the gradual separation of the continents, the reversal of the poles, and the Mosaic flood. To explain the origin of living beings, Burnet relied on the “spontaneous fruitfulness of the ground” in the primeval Edenic world, rather than on the direct creation of forms through divine action (Burnet 1965,1691, 141). By connecting this account to the Biblical story of Genesis I, Burnet broke with Cartesian counterfactualism, offering for the first time a fully realistic interpretation of a Cartesian-style developmental history of nature that also included the origins of living forms.
The issues involved in the subsequent “theory of the earth” tradition, as they were amplified by such natural philosophers as John Ray (1627–1705), John Woodward (1665–1728), and William Whiston (1667–1752), failed to achieve a consensus position on the question of the origins of organisms (Rudwick 1972). This issue was also complicated by the intimate connection drawn between the origin of forms in time and the theories of the embryological origin of individual organisms through normal generation. Both processes involved a notion of the alteration of form over time. Over a long history in the West, these issues were intimately associated in a particular way. In the traditions deriving from Aristotle's natural philosophy, sexual generation and the subsequent embryological development of the individual from primordial matter took place under the action of the soul (psuche) that was typically derived from the male parent. This theory also formed the explanation of how the species achieved eternity in time (De anima II: 415b 1–10). With the introduction of the theory of divine creation in Jewish, Christian and Islamic thought, a distinction had to be made between the first origin of species in historical time, and the normal generation of the individual. The origin of species was attributed to divine action, but origin of the individual organism itself was due to secondary causation by the parents. This separation of issues was strong in theological accounts accepting aspects of Aristotelianism (Thomas Aquinas), but was less clear in traditions indebted to Augustinian theology. Of considerable importance for early modern discussions was Augustine's theory of the original creation of the seeds (rationes seminales) of each species at an original moment in time that simply unfolded or developed later in historical time (Augustine 1982, chp. 23, 175–76; Roger 1997a, 264–66). As many interpreted Augustine's arguments, he provided support for the claim that both the species and the individual were products of direct divine creation.
In its seventeenth-century context, the issue of origins was also tied closely with the debates over the possibility of spontaneous generation of forms (Roger 1997a, chp. 2). Burnet, for example, seemed to imply that species could simply originate from unformed matter in the earth. The experimental refutations of current theories of spontaneous generation by such life scientists as Francesco Redi (1626–67), weakened, but did not destroy, the belief in spontaneous generation. Evidence for spontaneous generation could always be explained by appeal to Augustine's theory of the pre-existent rationes seminales.
Mechanistic accounts that attempted to explain either species or individual origins through an appeal to the properties of matter and the working of natural laws, however, ran into severe conceptual and empirical difficulties. The empirical researches of William Harvey (1578–1657), published in his Observations on the Generation of Animals in 1651, claimed to refute on empirical grounds the theory of the male and female semen utilized in all early mechanistic theories, such as those put forth by Pierre Gassendi (1592 –1655) and Nathaniel Highmore (1613–85) (Fisher 2006 in Smith 2006). The ridicule that greeted Descartes's own posthumously-published account in 1677 of the formation of the fetus by mechanical action on a male and female semen suggested that his comprehensive mechanical philosophy could not deal with this question. “Mechanistic” epigenesis, as these theories might be termed, was generally rejected in the latter seventeenth century. As we shall see below, however, such theories were to be revived in a modified form in the middle of the eighteenth century in a form that was closely tied to the origins of species transformism.
As a consequence of the failure of “mechanistic” epigenesis, post-Cartesian mechanists, particularly those on the Continent, who were concerned to bring organisms within the purview of the mechanical philosophy, opted instead for some version of a preformation theory of origins, or more accurately, a “pre-existence” theory of generation. First set forth by Jan Swammerdam (1637–80) in the late 1660s, and then given an influential philosophical statement by Nicholas Malebranche (1638–1715) in his Recherche de la vérité of 1674, some form of pre-existence theory became paradigmatic in the Kuhnian sense in the life sciences of the late seventeenth and early eighteenth centuries, particularly among those embracing the “mechanical” philosophy in some form. These pre-existence theories all denied the origins of forms in historical time. Questions of organic origin were removed to divine action at the first creation of the world (Roger 1997a, chp. 6).
At least three variants of the theory of pre-existence can be distinguished. Two of these assumed the pre-existence of forms in miniature, either encased in the ovaries of the female (Ovism), the original version, or after the discovery of spermatozoa in 1677, in the testes of the male (Vermism). These generally became the main versions one finds expressed in the official medical and professional gynecological literature of the 1670–1740 period. A third alternative, having few followers in the seventeenth and early eighteenth century, but one that became particularly popular by the 1770s, was the theory of pre-formed “germs,” given its first clear statement by Claude Perrault (1608–80). This theory, closely resembling in some respects St. Augustine's theory of creation by means of rationes seminales mentioned above, held that the first primordia of organisms were formed at the original creation as seeds dispersed in the soil, from which they were taken in with food. Under the proper conditions and within the correct organisms, these “germs” became implanted in the ovaries from which they then developed in response to fertilization. In all three accounts, the act of fertilization provided the occasion, and not the cause, of the development of organisms in time.
The theory of preexistence was seen to solve many problems. First, it explained the intimate interrelation of structure and function that seemed to require the existence of parts of the organism in an integrated system. The heart could not beat without ennervation, and the nerves could not exist without the heart. Consequently the entire organism must pre-exist, so the argument went. The existence of such integrated systems seemed difficult to explain by the sequential development of parts, as implied in Aristotelian and other “epigenetic” theories of development. Second, this account was easily harmonized with theological developments in the seventeenth century, particularly on the Continent with the growth of Calvinism (Protestant) and Jansenism (Catholic). In both of these traditions, Augustine's solution formed the basis for a “theistic” mechanism that emphasized God's omnipotence and the passivity of nature (Roger 1997a, chp. 6). As a third strength of the theory, the pre-existence theory, at least in the versions that embraced the “germ” theory, allowed for the appearance of life in time, as seemed to be suggested by the existence of fossil forms. At the same time it did not imply any change of species or development of one species from another over history. Finally, some kind of preformation of the embryo could be reconciled with the best microscopic observations of the late seventeenth and early eighteenth centuries, as these were reported by such experts on this instrument as Anton van Leeuwenhoek (1632–1723), Jan Swammerdam (1637–80 ), Marcello Malpighi (1628–94), and Henry Baker (1690–1774).
As embryological origin bears on the question of species transformism, the pre-existence theory effectively removed the organism from the effects of local circumstance and environmental conditions and placed the origin of species, as well as that of the individual, at a moment in the original creation. A quote from a contemporary source illustrates this point:
And indeed all the Laws of Motion which are as yet discovered, can give but a very lame account of the forming of a Plant or Animal. We see how wretchedly Des Cartes came off when he began to apply them to this subject; they are form'd by Laws yet unknown to Mankind, and it seems most probable that the Stamina of all the Plants and Animals that have ever been, or ever shall be in the World, have been formed ab Origine Mundi [from the foundation of the world] by the Almighty Creator within the first of each respective kind. (Garden 1691, 476–77)
The immediate consequence of this theory was a new rigidity given to the concept of species that it had not possessed in the Aristotelian and Scholastic traditions. Pre-existence theory reinforced a sharp distinction between “essential” and “accidental” properties to a degree not implied by the prior tradition. This theory made it difficult to explain obvious empirical phenomena, such as monstrosity, the regeneration of lost parts, the resemblances of offspring to both parents, evidence for geographical variation, racial differences, or even the existence of hybrid forms such as the mule. It seemed necessary to attribute these anomalies to divine action at an original creation. These difficulties in the theory resulted in a variety of criticisms that were eventually to lead to the downfall of preexistence theory in its original form, although the theory was to have a long subsequent history through a modification of the “germ” theory (Detlefsen 2006 in Smith 2006; Roger 1997a, chp. 7; Roe, 1981).
The dominance of some form of preexistence theory of generation between roughly 1670 and the 1740s provides some explanation for the lack of efforts among natural philosophers to develop transformist theories of species origins in the same period. Although there were exceptions to this claim—the Epicurean cosmology developed by Benôit de Maillet (1656–1738) in the manuscript Telliamed that circulated in French circles for ten years before its publication in 1748, offered bold speculations on how sea creatures developed into land forms over time—the period before the middle of the eighteenth century was dominated by a theory of organic generation that effectively precluded the naturalistic development of species. The development of scientific transformism was therefore intimately tied to new theories of generation.
The first beginnings of these inquiries can be conveniently dated to the 1740s. In 1744 the Swedish naturalist, Carl von Linné (Linnaeus) (1707–1778) offered a theory in his Oratio de telluris habitabilis incremento (Oration on the Increase of the Habitated World), in which he presented a narrative of a historical creation of the present world and its inhabitants by descent from a few original forms that had been created by divine action on a primeval equatorial island. In response to evidence for the sudden creation of new species that was drawn to his attention in 1744, he later developed a theory of how the original forms had likely hybridized to create new species in time. This Linnaean thesis of species origin by the hybridization of original forms was to have a long history, extending to the work of Gregor Mendel. The hybridization theory does not, however, imply a genuine historical change of species in the sense of later transformism, and in some respects it was to form a source of opposition to genuine transformism, as will be seen in the latter part of this article.
The emergence of the first systematic speculations on the changes of species in response to external changes of conditions was directly tied to the critiques of the pre-existence theory of generation. Beginning in the 1740s, efforts were made to replace the pre-existence theory with a reformulated version of “mechanistic” epigenetic embryology described above. These revived and revised theories were first given currency by the French natural philosopher Pierre de Maupertuis (1698–1759) in a popular series of treatises published between 1744 and 1751. In these Maupertuis returned to the theory of the origin of the embryo from the Galenic-Hippocratic theory of the “two seeds” previously utilized in the discredited theories of Descartes. To deal with the difficulty of explaining how atomistic seeds could be formed by mechanical action into the complexity of the embryo without the intervention of an external organizing principle, Maupertuis formulated a series of theories originally relying upon Newtonian attraction between corresponding particles, and finally on a theory that claimed the particles themselves to be endowed with an internal principle that led them to arrange themselves to form specific parts of the fetus. With Maupertuis, we can distingish a new version of mechanistic epigensis that tied it to a theory of vital matter (Terrall 2002, chp. 7; Hoffheimer 1982).
There are two ways in which this theoretical change in embryological theory instituted by Maupertuis bore on the transformation of species. First, this account allowed that the embryo actually comes to be in historical time. Second, it involved a theory of material inheritance through the passing on of atomized material from one generation to the next. Third, the conservation of the identity of the species was guaranteed only by the transmission of unaltered material. If this process was altered by circumstances in any way, the possibility of significant change in the lineage of ancestor and descendant was not precluded. The embryo had been made part of a historical process. These options, opened up by Maupertuis's speculations, were then developed and elaborated within an institutional setting by his associate, Georges-Louis LeClerc, comte de Buffon (1707–88).
As the head of the King's Garden and Natural History Cabinet in Paris for the last half-century of the Bourbon monarchy (1739–88), Buffon was institutionally situated to occupy the position of the major theoretician of the natural-historical sciences of his era, unequalled even by his contemporary Linnaeus. Furthermore, through his analyses of the issue of animal and plant generation, his reformulation of the problems surrounding the “theory of the earth,” and through his methodological revolution in the epistemology of the natural-historical sciences, Buffon was able to set up a series of theoretical questions that could be developed further by his successors. In this way he was the key figure in the pre-Darwinian period to open up the issues of transformism.
Buffon's major work, the Histoire naturelle, générale et particulière, avec la description du cabinet du roi (1749–89), with the first series (1749–67) written in collaboration with the comparative anatomist Marie-Louis Daubenton (1716–1800), dealt not only with the material suggested by its title, but also with issues in the foundational epistemology and methodology of the natural-historical sciences. Throughout the Natural History Buffon offered to a wide readership a new vision of inquiry into plants, animals and the “theory of the earth” that re-oriented investigations after this point. Originally intended to deal with the entire range of animals, plants and minerals, in actual realization his Natural History dealt only with the natural history of the primary quadrupeds in the first fourteen volumes (1749–67). The natural history of the birds was treated in a second series of nine volumes (1770–83). A series of seven volumes of supplements offered additional reflections on issues related to the quadrupeds and historical cosmology. An additional five volumes (1783–88) dealt with issues of mineralogy and chemistry. Continuations of these inquiries after his death by his understudy Bernard de Lacépède (1756–1825) extended Buffon's general approach into the reptiles (1788–89), fishes (1798–1803) and cetaceans (1804). The “age of Buffon” became a defining era in natural history and established the King's garden and its Revolutionary successor, the Muséum national d'histoire naturelle, as the foremost institutional center of natural-historical inquiry through the nineteenth century (Spary 2000, chp. 1; Corsi 1988, 2001).
As a natural philosopher of major proportions who explored foundational methodological and philosophical questions while he also participated in the analysis of empirical questions, Buffon has been seen as deeply innovative in the unusual way in which he sought to validate the inquiry into natural history in relation to a naturalized epistemology that scholars have seen as novel for its time (Hoquet 2005; Roger 1997a, chp. 9; Roger 1997b, chp. 6). In this methodological revolution, Buffon claimed epistemic warrant for a form of empirical certitude— termed “physical truth” [verité physique]— that could be attained through inquiries into the concrete relations of beings in their material relations, and he opposed this “physical” truth to the “abstractions” of mathematical physics that had previously claimed to be the route to certitude in the sciences. Developed in a long “Discourse on Method” that opened his Natural History, Buffon contrasted the “physical” truth obtained in the “concrete” sciences, such as he intended to lay out in the Natural History, to the mere “mathematical” certainty available in the “abstract” sciences like mathematics. Building upon his own early work on probability calculus, Buffon argued that a science which is based upon repeated observation can achieve a degree of scientific certitude that surpasses that available from a mathematical analysis of nature (Hoquet 2005; Grene and Depew 2004; Roger 1997b, chp. 6; Sloan 1987; Buffon 1749 in Lyon and Sloan, 1981, esp. 122–27). From the basis of this novel epistemological framework, Buffon reoriented natural history away from a primarily classificatory project to one which sought to extend the concept of natural history to encompass the analysis of organisms in relation to conditions of existence, to biogeography, and in his later work, to an integration of historical biology with cosmology and historical geology. If he was not alone responsible for “bursting the limits of time,” he was one of the major figures in the “time revolution” of the latter eighteenth century (Rudwick 2005).
Buffon's new “style” of natural-historical inquiry also disconnected it from its long association with providential “design-contrivance” natural theology. It also made natural history into an alternative theoretical project that asserted the claims of this form of inquiry against the heritage of mathematical physics. Natural historical science now claimed its own methodology; it asserted that it yielded truths greater than those available in mathematical physics; it presented a research program directed toward the understanding of the habits, anatomy, ecology, distribution, and history of living beings. Buffon also broke with the Cartesian “counter-factual” tradition of discussion in the theory of the earth discussions. Even though all these points were made in fragmentary form, and often without satisfactory development from a general philosophical point of view, their presentation in Buffon's widely influential work profoundly affected the subsequent tradition of natural history.
Buffon was also able to give these inquiries a concrete institutional basis. As the autocratic director of the Paris Jardin du Roi, with its attendent large Cabinet of specimens from all over the world, he transformed the Jardin into a center of research into comparative anatomy, chemistry, minerology, botany, and biogeographical study (Spary 2000). By providing an institutional setting for these inquiries, the speculations and theoretical reflections of eighteeth-century natural historians could be subjected to organized critique and specialized examination in a context not found elsewhere in the natural-historical sciences of the period. Buffon's theoretical vision provided a concrete framework against which those immediately associated with the Jardin could develop further reflections on such issues as the nature and duration of species, the significance of comparative anatomical studies, the historical relationships of forms, and the systematic relations of living beings to one another.
The concrete manifestation of Buffon's combination of novel methodology and empirical inquiry is displayed by his treatment of embryological generation in the second volume of his Natural History. It extends from there into his unusual analysis of the meaning of “species” in natural history. In both instances, the notion of epistemic certainty gained from a “constant recurrence” of events seems to have played a fundamental role in his reflections. Following the lead of his friend Maupertuis, Buffon revived the classical theory of the two seeds to explain animal generation, deriving the origin of the embryo from the mechanical mixture of these ingredients. Amplifying upon Maupertuis's prior speculations, he explained the organization of the particles of these two seeds into a structured whole through microforces closely identified with Newtonian attractive forces that formed an organizing force-field, an “internal mold,” that assimilated matter in the proper order for embryological development. Viewed in longer historical perspective, Buffon's theory of the internal mold functioned in a way similar to Aristotle's notion of a substantial form, and was likely influenced by Aristotle's discussions. It serves as an immanent principle of organization that acts in company with matter to form the unified organism. The internal mold also guaranteed the perpetuation of like by like over time. Unlike Aristotle's substantial form, however, Buffon's internal mold is passive and without an internal finality in its action. It is also not a principle of vitalization.
For this reason, Buffon was conceptually required to attribute some new powers to matter to account for vital action. Like Maupertuis before him, Buffon did not assume that an inert and common matter was sufficient for a plausible formulation of a theory of mechanical epigenesis. Vital properties therefore had to be attributed to a specific kind of matter confined to living beings, the organic molecules, that possessed inherent dynamic properties. This introduction of the concept of “vital” matter by Buffon, even with these restrictions on its actions, represents an important development in the history of the life sciences of this period. It broke with the uniformity of matter assumed by the Newtonian, Gassendist, and Cartesian traditions, and in a limited way it positioned Buffon at the opening of the “vitalist” revolution that was to open the door to genuine species transformism, even though Buffon himself never moved into this new domain (Reill 2005, chp. 1).
In his original formulations, Buffon described these internal molds and molecules as originating from divine creation. As the Natural History progressed, however, Buffon increasingly viewed the organic molecules as formed from an original “brute” matter, and the internal molds themselves were seen to arise spontaneously, obtaining their specificity of action purely from the differential forces of attraction between different shapes of organic particles (Buffon 1765 in Piveteau 1954, 38–41).
It was following upon his proposed solution to the issue of organic generation that Buffon then addressed the issue of organic species and their permanence. In the fourth volume of the Natural History (1753) devoted to the large domestic quadrupeds, Buffon first raised the option of species transformism, only to reject it. In an article devoted to the domestic donkey, Buffon drew attention to the close similarity revealed between the horse and the ass by his collaborator Daubenton's anatomical descriptions. This similarity strongly suggested an underlying unity of plan of all the quadrupeds to such a degree that Buffon raised the possibility that all might have been derived from single stem (souche) which “in the succession of time, has produced, by perfection and degeneration, all the other animals” (Buffon 1753 in Piveteau 1954, 355). In a move that has confused commentators every since, Buffon then rejected this possibility.
The explanation of Buffon's 1753 rejection of transformism has taken many forms (Bowler 2003, chp. 3), but this article adopts the view that both his initial rejection of transformism, and his subsequent developments toward the concept of historical species change reflect coherent and consistent developments of his thought (Sloan 2006a; 1987). Similar to Aristotle's concept of the substantial form—the metaphysical foundation for the essential identity of offspring and parent through sexual generation— Buffon's internal mold functioned in a similar way. The species is maintained in time and given its ontological reality by the passing on of an immanent formal principle from parent to offspring. But this implied, for Buffon, a significant redefinition of the concept of an organic species. This redefinition has affected the tradition of natural history and biology since the 1750s (Sloan in Ruse and Richards, 2008 forthcoming; Sloan 2006b; Gayon, 1996). Explicitly denying the long-accepted meaning of ‘species’ as a universal or, in modern parlance, a class concept, constituted by a set of individuals on the basis of possession of defining properties, Buffon defined a species in natural history solely as the historical succession of ancestor and descendant linked by material connection through generation. The species is “… neither the number nor the collection of similar individuals which forms the species; it is the constant succession and uninterrupted renewal of these individuals which constitutes it” (Buffon 1753 in Piveteau 1954, 355). The empirical sign of this essential unity of the species over time is fertile interbreeding, a criterion that takes precedence over similarities of anatomy or habits of life. The horse and ass must be two different species because they cannot interbreed and produce fertile offspring, whatever may be their anatomical resemblances. The dogs, on the other hand, must, in spite of great morphological differences between breeds, constitute one species because of their interfertility.
In setting forth this new meaning of ‘species’ in natural history, distinguishing it from the traditional connotation as a logical universal as this concept continued to be understood by such contemporaries as Linnaeus, Buffon was doing more than distinguishing the “category” from the “taxon” as these terms have come to be understood in contemporary philosophy of biology. In an important sense, Buffon introduced an opposition between these two meanings, granting “reality” to the species conceived as a material succession spread out in time, and allowing only “abstractness” or “artificiality” to the species conceived as a class concept or universal in the logical sense. This introduced a fundamental confusion into the denotation of ‘species’ in subsequent discussions in the biological literature that has persisted to the present, underlying a major component of the so-called “species problem” (Stamos 2003; Wilson 1999; Wheeler and Meier, 1999; Ereshefsky, 1992; Dupré 1993). These issues underlie contemporary disputes that oppose “species as sets” to “species as spatio-temporal individuals” (Sloan 2002 in Auxier and Hahn, 2002).
The subsequent developments in Buffon's thought toward what an older tradition of scholarship mistakenly interpreted to be evolutionism, involved the gradual broadening of his natural-historical species to include wider and wider degrees of material relationship. This expansion of his original concept Buffon expressed in the language of a “degeneration” of forms in time in response to environmental conditions. The encounter with a wide body of new data from the colonies and exploratory voyages returned to Paris during the course of the writing of the Natural History impressed Buffon with the degree to which species seemed to be affected by external circumstances such that from a single source numerous “degenerations,” or in an early use of the term, “races,” could arise. Developed in main detail in his long article, “On the Degeneration of Animals” of 1766, Buffon's theory lumped the quadrupeds of both the Old and New worlds into a limited number of primary “families” and “genera” which had degenerated in time in response to migration from common points of origin to new locales. To explain these changes, Buffon appealed to slight alterations due to environmental conditions that could affect the organic molecules, and in turn affect the internal molds.
Buffon subsequently made some steps toward combining the thesis of the historical degeneration of species with his theory of historical cosmology in On the Epochs of Nature, published as a supplement to the Natural History in 1779. In this treatise he reworked his earlier speculations on the “theory of the earth,” first set out in 1749, adding to this a historical chronology of the age of the earth determined experimentally in the 1770s by quantitative studies on cooling spheres of metal. In this great synthesis, Buffon combined a history of the Earth with a historical sequence of the emergence of living forms (Buffon 1988, 1779). Expanding the time scale considerably beyond the accepted “Mosaic” chronology of less than 10,000 years from the beginning of the world to the present, to an estimate of approximately 75,000 years in the published version and over two million years in his draft manuscripts, Buffon offered a naturalistic solution to the two inherited Cartesian dilemmas. First, his schema was offered as a realistic account. The Cartesian language of counterfactualism has disappeared. Second, he integrated the history of living forms into this naturalistic history of the world. Further concretizing his theory of the internal molds and organic molecules, both were now seen to arise by natural laws from the natural attraction of different shapes of matter and from the changes in matter brought about on the cooling earth. Animals first originated by the spontaneous clumping together of these organic molecules (Buffon 1988, époque 5).
The Epochs also offered a schema for a historical sequence of forms, beginning with marine life and plants and eventually resulting in present forms. The extent of this naturalistic vision even verges on incorporating the origin of human beings, although this issue is left vague. Humankind appears, without explanation in the text, in a non-paradisal state in the northern latitudes of Eurasia, surrounded by ferocious animals, earthquakes and floods, and in a primitive social condition that required collaboration for survival. Buffon's liberal use of a form of spontaneous generation that allowed for the origin of even major animal groups from the clumping together of organic molecules as the earth cooled, rendered the actual derivation of forms from previous forms unnecessary. In several respects, the development of genuine transformist theories by Buffon's successors required a much more restricted use of the possibility of spontaneous generation.
Buffon's Epochs appears to have had an uneven impact on subsequent reflections on these issues outside of France (Roger in Buffon 1988, cxxiv). The work was never translated into English and seems to have played an insignificant role in Anglophone discussions, in contrast, for example, to the major impact of the works of Linnaeus, which received a wide British exposition and translation. The boldly speculative character of the Epochs was also at odds with the more professionalized inquiries into geology and natural history being undertaken by a younger generation of naturalists who may have adopted Buffon's naturalism and extension of geochronology, but not his grand style (Rudwick 2005, chp. 3).
On the other hand, the Epochs had a different history in the Germanies. The treatise was quickly translated into German and it seems to have played an important role in the development of German historicism (Reill 1992 in Gayon et al, 1992). Although linkages are unclear, the importance of Buffon's work for the development of progressive, rather than degenerative, theories of historical transformism sketched out by Johann Gottfried Herder (1744–1803) in his Ideen zur Philosophie der Geschichte der Menschheit (1784–91) is suggested by several lines of evidence. Through Herder's impact on the subsequent development of German Naturphilosophie and Romanticism, a general historical “development” of species from simple beginnings to more complex forms in company with a development of the history of the world was introduced broadly into German reflections of the early nineteenth century (Richards 2002, chps. 2, 3, 8). For Kant, the Epochs formed the foremost example of a genetic history of nature (Naturgeschichte), as opposed to a Linnean description of nature (Naturbeschreibung). This set up within the German tradition an opposition between two alternative projects in natural history that persisted into the nineteenth century (Sloan 2006a; Wilson 2006 in Smith 2006).
Although several individuals at the Paris Muséum national d'histoire naturelle—the restructured post-Revolutionary successor to the Jardin du Roi—pursued aspects of Buffon's project in the decades following his death, a list that included his former collaborator Marie-Louis Daubenton and his immediate understudy Bernard de Lacépède (1756–1825) (Corsi, 1988, chp. 1), subsequent reflections drew most inspiration from the theoretical developments by Buffon's one-time understudy and the occupant of the new chair of invertebrates (Vers) from 1794–1829, Jean Baptiste Pierre Antoine de Monet, Chevalier de Lamarck (1744–1829).
Lamarck developed the theory of species change over time to the point that it was recognized at the time, and has been acknowledged subsequently, as the first modern theory of species transformism. Formulated within an institutional context dedicated to scientific work, Lamarck's theories also had the necessary material conditions for their elaboration in relation to extensive museum collections of materials. Expounded through his annual lectures and writings within this environment, his theories could be tested, debated, and developed by others against the background of collections, museum displays, and other lectures taking place at the Paris Muséum.
Lamarck's theory of species transformism emerged gradually from his annual Muséum lectures on the “animals without backbones” that commenced in 1794. As the new occupant of this chair, Lamarck undertook in 1794 a massive reorganization of the Muséum collections of the animals subsequently to be known as the “invertebrates.” Adopting from his earlier method of arrangement of the plant groups in his work on French botany (1778) that had ordered groups serially from most complex to most simple, Lamarck adopted a similar method for the invertebrate groups. These taxonomic rearrangements took place before Lamarck made any public declaration of his views on species transformism, but this rearrangement provided him with an empirical base from which these theories were then developed (Burkhardt 1977).
In view of the many interpretations (and misinterpretations) of Lamarck's views since 1809, the primary features of Lamarck's theory need to be carefully detailed. In most fundamental terms, his theory of species change was tied to his reversal of the taxonomic ordering of forms originally presented in his early systematic arrangements. In his first arrangements, these were ordered as a series of animal groups arranged in simple linear series that began with the most complex forms and terminated in the least organized. By 1800, Lamarck decided that this ordering was artificial, and that the “natural” arrangement was from simple to complex. The evolutionary theory he developed involved the claim that this new order of arrangement was also the sequence in which forms had been historically generated one from another over time.
These themes were first presented in the Muséum lectures of 1800, and then were developed in more detail in his Recherches sur l'organisation des corps organisés (1802), with the full exposition in the Philosophie zoologique (1994. 1809). Some further significant elaborations of his ideas were then expressed in his many articles for the second edition of Joseph Virey's Nouveau dictionnaire d'histoire naturelle (1817–19) (Roger and Laurent 1991), and in the long introductory discourse to his major work of taxonomic revision of the invertebrates, the Histoire naturelle des animaux sans vertèbres (1815–22). The following claims formed the core of his theory:
- The origin of living beings is initially through spontaneous generation. This action is confined, however, to the origins of the most structurally-simple forms of life—infusoria. All subsequent forms necessarily have developed in some way in time from the elementary beginning in these simplest microscopic forms (infusoria).
- The dynamism for this “ascending,” rather than “degenerating,” history of life over time is supplied by the causal agency of dynamic material agencies—caloric and electricity. These material agencies produce the spontaneous generation of the infusorians and also provide the impetus by which these give rise to forms of higher complexity, the radiarians, and so on up the series. Moving beyond the distinction of “inert” and “living” matter of his mentor Buffon, Lamarck's theories generally can be considered truly “vitalist” in inspiration in that they attribute a genuine dynamism to living matter and grant it the ability to create new forms and structures through its inherent powers. Lamarck's appeal to the causal role of Newtonian aetherial fluids, however, grounded his theory on a concept of active matter rather than on special vital forces, and in this respect it can be termed a theory of vital materialism.
- The principal axis of Lamarckian transformism is a linear series, realized in time, that moves from simpler forms up a scale of organization to more complex forms. This results in an axis of fourteen primary groups, terminating in the mammals. This parallels the “natural” linear order of classification of groups he had developed in his taxonomic systems. Position on the series is defined primarily in terms of the structural and functional elaboration of the nervous system.
- The best-known feature of Lamarckianism in the subsequent tradition—the theory of transformism via the inheritance of acquired characters—functions as a subordinate, diversifying process through which major animal groups are adapted to local circumstances. Such adaptation is not, however, the primary cause of transformation from group to group up the series. Consequently, in contrast to Darwin's later theory, the primary evolution of life is not through local adaptation.
- Major transformations between species may, however, occur through the action of use and disuse of structures. For example, the transformation of primates into humans presumably has occurred by means of this adaptive process.
Revisions of the third point indeed occurred in both the diagram supplied as an Appendix to the Zoological Philosophy and in the Introductory Discourse to the later Natural History of Animals Without Vertebrae (1815). Likely responding to Georges Cuvier's criticisms of linear relationships (see below), Lamarck admitted a more complex pattern of group relations, with some showing independent lineages. This issue was not, however, developed in any theoretical extent by Lamarck himself, and has not had significant impact on the historical understanding of Lamarckianism. Some of these elements in Lamarck's later theory did, however, have some impact on British readings (Sloan 2007,1997)
The reception of Lamarck's views remains a topic of active scholarly exploration (Laurent 1997, section 4; Corsi, 2001). Within the confines of the Muséum parallel, if not immediately continuous, developments of critical issues were made by his younger colleague, the comparative anatomist Etienne Geoffroy St. Hilaire (1772–1844). Less concerned with the issue of species transformism than with the implications of comparative anatomy, Geoffroy St. Hilaire pursued the implications of the anatomical “unity of type”—the remarkable resemblance of anatomical structure between organisms revealed by the deeper anatomy of forms. Pursuing this issue in his Muséum lectures and in several papers (Guyader 2004), Geoffroy St. Hilaire proceeded to work out the implications of the anatomical similarities of vertebrates as one went deeper into their anatomical structure. Based on two main principles, the “principle of connection” and the “law of balance,” Geoffroy St. Hilaire drew attention to the implications of comparative anatomy for the unity of the animal kingdom. Although Geoffroy St. Hilaire was initially more concerned with issues of comparative anatomy and embryology than with the question of historical species change, in the mid-1820s he developed a more historical position on the relation of the unity of type to issues of the fossil record and to the development of life (Guyader 2004, chp. 4).
By 1823, Geoffroy St. Hilaire had extended his theory of the “unity of type” to the claim that even the invertebrates shared a common plan with the vertebrates, and by 1825 he had embraced a limited version of transformism. This led him into direct opposition to the claims of his one-time friend and colleague, Georges Cuvier (1769–1832), whose own researches in comparative anatomy and paleontology had led him to conclude that animals were formed on a series of four body plans (embranchements) that may display some unity of type within the embranchements. Cuvier denied, however, the possibility of such unity between these plans.
The “great debate” that broke out in French life science and quickly ramified into a popular public controversy in the late 1820s between Geoffroy St. Hilaire and Cuvier (Appel 1987), forms one of the historic encounters between differing conceptions of biology. It drew division lines within French, and even British, biology over the relation of organisms to history, and it directly engaged the possibility of species change. This debate also served to focus issues within French life science in a way that significantly affected the later French reception of Darwin. This debate eventually was to involve issues of paleontology, comparative anatomy, transformism of species, and the relation of form to function (Guyader 2004).
Cuvier's arguments, reinforced by the authority he carried in French comparative anatomy and science generally, resulted in the dominance of his positions within the Paris Académie des sciences. Nonetheless, the tradition of Geoffroy St. Hilaire remained a strong current within the Muséum, continued by such individuals as Antoine Etienne Serres (1786–1868), whose arguments for a historical sequence of forms, backed by embryological evidence, were canonized in morphological circles as the Meckel-Serres law of recapitulation (Gould 1977, chp. 3). Outside official Academic French science, Geoffroy Saint Hilaire's theories had broad appeal to those who saw the relevance of developmental embryology for issues of group relationship, an issue that preformationist Cuvier had ignored. The renewed interest in the relationship between evolution and developmental biology at the present has stimulated new interest in Geoffroy's views (Guyader 2004).
Until recent decades, a long historiographical tradition has emphasized the endemic developments in British natural history, geology, and British versions of natural theology as the primary background for understanding the origins of Darwin's own views. The new awareness of the importance of issues raised within British medical discussions, and the impact of French and German discussions on the British context have only recently been emphasized (Richards 2002; Sloan 2007, 2003a; Desmond 1989).
Darwin's early Edinburgh mentor, Robert Edmund Grant (1793–1874), provided a crucial link between the Continental discussions centered around the Cuvier-Geoffroy debate, and Darwin's early formation. Coming into contact with Darwin in his years as a young medical student at the University of Edinburgh (1825–27), Grant served as Darwin's first mentor in science. Subsequently, Grant became the holder of the first chair in comparative anatomy at the new University College London. From this position Grant brought the attention of a British and Scottish audience to the issues being debated between Geoffroy St. Hilaire, Cuvier and Lamarck, and advocated himself a variant of a Lamarckian-Geoffroyean transformism. The elaboration of these issues in British discussions in the 1830s and 40s by Grant and his disciples made these topics issues of scientific discussion. The contrasting interpretation of these issues by Richard Owen (1804–92), the Hunterian lecturer in Comparative Anatomy at the College of Surgeons, formed a background of discussion for understanding many aspects of Darwin's early development (Desmond 1989, Sloan 1992).
Owen's role in the formation of some of Darwin's thinking is a topic still in need of deeper exploration. Following his return from the Beagle voyage in October of 1836, Darwin's early associations with Robert Grant ceased dramatically, while those with Owen developed for a time into one of friendship, which included social visits. Darwin also may have attended some of Owen's Hunterian lectures. From his position as holder of the prestigious Hunterian lecturship in comparative anatomy from 1837–56, Owen developed a reinterpretation of the significance of the Cuvier-Geoffroy dispute. Owen had been made directly aware of these issues during a trip to Paris in 1831, and he resolved after his return to find a solution to the conflict between Cuvier and Geoffroy. This eventually led to his positing the theory of the archetypal vertebrate in an important set of publications in 1847 and 1848. Employing aspects of William Whewell's philosophy of science (see below) to develop these arguments, Owen formulated the theory of the unity of type in relation to Cuvierian form and function through the positing of an ideal archetypal form. This abstraction functioned for Owen both as a transcendental idealization similar to a Platonic form, and also as an immanent law working in matter, conceived on the analogy of a Newtonian law, which governed the development of forms in time (Sloan 2003a, Rupke 1993). By means of this theory, Owen claimed he could coherently explain both the deep resemblance of forms in their internal anatomy, emphasized by Geoffroy St. Hilaire, and also the close fitting of structure and function to the organism's “conditions of existence,” the point emphasized by Cuvier.
To distinguish these two meanings of relationship, Owen introduced into the literature a crucial distinction between resemblances of “homology,” meaning the presence of the same parts in every variety of form and function—Geoffroyean relationship—from “analogy,” denoting solely the similarity of parts in their functional adaptations—Cuvierian relationships. Through his concept of homology in relation to the theory of the archetype, Owen claimed he could at last give a coherent meaning to the concept of “sameness” in anatomical relationships. Furthermore, as this theory was developed in relation to his work on the fossil record, the theory of the archetype as an immanent law working in time led Owen to embrace a concept of branching and diversifying relations of forms as divergences from this ideal archetypal form over time. Owen thus broke with a linear historical progressionism from simple to complex forms assumed in transformist theories like those of Lamarck, particularly in Lamarck's writings before 1815. He also distinguished this kind of historical relationship from that advocated by some of the German proto-transformists who developed their ideas on linear models.
Although Owen's model cannot be considered a genuine species transformism—species do not change historically one into another and the archetype exists as a law or idealization rather than as an actual historical form—, it can be seen that by his integration of comparative anatomy, paleontology, and even embryology in this framework, Owen set out a sophisticated model of relationship that later could be, and was, reinterpreted from the viewpoint of Darwin's own theory.
Since Darwin's theory of evolution is the subject of the entry on Darwinism, the present entry will focus on the following points in relation to Darwin's theory not developed in the other entry:
- 2.1 The Origins of Darwin's Theory
- 2.2 The Natural Selection Concept
- 2.3 The Central Argument of the Origin
- 2.4 The Popular Reception of Darwinism
- 2.5 The Professional Reception of Darwinism
Charles Darwin's version of transformism has been the subject of massive historical and philosophical scholarship almost unparalleled in any other area of the history of science. This includes the continued flow of monographic studies and collections of articles on aspects of Darwin's theory (Ruse and Richards 2008 in preparation; Hodge and Radick, 2003, 2nd. ed 2009 in preparation; Hösle and Illies 2005; Gayon 1998; Bowler 1996; Tort 1996; Depew and Weber 1995; Kohn 1985a). The flow of popular and professional biographical studies on Darwin continues (Browne 1995, 2002; Desmond and Moore 1991; Bowlby 1990; Bowler 1990). In addition, major editing projects on Darwin's manuscripts and correspondence (Keynes 2000; Burkhardt et al. 1985-; Barrett et al. 1987) continue to reveal details and new insights into the issues surrounding Darwin's own thought.
This continued scholarly interest reflects not only concerns of historians, but also the continued relevance of Darwin's own writings as sources of creative reflection for contemporary work in evolutionary biology (Gould 2002; Gayon 2003 in Hodge and Radick 2003, chp. 10). This historical phenomenon itself presents difficulties for the historical understanding of Darwinism. Particularly within anglophone philosophy of biology, the emphasis on the lines of the development of Darwin's evolutionary theory that have led to the consensus position achieved in the so-named “synthetic” theory of evolution of the 1930s (see below) has tended to obscure the complex history of Darwin's own theoretical reflections and the history of Darwinian theory since 1859. The interpretations of Darwin from the perspective of contemporary evolutionary biology are themselves the product of historical developments that represent either the elaborations of themes found only in part in the writings of the historic Darwin, or they are rational reconstructions that cannot in fact be attributed to Darwin's writings. Darwinism as a historical phenomenon can be seen as an evolving set of theories that have altered in relation to the changes in social and intellectual contexts (Depew and Weber, 1995).
These internal complexities in the heritage from Darwin's works have shaped Darwinism into more than one tradition. French biology, for example, still pays greater respect to Lamarck than is true in English literature and many French commentators seek to de-emphasize the contrasts between the presumably failed theories of Lamarck and those of Darwin (Laurent 1997). The long heritage of Kantianism and German Idealism has influenced lines of the German interpretations of Darwin up to the present (Hösle and Illies 2005). American interpretations of Darwinism are often at odds with British readings, as can be seen in the Sewall-Wright interpretations of population genetics developed in opposition to those of R. A. Fisher (Shanahan 2004).
In its historical origins, Darwin's theory was different in kind than its main predecessors in important ways. Viewed against the longer historical scenario developed in the present entry, Darwin's theory does not deal with the ultimate origins of life through naturalistic means, and therefore was more restricted in its theoretical scope than its main predecessors deriving from the reflections of Buffon and Lamarck. This restriction also distinguished it more immediately from the grand evolutionary cosmology put forth anonymously in 1844 by the Scottish publisher Robert Chambers (1802–71) in his immensely popular Vestiges of the Natural History of Creation, a work which in many respects prepared Victorian society in England, and pre-Civil War America, for Darwin's more restricted theory (Secord 2000). This restriction in scope also differentiated Darwin's theory from the historical developmentalism of his German contemporary, the paleontologist Heinrich G. Bronn (Gliboff 2007).
A long tradition of scholarship has interpreted Darwin's theory to have originated from his original formation in British natural history and natural theology, and his subsequent experience with plant and animal biogeography, particularly as encountered on oceanic islands during the Beagle voyage (December 1831– October 1836). Emphasis has also been put upon his conversion to the uniformitarian geology of Charles Lyell and to Lyell's thesis of gradual change over time (Herbert 2005; Hodge 1982). Complementing this predominantly Anglophone historiography have been the social-constructivist analyses emphasizing the origins of Darwin's theories in British Political Economy and British natural theology (Young, 1985, chps. 2,4,5).
A revisionist historiography, on the other hand, has de-emphasized some of the novelty of Darwin's views; there has been within these accounts a greater emphasis on the degree to which Darwin was not a “Darwinian.” Questions have been raised regarding the validity of the standard biographical picture of the early Darwin, and new emphasis has been placed on Darwin's relations to the Romantic movement, to British medical developments, and to his early formation in Scottish science (Richards 2002; Desmond and Moore 1991; Desmond 1989).
Such revisions to a long-standing historiography in the understanding of the genesis of Darwinian theory are indebted to the wealth of manuscripts and correspondence that have become available since the 1960s. These materials have drawn attention to previously ignored aspects of Darwin's biography. The importance of his Edinburgh period from 1825–27, discounted in importance by Darwin himself in his late Autobiography, has been seen as critical for his subsequent development (Desmond and Moore 1991; Hodge 1985 in Kohn 1985a, Sloan 1985 in Kohn 1985a). It was at Edinburgh that he first encountered the writings of Lamarck and Geoffroy St. Hilaire through his mentor Robert Edmund Grant. This period also initiated an abiding interest in invertebrate zoology that would later emerge in full in his important work on the barnacles (Stott 2004; Love 2002).
Similarly, appreciation of the content of his work in physiological botany and in entomology during his studies in Cambridge from 1827–31 under the guidance of his mentor John Stevens Henslow (1795–1861), and his work in geology with Adam Sedgwick (1795–1873), has considerably deepened the understanding of his preparation for the theoretical work that transpired during the voyage of the H.M.S. Beagle. Under Henslow's guidance, Darwin was introduced to the writings of both John Herschel and Alexander von Humboldt. Humboldt's writings on botanical geography, geology, landscape, anthropology, and the philosophy of nature, to the degree they were known to Darwin in these years, seem to have played an important, if still uncertain, role during the Beagle years. Some scholars now interpret Darwin's initial reflections on transformism to have developed initially from reflections stimulated by Humboldt's version of German philosophy of nature as much as from the traditional sources usually assumed in Lyell, Herschel and British natural theology (Richards 2005 in Hösle and Illies 2005); idem. 2002, chp. 14; Sloan 2001). Rather than seeing Darwin's theory developing from any one root, however, current scholarship emphasizes a multiplicity of origins that include the traditional British traditions as well as Continental sources (Sloan 2003b in Hodge and Radick 2003; Hodge 2003 in Hodge and Radick 2003; Hodge 1982).
Darwin's theory first took concrete written form in reflections in a series of notebooks composed by Darwin after the return of the Beagle between March of 1837 and September of 1839 (Barrett et al. 1987). Beginning with the notebook reflections of the third or “D” Notebook, composed between July and October of 1838, Darwin first worked out the rudiments of what was to become his theory of natural selection (Hodge 2003 in Hodge and Radick, 2003). To summarize a complex issue, these notebook reflections show Darwin proceeding through a series of stages in which he first formulated a general theory of the transformation of species. He then attempted to work out a causal theory of life that would explain the tendency of life to complexify and diversify (Sloan 1986). This was then replaced by a shift in focus to the control of population assumed to be expanding in a geometrical fashion. This allowed him to develop the implications of population increase for the transformation of species. Through his universalization of Thomas Malthus's (1766–1834) “principle of population,” Darwin introduced something similar to an “inertial” principle into his theory, although such language is never used in his text. Newton's first law, for example, established his physical system upon the tendency of a body in motion to persist in uniform motion in a straight line, requiring a causal explanation for any deviations from this initial state. Similarly, the principle of population introduced after his encounter in 1838 with the work of Thomas Malthus, supplied Darwin with the assumption of an initial dynamic state of affairs that was not itself explained within the theory—there is no attempt to account for why living beings tend to reproduce geometrically. Rather, the principle of population functions axiomatically, defining a set of initial conditions from which any deviance from this ideal state demands explanation. This theoretical shift enabled Darwin to bracket his earlier efforts to develop a causal theory of life, and focus instead on the means by which the dynamic force of population was controlled, and determine how this control on population worked out in company with the phenomenon of slight individual variation and changing conditions of life to produce a gradual change of form and function.
The foremost difference distinguishing Darwin's theory from previous explanations of species change centers on the different way in which he explained how this process occurred. Prior theories, such as Lamarck's, relied on the inherent dynamic properties of matter, or as in some of the German reflections, on special dynamic forces, such as those building upon the Bildungstrieb theory of Johann Blumenbach (1752–1840). Darwin's emphasis on the factors controlling population increase, rather than on developing an explanation of species change by means of a causal theory of life, accounts for many of the differences between Darwin's theory and those of his predecessors and contemporaries.
These differences can be summarized in the concept of natural selection as a central ingredient of Darwinian theory. However, the meaning of this concept is complex and it has given rise to considerable controversy. Its interpretation remains a point of contention even in contemporary philosophy of biology. Some see it as a statistical description that emerges from populational phenomena (Walsh, Lewins and Ariew, 2002). Others have viewed it as analogous to a Newtonian force (Sober 1984). Still others have claimed it is a propensity of natural populations in relation to their environment that can be directly measured (Brandon and Ramsey 2007). None of these descriptions accurately captures Darwin's own complex meaning of the term, and some of this ambiguity is important for understanding the subsequent history of evolutionary theory.
One way to see the complexity of Darwin's own thinking on these issues is by following the stages of the development of this concept between the close of the Notebook period (1839) and the publication of the Origin. This period of approximately twenty years involved Darwin in a series of reflections that form successive strata in the final version of his theory of the evolution of species. Understanding the historical sequence of these developments has significance for the subsequent controversies over this concept. It also has some bearing on assessing Darwin's relevance for more general philosophical questions, such as those surrounding the teleology of nature.
The earliest set of themes in the manuscript development of natural selection theory can be characterized as those developed on the positing of a strong analogy between human art and the workings of nature. As this was developed in the first coherent draft of the theory, a 39-page draft of 1842, this discussion transferred the concept of selection of forms by human agency in the creation of the varieties of domestic animals and plants to the active selection in the natural world by an almost conscious agency, a “being more sagacious than man (not an omniscient creator)” (Darwin 1842 in Glick and Kohn 1996, 91). This agency selects out those features most beneficial to organisms in relation to conditions of life, analogous in its action to the selection by man on domestic forms in the production of different breeds. Interwoven with these references to an almost Platonic demiurge are appeals to the selecting power of an active “Nature”:
Nature's variation far less, but such selection far more rigid and scrutinizing[.…] Nature lets [an] animal live, till on actual proof it is found less able to do the required work to serve the desired end, man judges solely by his eye, and knows not whether nerves, muscles, arteries, are developed in proportion to the change of external form. (Ibid., 93)
These themes were continued in the 230 page draft of his theory written in 1844. Again he referred to the selective action of a wise imaginary being whose selection was made with greater foresight and wisdom than human selection. This agency worked as a secondary cause in a larger plan of a superintending creator such that “the process of selection could go on adapting, nicely and wonderfully, organisms, if in ever so small a degree plastic, to diverse ends. I believe such secondary means do exist” (Darwin 1844 in Glick and Kohn 1996, 103).
Darwin returned to these issues in 1856, following a twelve-year period in which he had published his Geological Observations on the Volcanic Islands (1844), the second edition of his Journal of Researches (1845), the Geological Observations on South America (1846), the four volumes on fossil and living barnacles (1851, 54, 55), and the Geological Observations on Coral Reefs (1851). In addition, he had published several smaller papers on invertebrate zoology, geology, and experiments on the resistance of seeds to salt water.
The intervening inquiries between 1844 and 1856 positioned Darwin to deal with the question of species change against an extensive empirical background. The composition of his long manuscript or “Big Species Book,” commenced in 1856, known in current scholarship as the “Natural Selection” manuscript, formed the immediate background to the published Origin. This text provides insights into many issues in Darwin's thinking. It was also prepared with an eye to the scholarly community. This distinguishes its form of argument from that of the subsequent “abstract,” which became the published Origin of Species. This incomplete manuscript contained tables of data, references to scholarly literature, and other apparatus expected of a non-popular work, none of which survive in the published condensation.
The “Natural Selection” manuscript also contained some additional theoretical developments of relevance to the concept of natural selection. Scholars have noted the introduction in this manuscript of the “principle of divergence,” the thesis that organisms under the action of natural selection will tend to radiate and diversify within ecological conditions. Although the concept of group divergence under the action of natural selection might be seen as an implication of Darwin's theory that was present since the 1830s, nonetheless Darwin's explicit definition of this as a “principle” in the “Natural Selection” manuscript, and his assement of this as playing a new theoretical role in the way variation related to “natural” selection and conditions of existence, constituted a new level of attention to this issue, and a new theoretical status to the principle (Kohn 2008 in Ruse and Richards 2008 forthcoming, and Kohn 1985b in Kohn 1985a).
Still evident in the “Natural Selection” manuscript is Darwin's implicit appeal to some kind of teleological ordering of the process. The action of the “wise being” of the earlier manuscripts, however, has now been given over entirely to the action of a selective “Nature,” now referred to in the traditional feminine gender. This Nature,
cares not for mere external appearance; she may be said to scrutinise with a severe eye, every nerve, vessel & muscle; every habit, instinct, shade of constitution,—the whole machinery of the organisation. There will be here no caprice, no favouring: the good will be preserved & the bad rigidly destroyed.… Can we wonder then, that nature's productions bear the stamp of a far higher perfection than man's product by artificial selection. With nature the most gradual, steady, unerring, deep-sighted selection,—perfect adaption [sic] to the conditions of existence.… (Darwin 1856, in Stauffer 1974, 224–25)
The language of this passage, directly underlying statements about the action of “natural selection” in the first edition of the published Origin, indicates the complexity in the exegesis of Darwin's meaning of “natural selection” when viewed in light of its historical genesis (Ospovat 1981). The parallels of art and nature, the intentionality implied in the term “selection,” the notion of “perfect” adaptation, and the substantive conception of “nature” as an agency working toward certain ends, all render Darwin's views on teleological purpose more complex than they are typically interpreted from the standpoint of contemporary Neo-selectionist theory (Lennox 1993).
The hurried preparation and publication of the Origin between the summer of 1858 and November of 1859, prompted by the receipt on June 18 of 1858 of the letter from Alfred Russel Wallace that outlined his remarkably similar views on the possibility of continuous species change under the action of a selection upon natural variation, had important implications for the form of Darwin's published argument. Rapidly condensing the detailed arguments of the “Big Species Book” manuscript into shorter chapters, Darwin also universalized several claims that he had only developed with reference to specific groups of organisms or with application to more limited situations in the manuscript. This resulted in a presentation of his theory at the level of a broad generalization. The absence of tables of data, detailed footnotes, and references to the secondary literature in the published version also resulted in predictable criticisms. Some members of the scientific elite, such as the comparative anatomist Richard Owen, attacked the work for the lack of evidence and for unwarranted speculation. At the same time, this same generalizing character of the work and its unification of a broad series of inquiries into taxonomy, paleontology, embryology, biogeography, and comparative anatomy around the claim of descent from primordial forms, drew together an enormous range of biological inquiry under one comprehensive theory. On the popular level, the lack of detail and the literary style of the work allowed the Origin to be read by a wider reading public that previously devoured the many editions of Robert Chambers's Vestiges of the Natural History of Creation and the two editions of Darwin's popular Journal of Researches.
The structure of the argument of the Origin has been the topic of considerable literature and can only be summarized here (Lennox 2005; Waters in Hodge and Radick 2003; Hodge 1989, 1983, 1977; Ruse 1979, 1975; Ghiselin 1969). Reference should also be made to the article “ Darwinism” in this encyclopedia for additional discussion. Darwin himself described his book as “ one long argument.” The exact nature of this argument is not, however, immediately transparent, and alternative interpretations have been made of his reasoning and rhetorical strategies in formulating his evolutionary theory.
The scholarly reconstruction of Darwin's methodology employed in the Origin has taken two primary forms. One attempt has been to reconstruct it from the standpoint of currently accepted models of scientific explanation, sometimes presenting it as a formal deductive model (Sober 1984). The other approach, the one explored here, relates it to the accepted canons of scientific explanation found in Victorian discussions of methodology of the time (Lennox 2005; Waters in Hodge and Radick 2003; Hull in Hodge and Radick 2003; Hodge 1983; Ruse 1975). However, the degree to which Darwin did in fact draw from these available methodological discussions of his contemporaries—John Herschel, William Whewell, John Stuart Mill— is not fully clear. The majority viewpoint has emphasized the importance of John Herschel's A Preliminary Discourse on the Study of Natural Philosophy (1830), which Darwin read as a young student at Cambridge prior to his departure in December of 1831 on the H.M.S.Beagle. In Herschel's writings he would have encountered the claim that science seeks to determine “true causes”—verae causae— that Newton had specified in the third of his Rules of Reasoning in Philosophy as the goal of scientific inquiry. Such causes, in Herschel's formulation, were those necessary to produce the given effects; they were truly active in producing the effects; and they are actually responsible for the effects (Herschel 1987, 1830; Lennox 2005; Waters in Hodge and Radick 2003). These criteria distinguished a satisfactory scientific account from a simple saving of phenomena through a plausible explanation. The impact of Herschel's arguments on Darwin's intellectual development was evidently profound, and the effects of this reading of Herschel on his early work can be seen in his theorizing in geology in which he used the notion of true cause in the framework of his endorsement of Lyellian geology to explain such issues as the formation of coral reefs.
The other likely methodological source for Darwin's mature reasoning was the work of his older contemporary and former mentor, the Rev. William Whewell (1794–1866), whose History of the Inductive Sciences (1837) and Philosophy of the Inductive Sciences (1840) were read with care by Darwin after his return from his round-the-world voyage. The impact of Whewell's theory of scientific method is indirectly evident in several of Darwin's arguments in the Origin, although no explicit mention is made of Whewell's (nor of Herschel's) methodological precepts in the text itself. Nevertheless, a plausible argument can be made that the actual structure of the text is more closely similar to a “Whewellian” rather than “Herschelian” model of argument. In Whewell's 1840 account, the emphasis of scientific inquiry is to be placed on the discovery of “true causes” through the drawing together of disparate phenomena under a single unifying “Conception of the Mind,” exemplified for Whewell by Newton's universal law of gravitation. This “Consilience of Inductions,” as Whewell termed this process of theoretical unification under a few simple concepts, was achieved only by true scientific theories employing true causes (Whewell 1840, xxxix). In a restatement of this principle in a revised edition published only a year before the Origin, Whewell argued that “the cases in which inductions from classes of facts altogether different have thus jumped together, belong only to the best established theories which the history of science contains.” (Whewell 1858, 77–96). Whewell's influence seems in evidence in the way in which Darwin deals with major objections to his theory, as will be examined below.
In rhetorical structure, the text presents what might be termed a “constructive” argument. It proceeds by presenting a series of limited issues for acceptance in the first three chapters, none of which required of the reader a considerable leap of theoretical assent, and most of which, such as natural variation and Malthusian population increase, had already been recognized in some form in the literature of the period. These ingredients are then assembled together in chapter four into a remarkable synthesis that rapidly extends the claims by generalization to cover the full range of life both in time and in space. With Darwin's carefully-designed rhetorical strategy of presentation, only by chapter four would the reader know the full character and possible implications of the claims being developed in the early chapters.
Opening with a pair of chapters that draw upon the art-nature analogy developed in the manuscripts, Darwin framed the argument with an account of the origin of domestic animals, and by inference, of plants. These forms are presumed to have arisen through the action of human selection on the slight variations existing between individuals within the same species. A possible interpretation of this process as implying directional, and even intentional, selection, was at the same time downplayed in the published work through the importance given by Darwin to the role of “unconscious” selection. This denotes the selection practiced even by aboriginal peoples who simply seek to maintain the integrity of a breed by preserving the best forms. The domestic breeding analogy is, however, more than a rhetorical strategy. It repeatedly functions for Darwin as the principal empirical example to which he could appeal at several places in the text as a means of visualizing the working of natural selection in nature. From this model of human selection working on small natural variations to produce the domestic forms, Darwin then developed in the second chapter the implications of “natural” variation, delaying discussion of the concept of natural selection until chapter four. The focus of the second chapter introduces another important issue. Here he extends the discussion of variation developed in chapter one into an attack on the traditional“ Linnaean” understanding of classification as a sorting out of species by means of essential defining properties. It is in this chapter that Darwin most explicitly develops his own positions on the nature of organic species in relation to his theory of descent.
Darwin's analysis of the “ species question” is a complex issue that has many implications for how his work was read by his contemporaries and successors, and it still plays a role in contemporary discussions (Sloan 2008 in Ruse and Richards 2008 forthcoming, Stamos 2007, Sloan 2002). His sometimes contradictory statements on this issue—alternating between overt denials of the reality of species in some places, and clear affirmation of the reality of species in others—have been seen as an intentional rhetorical strategy (Stamos 2007; Beatty 1985 in Kohn 1985a). The author of this article is less inclined to read this as a deliberate effort, with these contradictions seen more as representing his complex synthesis of competing strands of discourse about species available in the existent literature of the time.
Darwin addresses this issue initially by raising the problems created by natural variation for the taxonomic discrimination of taxa at the species and varietal levels. Although the difficulty presented to taxonomists by groups at this level was a well-recognized problem in the literature of the time, Darwin subtly transforms this practical problem into a metaphysical ambiguity. Prior tradition had been heavily affected by Buffon's novel conception of biological species. As we have analyzed above, Buffon made a sharp distinction between “natural” species defined by such properties as fertile interbreeding, and “artificial” species and varieties defined by morphological traits and measurements upon these. Particularly as developed by German natural historians of the early nineteenth-century, “Buffonian”species were defined by the unity of common descent, distinguished by their historical and ontological character from the taxonomic species of Linnaean natural history. This distinction between “natural” and “book” species, as one contemporary termed this difference, maintained the distinction between problems of practical classification, which many of Darwin's contemporaries recognized, from the issue of genuine species transformism, which most rejected. Remarkable in Darwin's argument is the way in which he drew issues from these two traditions of discourse together, and then utilized ingredients drawn from each of these traditions to undermine the arguments for species realism of the other.
For example, natural variation is employed by Darwin in chapter two of the Origin to break down the distinction between species and varieties as these concepts were commonly employed in the practical taxonomic literature. The arbitrariness apparent in making distinctions, particularly in plants and invertebrates, meant that such species were only what “competent naturalists” with substantial practical experience defined them to be (Darwin 1964, 1859, 47). These arguments form the basis for claims by his contemporaries that Darwin was a species “nominalist,” who defined species only as conventional and convenient divisions of a continuum of individuals. But this only in part captures the complexity of his argument. Drawing also on the tradition of species realism developed within the Buffonian tradition, Darwin also affirmed that species and varieties were defined by common descent and material relations of interbreeding. Previously, however, this implied a fixity of such “natural” species within historical relationships defined by conservative “types.” However, Darwin then employed the ambiguity of distinction between species and varieties created by taxonomic variation in the practical taxonomy to undermine the ontological fixity of natural species. Varieties are not only logical subdivisions of a natural group. They are, as he terms them, “incipient” species (ibid., 52). This subtly transformed the issue of local variation and adaptation to circumstances into a primary ingredient for historical evolutionary change. The conclusions to be drawn from this argument were, however, only to be revealed in chapter four of the text.
Before assembling the ingredients of these first two chapters, Darwin introduced in chapter three the “Malthusian” parameter of the geometrical increase of population, which he extended from a principle claimed by Malthus to govern only human population in relation to food supply, into a general principle governing all of organic life. Thus the organisms comprising food itself would be included. Through this universalization, the control on population becomes only in the extreme based directly on the traditional Malthusian limitations of food and space. Normal controls are instead exerted through a complex network of relationships of species acting one on another in predator-prey, parasite-host, and food-web relations. This profound revision of Malthus rendered Darwin's theory deeply “ecological” as this term would later be employed. The presence of mice can be determined by the numbers of bumble bees, or the abundance of Scotch Firs by the number of cattle, to cite two examples employed by Darwin (ibid., 72–74). This recognition of complex species-species interactions as the primary means of population control also prevents one from reading the Origin as a simple extension of British political economy and the competition imbedded in Victorian industrialization to the natural world.
With the ingredients of the first three chapters in place, Darwin was then positioned to assemble these together in his culminating fourth chapter on natural selection. In this long discussion, Darwin develops his main discussion of his central theoretical concept of natural selection. For his contemporaries and for the subsequent tradition, however, Darwin's concept of “natural” selection was not unambiguously clear for reasons we have outlined above, and these unclarities were to be the source of several lines of disagreement and controversy. It is not clear in Darwin's discussion if he conceives of natural selections as an efficient or final cause, if it is an emergent result of other causes, or if it is a simple description of the working together of several independent causal factors and does not itself have causal status. Contemporary discussions within the philosophy of biology still debate aspects of this original conceptual ambiguity in disputes over whether natural selection is a causal force, a statistically-emergent property, or a propensity of populations (Sober 1984, chp. 1; Walsh, Lewens and Ariew 2002; Brandon and Ramsey 2007).
In the initial definition of natural selection presented in the first edition of Darwin's text, it is characterized as “preservation of favourable variations and the rejection of injurious variations” (Darwin 1964, 81). As Darwin elaborated on this concept in the first edition, he continued to describe natural selection in language suggesting that it involved an intentional selection, continuing the art-nature parallel found in the manuscripts. For example:
As man can produce and certainly has produced a great result by his methodical and unconscious means of selection, what may not nature effect? Man can act only on external and visible characters: nature cares nothing for appearances, except in so far as they may be useful to any being. She can act on every internal organ, on every shade of constitutional difference, on the whole machinery of life. Man selects only for his own good; Nature only for that of the being which she tends. Every selected character is fully exercised by her; and the being is placed under well-suited conditions of life. (Ibid., 82)
The manuscript history behind such passages prevents the simple discounting of these statements as mere rhetorical imagery. The parallel between intentional human selectivity and that of “nature” formed the original model upon which the concept of natural selection was constructed in the first place. Criticisms that quickly developed over the overt intentionality imbedded in this discussion, however, led Darwin to revise the argument in editions beginning with the third edition of 1861. From this point he explicitly downplayed the intentional and teleological language of the first two editions, denying that his appeals to the selective role of “nature” were anything more than a literary metaphor, and he moved decisively in the direction of defining natural selection as the description of a result of the action of natural laws working upon organisms rather than as an efficient or even a final cause of life (Sloan 2005 in Hösle and Illies 2005). The adoption in the fifth edition of 1869 of Herbert Spencer's terms “survival of the fittest” as a synonym for “natural selection” further emphasized this shift of meaning from the early texts and drafts to the formulations in the final statements of the 1860s and 70s. It is these later expressions that underlie later mechanistic and non-teleological understandings of natural selection.
The conceptual synthesis of chapter four also introduced discussion of such matters as the conditions under which natural selection most optimally worked, the role of isolation, the causes of the extinction of species, and the principle of divergence. The introduction of this latter principle in the closing portion of the chapter was a novel development beyond the early manuscripts, and its importance for giving a profoundly “ecological” dimension to his argument has been emphasized by scholars (Kohn 2008).
Many of these points were made through the imaginative use of “thought experiments” in which Darwin constructed possible scenarios through which natural selection could bring about substantial change. Although these did not count for his critics as empirical evidence for his claims, it has been argued that these assisted Darwin in satisfying certain criteria of adequacy as set forth by John Herschel in his methodological canons (Lennox 2005). Another display of the use of imaginative images to develop his claims about natural selection in relation to species transformism is in the one diagram to appear in all the editions of the Origin. In this diagram were summarized the image of gradual change from common ancestral points, the frequent extinction of most lineages, the general tendency of populations to diverge and fragment under the pressure of population increase and the principle of divergence, and the persistence of some forms unchanged over long geological periods in stable conditions.
Remarkable about this diagram is the relativity of its coordinates. It is first presented as applying only to the divergences taking place at the varietal level, with varieties represented by the small lower-case letters within species A–L of a “wide ranging genus,” with the horizontal time coodinates measured in terms of a limited number of generations. However, the attentive reader could quickly see that Darwin's destructive analysis of the distinction between “natural” and “artificial” species and the relativity of the species-variety distinction, worked out in chapter two, allowed this diagram to represent all organic relationships, from those at the non-controversial level of diverging varieties within fixed species, to those of the relations of species within different genera. Letters A–L could also represent taxa at the level of Genera, Families or Orders. The diagram can be applied to relationships between all levels of the Linnaean hierarchy with the horizontal coordinates representing vast expanses of time. In a very few pages of argument, the diagram was generalized to represent the most extensive group relations, encompassing the whole of geological time.
The restricted scope of Darwin's theory, when compared to its predecessors, meant that it avoided certain major questions, such as that of ultimate origins. The diagram of chapter four and the summary of the work in the final chapter suggested the origination of living beings from a few original forms, a result of “several powers, having been originally breathed into a few forms or into one” (ibid. 490). This could suggest a naturalistic origin of original forms by means of the action of a vitalistic power of life. Or it could be read as implying the action of a supernatural cause. In response to criticisms, he quickly added in the second edition of 1860 the phrase “by the Creator,” which remained intact in all subsequent editions. Coupled with the quotations on the frontispiece of the work that suggested the location of his work within the tradition of British natural theology, conceptual space was created both at the beginning and end of the work for a reading of the text in ways compatible with a theistic account of creation by natural laws.
The sweep of the theoretical generalization that closed the natural selection chapter, restated even more generally in the final summary of the book, required Darwin to deal with several obvious objections to the theory that would occupy him through the numerous revisions of the text between 1859 and 1872. Anticipating at first publication several obvious lines of objection, Darwin devotes much of the text of the original Origin to offering a solution in advance to predictable difficulties. As Darwin outlined these main lines of objection, they included the apparent absence of numerous slight gradations between species, both in the present and in the fossil record, of the kind that would seem to be predictable from the gradualist workings of the theory (chps. 6, 9). The existence of organs and structures of extreme complexity, such as the vertebrate eye, structures that had since the writings of Galen in Hellenistic antiquity served as a mainstay in the argument for external teleological design, needed some plausible explanation (chp. 6). The evolution of the elaborate instincts of animals and the puzzling problem of the evolution of social instincts that resulted in the development of sterile neuter castes in the social insects, proved to be a particularly difficult issue for Darwin in the manuscript phase of his work and needed some account (chp. 7). The complex issue concerning the distinction between natural species defined by interfertility, and artificial species defined by morphological differences, also required a full chapter of analysis in which he sought to undermine the absolute character of the interbreeding criterion as a sign of fixed natural species (chp. 8). To each of these lines of objection Darwin offered his contemporaries plausible, if not for many critics compelling, replies. Additional arguments were worked out through the insertion of numerous textual insertions over the five revisions of the Origin between 1860 and 1872, including the addition of a new chapter dealing with “miscellaneous” objections in the sixth edition of the Origin. Further detailed argument was supplied in separate treatises, such as the two-volume Variation of Plants and Animals Under Domestication (1868), a work which unlike the published Origin discussed several issues with the kind of documentation that might have been expected from a work derived from the “Big Species” manuscript. In chapter ten of the Origin, Darwin developed his position on the fossil record. At issue here was whether or not the known fossil record displayed a gradual progression of forms from simple to complex, or if it supported the claim for the persistent existence of all major groups throughout the record. The thesis of geological progressionism had been denied by none other than Darwin's great geological mentor, Charles Lyell in the Principles of Geology (1830–33), although it had been strongly defended by such contemporaries as William Buckland, and in a complex branching form by Richard Owen (Desmond 1984; Bowler 1974). Darwin opted for a progressionist interpretation of the record.
For reasons related both to the condensed and summary form of public presentation, and also to the bold conceptual sweep of the theory, the primary argument of the Origin could not gain its force from the data presented by the book itself. Instead, it presented an argument from consilience in Whewell's sense, gaining its force from the ability of Darwin's theory to draw together a wide variety of issues in taxonomy, comparative anatomy, paleontology, biogeography, and embryology under the simple principles worked out in the first four chapters (chps. 11–13). This explanatory power also provided Darwin with a means of defeating certain major objections, such as those drawn from the existence of organs of great complication and function. Dealing with the question of the vertebrate eye in chapter six, for example, Darwin offered a few speculations on how such a structure could have developed by the gradual selection upon the rudimentary eyes of invertebrates. But the primary solution offered was the ability of his theory to draw together numerous lines of inquiry that would not otherwise receive a coherent explanation. In such a case one would “admit that a structure even as perfect as the eye of an eagle might be formed by natural selection, although in this case he does not know any of the transitional grades” (Darwin 1964, 188).
The theory rested its case on its claim to be able to unify numerous fields of inquiry and on its potential theoretical fertility. He also developed this claim for explanatory superiority rhetorically against a doctrine of “special creationism,” which he posed as the main alternative option. This stylized opposition to creationism, envisioned as the direct action of a deity in creating each individual species exactly in its present condition, was a point of considerable criticism by his contemporaries, most of whom held no such view. But it has served since 1859 to define much of the popular debate over evolutionary theory.
The fertility argument can be seen as the most compelling claim in retrospect. As he envisioned it, with the acceptance of his theory, “a grand untrodden field of inquiry will be opened” in biology and natural history. The long-standing issues of species origins, if not the ultimate origins of life, as well as the causes of their extinction, had been brought within the domain of naturalistic explanation. It is in this context that he makes the sole reference in the text to the “origin of man and his history” (ibid., 488).
The broad sweep of Darwin's claims, the brevity of the empirical evidence actually supplied in the text, and the implications of his theory for several more general philosophical and theological issues, immediately opened up a controversy over Darwinian evolution that has waxed and waned over the past 149 years. On the level of popular science, Darwin's theory fell into a complex social situation that took on different features in different national traditions. In the Anglophone world, the great popularity of the anonymous Vestiges of the Natural History of Creation of 1844, which had reached 11 editions and sold 23,350 copies by December of 1860 (Secord in Chambers 1994, 1844, xxvii), with several more editions to appear by the end of the century, certainly prepared the groundwork for the general notion of the evolutionary origins of species by natural law. The Vestiges's grand schema of a teleological development of life from the earliest beginnings of the solar system to the emergence of humanity under the action of a great “law of development,” further popularized for Victorian readers by Alfred Lord Tennyson's epic In Memoriam (1850), provided a context in which some could read Darwin as supplying additional support for the belief in an optimistic historical development of life with the promise of ultimate historical redemption.
The popular image of a great public outcry against Darwin has been shown by careful historical analyses to be generally mythical, or at least in need of careful discrimination by social group, national tradition, and religious affiliation (Ellegard 1990). Analysis of the various national receptions of Darwin currently forms a minor scholarly industry in its own right. (Gliboff 2007; Numbers 1998; Pancaldi, 1991; Todes 1989; Bowler 1985 in Kohn 1985a; Corsi and Weindling 1985 in Kohn 1985a; Scudo and Acanfora 1985 in Kohn 1985a; Kelly 1981; Hull 1973; Glick 1972). Studies of non-Western receptions have also been made (Pusey 1983).
The publication of the Descent of Man in 1871 did, however, mark a watershed in the popular reception of Darwin. Retaining his views on human evolution quietly in the background while the defense of his general theory had been conducted by advocates as diverse as Thomas Henry Huxley (1825–95) in England, Asa Gray (1810–88) in the United States, and Ernst Heinrich Haeckel (1834–1919) in Germany, Darwin's own views on human evolution remained unclear. The Descent, however, seemed to many of his readers, even those previously sympathetic to the Origin, to throw Darwin's weight behind materialist and anti-religious forces. Although the question of human evolution had already been dealt with in part by Thomas Huxley in the Man's Place in Nature of 1863, by Charles Lyell in the same year in his Geological Evidences of the Antiquity of Man, by Alfred Russel Wallace in articles in 1864 and 1870, and by Ernst Haeckel in his Natürliche Schöpfungsgeschichte of 1868, these authors had either not ventured to deal with the full range of questions presented by the inclusion of human beings in the evolutionary process (Huxley), or they had emphasized the moral and mental discontinuity between humans and animals (Lyell, Wallace). Only Haeckel had drawn out a more general reductive conception of humanity from evolutionary theory and he had not carefully tied his speculations to the workings of Darwin's actual theory.
One of the predominant themes of the Descent was an elaboration upon the workings of the secondary process of sexual selection in the animal kingdom. Sexual selection—the selection of females by males or vice versa for breeding purposes—had played a minor role in the original argument of the Origin. Darwin now developed this secondary form of selection in elaborate detail. This was also employed to explain the origins of human races and the dimorphism of human sexes. The Descent presented, as one commentator has put it, “a closer resemblance to Darwin's early naturalistic vision than anything else he ever published” (Durant in Kohn 1985a, 294). Darwin's treatment of the “human question” integrated his theory of natural selection with a naturalistic analysis of the origins of ethics, society, the origin of races, the origins of “mental powers,” the development of sexual differences, and even indirectly, the origin of religion. This detailed application of his theory to such a wide spectrum of human issues was unequalled by the earlier efforts of Darwin's supporters.
Darwin's extension of his theory into the questions traditionally discussed within philosophy, theology, and social and political theory, hardened the opposition of many religiously-based communities to evolutionary theory, although here again, distinctions must be made between different communities (Ellegard 1990, chp. 14). Such opposition was not simply based upon the denial of the literal scriptural account of the origins of humankind, an issue which played differently within different religious communions (Artigas, Glick, and Martinez 2006; Moore 1981). More fundamentally, this opposition was due to the denial of distinctions, other than those of degree, between human properties and those of animals. At issue was also the evident denial of some kind of divine guidance to the processes leading to human evolution and the pronounced non-teleological character of Darwin's final formulations of his theory of natural selection in the Origin, if teleological aspects remained in discussions in his lesser-known botanical works of his last years (Sloan 2005 in Hösle and Illies 2005; Lennox 1993).
As he applied his theory to ethics, Darwin was neither a Utilitarian nor a Deontologist, as these terms have come to be used in contemporary ethical discourse, but instead reworked the moral sense tradition of the Scottish moralists Adam Smith, David Hume and James Macintosh (Richards 2003 in Hodge and Radick 2003; Richards 1999 in Maienschein and Ruse 1999). In Darwin's evolutionary schema, however, the moral sense was derived historically from animal instinct rather than constituting a property of an autonomous human domain, as it had functioned in moral sense theories previously. Furthermore, his account was seen by many to undermine the universality of the moral sense theory by making it the product of an evolutionary adaptation to circumstances. For many, Darwin's theory led to a pure relativization and naturalization of ethics (Farber 1994, chp. 5). It was, in the view of its philosophical critics, to reduce ethics to biology. Not even for some strong supporters of evolution, such as Thomas Huxley and Alfred Russel Wallace, was Darwin's account adequate (ibid, chp. 4). Much of subsequent moral philosophy, building upon the canonical acceptance of the “is-ought” distinction that received its most influential expression by G. E. Moore in his Principia Ethica of 1905—itself an attack on Spencer's version of evolutionary ethics—emerged from the debate over evolutionary ethics that followed Darwin.
Outside Britain, the general reception of Darwin's theories was conditioned, if not determined, by the differing intellectual and social contexts into which his theory was inserted. In France, for example, Darwin's theory was located against the prior debates over transformism of the 1830s that had pitted the theories of Lamarck and Geoffroy St. Hilaire against Cuvier. These debates had been resolved, at least within official Parisian academic science, in favor of Cuvier's anti-transformism. Darwin was then readily placed into the tradition of rejected science. The complex intellectual framework provided by the positive philosophy of Auguste Comte (1798–1857) also worked both for and against Darwin. On one hand, Comte's emphasis on the historical progress of science over superstition allowed Darwin to be summoned in support of a theory of the progress of science over religion, and the Origin was so utilized in the preface to the first French translation made by feminist Clémence Royer (Harvey 1987 in Abir-Am and Outram 1987). On the other hand, the Comtean three stages view of history, with its claim of the historical transcendence of speculative and metaphysical periods of science by a final period of experimental science governed by determinate laws, placed Darwin for some within a superseded tradition of speculative nature philosophy. As one famous scientist and methodologist of the period viewed it, Darwin's theory was to be placed with those of “a Goethe, an Oken, a Carus, a Geoffroy Saint-Hilaire,”—a grand speculation alien to the new scientific spirit of rigorous experimentalism (Bernard 1865, 1957, 91–92).
In the Germanies, Darwin's work entered a complex social, intellectual and political situation in the wake of the failed efforts to establish liberal democracy in 1848, and by 1870 Darwinismus was involved in the so-called Kulturkampf that pitted Bismarck's government of the new Germany particularly against Catholicism. The philosophical traditions of German Naturphilosophie, Romanticism, and the Idealism of Fichte and Hegel formed a fertile ground prior to 1859 into which Darwin's developmental view of nature and theory of the transformation of species was often assimilated (Corsi and Weindling 1985 in Kohn 1985a). Less concerned to relate Darwin to prior philosophical traditions, the first major interpreter of Darwin's theory for the German-speaking world, the paleontologist Heinrich Bronn (1800–62), was responsible for a sympathetic, but critical reading of Darwin that challenged his theory on substantial methodological and empirical points. These concerns then entered into his important translation of the Origin in 1860 (Gliboff 2007). The association of Darwinism with the tradition of Naturphilosophie also resulted in a lukewarm reception among advocates of the rigorous experimental empiricism and critical scientific methodology developed by such prominent scientific intellectuals as Hermann von Helmholtz (1821–94). On the other hand, the enthusiastic advocacy of Darwinism in Germany by Jena professor of zoology Ernst Haeckel also made Darwinism a player in the polarized political and religious disputes of Bismarckian Germany (Richards 2004). Through his popular polemical writings such as the Natural History of Creation (1868) and Anthropogeny (1874), Haeckel advocated a materialist monism in the name of Darwin, and used this as a stick with which to beat traditional religion. Much of the historical conflict between religious communities and evolutionary biology can be traced back to Haeckel's polemical writings, which went through numerous editions and translations, including several English and American editions, in the last decades of the nineteenth and the early decades of the twentieth centuries. Haeckel, more than any other interpreter of Darwin's views, created the image of a warfare between evolutionary theory and religious traditions.
One cannot always distinguish between “popular” and “professional” receptions of Darwin, as the case of Ernst Haeckel vividly displays. The simplest solution is to confine the latter designation to the reception by people with professional research and teaching positions in universities and scientific societies who were intimately familiar with the empirical evidence and the technical scientific issues under debate in the 1860s in geology, comparative anatomy, embryology and classification theory. These can usually be distinguished from lay interpreters who may not have made distinctions between the views of Lamarck, Chambers, Schelling, Spencer and Darwin on the historical development of life. This itself only gives a crude instrument of analysis, however. Haeckel displays this imprecision. He was a leading professor of zoology at an important German university (Jena) who formed a generation of scientific workers in embryology and natural history. From this position he was able to develop Darwinism both as a popular movement with social and political extensions, and also as a scientific research program that pursued the study of morphology and comparative embryology in the light of Darwin's general theory (Richards 2004, 1992, chp. 6; Nyhart 1995).
Darwin's reception among the scientific elites presents a complex picture that has been treated in an extensive literature that will be explored only selectively in the present entry (Bowler 1996; Pancaldi 1991; Glick 1972). Many prominent members of Darwin's immediate intellectual circle—Adam Sedgwick, William Whewell, Richard Owen, and Thomas Huxley— had previously been highly critical of Chambers's Vestiges in the 1840s for its popular character and its scientific incompetence. Darwin himself feared a similar reception, and he recognized that his ability to convince this group and the larger community of scientific specialists, which included Charles Lyell and John Herschel and other international experts with which he had corresponded widely, was a substantial challenge. With this group he was only partially successful.
Historical studies have revealed that only rarely did members of the scientific elites accept and develop Darwin's theories exactly as they were presented in his texts. Statistical studies on the reception by the scientific community in England in the first decade after the publication of the Origin have shown a complicated picture, in which there was neither a wide-spread conversion of the scientific community to Darwin's views, nor a clear generational stratification between younger converts and older resisters, counter to Darwin's own predictions (Hull et al., 1978). These studies also reveal a distinct willingness within the scientific community to separate acceptance of the broader claims of species descent with modification from common ancestors from the explanation of this descent through the action of natural selection. To utilize the categories of a Lakatosian “research program” analysis of scientific theories in their historical extension, one can distinguish between a “hard core” of central assumptions, a “protective belt” of auxiliary hypotheses that protect this central core from refutations, and a “positive heuristic” of applied research applications that are subject to continued revision and even refutation (Lakatos 1974 in Lakatos and Musgrave, 1974). Employing these distinctions, it is difficult to claim that anything more than the belief in descent from common ancestry was maintained by a broadly international scientific community at the “hard core” level in the closing decades of the nineteenth century. The “eclipse” of natural selection theory, if not of the theory of common descent with transformation, in the period between 1870–1930 (Bowler 1983; idem., 2004 in Lustig et al., 2004) meant that the historical impact of Darwin was based on deviations from his actual formulations of his theory. An important exception to this will be explored below.
Of central importance to this complex reception was the role of normal individual variation and its causes. From the first public presentation of his theory, Darwin had relied on the novel claim that small individual variations—the kind of differences considered by an earlier tradition as merely “accidental”—formed the raw material upon which, by unlimited addition through the action of natural selection, major changes could be produced sufficient to explain the differences in all the various forms of life over time. The causes of this variation were, however, left unspecified by Darwin. Variation was presented simply as governed by “unknown laws.” In keeping with his commitment to the gradualism of Lyellian geology, Darwin also rejected the role of major “sports” or other sources of discontinuous change in this process.
As critics centered in on the claim that such micro-differences between individuals could be accumulated over time without natural limits, Darwin began a series of modifications and revisions of the theory. In the fourth edition of 1866, for example, Darwin inserted the claim that the continuous gradualism illustrated by the branching diagram, was misleading, and that variation does not necessarily go on continuously. “It is far more probable that each form remains for long periods unaltered, and then again undergoes modification” (Darwin 1866, as in Peckham 2006, 213). This change-stasis-change model presumably allowed variation to stabilize for a period of time around a mean value from which additional change could then resume. Such a model would require even more time than assumed in earlier editions.
The difficulties in Darwin's arguments by 1866 were highlighted in a lengthy and telling critique of Darwin's theory in 1867 by the Scottish engineer Henry Fleeming Jenkin (1833–85). Using an argument previously raised in the 1830s by Charles Lyell against Lamarck, Fleeming (as he was generally known) Jenkin cited empirical evidence from domestic breeding that suggested a distinct limitation on the degree of variation, and the extent to which selection upon this could be taken (Jenkin 1867 in Hull, 1973). Using a loosely mathematical argument, Jenkin argued that the effects of intercrossing would continuously swamp deviations from the mean values of characters and result in a tendency of a population to return to the normal values over time. For Jenkin, Darwin's reliance on continuous additive deviation was presumed undermined by this argument, and only more dramatic and discontinuous change could account for the origin of new species.
Jenkin also argued that the time needed by Darwin's theory was simply inadequate, supporting this claim by appeal to the physical calculations of the probable age of the earth presented in publications by Jenkins's mentor, the Glasgow physicist William Thompson (Lord Kelvin) (1824–1907) (Burchfield, 1975). On the basis of Thompson's arguments, Jenkin judged the time since the origins of the solar system to be insufficient for the Darwinian gradualist theory of species transformation. Jenkin's multi-pronged argument gave Darwin considerable difficulties and set the stage for more detailed empirical inquiries into variation and its causes. The time difficulties were only resolved in the twentieth-century with the discovery of radioactivity.
As a solution to the variation question and the causal basis of this phenomenon, Darwin developed his “provisional hypothesis” of pangenesis, which he presented the year after the appearance of the Jenkin review in Darwin's two-volume Variation of Plants and Animals Under Domestication (1868). Although this theory had been formulated independently of the Jenkin review (Olby 1962), in effect it functioned as his reply to Jenkin. This offered a causal theory of variation and inheritance through a return to a theory resembling Buffon's theory of the organic molecules of the previous century. Invisible material “gemmules” were presumed to exist within the cells, and according to theory, they were subject to external alteration by environment and circumstance. These were then shed continually into the blood stream (the “transport” hypothesis) and assembled by “mutual affinity into buds or into the sexual elements” (Darwin 1868, 1875, vol. 2, p. 370). In this form they were then transmitted—the details were not explained—by sexual generation to the next generation to form the new organism out of “units of which each individual is composed” (ibid.). In Darwin's view, this hypothesis united together numerous issues into a coherent and causal theory of inheritance and explained the basis of variation. It also explained how use-disuse inheritance, which Darwin never abandoned, could work.
This theory, although not specifically mentioned or appealed to, seems to be behind an important distinction he inserted into the fifth edition of the Origin of 1869 where he made a direct reply to Fleeming Jenkin. In this textual revision, Darwin distinguished “certain rather strongly marked variations, which no one would rank as mere individual differences” from ordinary variations (Darwin 1869, in Peckham 2006, 178–179). This revision shifted his emphasis away from the importance of normal individual variation to something he now termed “strongly marked” variation. The latter was now the variation with primary evolutionary significance, since this was more likely to be transmitted to the offspring. In this form it presumably could be maintained in a population against the tendency to swamping by intercrossing. Darwin's struggles over this issue defined a set of problems that British life scientists in particular were to deal with into the 1930s. They also placed Darwinism in a defensive posture that forced its supporters into major revisions in the Darwinian research program (Gayon 1998; Vorzimmer 1970).
Evolutionary discussions that developed with the publication of the six editions of the Origin and the later Darwinian works took many shapes, and raised several different lines of inquiry. Some of the theoretical options of the late nineteenth-century included neo-Lamarckianism, saltationist and orthogenetic theories, and a complex body of theories that attempted to build upon Darwin's insights, typically without making strong use of his principle of natural selection (Shanahan 2004; Bowler 1996, 1983). In what follows, focus will be given to one strand of these discussions that did pursue natural selection theory and the issues raised by the concept of variation and the working of natural selection in relation to this. Out of this emerged the generally established consensus position which governs most discussions at the present. For additional perspectives on this period see DARWINISM this encyclopedia, and Plutynski 2006a and Lennox 2008.
The failure of experiments by Darwin's cousin Francis Galton (1822–1911) to find experimental proof for the pangenesis theory by experimental tests on breeding rabbits (1871) led Galton into a long inquiry into the statistics of inheritance. This resulted in the development of some of the main principles and techniques of modern statistical analysis as Galton worked out the first mathematical theory of inheritance. Initially these developments reinforced the theory of discontinuous evolution in a form that was not easily dislodged. Galton's law, first presented in his Natural Inheritance of 1889, and again in modified form in 1897, analyzed the transmission of inheritance by means of a mathematical theory of regression of a population to a mean value over time. Under the assumption that inheritance was quantitative in character and that each parent contributed equally to the offspring, Galton's “statistical law of heredity that appears to be universally applicable to bisexual descent,” as he was to claim with his final formulation (Galton 1897, 401), took the form of the equation:
M+D= 1/2(M+D1) +1/4 (M+D2) +1/8 (M+D3), or generally by the series M+(1/2D1+1/4D2+1/8D3…)
where D is the average deviation from the measured mean, M, and the coefficients 1/2 (parental), 1/4 (grandparental), 1/8 (great grandparental) etc. denote respective contributions from prior generations. With this equation, phenomena of both alternating and strongly persistent patterns of inheritance could presumably be explained by calculating the different strengths of ancestry (Galton 1897).
Independently reinforcing Galton's mathematical defense of discontinuous inheritance were the empirical and theoretical studies by the Cambridge zoologist William Bateson (1861–1926). In a major 1894 work (Materials for the Study of Variation) on the broad question of variation in a wide body of natural populations, Bateson examined the empirical evidence for continuous and discontinuous variation in natural populations and concluded that there were fundamental discontinuities separating natural species. Darwin's reliance on small and continuous variation as the main ingredient upon which natural selection worked was judged unsustainable: “the Discontinuity of which Species is an expression has its origin not in the environment, nor in any phenomenon of Adaptation, but in the intrinsic nature of organisms themselves, manifested in the original Discontinuity of Variation” (Bateson 1992, 1894, 567). Bateson offered no causal theory to explain such discontinuous variation, but the detailed evidence supplied in his work served to define the research problems with a new rigor.
At approximately the same time a causal theory of discontinuous variation was being worked out by the University of Amsterdam botanist Hugo De Vries (1848–1935). Embracing in a revised form Darwin's theory of inheritance by means of the transmission of material gemmules, which he renamed “pangens,” but confining these to the interior of the cell (denial of the “transport” hypothesis), De Vries developed a causal theory of inheritance in which each unit character was associated with a single material pangen (Vries 1910, 1889, 11). Viewed from the perspective of this theory, De Vries concluded that the organism was simply a mosaic of characters, each determined by unit pangens. Experiments designed to explore the consequences of his theory led De Vries in the 1890s to develop a theory of inheritance that resulted in his formulation of empirical laws of discontinuous inheritance. He then simply reformulated these after his important “rediscovery” in 1900 of Mendel's paper of 1866 on plant hybridization (Darden 1976).
Prior to the introduction of Mendel's long-neglected paper of 1866 into this discussion in 1900, other developments in British life science surrounding the variation question were leading in a different direction. Galton's concern to develop a mathematical theory for the analysis of variation and the transmission of inheritance was inspirational on the work of Bateson's one-time Cambridge mentor, Walter Frank Raphael Weldon (1860–1906), professor of zoology at University College London (1891–99), and later professor at Oxford University (1900–06). Inspired by Galton's mathematical approach to the analysis of populations put forth in Natural Inheritance (1889), Weldon was dedicated to extending these methods to natural populations of organisms in the wild. Initially, Weldon was in agreement with Galton's conclusion that the effects of natural selection were generally insignificant (Weldon 1890). Following upon the deep friendship and collaboration that developed after 1890 between Weldon and fellow University College professor (applied engineering mathematics) Karl Pearson (1857–1936), however, this situation changed. Pearson had independently been drawn to Galton's statistical methods by his study of Natural Inheritance. Through his friendship with Weldon, the mathematical analysis of variation in natural populations in relation to evolutionary change took on a new dimension and led to a major theoretical clash with the discontinuist theory of Bateson and De Vries, and subsequently, that of Mendel.
Pearson's deep philosophical commitment to a neo-positivist empiricist epistemology, inspired in many respects by Viennese physicist and philosopher Ernst Mach (1838–1916), also added an epistemological level to this disagreement. Pearson rejected, on epistemic grounds, the search for hidden causes and theoretical entities in science generally, and this lay behind his denial of of inheritance by non-observable entities, such as De Vries's pangens (Gayon, 2007; Sloan 2000; Pearson 1892).
Applying these epistemological premises to the issue of variation and its causes, Pearson and Weldon together turned to an empirical study on natural variation as a means to test the orthodox Darwinian theory of natural selection. They assumed evolutionary change could take place through selection upon the slight individual variations between individuals. Weldon's extensive comparative field work on variation in populations of the common shore crab Carcinus moenas in Plymouth, England, and Naples, Italy, resulted in a series of landmark studies between 1893 and 1898, in which the two utilized Pearson's statistical methods to develop a new way of analyzing the inheritance of variation that made no a priori commitment to the causal agency of germ plasms, “stirps,” or pangens (Weldon 1893, 1895). This phenomenalist mathematical analysis seemed to reveal the gradual morphological diversion of populations under specifiable selective pressures, as expected by traditional Darwinian gradualism. In a dense mathematical discussion of Galton's law of ancestral inheritance, Pearson then reformulated Galton's law in the following form:
K0 = 1/2 (σo / σ1K1) + 1/4 (σo / σ2K2) + 1/8 (σo / σ3K3) + 1/16 (σo / σ4K4)+ …
where K0 is the predicted deviation of offspring from the mean of the offspring generation, K1 is the deviation of the offspring's mid-parent, K2 that of its mid-grandparent, etc., and σ is simply the empirically measured standard deviation of variation around the mean of the population (Pearson 1898). Since the parameters are purely empirical, without commitment to an underlying causal ontology, there is no implied limitation on long-term evolutionary change through selection acting directly upon on slight individual morphological variations.
The bitter disputes that broke out between the camp of Weldon, Pearson and their disciples, and that of the discontinuists, armed after 1900 with Mendel's experimental results as well as with the data collected by Bateson and De Vries from their own experiments, form one of the minor dramas of the history of recent life science (Plutynski 2006; Gayon, 1998; Magnello 1998; Mackenzie 1981; Norton, 1973; Provine 1971; Froggatt and Nevin, 1971). On one hand the sophisticated techniques of mathematical and statistical analysis of evolutionary change developed by Pearson and his students that filled the pages of the new journal Biometrika were unmatched by the simple algebra and statistics of their opponents. Indeed, the discontinuist opposition led by Bateson was typically unable to deal with these complex mathematical arguments. But the new experimental science, named “genetics” by Bateson, based on the application of Mendelian laws to the experimental breeding of plant and animal populations under laboratory conditions, won the international allegiance of a wider body of adherents. The publication in 1901–03 of the Mutation Theory (English edition 1909–10) by De Vries provided an additional body of experimental evidence in support of the claim that species originate suddenly by a process of “mutation,” presumably through some transformation in the genetic material. In a major revision of Darwin's arguments, De Vries claimed that species must be considered to be fixed entities, and that new species are originate from other species by small, but discrete, stages.
The historical reconciliation of a material theory of inheritance with the principle of natural selection —generally designated later as the “synthetic” theory of evolution—was the product of a long and protracted struggle in the period between 1870 and 1930. The theory of inheritance that followed upon the re-introduction of Mendel's famous 1866 paper into the discussions in 1900 was originally met with strong resistance by defenders of orthodox natural selection theory. Weldon and Pearson, for example, responded to Mendelism and to the apparent support it gave to discontinuous evolution, by arguments that proceeded to show that Mendelian inheritance was only a special case of blending inheritance governed by Pearson's modifications of Galton's law. The complicated efforts by Pearson to demonstrate this point mathematically (Pearson 1904), however, fell on deaf ears. By 1906 and the untimely death of Weldon, Batesonian genetics had achieved a dominant position in the life sciences internationally, even gaining converts from the biometrical school.
The triumph of Bateson and the new genetic science reinforced saltationist evolution. Only by De Vriesian “mutation” was genuine novelty introduced into a natural population. All other novelty was simply combinatorial, meaning that with the number of determining genes large enough, there were presumably sufficient combinatorial classes possible to account for the shape of the normal curve of variation around the mean values for any given trait. Natural selection could only work on this available variation, and produce only micro-changes in populations, sufficient to account for the data offered in favor of gradualism by Weldon and Pearson, but incapable of creating genuine new species. Support for this conclusion from the mathematical side was also gained from G. H. Hardy's demonstration in 1908 that in a stable population undergoing hypothetically random mating, the proportion of dominant and recessive traits in a population would remain stable, with no tendency for one or the other to predominate (Hardy 1908).
Efforts to find some reconciliation between the discontinuist claims of Mendelism and De Vriesian mutation theory on one side, and the biometrical claims of continuism on the other, were nonetheless attempted as early as 1902 by Pearson's former student and applied statistician George Udny Yule (1871–1951). It was Ronald Aylmer Fisher's (1890–1962) work that then provided the fundamental impetus for a theoretical shift in the conceptualization of evolutionary theory (Plutynski 2006, 2005). Equal to Pearson in his grasp of mathematics and statistics, but convinced of the truth of the Mendelian theory, Fisher began a revision of the framework of evolutionary biology with a series of seminal papers that commenced in 1918 and culminated in his magisterial The Genetical Theory of Natural Selection of 1930.
Dissatisfied with Pearson's discounting of Mendelianism as only a special case of blending inheritance, and unlike Pearson, willing to accept an underlying causal relation of variation to material “Mendelian factors,” Fisher subjected Pearson's claims to a careful statistical treatment. In his landmark paper of 1918, Fisher proceeded to show that the empirical coefficients in the equations governing dominance were in fact better explained through the assumption of the operations of discrete Mendelian factors than by the assumptions of quantitative blending inheritance (Fisher 1918).
In developing his views after 1918 in a series of shorter papers that formed the foundations for the Genetical Theory, Fisher accepted by 1922 Wilhelm Johanssen's term “gene” to replace his earlier appeal to Mendelian “factors.” In these studies he also made appeals to contemporary statistical mechanics (Depew and Weber, 1995, chp. 10). Thus he comments in an important paper of 1922 that “the whole investigation may be compared to the analytical treatment of the Theory of Gases” (Fisher 1922, 321). By the writing of the Genetical Theory, these parallels were even more prominent. Fisher approaches the general issue of natural selection with the physicist's arsenal of idealizing initial conditions, appeals to hidden theoretical entities, and the concern to establish mathematical laws governing the process.
In the crucial second chapter of his work, Fisher lays out in a highly compressed form the basic ingredients of his “mathematical ” theory of natural selection. Fundamental ingredients of this theory are derived from the mathematical idealizations used in actuarial tables that he now applied to populations of organisms. This enables him to give ideal mathematical definitions of probability of survival at various life stages. To deal with the Malthusian parameter of population increase, he defines the measure of the relative rate of increase m that measures this Malthusian factor. He also gives mathematical definitions of the concept of reproductive value; of the definition of “fitness”; and finally of the role of genes in inheritance. Then combining these together he arrives at the equation for total fitness:
where W is the total fitness; p and q are the frequencies of alternative genes; a is the magnitude of the excess of a given factor in the relative m values in two groups of individuals with alternative genes; α the measure of the average effect on the chosen measurement; dp is the increase in the proportion of one gene compared to the other; pqaα is the contribution of each factor to the fitness measure by the genetic variance; and dt is the change over time. With this equation, the change of fitness, Wdt would be positive if the time is positive. This provides Fisher with the ingredients for his formulation of the “Fundamental Theorem of Natural Selection” which he states formally as:
The rate of increase in fitness of any organism at any time is equal to its genetic variance in fitness at that time. (Fisher 1999, 1930, 35)
In this statement it is also important to note that the theorem is formulated to apply not to individual organisms, but to populations of organisms.
Fisher himself drew the direct parallel between his fundamental theorem and the second law of thermodynamics. In his words, “both are properties of populations, or aggregates, true irrespective of the nature of the units which compose them; both are statistical laws; each requires the constant increase of a measurable quantity in the one case the entropy of a physical system and in the other the fitness, measured by m, of a biological population.”
The principal differences in the working of the second law of thermodynamics and Fisher's fundamental theorem include such things as the possibility of species extinction; fitness is different for every organism; fitness is affected by changes in the environment; entropy changes are irreversible, whereas evolutionary change is not; and most fundamental, the second law leads to increased disorganization and the heat death of the universe, whereas “evolutionary changes are generally recognized as producing progressively higher organization in the organic world” (ibid., p. 37).
Fisher's idealizing mathematical approach to questions of biology, and the validity of his use of such strong analogies between statistical mechanics and population biology remains a topic of contemporary discussion (Plutynski 2006b). Pressed far enough, such analogies can lead to viewing natural selection as acting purely upon genes in populations, reducing organisms in nature to mere epiphenomena, as held by some strong“genic” selectionists. Fisher never goes this far, and in fact it is important for his general theoretical views that organisms in their environment have some fundamental and creative action in evolution (Fisher 1934). Nonetheless, Fisher's analysis of natural selection does move it away from the conception of an agency acting on variations in observable morphological characters in empirical whole organisms, as assumed in the prior Darwinian tradition and even maintained in the bio-mathematical analyses of Weldon and Pearson. For those critical of Fisher's assumptions, this Fisherian replacement of the conception of the organism as a coordinated whole acting in the natural environment—the long tradition from Aristotle through Kant, Cuvier and modern morphologists—with the notion of organisms as “bags of atomic genes,” has implied a false reductionism that incorrectly abolishes conceptions of organization, form, and purposeful behavior from evolutionary biology (Grene and Depew 2004, chps. 7, 9). It can, however, be argued that Fisher never endorsed such a view.
On more general philosophical grounds, Fisher's work also has bearing on other issues involved in the more popular discussions of evolutionary biology that have taken place since the 1930s. By utilizing analogies drawn from statistical mechanics and the mathematical assumptions of parametric statistics, Fisher also raised the issue of random stochastic process or “chance” to a new level of importance in evolutionary theory. The role of statistical chance in his analysis of natural selection carried a special technical meaning and did not necessarily imply commitment to a non-teleological philosophy of nature that places “blind chance,” rather than teleological purposiveness, at the basis of perceived natural order (Fisher 1934; Turner 1985). But the advocacy of such claims has been a generating cause of some of the current public debates over evolution (Dawkins 1986, 1996.)
Although debates about Fisher's formulations and the meaning of his “Fundamental Theorem” are ongoing, his theoretical idealizations of the principles of natural selection, applied to population genetics, have nonetheless been the source of a fundamental reorientation of evolutionary theory. His work, more than any other, directly attacked the problem of how to connect the discontinuous character of Mendelian genetics to the continuist and gradualist claims of orthodox Darwinism. This opened up the route to the “Modern Synthesis” that formed the foundations for the neo-synthetic theory generally in dominance today.
In analyzing the origins of this theory, it has been useful to divide this along generational lines. One is an early phase associated with the names of Fisher, Sewall Wright (1889–1988), J. B. S. Haldane (1892–1964), and Julian Huxley (1887–1975) who dealt directly with the reconciliation of mendelism and natural selection through mathematics. A second phase brought this into more direct contact with empirical scientific work, as exemplified by the work of fruit-fly geneticist Theodosius Dobzhansky (1900–75), ornithologist Ernst Mayr (1904–2005), and paleontologist George Gaylord Simpson (1902–84) (Plutynski 2006a; Shanahan 2004; Smocovitis 1996; Mayr and Provine 1998).
Fisher's appeal to contemporary physical theory as a key foundation of his genetical theory of natural selection was not the only way in which new physical theory played into the assumptions of evolutionary biology in the 1930s and beyond. Issues presented by biophysics and molecular biology have influenced the development of alternative models of evolution to those put forth by the Modern Synthesis (Depew and Weber 1995, chps. 16–17). It is safe to say, nonetheless, that the basic assumptions of the Synthetic Theory continue to dominate scientific and philosophical discussions and textbook analyses of evolutionary biology at the writing of this article.
The long historical scenario summarized in the present entry has sought to display the complexity of evolutionary theory as a historical phenomenon. If we are to avoid essentialist definitions of theories, we can at best speak of a family of theoretical efforts to integrate the history of life and the history of the world together in naturalistic terms. This survey emphasizes the point that the historical and philosophical story of evolutionary biology is not that of a simple linear development of increasingly true theories leading to a present consensus. If space permitted, even more attention would be given to the specifying factors created by different intellectual and national traditions and social structures in shaping contemporary evolutionary theory into a complex set of theories that are themselves undergoing evolutionary change. The more general philosophical issues associated with evolutionary theory—those surrounding natural teleology, ethics, the relation of evolutionary naturalism to the claims of religious traditions, the implications for the relation of human beings to the rest of the organic world—receive no single solution from evolutionary science. If, as has been argued, contemporary neo-selectionist evolutionary theory has a remarkable continuity with select features of the works of Darwin, alternative interpretations, such as the current movement known as evolutionary developmental theory or “evo-devo,” mark a return to the tradition of Haeckel and his successors, who considered it essential to link evolution with embryonic development (Laubichler and Maienschein 2007; Gilbert, Opitz and Raff 1996). These developments suggest that there are still substantial theoretical issues at stake that may alter the understanding of evolutionary theory in important ways.
The professionalization of the philosophy of biology has, to be sure, considerably narrowed the concerns of many working philosophers to a limited set of questions generally discussed within the confines of the accepted neo-selectionist theory, including the analysis of such questions as units of selection, group vs individual selection, sociobiological theory, the selective value of altruism, and the mathematical analysis of natural selection and attendant concepts such as that of fitness. At the same time, signs of continued theoretical debate prevent any assumption of final historical closure on a single interpretation of evolutionary biology.
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