The Biological Notion of Individual
How we should think about biological individuals or agents and the roles they play in processes such as natural selection, speciation, and organismic development have become lively topics of discussion in the philosophy of biology in recent years. Individual organisms have been central to philosophical reflection on such processes, but they are not the only type of biological individual. For example, both genes and groups have been considered kinds of biological individual that function as units of selection. And some propose genomes are biological agents that code for organismal development. Focusing on organisms as one prominent kind of biological individual sheds substantial light on what biological individuals are. But to address broader questions about the structure of the biological world and its relation to human thought, we also need to reflect on biological individuals more generally.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. The Problem of Biological Individuality
- 3. Organism-Centred Views of Biological Individuals
- 4. Pluralism in the Face of Biological Heterogeneity?
- 5. The Tripartite View of Organisms and Homeostatic Property Cluster Kinds
- 6. Groups as Biological Agents: Superorganisms, Trait Groups, Species, Clades
- 7. Genes: Shifting Views of Developmental Agency
- 8. The Evolution of Biological Individuality
- 9. Concluding Thoughts
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
An untutored but attentive survey of almost any part of the living world reveals an incredibly diverse variety of individuals. At ground level, we see ants, beetles, moles, marmots, alligators, ivies, mushrooms, algae blooms, and ostriches. Through magnification, we see or infer flagella-propelled protists, tRNA molecules, prions, and bacteria of many kinds. At larger or collective scales, we can find herds of zebra, sweeping and astonishing coral reefs, biofilms made up of many different species of organisms, and even fungus complexes several hectares in area and with masses greater than an elephant's. Each of these entities is a candidate for exemplifying some kind of biological individual, and each has been treated as such in one or another part of the biological sciences. Those sciences recognize several kinds of biological individual as they attempt to discover generalizations, provide explanations, and make predictions about the biological world.
Of the many kinds of biological individual, organisms are the most prominent in common sense. And most of us feel confident in telling which things are organisms and which aren't. However, it proves surprisingly difficult to specify what it is to be an organism. Here there is intimate interplay between empirical data gathered by biologists and the conceptual probing that both they and philosophers of biology offer. Elaborating on two of the examples of biological individuals given above illustrates this interplay between empirical and conceptual work.
In the early 1990s, a team of biologists reported in the journal Nature that they had found high levels of genetic identity in samples of a species of fungus (Armillaris bulbosa), which had taken over a large geographic region in Michigan's Upper Peninsula (J. Wilson 1999: 23–25). They used these data to make a case for viewing these samples as constituting parts of one gigantic fungus, with an estimated biomass of more than ten tons and an estimated age exceeding 1500 years. They concluded, “members of the fungal kingdom should now be recognized as among the oldest and largest organisms on earth” (Smith, Bruhn, and Anderson 1992: 431). A number of other scientists have questioned whether this final claim about the organismal status of the humungous fungus is warranted, and some have argued the claim is mistaken.
How do we judge such claims and disputes? Minimally, we seem to need more empirical information about the example. Is the fungus a continuous biological structure? Does it have a determinate growth pattern? Is it able to reproduce? But this information alone can't settle the matter. We must also draw on our antecedent concept(s) of an organism and the status of organisms as biological individuals. Reflecting on the empirical information also allows us to fine-tune, amend, or challenge our antecedent concept(s), and to do so better than common sense reflection alone would.
Consider a second example in more detail (Turner 2000: ch.2). Coral reefs, despite rapidly becoming a thing of the past due to the climate changes associated with global warming, are spectacular and beautiful parts of the living world. They consist of two chief components. The first are accretions of calcite deposits. The second are the small animals, polyps, which produce and grow on the deposits. (Coral polyps belong to the same Linnaean class as sea anemones, and to the same Linnaean phylum as jellyfish.) The polyps are indisputably organisms. But further, conservation biologists also often describe the coral reefs, consisting of the polyps and deposits, as living things that can grow and die.
The reefs are at least biological individuals. And taking seriously their life, growth and death leads to the question of whether they too might be organisms. The dependence of the reefs on polyps does not rule this out, since such dependence is common in organisms. For example, we depend on internal bacteria that outnumber our own cells by about ten to one, and yet we are organisms (Ackerman 2012). And the polyps that reefs depend on are themselves dependent on single-celled algae, zooanthellae, for the glucose that provides the energy necessary for polyp photosynthesis, which in turn drives the process of calcification. Moreover, it is the zooanthellae that supply the pigments that give living corals their spectacular colours; absence or diminished presence of zooanthellae signals a problem for the long-term survival of a coral reef. Neither are the zooanthellae free of dependence. By infecting the polyps they gain a feeding den crucial to their survival.
Further reflection along these lines may suggest that an integrated network of dependence relations is itself a mark of being an organism. If that were so, then we may come to view the coral reef as a better example of an organism than either the polyps or zooanthellae, as the reef enjoys a kind or degree of complex, functional integrity that polyps and zooanthellae arguably lack (cf. also Combes 2001). Again, knowing what to say about this striking claim turns on what is packed into our conception of an organism. Empirical complexities to cases like that of a coral reef both allow us to unpack these and also to inform how we might regiment that conception to better capture features of the structure of the biological world that are not accessible to commonsense reflection alone.
While conceptual aspects to these issues are philosophical, there are many other philosophical problems concerning biological individuals. There are metaphysical issues about whether biological individuals are physical objects (van Inwagen 1990) or processes (Whitehead 1929) or something else, and about whether they exist at all (Unger 1980). There are epistemological issues about how to detect individuals and the relationships they enter into (Hacking 1982). And there are ethical issues about whether biological individuals have moral status by virtue of being alive (Varner 1998). But here we focus on conceptual and metaphysical aspects of issues like those raised in the fungus and reef examples by both philosophers of biology and biologists themselves.
One of the most general of these issues is what we will call the Problem of Biological Individuality (cf. Clarke 2010), and we can express it in a number of different questions:
- What makes something a biological individual?
- What is the nature of being a biological individual?
- What is the best explicative definition of “biological individual”?
As will become apparent, addressing the Problem of Biological Individuality does not require an essentialist answer according to which biological individuals form a kind individuated by a set of singly necessary and jointly sufficient properties. Indeed, biological essentialism is a view with little credibility in discussions of species and more generally amongst philosophers of biology (Hull 1965; Sober 1980; cf. Devitt 2008).
Responses to the Problem of Biological Individuality should clarify what relationship(s) hold between the category of biological individuals and the related categories of living thing, organism, evolutionary individual, developmental individual, and so on. For example, are biological individuals just organisms? Is there a nesting or some other hierarchical relationship between biological individuals and living agents? Although there are semantic decisions to be made about how these terms will be used, those uses should also be assessed in part by the plausibility of the implications they hold for scientific methodology, evidence judgments, and prediction and explanation.
To take a simple example, suppose someone proposes that all evolutionary individuals (also called units of selection) are organisms. Measuring fitness values to help predict trait frequencies of populations of evolutionary individuals in the future would then involve counting just all the relevant organisms. This methodology will produce misleading predictions and evidence judgments about the course of natural selection, however, if groups (in some contexts) or genes (in other contexts) are also evolutionary individuals, as many have argued. Detecting the poor predictions or judgments would then tell against the initial claim that all evolutionary individuals are organisms.
Taking biological individual as a quite general category that may subsume several kinds of biological individuals (e.g., evolutionary, developmental, living things, and others), we find it useful to distinguish two aspects of the Problem of Biological Individuality. The first concerns individuality in general—what it is that makes anything an individual of any kind. The second aspect concerns biology in particular—what it is that makes an individual biological rather than, say, chemical or sociological.
When philosophers of biology discuss individuality they understand individuals to be distinct from other entities such as properties, processes, and events, even if certain (say) properties and processes are constitutive of some forms of individuality. Biological individuals have three-dimensional spatial boundaries, endure for some period of time, are composed of physical matter, bear properties, and participate in processes and events. Biological processes (such as photosynthesis) and biological events (such as speciation) lack such a suite of features.
A further feature often associated with individuals is agency: a typical individual is a locus of causation, as are electrons in physics and molecules in chemistry (R.A. Wilson 2005). The sense in which biological individuals are agents is compatible with their also playing a more passive role in biological processes, or with their functioning as products rather than as causes of the evolutionary processes they are involved in. For instance, this notion of agency allows that some species and even larger clades are (on some views of speciation and taxa ontology) biological agents.
This deflationary notion of agency is weaker and less controversial than the notion of agency that Peter Godfrey-Smith (2009) has challenged through his critique of rationalizing and optimizing approaches to explanation within evolutionary biology, approaches exemplified by Dawkins' (1976 ) classic appeal to selfish genes. In fact, the conception of agency that we draw on is compatible with recognizing that the vast majority of biological agents are not psychological agents at all. It remains an interesting question as to why the use of cognitive metaphors in describing biological agency is widespread, if not ubiquitous (R.A. Wilson 2005: ch. 4–6; Godfrey-Smith 2009; Dennett 2012). Related issues that likewise are worth pursuing elsewhere include whether the agency of some biological individuals is determined partially by their context (e.g., Morris forthcoming) or relations to other things (R. A. Wilson 2005), whether such agency is determined partially by our values or conventions (Butler 2009; Keller 2002; Kitcher 2001), and whether biological agency and reality can come in degrees (Sober 1991; Godfrey-Smith 2009; Clarke 2012).
With individuals understood as agents in our sense, what makes for distinctly biological individuals? We have already suggested that “biological individual” is a term that encompasses many different kinds of agents, and in light of that one might well appropriate Philip Kitcher's (1984: 308) famous pluralistic quip about species, to suggest that there simply are whatever many kinds of biological individual are recognized by competent biologists. Historically, however, there has been lumping together of or slides between three categories: biological individual, organism, and living thing. One legacy of this has been a historical privileging of organisms in reflection on biological individuals more generally. Consider two recent challenges to this privileging:
- To understand life we should focus more than we have on collaborations between varieties of things (e.g., viruses, prions, plasmids, symbionts) that may not all be organisms; this is because these collaborations are characteristic and explanatory features of living systems, which may even suggest that a great variety of things other than organisms are alive (Dupré and O'Malley 2009).
- Far from being paradigmatic biological individuals, organisms may be marginal or special cases of biological individuals (Haber 2013).
These are challenges to particular ways in which organisms have been thought special. Heeding what we think is right in these challenges, we next begin to articulate an answer to the Problem of Biological Individuality that proposes a different special place for organisms in reflection on biological individuals more generally.
While we break with traditional views that simply equate organisms with biological individuals, or with living agents, we do think a sort of organism-centred view is a good start on the Problem of Biological Individuality. On this view biological individuals include exactly:
- organisms (such as wasps and whales, and perhaps endosymbionts and slime molds)
- some parts of organisms (such as hearts, placentas and plasmids) and
- some groups made up of organisms (such as zebra populations and aggregates of bacteria).
We call this an organism-centred view because each of its three parts reference organisms (cf. Pepper and Herron 2008: 622). It allows that many biological individuals—for example, hearts and populations—are not themselves organisms. And it allows us to recognize a thing as a biological individual even when we are not sure whether it is an organism, or a part of an organism (e.g., an endosymbiont) or a group of organisms (e.g., a colony of eusocial insects). Organism-centered views of biological individuality seem widely, if implicitly, endorsed, though confusing choices of terminology can conceal this. For instance, such a view may capture what truth lies behind recent proposals to extend the term “organism” to both some parts and groups of organisms (e.g., Queller 1997; Okasha 2011).
To see how an organism-centred view captures something striking about organisms without running afoul of A and B, take those challenges in turn. A's challenge to historical privileging of organisms addresses the methodological question of how to study life. The challenge proposes that our studies focus not just on organisms, but instead on a variety of things that produce life through interactions. This methodological prescription is based on answers to other questions, e.g., about how life is generated. Although an organism-centered view and Challenge A directly address different questions, they in fact can be viewed as fitting together nicely. Both are based on rejecting the ideas that only organisms are biological individuals, that only organisms are alive, and that only things that are alive are biological individuals. The methodological reorientation that A proposes does little by way of challenging an organism-centered view of biological individuals.
Challenge B raises the question of which biological individuals are paradigmatic. There are many senses of “paradigmatic”, but it is difficult to think of a plausible sense here that results in a tension between this challenge and an organism-centered view of biological individuality. Such a view, after all, holds that the extension of “biological individual” includes some (perhaps relatively many) groups above, and some (perhaps relatively many) parts within, organisms. Based on the number of traditionally excluded things this lets in, and on the differences between those and organisms themselves, an organism-centred view could allow that organisms are no longer paradigmatic biological individuals. It is simply that, conceptually or metaphysically, all biological individuals either are organisms or are importantly related to them on one of the two ways specified: mereologically, or by group membership. For this reason, understanding the nature of organisms and their relations is central to understanding biological individuality even if organisms represent just a fraction of the biological individuals there are, or are an idiosyncratic subset of biological individuals.
As promising as an organism-centred view of biological individuality is, its initial formulation does not specify which parts of organisms are biological individuals and which are not; likewise for groups of organisms. And it says nothing about what an organism is. We need to address these issues. To do so we must first reflect on the heterogeneity one finds in the biological world.
At the outset we emphasized the diverse variety of biological individuals. One can think of this diversity as consisting in significant differences between kinds of biological individuals. But striking diversity in the living world also exists within biological kinds. Within the category organism, for instance, there is astonishing diversity. Likewise within other putative kinds of biological individual: evolutionary individual, developmental individual, Homo sapiens, and so on. This diversity within biological kinds has been labeled intrinsic heterogeneity because it seems part-and-parcel, and distinctive, of those kinds and how they are theorized in the biological sciences (R.A. Wilson 2005: ch.3).
Intrinsic heterogeneity is manifest most clearly in the centrality of population thinking in evolutionary biology. Natural selection acts on variation within a population of individuals. As Elliott Sober has argued (1980), in the physical sciences and in pre-Darwinian biology, variation was understood as deviation from a natural or normal state, whereas in the post-Darwinian era, and especially through the Evolutionary Synthesis, variation came to be viewed as prodigious and itself crucial to the underlying causal mechanisms at the heart of biological stasis and change. Rather than being explained away, variation goes all the way down and does much explaining.
But intrinsic biological heterogeneity isn't restricted to evolutionary biology. The geophysicist Walter Elsasser drew this out in his Atom and Organism (1966) with the contrast between physical and biological kinds (see also Elsasser 1975, 1998). Roughly put, the chief idea is that if you've seen one electron (or quark or boson) you've seen them all. Although there are differences between instances of any two individuals (in accord with Leibniz's Law), these are differences that do not matter for physical kinds. What physicists and chemists do is abstract away from such differences, treating any instance like any other. By contrast, this is not true in the biological sciences. If you've seen one tiger (or vertebrate or coral reef) you have not seen them all, for there are differences between instances of any of these biological kinds that remain significant (in some cases, central) for the articulation of biological knowledge.
If Elsasser's general contrast obtains, then we should expect to find manifestations of intrinsic heterogeneity throughout the biological sciences. In ecology, intrinsic heterogeneity is manifest in mechanisms of competition and cooperation between species; in developmental cell biology, it is manifest in the diversification of cell types in accord with cellular environment and the timing of their movement and cell division; in genetics, we see so many different sorts of genes that we struggle to say what “gene” should mean; and intrinsic heterogeneity complicates attempts to more precisely specify what it is to be an organism, or a biological individual more generally.
Various forms of pluralism have become increasingly popular approaches to handling intrinsic heterogeneity, responding to the difficulty that intrinsic heterogeneity presents for characterizing some kind K by moving on to characterize finer-grained, more determinate kinds. If K seems too diverse to characterize, split it into diverse sub-kinds and characterize each of those. Jack Wilson has done this where K = biological individual, as he moves beyond this to characterize genetic, functional, and developmental individuals (1999, 2000). And famously, John Harper invoked pluralism where K = organism, by focusing instead on the more particular kinds ramet and genet. A ramet begins as a seed or fertilized egg; a genet originates through clonal growth. Ramets and genets can differ in a given situation, e.g., each of the trees in an aspen grove that forms clonally is a ramet, but collectively they typically form a single genet. A pluralist might prefer this description over any attempt to say what the organisms per se are in this case.
One reason to instead or additionally explore monistic approaches to biological individuality is that intrinsic biological heterogeneity should lead us to suspect that the pluralistic splitting of concepts will simply turn up more heterogeneity. This may be why pluralism in biology seems never to end conceptual disputes (Clarke 2010). A second reason to do so is the frequently overlooked fact (Brigandt 2009) that monist and pluralist approaches are often compatible, even complementary. Monists can quite happily recognize as correct, useful, or legitimate, multiple categories that result from splitting K, while still attempting to elucidate K as an umbrella or genus category (or even a less neatly related category). Splitting the category tools into hammers, saws, and others doesn't thereby impugn tools as a category.
The two pluralism-compatible ways in which we advocate monism concern, respectively, approaches to concepts of biological individuality in general, and to the concept of organism in particular.
Regarding the first, we encourage attempts to retain concepts of biological individuality when apparent counterexamples to their definitions arise from intrinsic heterogeneity. To see this, consider a particular concept of biological individuality, Godfrey-Smith's (2009) notion non-marginal evolutionary individual. Ereshefsky and Pedroso (2012) interpret Godfrey-Smith as implying a certain necessary condition on being such an individual: to qualify, a thing must be the product of a significant genetic bottleneck event. A genetic bottleneck event is a narrowing between generations. Any human individual, for example, is typically the product of such a bottleneck, as he or she develops from a single cell (a zygote) in which maternal and paternal genetic material is combined. Ereshefsky and Pedroso marshal biofilms as a putative counterexample to this necessary condition on being a non-marginal evolutionary individual. Biofilms, they argue, are non-marginal evolutionary individuals despite not satisfying the bottleneck condition.
A pluralist might accept this as a counterexample, then consequently move from non-marginal evolutionary individual to two finer-grained concepts, one associated with genetic bottlenecks and the other with cases like biofilms. But the ecumenical monist option is to allow that a pluralistic focus on more specific concepts may be fruitful, while denying that biofilms are a counterexample. Put differently, the monist can retain the initial concept of non-marginal evolutionary individuality while conceding that such individuality can be realized in more than one way. This is an attractive option when there is some good theoretical reason for retaining the initial concept. In the present case, Godfrey-Smith argued for the bottleneck condition on the basis that non-marginal individuals are the kinds of things that form populations in which selection can produce evolutionary novelty. Production of such novelty is important enough, he contends, that whatever mechanism enables this should count as a constitutive factor (one satisfied to degrees) of being a non-marginal evolutionary individual.
We can agree with both this, and with Ereshefsky and Pedroso's insistence that bottlenecks are not the only novelty-creating mechanism. They are not the only such mechanism because biofilms enjoy novelty creation by lateral gene transfer rather than bottlenecks. What is right about pluralism here is that there are at least two distinct mechanisms rather than one. What is right about monism is emphasizing that the two mechanisms play the same theoretically important role—helping generate evolutionary novelty. This role helps distinguish the concept non-marginal evolutionary individual that the monist retains as theoretically important, while encouraging pluralist exploration of distinct mechanisms.
Pluralism and monism of these sorts are not just compatible, but complementary as well. The exploration of mechanisms helps us better articulate their shared role and the concept of non-marginal evolutionary individual; in turn, this helps guide further exploration of associated mechanisms. This is one way in which interplay between conceptual and empirical work, exemplified in our introduction, is manifest when exploring various sorts of biological individuality.
In the next section we elaborate the second way we advocate monism. This way involves developing an account of being an organism that accommodates intrinsic heterogeneity by drawing on the Homeostatic Property Cluster (HPC) view of kinds. This view has been widely discussed with respect to biological species (Boyd 1999a,b; Griffiths 1997, 1999; R.A. Wilson 1999; cf. Ereshefsky 2007; Ereshefsky and Matthen 2005), but has also been introduced in accounts of higher taxa, homology, and cell types (Assis and Brigandt 2009; Rieppel 2005a, 2005b, 2007; Wilson, Barker, and Brigandt 2007).
Although this view of kinds fits with some forms of pluralism, it is motivated by a distinctive response to intrinsic heterogeneity. Confronted by Elsasser's point that intrinsic heterogeneity is something about biological kinds to be captured rather than overcome, the HPC view responds with naturalistic humility: when empirical work repeatedly reveals intrinsic heterogeneity, change your philosophy of kinds to accommodate this.
Our account of being an organism is called the Tripartite View of Organisms (R.A. Wilson 2005: ch. 3–4). At its core are the explicit claim that organisms are a type of living thing (or individual or agent), and the implicit claim that this kind is central to the biological sciences. Additionally, organisms are distinguished from other living agents by two properties: belonging to a certain sort of reproductive lineage, and having a certain type of autonomy. In summary, the Tripartite View holds that any organism is physically continuous and bounded and is:
- a living thing (individual, agent) during at least some of its existence
- that belongs to a reproductive lineage, some of whose members have the potential to possess an intergenerational life cycle, and
- which has minimal functional autonomy of the relevant kind.
To explicate the view further, consider each of these three features in turn.
Like other biological kinds, living agent is an HPC kind and so we give “living agent” an HPC definition. Empirical facts and findings continually inform the definition and to see what a good definition might look like consider the following structural, functional, and relational properties possessed by living things. Living agents
- have heterogenous and specialized parts
- include a variety of internal mechanisms
- contain diverse organic molecules, including nucleic acids and proteins
- grow and develop
- have a metabolism
- bear environmental adaptations
- construct the niches that they occupy
The fundamental, general feature of HPC views of kinds concerns how an HPC kind term is defined by a cluster of properties rather than any one property. No one property in the definitive cluster need be possessed by any individual belonging to the kind, but each individual must have one of the n-tuple of properties in the cluster that is sufficient for belonging to the HPC kind. What features or implications of the HPC view of kinds are important for understanding its application to the case of living things?
First, defining a kind term by a property cluster, rather than a single property, as HPC views do, acknowledges a complexity to the structure of entities that fall under the biological kind living thing. While the view allows that there may (though needn't) be some properties in the defining cluster that all living things share (e.g., metabolism), it resists the idea that even such properties are profitably thought of as essential to the kind.
Second, implying that no one of the properties in a given definitive cluster is strictly necessary for an individual to belong to the corresponding HPC kind recognizes the intrinsic heterogeneity of entities subsumed under living thing. For instance, this accommodates biological individuals that don't reproduce (e.g., sterile organisms), or that stop growing, or that malfunction so as to lose their capacity for self-repair as living things, and so on.
Third, the HPC view doesn't conceptualize a definitive cluster of properties as simply those properties that each kind member typically coinstantiates. Rather, coinstantiation of properties in the cluster is reliably underwritten by specific causal mechanisms and constraints. This gives definitive clusters their homeostatic character, and ensures the causal structure of the world plays a significant role in determining what is and what is not an HPC kind. Consequently, whether something is a living thing is determined in significant measure by how the mind-independent world is, rather than simply by our conventions and categories for thinking about the world (Wilson, Barker, and Brigandt 2007). This is one thing that distinguishes the HPC view from Wittgensteinian family resemblance accounts of concepts and from subjective taxonomies, such as pheneticism about species (Sokal and Sneath 1963; Sokal and Crovello 1970).
Suppose that organisms are living agents, and that we accept the HPC view of living agency. This tells us something significant about what organisms are. But as section 4 suggests, it would be a mistake simply to identify organisms with living agents. Doing so would have problematic implications, chief among them being that only organisms are living agents.
Implying that only organisms are living things is hopeless in light of counter-examples, namely, entities that form parts of organisms. These include cells and the organelles they contain (such as mitochondria and ribosomes), bodily organs (such as the heart or kidney), and bodily systems (such as the digestive system or the circulatory system). Such entities have the structural, functional, and relational properties specified in the HPC definition given above, but they are not themselves organisms. Closest to our commonsense thought is the second of these, where we readily speak of an organ that is available to be transplanted from a dead person to living recipient as living or alive. Cells are conceptualized in much the same way, with certain diseases leading to the death of particular cells, or treatments of those diseases as succeeding just when they preserve the life of those cells.
So organisms are a kind of living thing. The next distinguishing feature of organisms according to the Tripartite View, something that helps separate organisms from other living things, is that they have life cycles that allow them to form reproductive lineages of a certain kind. Simply reproducing is not the distinctive feature here.
A life cycle is an intergenerationally replicable series of events or stages through which a living agent passes (Bonner 1993). These events or stages constitute a cycle because they begin and end with the same event, such as the formation of a fertilized egg in sexually reproducing organisms, or the creation of a fissioned cell in clonally reproducing organisms. “Development” is the global name for the processes that causally mediate between these events or stages. And while the stages themselves often form standard sequences, there can be tremendous variation across phyla in what a given organism's life cycle consists in (Buss 1987; Godfrey-Smith 2009). Some organisms, such as flukes, have life cycles that take them literally through one or more host organisms, and many insects undergo significant metamorphic changes in bodily form through their life cycle.
Intergenerational life cycles make it possible for organisms to form reproductive lineages of living things. Such reproductive lineages are one of the most impressive and causally potent features of the biological world. Although reproduction itself has sometimes been thought of as part of an organism's life cycle, we should think about this more carefully in articulating the role of reproduction in intergenerational life cycles that characterize organisms in general. For there are many species in which only a small minority of organisms get to reproduce, and reproductive skew is a widespread feature of the world of organisms. Yet it seems clear that all of these organisms, however much or little they reproduce, still possess a life cycle. Even the capacity to reproduce does not accurately characterize a universal feature of organismic life cycles. This is not only because the capacity itself may not be replicated, but also because there are organisms designed to be non-reproductive.
The best-known examples of such individuals are found amongst the so-called social insects—species of ants, bees, wasps, along with the phylogenetically distinct termites—groups of which have a caste structure. In such species, a few individuals do most if not all of the direct reproductive labor (e.g., queens), and many others are rendered reproductively sterile throughout all or much of their life (e.g., worker castes). So there are reasons to include neither reproduction nor the capacity to reproduce as part of the generic life cycle of organisms. What is true, however, is that all organisms have life cycles that allow them to form reproductive lineages. They do so through the reproductive activity of members of the lineage to which they belong, even if not every member of that lineage reproduces or even can reproduce.
On the Tripartite View, the third distinguishing feature of organisms is that they have a minimal level of functional autonomy of the relevant kind. This builds on the intuition that organisms are not simply living things or agents but have a life of their own: they are able to exercise some sort and degree of control over themselves and subsequently are relatively free with respect to relevant other things, including relevant other agents and environment. Judgments about which contrast classes are relevant, and whether freedom with respect to those is sufficient in a case for the minimal functional autonomy required to be an organism, likely must be shaped partially by norms (see Barker and Velasco forthcoming). But this allows that being an organism remains in many cases a determinate and relatively natural matter, and that rationality constrains whatever normative elements there must be. Putting the minimal functional autonomy condition differently, any organism is a locus of control in ways that neither non-living things nor obligately-dependent living things (such as organs) are. Or as others have said, the high level of functional integration possessed by parts of organisms (Okasha 2011: 59; Pradeu 2012: 243–244) imbues the whole organisms they constitute with both capacities to act and largely shared fates those capacities contribute to (Sober 1991: 291). In some sense, this is why any organism has a life to lead, rather than simply being alive.
Unlike accounts of organisms that tend to rely on single and short criteria for being an organism, the Tripartite View has the resources to explain much about our (at times) mixed intuitions about the organismal status of certain biological and non-biological individuals. In order to see what the Tripartite View implies about a range of putative biological individuals, consider 20 such individuals:
- bodily organs, systems: satisfy (a) but not (b); (c) very limited, if satisfied at all.
- obligate parasites: satisfy (a)–(b), though the extent to which (c) is satisfied varies; cf. viruses on (a) and (c) below.
- mitochondria: were once organisms (Margulis 1993) but are no longer such: special case of obligate parasites that have given up (b) in addition to (c), over evolutionary time.
- genes, or DNA fragments: at least some satisfy (c), and a variant of (b), but don't satisfy (a).
- developmental systems: do not satisfy (a)–(c); may be parts of organisms, or have organisms as parts, but are not organisms.
- single cells: as unicellular organisms, satisfy (a)–(c), but in multicellular organisms, fail to satisfy (b) and (c).
- viruses: satisfy (b); satisfaction of (a) borderline and of (c) questionable in many cases because of the sort of dependence on other organisms.
- plants: satisfy all of (a)–(c)
- vertebrates + their environments: not themselves organisms because not living things, even though they contain an organism as a proper part; see also parasite-host systems.
- parasite-host systems: satisfy (a) and (b), but so too do their constituent parts; this makes us reluctant to see them as satisfying (c), and so reluctant to count them as organisms.
- first/last living thing: if in a lineage, can satisfy (a)–(c); if not, doesn't satisfy (b).
- individual sterile termites: satisfy (b) despite their sterility, as well as (a) and (c), and so are organisms.
- a group of sterile bees: do not satisfy (a), and so are not organisms, even if they satisfy (b) and (c).
- colonies of organisms: satisfy (b), and in key cases (e.g., social insects), (c); if but only if they satisfy (a), this would justify the view that they are a kind of organism, superorganisms.
- higher level entities (e.g., groups, species): do not satisfy (a) and even satisfaction of (b) and (c) are likely to be contentious: they are lineage-based, biological individuals that are not living things.
- Gaia: does not satisfy (b); defenders of Gaia hypothesis (Lovelock 1979 ) suggest that Earth satisfies (c) and, less obviously, (a).
- autocatalytic chemical reactions: do not satisfy (b), and even though they share some of the properties in (a), do not satisfy (a).
- artificial life critters: may satisfy a variant of (b) and perhaps even (c), but fail to satisfy (a) due to the simulational nature of the entities and their environments (R.A. Wilson 2005: 91–94).
- humungous fungus: satisfies (a)–(c), and so is an organism, but that status is jeopardized if there is lack of physical continuity and boundedness.
- coral reefs: may satisfy (a) and (c), but not (b), and so are like Earth on the Gaia hypothesis.
To summarize, we have seen that biological individuals include organisms and non-organisms. The Tripartite View of Organisms, drawing on the HPC view of kinds, represents one monistic alternative or complement to pluralism about organisms. If a sort of organism-centred view of biological individuality like that introduced in section 3 is correct, the Tripartite View will inform discussions of biological individuals that are organisms and those that are not, and so that view will play a role in responding to the Problem of Biological Individuality. But there remain issues about biological individuals other than organisms to consider.
In what follows we turn to consider two such biological individuals, groups and genes. In each case we focus primarily on just one recent debate that the kind of individual has been central to: debate about the role of groups with respect to the levels of selection, and debate over the place of genes in understanding organismic development and evolution.
On the standard Darwinian view of natural selection, the mechanism of natural selection operates on individual organisms. Because there is heritable variation within a population of conspecifics with respect to traits that imbue those organisms with differing levels of fitness, natural selection can increase the proportion of organisms with traits that promote fitness. Many biologists and philosophers of biology have recognized that the substrate-neutrality of the conditions for natural selection imply in principle that it can act on a large variety of entities in the biological hierarchy, stretching from the very small (e.g., single base pairs) through to the very large (e.g., clades). And there are a variety of proposals for what is required to be an entity that selection can act on—what is required to be an evolutionary individual or agent (e.g., Bouchard 2008, and see Clarke 2010). But as a matter of fact the bulk of discussion that moves beyond the standard Darwinian view has focused on two such agents: groups “above” and genes “below” (Sober and Wilson 1998; Okasha 2007; Godfrey-Smith 2009; Haber 2013).
The term “group” itself refers to collections of individuals of very different scales and kinds, ranging from temporary dyads of individuals (such as two crickets sharing a ride on a leaf, Sober and Wilson 1998), through to organisms that live together with a social division of reproductive labour (such as social insects), and even higher-level taxonomic groups whose members are largely separated in space and time (such as planktotrophic mollusks, Jablonski 1986, 1987). Darwin himself appealed to group selection between “tribes” in explaining how moral traits involving self-sacrifice could evolve in human societies that differed with respect to such traits. But he offered no substantive discussion of the differences between these kinds of groups and the relevance of each for natural selection. It has only been with the revival of group selection, largely through the work of David Sloan Wilson (1975, 1977, 1980, 1983, 1997a,b) and his frequent collaborator Elliott Sober (Wilson and Sober 1989; Sober and Wilson 1994, 1998) that this question has received heightened attention (Lloyd 2005; Lloyd et al. 2005; Okasha 2007; Waters 2005; R.A. Wilson 2007).
One fundamental distinction here is between two sorts of groups. One is superorganisms, which are groups sometimes viewed as organisms as we saw above. The other is trait groups, which possess few of the characteristics that organisms have but nonetheless might be thought to function as organisms do vis-à-vis natural selection. Paradigm examples of superorganisms are colonies of social insects, e.g., Hymenoptera such as ants, wasps, and bees, together with the taxonomically distinct termites. Indeed, the term “superorganism” was introduced by the entomologist William Morton Wheeler in his 1920 essay “Termitodoxa, or Biology and Society”, although he had talked of ant colonies as organisms as early as his 1911 essay “The Ant-Colony as an Organism”. Even though evolutionary considerations were often in the background in appeals to the concept of a superorganism, the concept has had a metaphorical life of its own in characterizing the structural intricacy of certain social structures of a small number of species.
By contrast, D.S. Wilson (1975) introduced the term “trait group” specifically to name a type of group that he thought was pervasive in nature, and that could be a unit of selection just as individual organisms were. Thus, trait group selection came to represent a form of “new group selection”, contrasted with forms of group selection that were likely much more limited in their efficacy and prevalence.
The intuitive idea behind a trait group is that demes can feature evolutionarily relevant structure wherein organisms belonging to one part of the deme are subject to causal influences that do not extend to the deme as a whole. A population of such structured demes would then function as a metapopulation, with natural selection operating between the trait groups that make up that metapopulation. Sober and Wilson have defined a trait group as “a set of individuals that influence each other's fitness with respect to a certain trait but not the fitness of those outside the group” (1998: 92; Basl 2011 raises important problems for this definition). This builds on Wilson's earlier talk (e.g., 1980: 20–24) of trait groups exerting a ‘sphere of influence’.
On this view of what a group is, how long a group persists is irrelevant to its status as a group. What is crucial, rather, is that group members interact in some evolutionarily significant way, such as caterpillars feeding on the same leaf might. It is also strictly irrelevant whether the members of such groups are conspecifics, and this is one reason why Wilson has used the notion of a trait group to discuss the evolutionary dynamics of multispecies communities (e.g., D.S. Wilson 1980: ch. 5–6). While we might describe such groups as evolutionary individuals or as individual units of selection, it should be clear that trait groups in general are not organisms because they are not living things.
Kim Sterelny (1996) has invoked the distinction between superorganisms and trait groups to argue that group selection is a much less significant force in directing evolution than proponents of group selection have thought. The idea is that superorganismic group selection is real but found only in special cases, while examples we might describe as instances of trait group selection are better described as cases of genic or individual selection relativized to a particular environment, where part of that environment is composed of other individual organisms. In effect, this argues that Wilson and Sober have failed to identify a new form of group selection, trait group selection, since at best they have offered a way to redescribe how natural selection operates on individuals and genes. Together with skepticism about the notion of a trait group (cf. Sober 2011), this amounts to denying the significance of trait groups for natural selection.
Sterelny's view that we can redescribe trait group selection without positing groups as the units of selection is an instance of a position that has been called model pluralism about the levels of selection, since it claims that there is a plurality of models that evolutionary biologists might adopt (R.A. Wilson 2003, 2005: ch.10). This view has gained much support in the literature in recent years, being defended in influential papers by Dugatkin and Reeve (1994) and more recently by Kerr and Godfrey-Smith (2002). While pluralistic in name, the effect of model pluralism has often been to reinforce the status of individual and genic selection at the expense of group selection. For example, Dugatkin and Reeve call model pluralism “broad-sense individualism”, characterizing this as the view that “most evolution arises from selfish reproductive competition among individuals within a breeding population” (1994: 107). And entomologists Andrew Bourke and Nigel Franks summarize their discussion of this topic by saying that “colony-level, group, individual, and kin selection are all aspects of gene selection” (1995: 67). As with Dawkins's appeal to shifts in perspective between two views of a Necker cube as a way to explain the relationship between the selfish gene view and traditional (organismic) Darwinian views of natural selection, here pluralism-in-the-abstract often amounts to a sort of fundamentalism-in-the-particular-case.
Paleobiologists and paleontologists have also explored higher-level selection with a focus on species and clade selection (Grantham 1995). Clades are monophyletic groups of organisms or species, groups defined by an ancestor and all of and only its descendants. Steven Stanley and Stephen Jay Gould have been two of the most prominent defenders of the idea that there are large-scale patterns of evolutionary change that are due to species of clade selection, and both have done so in part by explicitly developing an extended analogy between individual organisms and species (e.g., Stanley 1979: 189; Gould 2002: 703–744). Amongst putative examples of clade selection are the evolution of planktotrophic mollusks in the late Cretaceous (being selected for greater geographic dispersal and so longetivity, Jablonski 1986, 1987), the evolution of larger body size in males (selected via population density and geographic range, Brown and Maurer 1987, 1989), and the evolution of flowering plants (selected via vector-mediated pollen dispersal, Stanley 1981: 90–91).
One of the chief threads to the continuing debate over species and clade selection parallels that over trait group selection and model pluralism. Are species or clades themselves really the agents of selection, the units that are being selected, or do they simply tag along for the ride, with selection operating exclusively on genes and organisms? Elisabeth Vrba (1986, 1989; and see Vrba and Gould 1986), for example, has distinguished between species sorting and species selection, arguing that while a sorting of species may be the product of evolution by natural selection (see Barker and Wilson 2010), this outcome is typically brought about not by species selection but by individual selection.
Although we have concentrated on groups and the levels at which natural selection operates in this section, it would be an oversight to remain silent on an idea about species that has become influential in the literature: that species themselves are individuals. Historians have discussed the extent to which past biologists such as Buffon (via his sterility criterion of species), and philosophers such as Hegel (through his conception of concrete universals), helped generate and facilitate this view (Stamos 2004). But the species-as-individuals thesis did not flower until Ghiselin (1974) argued for it and quickly converted David Hull (1976, 1978) to the idea (see also Ghiselin 1997). Levels of selection considerations were only a periodic and small part of the motivation for the thesis. Rather the thesis developed as part of a response to the perceived failure of essentialism about species, and in part as a way to express the idea that species were treated within systematics and evolutionary biology not as kinds but instead as spatiotemporally restricted lineages, with individual organisms as their physical parts. The species-as-individuals thesis was presented and seen as making a radical break with previous views of the ontological status of species, as it implied that biologists and philosophers alike had misidentified the basic ontological category that species belonged to. But over time, both as its proponents have clarified what the thesis implied (e.g., gravitating to talk of historical entities rather than individuals) and as more sophisticated options for defenders of the view that species are kinds were developed (e.g., the HPC view of kinds, Boyd 1999a,b; Wilson, Barker and Brigandt 2007), this radical edge to the thesis has diminished. A now widely accepted insight clarified in the process is that in the case of many species, organisms belong to them (as parts or members) by virtue of their interactions and their extrinsic rather than intrinsic properties (Barker 2010; cf. Devitt 2008).
Genes themselves have been thought of as biological individuals of particular significance not only in the process of natural selection, but also as developmental individuals in the construction of organisms. One topic that has received much recent discussion is how genes have been conceptualized, the kinds of properties they have been viewed as having, and the causal roles they have been ascribed in inheritance and development. We will focus on two metaphors that have played an important role here—the much-discussed informational metaphor and what has been called the cognitive metaphor (R.A. Wilson 2005: ch.2). We will also discuss a related challenge to the standard view of genetic agency that has been issued by developmental systems theory (Griffiths and Gray 1994, 2001).
The ideas that genes carry information about phenotypic traits, that they encode for proteins, and that they contain a blueprint for organismic development, are all widely accepted in the biological sciences and in broader representations of what genes do. Yet it is only recently that these ideas have been recognized as forming part of a cluster of claims that make up an informational metaphor for characterizing genetic agency, with the status of that metaphor a continuing topic of debate. This information metaphor predates the discovery of the structure of DNA by Watson and Crick in 1953, having its roots in the cybernetic tradition led by the physicists Norbert Wiener and Erwin Schrödinger in the 1940s and ‘50s. The metaphor also subsumes talk of genetic programming, instructions, and recipes. Evelyn Fox Keller (2000) has argued that this blending of computational and coding metaphors was productive for geneticists because it allowed the development of a notion of genetic action in absence of detailed knowledge of the biochemical structures and mechanisms in which such action was ultimately realized. In our view, the informational metaphor has also contributed to a misleading view of the kinds of individuals or agents that genes are. This is so to the extent that the metaphor has implied that genes are self-contained and autonomous agents in their own right, agents whose intrinsic properties hold the secret to understanding a wide range of phenomena in the biological world.
The informational metaphor has done this partly through its interactions with appeals to cognitive metaphors, the metaphorical attribution of cognitive states and traits to biological entities that do not literally possess those states and traits. When we describe a laptop computer as thinking what to do next or as not wanting to be cooperative, we make use of the cognitive metaphor, something that Dan Dennett (1987) calls adopting the intentional stance. Reliance on such cognitive metaphors is widespread in the biological sciences, ranging from our attributions of knowledge and recognition to cells in the immune system, through to the attribution of goals and desires to Mother Nature in describing how natural selection operates (cf. Godfrey-Smith 2009: 9–11, 36–39).
The cognitive metaphor enters talk of genes in several ways. First, the metaphor of the selfish gene, introduced and made popular by Richard Dawkins (1982, 1989), conceptualizes genes as having interests (their own replication and preservation), and engaging in means to satisfy those interests (strategies). Having interests and adopting strategies are both properties that only agents with a psychology can literally possess, and so the cognitive metaphor serves to extend this sort of cognitive agency to biological agents, such as genes. Second, explanations of molecular and intra-cellular processing in general have made use of the cognitive metaphor, and accounts of the operation of genes have been no exception. Genes execute instructions, recognize binding sites, and try to maximize their replication in future generations. The interaction between the informational and cognitive metaphors is apparent not only in such examples, but might be thought required insofar as the informational metaphor itself presupposes the cognitive metaphor, as some have in effect argued is the case in cognitive science (Horst 1996).
One reason why the web of informational and cognitive metaphors has been productive within genetics is that their extensive, fruitful entwinement with literal descriptions has made it difficult to say just where the boundary is between literal and metaphorical description. Genes are sequences of DNA that serve as templates for the production of amino acids, which in turn constitute the proteins that are the basic building blocks of biological structures and processes. Given this and the correspondence between specific nucleotide triplets and specific amino acids, it is very natural to talk of genes as coding for protein synthesis, and even for organismic traits. While some have been critical of the role of these metaphors in directing our thought about both natural selection and organismic development (Griffiths 2001; Sarkar 1996; Moss 2003), others have sought to defend much of the orthodoxy here (Maynard Smith 2000).
One of the chief criticisms of the reliance on the informational metaphor has been that it distorts the role of genes in developmental biology and in our understanding of how evolution operates. This criticism has been articulated most fully by proponents of developmental systems theory (DST) a loose-knit cluster of historians, philosophers, psychologists, and biologists who view themselves as redressing an imbalanced view of organismic development (Oyama, Griffiths, and Gray 2001). According to DST, genes are simply one type of developmental resource for the building of organismic bodies, and to view them as coding for organismic traits or, in toto, as serving as “master molecules” for the construction of whole organisms, is to inflate their actual role in ways that are misleading. The psychologist Susan Oyama's 1985 book The Ontogeny of Information is widely viewed as a founding document for DST (see also Oyama 2000b), and there have been healthy interactions between explorations in DST, reinterpretations of the history of biology (Amundson 2005; Keller 2000, 2001), the development of niche construction theory at the interface of ecology and evolutionary theory (Odling-Smee, Laland, and Feldman 2003), and the rise of evolutionary developmental biology in contemporary biology (Maienschein and Laubichler 2006; Neumann-Held and Rehmann-Sutter 2005; Müller and Newman 2003; Robert 2004).
The positive vision that has emerged from such interactions is something like this. Organismic development is not simply the unfolding of a genetic program but an active process in which organisms construct themselves through the recruitment and deployment of a range of developmental resources. These form developmental systems, and it is these systems that are the fundamental units for understanding development. Because development is systematic, developmental causes are typically context-sensitive and contingent on what is “going on” in the system more generally, not just on the intrinsic properties of some particular developmental resource. Development itself is a constructive process in that organismic traits are built from the full range of resources that constitute particular developmental systems, rather than simply being “passed down” through their encodings in particular developmental resources, genes. Developmental resources can be found at various scales beyond that of the gene, ranging from nuclear but non-genetic resources, such as the methyl groups in chromatin marking, through to other cellular resources, such as actin fibres and other cytoskeletal structures, and to organismal-level resources, such as the Buchnera bacteria that are transmitted as digestive resources in aphid development.
Thus, DST involves broadening the conception of what the causal agents for organismic development are. But since there seems no barrier within DST to viewing developmental resources as forming part of an organism's environment, it also returns us to a question about organisms that we raised earlier: where do individuals begin and end? Consider animal-built structures, such as nests and burrows. These often form a crucial part of the environment for the birth and development of offspring, and their particular properties often have a differential impact on the survival of those offspring. Such environmental resources seem no less (than genes) a crucial, causal part of what particular organisms need to develop, even if they are shared by multiple organisms. If that is so, then developmental systems can extend beyond the bodily boundary of the organism whose development they are crucial for. However, they are not simply an extended phenotype (Dawkins 1982) of some gene or genes, for they form an active causal role in the creation of the very thing that possesses such a phenotype, the organism. As such they are akin to the extended cognitive systems defended by proponents of the extended mind thesis in the philosophy of mind (R.A. Wilson 2004; Clark 2008; Wilson and Clark 2009).
However we understand the concept of an organism (section 5) and whatever we think of the status of both groups (section 6) and genes (section 7) as biological individuals, biological individuality is a dynamic phenomenon that has changed over time. What biological individuals there are has changed over the 3.8 billion or so years of life on planet Earth, and the evolution of individuality itself has become a topic of discussion in the last twenty years or so (Dawkins 1982; Buss 1987; Maynard Smith and Szathmáry 1995; Michod 1999; Okasha 2011; Calcott and Sterelny 2011).
The starting point here is the idea that the history of life is the history of the construction of more complicated biological individuals from simpler individuals, with the transitions between these evolutionary individuals being facilitated by natural selection operating at one or more levels. Underlying these ideas is the assumption that biological individuals are hierarchically organized: earlier individuals provide the material basis for later individuals. For example, prokaryotes, which are single-celled organisms without a nucleus, form the material basis for single-celled eukaryotes, which are organisms that do have a nucleus; in turn, single-celled eukaryotes serve as the material basis for multicellular eukaryotes.
The evolution of biological individuals from prokaryotes to single-celled eukaryotes around 2 billion years ago, and from those to multicellular eukaryotes in the last 600–800 million years, are established facts. In addition, there appear to be no counter-examples to this evolutionary trend. For instance, one does not find examples of (say) prokaryotes appearing from eukaryotes. Yet speculation and controversy surround almost everything else that has been said about these evolutionary transitions. Consider three such issues on which there is a sort of default position in the literature that remains subject to ongoing philosophical and empirical interrogation.
First, it is common to view the evolution of individuality itself as the evolution of complexity. There are, however, questions both about how complexity itself should be measured or conceived and about what empirical evidence we actually have for viewing the complexity of individuals as increasing over evolutionary time (McShea 1991). Do we consider the number of cell types that an organism has (Bonner 1988), the types of hierarchical organization it manifests (Maynard Smith 1988), or some more taxa-specific criterion, such as the information required to specify the diversity of limb-pair types (Cisne 1974)? Fossils constitute a principal source for the criteria that have been proposed here. Yet different kinds of organisms leave fossils with distinct kinds of features, and some kinds of organisms are more likely to leave fossils than are others.
One natural suggestion is that there may well be different kinds of hierarchies for the evolution of individuality, since kinds of individuals can differ from one another in more than one way. Daniel McShea (2001a,b; McShea and Changizi 2003) has proposed a structural hierarchy that is based on two components, the number of levels of nestedness and the degree to which the highest individual in the nesting is individuated or developed. McShea provides an overarching framework in which we can view eukaryotic cells as evolving from differentiated aggregations of prokaryotic cells that have intermediate parts; multicellular eukaryotes as evolving from differentiated aggregations of single-celled eukaryotes; and colonial eukaryotes as evolving from differentiated aggregations of multicellular eukaryotes.
By contrast, Maynard Smith and Szathmáry (1995) focus on differences in how genetic information is transmitted across generations, proposing eight major transitions in the history of life. These start with the transition from replicating molecules to compartmentalized populations of such molecules, and end with the transition from primate societies to human societies. While Maynard Smith and Szathmáry are interested in individuality and complexity, their eight transitions do not form a continuous, non-overlapping hierarchy. Also their discussion is focused primarily on exploring the processes governing each of the particular transitions they propose in terms of changes in replicative control.
Second, it is common to view the trend from prokaryotes to multicellular eukaryotes as resulting from some type of directional bias, one that makes the trend a tendency supported by underlying mechanisms and constraints. Perhaps the tendency is underwritten by thermodynamic, energetic considerations, by facts about the generative entrenchment of developmental systems, or by evolutionary advantages of increases in size (McShea 1998). But in supposing that there is some type of directional bias, each of these hypotheses might be thought committed to the sort of Panglossianism about adaptation that Gould and Lewontin (1978) are famous for critiquing, or (more subtly) to a view of evolutionary change as progressive or inevitable in some way. Gould has used his discussion of the Burgess Shale (Gould 1989) to challenge such views of evolution, arguing that the disparity of the fossils in that shale indicates that living things are significantly less different from one another than they once were. Gould argues that the range of biological individuals we see now on the planet is largely the result of highly contingent extinction events, and we should be wary of immediately assuming that observed trends or patterns are adaptive (or other) tendencies.
Third, many authors have recognized that whatever trends or tendencies there are in the evolution of individuals, there have also been changes over evolutionary time in the social relations between individuals (e.g., Frank 1998). But how we should integrate sociality into our view of the evolution of biological individuals remains under-theorized. And however limited fossil evidence for individual structures and ecological niches may be, such evidence for the kinds and extent of sociality is significantly more sparse. Much of the work to be done here seems distinctly philosophical in that it concerns how we think about what sociality is. Should we consider the simple aggregation of organisms to be a basic form of sociality? Does sociality essentially involve some form of cooperation, and if not, what is the relationship between “prosocial” sociality and antagonistic forms of sociality (e.g., competition or predation)? Although the “evolution of sociality” has been taken up by animal biologists (especially by primatologists) and evolutionary anthropologists (where it is often viewed game-theoretically), this has served to reinforce a view of sociality that seems somewhat narrow, e.g., the view is not clearly applicable to structurally simpler organisms. Perhaps we need to take seriously the idea that sociality is not a relatively recent addition to multicellular life but a more sweeping feature of many if not all biological individuals.
Philosophical discussions of various biological individuals, including organisms, groups of organisms, and parts of organisms (such as genes), have flourished in the past twenty years. Although one should heed the pluralist warning that what may be claimed about biological individuals per se holds true of only some particular type of biological individual, we have also suggested that an organism-centred view of biological individuals provides a useful way to recognize some core structure to the world of heterogeneous biological individuals.
One topic for future study with less anchorage in the ongoing debates that we have reviewed takes us from the living world in general to the small part of it that human beings occupy, and concerns the nature of human variation and our attempts to understand it. While variation is crucial to the process of natural selection in general, and there are many techniques (both mathematical and biological) for understanding it, a particular set of concepts and ideas has been used in understanding human variation in particular. Historically, we have conceptualized our own variation in terms of there being sorts or kinds of people, whether those be defined in racial, ethnic, geographic, cultural, genetic, phenotypic, economic, or other terms. Such conceptions share some distinctive features: they are often hierarchical, are often associated with positive status or negative stigma, and have often involved an explicit or implicit appeal to both norms and ideals of what it means to be human.
Since our own species is not simply the purview of the biological sciences but of much of medicine, the social sciences, and the humanities as well, more systematic reflection on this aspect of biological individuality will likely draw from, and in turn be relevant to, a wide range of disciplinary approaches to understanding human beings. Philosophers of biology and biologists themselves are especially well placed to make a significant contribution to this issue, as the following questions suggest. What does the widely recognized “death of essentialism” within evolutionary biology imply about the study of human variation (Hull 1986)? In what ways does the study of genetic variation within our species constrain or even dictate how we should think about human variation more generally (Lewontin 1982)? Are there significant continuities between historically influential ways of classifying and categorizing people—in racial terms, or on the scale of feeble-mindedness (as imbeciles, idiots, and morons) and contemporary views of health, human functioning, disability and disease?
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