Developmental Biology

First published Mon Mar 23, 2015

Developmental biology is the science of explaining how a variety of interacting processes generate an organism’s heterogeneous shapes, size, and structural features that arise on the trajectory from embryo to adult, or more generally throughout a life cycle. It represents an exemplary area of contemporary experimental biology that focuses on phenomena that have puzzled natural philosophers and scientists for more than two millennia. Philosophers of biology have shown renewed interest in developmental biology due to the potential relevance of development for understanding evolution, the theme of reductionism in genetic explanations, and via increased attention to the details of particular research programs. Developmental biology displays a rich array of material and conceptual practices that can be analyzed to better understand the scientific reasoning exhibited in experimental life science. This entry briefly reviews some central phenomena of ontogeny and then explores four domains that compose a subset of the import and promise of conceptual reflection on the epistemology of developmental biology.

1. Overview

1.1 Historical Considerations

Developmental biology is the science of explaining how a variety of interacting processes generate an organism’s heterogeneous shapes, size, and structural features that arise on the trajectory from embryo to adult, or more generally throughout a life cycle (Love 2008b; Minelli 2011a). It represents an exemplary area of contemporary experimental biology that focuses on phenomena that have puzzled natural philosophers and scientists for more than two millennia. How do the dynamic relations among seemingly homogeneous components in the early stages of an embryo produce a unified whole organism containing heterogeneous parts in the appropriate arrangement and with correct interconnections? More succinctly, how do we explain ontogeny (or, more archaically, generation)? In Generation of Animals, Aristotle provided the first systematic investigation of developmental phenomena and recognized key issues about the emergence of and relationships between hierarchically organized parts (e.g., bone and anatomical features containing bone), as well as the explanatory difficulty of determining how a morphological form is achieved reliably in offspring (e.g., the typical shape and structure of appendages in a particular species). Generation remained a poignant question throughout the early modern period, and was explored by many key figures writing at the time, including William Harvey, René Descartes, Robert Boyle, Pierre Gassendi, Nicolas Malebranche, Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, Anne Conway, Immanuel Kant, and others (Smith 2006). Observations of life cycle transitions, such as metamorphosis, fed into these endeavors and led to striking conclusions, such as Leibniz’s denial of generation sensu stricto.

Animals and all other organized substances have no beginning…their apparent generation is only a development, a kind of augmentation…a transformation like any other, for instance like that of a caterpillar into a butterfly. (Smith 2011: 186–187)

A major theme that crystallized in this history of investigation is the distinction between epigenesis and preformation (see the entry on epigenesis and preformationism). Proponents of epigenesis claimed that heterogeneous, complex features of form emerge from homogeneous, less complex embryonic structures through interactive processes. Thus, an explanation of the ontogeny of these form features requires accounting for how the interactions occur. Proponents of preformation claimed that complex form preexists in the embryo and “unfolds” via ordinary growth processes. An adequate explanation involves detailing how growth occurs. Although preformation has a lighter explanatory burden in accounting for how form emerges during ontogeny (on the assumption that growth is easier to explain than process interactions), it also must address how the starting point of the next generation is formed with the requisite heterogeneous complex features. This was sometimes accomplished by embedding smaller and smaller miniatures ad infinitum inside the organism (Figure 1). Epigenetic perspectives were often dependent on forms of teleological reasoning (see the entry on teleological notions in biology) to account for why interactions among homogeneous components eventually result in a complex, integrated whole organism. Though nothing prevents mixing features of these two outlooks in explaining different aspects of development, polarization into dichotomous positions has occurred frequently (Rose 1981; Smith 2006).

[three drawings, the first is like a balloon with a scrunched up human inside and a string hanging down, the second of a dangling human figure and the third of a somewhat larger dangling human figure.]

Figure 1: An early modern depiction of a tiny person inside of a sperm exemplifying preformationist views.

In the late 19th and early 20th century, the topic of development was salient in controversies surrounding vitalism, such as the disagreement between Wilhelm Roux and Hans Driesch over how to explain ontogeny (Maienschein 1991). Roux thought that a fertilized egg contains inherited elements that represent different organismal characteristics. During the process of cellular division, these elements become unequally distributed among daughter cells leading to distinct cell fates. Driesch, in contrast, held that each cell retained its full potential through division even though differentiation occurred. Although this issue is often understood in terms of the metaphysics of life (vitalism versus materialism), Driesch’s interpretation of development and the autonomy of an organism had epistemological dimensions (Maienschein 2000). The explanatory disagreement involved different experimental approaches and divergent views on the nature of differentiation in early ontogeny (e.g., to what degree cells are pre-specified). A familiar philosophical theme running through these discussions, both epistemological and metaphysical, is the status of reductionism in biology. Through the middle of the 20th century, embryology—the scientific discipline studying development—slowly transformed into developmental biology with a variety of reworked and recalcitrant elements (Berrill 1961). In conjunction with the issue of reductionism, a key aspect of this history is the molecularization of experimental (as opposed to comparative) embryology (Fraser and Harland 2000), with the concomitant stress on the explanatory power of genes (see the entry on gene and Section 3.1). This complex and fascinating history has been detailed elsewhere (see, e.g., Oppenheimer 1967; Horder et al. 1986; Hamburger 1988; Maienschein et al. 2005; Gilbert 1991; Embryo Project in Other Internet Resources).

Developmental biology has not been a primary area of exploration for philosophy of biology though this has been changing over the past two decades, especially due to the potential relevance of development for understanding evolution (Love 2015; Section 5), the theme of reductionism in biology and explanations from molecular genetics (Robert 2004; Rosenberg 2006; Section 3), and via increased attention to the details of particular research programs, such as stem cell biology (Fagan 2013). But it should not be forgotten that ontogeny was on the radar of philosophical scholars in the 20th century, as seen in Ernest Nagel’s treatment of hierarchical organization and reduction in the development of living systems (Nagel 1961: 432ff). For contemporary philosophy of science, developmental biology displays a rich array of material and conceptual practices that can be analyzed to better understand the scientific reasoning exhibited in experimental life science (see the entry on experiment in biology). After a brief review of some central phenomena of ontogeny, this entry explores four domains that compose a subset of the import and promise of conceptual reflection on the epistemology of developmental biology.

1.2 Developmental Phenomena

Developmental biology is the science that seeks to explain how the structure of organisms changes with time. Structure, which may also be called morphology or anatomy, encompasses the arrangement of parts, the number of parts, and the different types of parts. (Slack 2006: 6)

Most of the properties that developmental biologists attempt to explain are structural rather than functional. For example, a developmental biologist concentrates on how tissue layers fold or how shape is generated, and not so much on what the folded tissue layers do or how the shape functions. The ontogeny of function, at all levels of organization, is an element of developmental biology, but it is often bracketed because of the predominance (both past and present) of questions surrounding the ontogeny of form or structure (Love 2008b).

Textbooks (e.g., Gilbert 2010; Slack 2013; Wolpert et al. 2010) typically describe a canonical set of events surrounding the changing structures displayed during animal development.[1] The first of these is fertilization (in sexually reproducing species), where an already semi-organized egg merges with a sperm cell, followed by the fusion of their nuclei to achieve the appropriate complement of genetic material. Second, the fertilized egg undergoes several rounds of cleavage, which are mitotic divisions without cell growth that subdivide the zygote into many distinct cells (Figure 2). After many rounds of cleavage, this spherical conglomerate of cells (now called a blastula) begins to exhibit some specification of germ layers (endoderm, mesoderm, and ectoderm) and then proceeds to invaginate at one end, a complex process referred to as gastrulation that eventually yields a through-gut. All three germ layers, from which specific types of cells are derived (e.g., neural cells from ectoderm), become established during gastrulation or shortly after it completes.[2] Organogenesis refers to the production of tissues and organs through the interaction and rearrangement of cell groups. Events confined to distinct taxonomic groups include neurulation in chordates, whereas other events correlate with mode of development (metamorphosis from a larval to adult stage) or individual trauma (regeneration of a limb).

[6 columns by 2 rows.  The second row is a sideways view of the item in the first row.  The first column (A) has four orange colored cells labelled 'A', 'B', 'C', and 'D'.  The second column (B) has 8 cells, the bigger lower orange ones labelled '1A', '1B', '1C', and '1D'; the smaller pink ones on top labelled '1a', '1b', '1c', and '1d'.  The third column (C) has 12 cells with the bottom, orange, labelled '2A' through '2D', the middle, red,  labelled '2a' through '2d' and the top, pink, labelled '1a' through '1d'. The fourth column (D) has 16 cells, bottom layer, orange, is '2A' through '2D', top, pink, is '1a1' through '1d1', the middle alternates between larger red cells labelled '2a' through '2d' and smaller beige cells labelled '1a2' through '1d2'.  The fifth column (E) has at the bottom orange cells labelled '3A' through '3D', at the top a cross of four pink cells labelled '1a1' through '1d1' and between the branches of the cross four beige cells labelled '1a2' through '1d2'.  In the middle are large red cells labelled '2a' through '2d' and squished between the orange, beige, and red cells are dark red cells labelled '3a' through '3d'.  The last column (F) is different.  On the top is a clump of cells colored blue, green, pink, and orange. On the bottom on the left side is an arrow pointed up labelled 'developmental time'.  Next to it is a 6 rowed drawing. The first row on the bottom extends the full width of the column and contains the word 'zygote', the row above is split in two, on the left 'AB' and on the left 'CD'.  The third row is split evenly in 4: green 'A', blue 'B', orange 'C', and red 'D'.  The fourth row is split evenly into 8 each shaded the same color as the unit below (though with different intensities). The fifth row is split evenly into 16 and the sixth row into 32 following the same pattern as the fourth row.]

Figure 2: An example of embryonic cleavage in marine snail embryos showing the fate of different cell lineages through developmental time.

Several key processes underlie these distinct developmental events and the resulting features of form that emerge (e.g., the through-gut formed subsequent to gastrulation or the heart formed during organogenesis). These are critical to the ontogeny of form and link directly to major research questions in developmental biology (Section 2). First, cellular properties, such as shape, change during ontogeny. This is a function of differentiation whereby cells adopt specific fates that include shape transformations (Figure 3). Second, regions of cells in the embryo are designated through arrangement and composition alterations that correspond to different axes in different parts of the embryo (e.g., dorsal-ventral, anterior-posterior, left-right, and proximal-distal). The successive establishment of these regions is referred to as pattern formation. Third, cells translocate and aggregate into layers (e.g., endoderm and ectoderm, followed by the mesoderm in many lineages) and later tissues (aggregations of differentiated cell types). Fourth, cells and tissues migrate and interact to produce new arrangements and shapes composed of multiple tissue layers with novel functions (i.e., organs). These last two sets of processes are usually termed morphogenesis (Davies 2005) and occur via many distinct mechanisms. Fifth, there is growth in the size of different form features in the individual, remarkably obvious when comparing zygote to adult, although proportional change between different features (allometry) is also striking.

[A tree graph of 5 levels.  The top node 'Multipotential hematopoietic stem cell (Hemocytoblast)' points back to itself as well as pointing to the next level.  On the left 'Common myeloid progenitor' which points to 'Megakarycocyte' (which in turn points to 'Thrombocytes'), 'Erythrocyte', 'Mast cell', and 'Myeloblast' (which in turn points to 'Basophil', 'Neutrophil', 'Eosinophil', 'Monocyte' (which in turn points to 'Macrophage')).  On the right 'Common lymphoid progenitor' which points to 'Natural killer cell (Large granual lymphocyte)' and 'Small lymphocyte' (which in turn points to 'T lymphocyte' and 'B lymphocyte' (which in turn points to 'Plasma cell')).]

Figure 3: A simple illustration of the kinds of differentiation related to the cellular components found in blood.

None of these processes occur in isolation and explanations of particular form features usually draw on several of them simultaneously, presuming other features that originated earlier in ontogeny by different instantiations and combinations of the processes. This sets a broad agenda for investigation: how do various iterations and combinations of these processes generate form features during ontogeny? This can be seen more concretely through the example of vertebrate cardiogenesis. How does the vertebrate heart, with its internal and external shape and structure originate during ontogeny (Harvey 2002)? How does the heart come to exhibit left/right asymmetry in the body cavity? What causes cells to adopt a muscle cell fate or certain tissues to interact in the prospective region of the heart? How do muscle cells migrate to, aggregate in, and differentiate at the correct location? How does the interior of the heart adopt a particular tubular structure with various chambers (that differs among vertebrate species)? How does the heart grow at a particular rate and achieve a specific size? Solutions relevant to explaining the ontogeny of form characterize causal factors that account for how different processes occur and yield various outcomes (Section 3).

2. The Epistemological Organization of Developmental Biology

One recurring theme in the long history of investigations into development is that explaining the ontogeny of form consists of many interrelated questions about diverse phenomena (Section 1.2). Sometimes philosophers have attempted to compress these questions into one broad problem.

The real question concerning metazoan ontogeny is just how a single cell gives rise to the requisite number of differentiated cell lineages with all the right inductive developmental interactions required to reproduce the form of the mature organism (Moss 2002: 97).

The central problem of developmental biology is to understand how a relatively simple and homogeneous cellular mass can differentiate into a relatively complex and heterogeneous organism closely resembling its progenitor(s) in relevant aspects (Robert 2004: 1).

This language is not necessarily incorrect but can lead to skewed interpretations. For example, Philip Kitcher has argued that:

In contemporary developmental biology, there is … uncertainty about how to focus the big, vague question, How do organisms develop? (Kitcher 1993: 115)

This is simply false. While it is true that these questions have been manifested with differing frequency and vigor through history, and the ability to answer them (as well as the nature of the questions themselves) has been contingent on different research strategies and methods, the issue has not been an unwieldy central problem. But scrutinizing the structure of developmental biology’s questions is not merely an exercise in clarification. It is crucial for understanding how the science of developmental biology is organized.

2.1 No Theory of Development?

Although it is common in philosophy to associate sciences with theories, such that the individuation of a science is dependent on a constitutive theory or group of models, it is uncommon to find presentations of developmental biology that make reference to a theory of development. Instead, we find references to families of approaches (developmental genetics, experimental embryology, cell biology, and molecular biology) or catalogues of “key molecular components” (transcription factor families, inducing factor families, cytoskeleton or cell adhesion molecules, and extracellular matrix components). No standard theory or group of models provides theoretical scaffolding in the major textbooks (e.g., Slack 2013; Wolpert et al. 2010; Gilbert 2010). The absence of any reference to a theory of development or some set of core explanatory models is prima facie puzzling. Why is it so difficult to identify a constitutive theory for developmental biology? Three interpretations of this situation are possible. The first is that the lack of reference to theories does not indicate the absence of a theory; one can reconstruct a theory (or theories) of developmental biology out of the relevant discourse (e.g., multiple allied molecular models). The second interpretation is that the lack of reference to theories indicates an immaturity in developmental biology. Since mature sciences always have systematic theories, we should seek to formulate one for the domain of ontogeny. The third interpretation is that the lack of reference to theories should be taken at face value.

Developmental biology is not an immature science, groping about for some way to explain its phenomena: “some of the basic processes and mechanisms of embryonic development are now quite well understood” (Slack 2013: 7). The impetus for this type of interpretation arises out of commitments to a conception of mature science that presumes theories are abstract systems with a small set of laws or core principles (see the entry on the structure of scientific theories). On the other hand, holding that developmental biology already has a theory costumed in different guise—not referred to as such by developmental biologists—is a possible interpretation. It arises out of a cognate conception of science (sciences must have theories) that has been expanded to allow for different understandings of theory structure, such as constellations of models without laws, even though the assumption is that theory plays a similar organizing role in guiding research. But this assumption should be challenged and rejected on methodological grounds in the case of developmental biology. An analysis of the reasoning in a science should exhibit epistemic transparency and not postulate “hidden” reasoning structure (Love 2012). This criterion is based on the premise that the basis of successes in scientific inquiry must be available to those engaged in the practice of the science (i.e., scientists). If we postulate hidden structure not present in scientific discourse to account for inductive inference, explanation, or other forms of reasoning, then we risk obscuring how scientists themselves access this structure to evaluate it (Woodward 2003: ch. 4). The result is that the successes of the sciences become mysterious when viewed from the vantage point of its participants.

Epistemic transparency demands a descriptive correspondence between philosophical accounts of science and scientific practice. This does not mean that every claim made by any scientist should be taken with the same credence. The ruling concern is pervasive features of practice. The problem with assuming laws are required for explanation is their relative absence from a variety of successful sciences routinely offering explanations, not that no scientist ever appeals to laws as explanatory. Pervasive features of scientific practice should be prominent in philosophical accounts of sciences. Thus, it is not surprising that the desire for a theory can be found among some developmental biologists: “Developing a theory is of utmost importance for any discipline” (Sommer 2009: 417). But the fact that these calls are rare means we should not assume theories are actually needed to govern and organize inquiry within the domain.[3]

It was once thought that each science must have laws in order to offer explanations (see the entry on scientific explanations), but now this is seen as unnecessary (Giere 1999; Woodward 2003). The expectation that a science have a theory to accomplish the task of organizing and guiding inquiry is of similar vintage. It derives from an intuitive expectation of what counts as a mature science in the first place. Even if we find empirically successful and coherent traditions of research without a systematic theoretical framework providing guidance, then the science cannot be mature. One might shrug off these quasi-positivist appeals to maturity by invoking more flexible conceptions of theory and theory structure. But why retain the expectation that theories should accomplish the same epistemic tasks? It is a preconception about knowledge structure that is not plausible in light of the diversity of research practices found across the sciences. The few scientists who favor this philosophical response have different motivations. Instead of maturity, other reasons are salient, such as guidance in the face of a welter of biochemical detail and the need to forge a synthesis between evolution and development.[4]

Developmental biologists recognize that the “curse of detail” is one of the costs of developmental biology’s meteoric success over the past three decades: “The principal challenge today is that of exponentially increasing detail” (Slack 2013: ix). While something must provide organization and guidance to developmental biology, it need not be theories that accomplish the task. Regarding calls for a synthesis of evolution and development, these often assume that having a developmental theory is a precondition for synthesis (Sommer 2009): “Our troubles … derive from our standing lack of an explicit theory of development” (Minelli 2011a: 4). But this line of argument relies on the degree to which evolutionary theory exhibits the supposed structure to which developmental biologists should aspire. The actual practice associated with evolutionary theory indicates a more flexible framework with chameleon qualities that is responsively adjusted to the diverse investigative aims of evolutionary researchers (Love 2010b, 2013). Therefore, it is not clear that evolutionary theory is a valid template. A productive way forward is to relinquish the prior expectation that sciences must have theories of a certain kind to govern and guide their activity. Instead, sciences that display empirical success and fecundity should be studied to discover what features are responsible, without assuming that those features will be the same for all sciences: “Science need not be understood in these terms and, indeed, may be better understood in other terms” (Giere 1999: 4).

2.2 Erotetic Organization

The criterion of epistemic transparency (Section 2.1) encourages an exploration of the third interpretive option—the lack of reference to theories should be taken at face value. Developmental biology is organized primarily by stable, broad domains of problems that correspond to abstract representations of major ontogenetic processes (differentiation, pattern formation, growth, and morphogenesis; Section 1.2). But how does one interpret the “theoretical” aspects of developmental biology (e.g., positional information models of pattern formation) and the utilization of theories from other domains (e.g., biochemistry)? One way is to distinguish between theory-informed science—using theoretical knowledge—and theory-directed science—having a theory that directs inquiry and organizes knowledge (Waters 2007b); developmental biology is theory-informed but not theory-directed. Theories need not be wholly absent from developmental biology but—when present—they play roles very different from standard philosophical expectations. Developmental biology uses theoretical knowledge from biochemistry when appealing to morphogen gradients to explain how segments are established or chemical thermodynamics when invoking reaction–diffusion mechanisms to explain pigmentation patterns. It also uses theoretical knowledge derived from within developmental biology, such as positional information models. Different kinds of theory inform developmental biology, but these do not organize research—they are not necessary to structure the knowledge and direct investigative activities. Developmental biologists are not focused on confirming and extending the theory of reaction–diffusion mechanisms, nor are they organizing their research around positional information.[5] This theoretical knowledge is used in building explanations but does not provide rails of guidance for how to proceed in a research program. All sciences may use theoretical knowledge, but this is not the same as all sciences having a theory providing direction and organization.

Why think that problems provide organizational architecture for the epistemology of developmental biology? They are a pervasive feature of its reasoning practices, illustrated in textbooks that capture substantial community consensus about standards of explanation, experimental methods, essential concepts, and empirical content. Unlike evolutionary biology textbooks that discuss the theory of natural selection or economics textbooks that talk about microeconomic theory, an examination of several editions of major textbooks indicate that developmental biology does not have similar kinds of theories.

Jonathan Slack’s Essential Developmental Biology (Slack 2006, 2013) is organized around four main types of processes, also described as clustered groups of problems, which occur during embryonic development: regional specification (pattern formation), cell differentiation, morphogenesis, and growth. These broad clusters are then fleshed out along a standard timeline of early development, highlighting gametogenesis, fertilization, cleavage, gastrulation, and axis specification (see Section 1.2). Different experimental approaches (cell and molecular biology, developmental genetics, and experimental embryology) are utilized in a specific set of model organisms (see below, Section 4) to dissect the workings of these developmental phenomena. Subsequent chapters cover later aspects of development (e.g., organogenesis), with different systems treated in depth by tissue layer, differentiation and growth, or in relation to evolutionary questions (see below, Section 5). Throughout this presentation, no specific theory, set of hypotheses, or dominant model is invoked to organize these different domains of investigation. Instead, broad clusters of questions that reflect generally delineated processes (differentiation, specification, morphogenesis, and growth) set the agenda of research.

Scott Gilbert’s Developmental Biology exhibits a similar pattern (Gilbert 2000 [2003, 2006, 2010]). Developmental biology is constituted by two broad questions (“How does the fertilized egg give rise to the adult body? And how does that adult body produce yet another body?”), which can then be subdivided into further categories, such as differentiation, morphogenesis, growth, reproduction, regeneration, evolution, and environmental regulation. These questions can be parsed more analytically in terms of five variables: abstraction, variety, connectivity, temporality, and spatial composition. The values given to these variables structure the constellation of research questions within the broad problem agendas corresponding to generally delineated processes. For example, research questions oriented around events in zebrafish gastrulation are structured in a way that differs from the research questions oriented around vertebrate neural crest cell migration because they involve different values for the five variables: abstraction (zebrafish vs. vertebrates), temporality (earlier vs. later), spatial composition (tissue layer interactions vs. a distinctive population of cells), variety (epiboly vs. epithelium to mesenchyme transition), and connectivity (gut formation and endoderm vs. organogenesis and ectoderm/mesoderm). These configurations can be adjusted readily in response to shifts in the values for different variables (Love 2014).[6]

This anatomy of problems, with explicit epistemological structure derived from different values for these variables, operates to organize the science of development. Investigators from different disciplines can be working on the same problem but asking different questions that require distinct but complementary methodological resources. Knowledge and inquiry in developmental biology are intricately organized, just not by a central theory or group of models, and this erotetic organization is epistemologically accessible to the participating scientists. While theoretical knowledge, especially that drawn from molecular biological mechanisms (see the entry on molecular biology) and mathematical models (e.g., reaction–diffusion models) is ubiquitous (theory-informed), the clusters of problems that reappear across the textbooks and correspond to different types of processes provide the governing architecture (not theory-directed), which can be characterized explicitly according to the variables described. Further analysis of this problem anatomy is possible, including how it is displayed in regular research articles and not just textbooks, as well as other areas of biology (Brigandt and Love 2012; Love 2008a, 2014).

3. Explanatory Approaches to Development

Explanations in developmental biology are usually causal, though unlike standard mechanistic explanation there is a constant acquisition of new causal capacities (in terms of constituent entities, activities, and their organization) through development (Parkkinen 2014). Although much work remains in characterizing different aspects of explanation in developmental biology, there is no doubt that a difference making or manipulability conception of causation (see the entry on causation and manipulability) provides a core element of the reasoning (Woodward 2003; Strevens 2009; Waters 2007a). Genetic explanations of development (Section 3.1), similar to what is seen in molecular genetics, work by identifying changes in the expression of genes and interactions among their RNA and protein products that lead to changes in the properties of morphological features during ontogeny (e.g., shape or size), while holding a variety of contextual variables fixed. More recently, there has been growing interest in physical explanations of development (Section 3.2) that involve appeals to mechanical forces due to the geometrical arrangements of mesoscale materials, such as fluid flow (Forgacs and Newman 2005). Researchers agree on the phenomena that need to be explained (Section 1.2 and Section 2.2), but differ on whether physical rules or genetic factors are more or less explanatory (Keller 2002).[7] The existence of two different types of causal explanations for developmental phenomena poses an additional question about how they might (or might not) be combined into a more integrated explanatory framework (Section 3.3).

3.1 Genetics

Many philosophers have turned to explanations of development over the past two decades in an effort to esteem or deflate claims about the causal power of genes (Keller 2002; Neumann-Held and Rehmann-Sutter 2006; Rosenberg 2006; Robert 2004; Waters 2007a).[8] Genetic explanations touch the philosophical theme of reductionism and appear to constitute the bulk of empirical success accruing to developmental biology over the past several decades.[9] Statements from developmental biologists reinforce this perspective:

Developmental biology … deals with the process by which the genes in the fertilized egg control cell behavior in the embryo and so determine its pattern, its form, and much of its behavior … differential gene activity controls development. (Wolpert et al. 1998: v, 15)

These types of statements are amplified in appeals to a genetic program for development.

[Elements of the genome] contain the sequence-specific code for development; and they determine the particular outcome of developmental processes, and thus the form of the animal produced by every embryo. … Development is the execution of the genetic program for construction of a given species of organism (Davidson 2006: 2, 16).[10]

Whether or not these statements can be substantiated has been the subject of intense debate.[11] The strongest claims about genetic programs or the genetic control of development have empirical and conceptual drawbacks that include an inattention to plasticity and the role of the environment, an ambiguity about the locus of causal agency, and a reliance on metaphors drawn from computer science (Gilbert and Epel 2009; Keller 2002; Moss 2002; Robert 2004). But this leaves intact the difference-making principle of genetic explanation exhibited in molecular genetics (Waters 2007a), which yields more narrow and surgical causal claims under controlled experimental conditions, and is applicable to diverse molecular entities that play causal roles during development, such as regulatory RNAs, proteins, and environmental signals. We can observe this by reconsidering the example of vertebrate cardiogenesis (Section 1.2).

Are there problems with claiming that genes contain all of the information (see the entry on biological information) to form vertebrate hearts? Is there a genetic program in the DNA controlling heart development? Are genes the primary supplier and organizer of material resources for heart development, largely determining the phenotypic outcome? Existing studies of heart development have identified a role for fluid forces in specifying the internal form of the heart (Hove et al. 2003) and its left/right asymmetry (Nonaka et al. 2002). Biochemical gradients of extracellular calcium are responsible for activating the asymmetric expression of the regulatory gene Nodal (Raya et al. 2004) and inhibition of voltage gradients scrambles normal asymmetry establishment (Levin et al. 2002). A number of genes are clearly difference makers in these processes (Srivastava 2006; Brand 2003; Olson 2006), but the conclusion that genes carry all the information needed to generate form features of the heart is unnecessary and unwarranted. While it may be warranted empirically in some cases to privilege DNA sequence differences as causal factors in specific processes of ontogeny (Waters 2007a), such as hierarchically organized networks of genetic difference makers explaining tissue specification (Peter and Davidson 2011), the diversity of entities appealed to in molecular genetics and the extent of their individual and joint roles in specifying developmental outcomes means that debates about the meaning, scope, and power of genetic explanations will continue (Griffiths and Stotz 2013). But a shift away from genetic programs and genetic determinism to DNA, RNA, and proteins as difference makers that operate conjointly suggests that we conceptualize other causal factors in a similar way.

3.2 Physics

Fluid flow, as a physical force, is also a difference maker during the development of the heart, and ontogeny more generally, and developmental biologists appeal to physical difference makers, which are understood as factors in producing the morphological properties of developmental phenomena (Forgacs and Newman 2005). A physical causation approach was displayed prominently in the first half of the 20th century through the work of D’Arcy Thompson (Thompson 1992 [1942]; Keller 2002: ch. 2; Olby 1986). This occurred in the milieu of increasing attention to the chromosomal theory of inheritance and attempts to explore developmental phenomena via classical genetic methods (Morgan 1923, 1926, 1934). Thompson appealed to differential rates of growth and the constraints of geometrical relationships to explain how organismal morphology originates. Visual representations of abiotic, mechanical analogues provided the plausibility, such as the shape of liquid splashes or hanging drops for the cup and bell configurations of the free-swimming sexual stage of jellyfish. If physical forces generated specific morphologies in viscoelastic materials, then analogous morphologies in living species should be explained in terms of physical forces operating on the viscoelastic materials of the developing embryo. But morphogenetic processes that produce the shape and structure of morphology have been seen primarily, if not exclusively, in terms of genetics for the last half-century. Physical approaches faded from view as molecular genetics approaches went from strength to strength (Fraser and Harland 2000).

The molecularization of experimental embryology is one of the most striking success stories of contemporary biology as genes and genetic interactions (e.g., in transcriptional networks and signaling pathways) were discovered to underlie specific details of differentiation, morphogenesis, pattern formation, and growth when structure originates during development. Genetic approaches predominate in contemporary developmental biology; physical modes of causation are typically neglected, if not negligible. The frustration among researchers interested in physical causation during embryogenesis has been palpable.

To the molecular types, a cause is a molecule or a gene. To explain a phenomenon is to identify genes and characterize proteins without which the phenomenon will fail or be abnormal. A molecule is an explanation: a force is a description; to argue otherwise brings pity, at best (Albert Harris to John Trinkaus, 12 March 1996; Source: Marine Biological Laboratory Library Archives).

Despite this predominance of genetic explanatory approaches and the frustration among researchers utilizing other approaches, a groundswell of interest has been building around physical explanations of development, especially in terms of their integration with genetic explanations (Miller and Davidson 2013).

3.3 Integrating Approaches: Genetics and Physics

Thompson held that physical forces were explanatory but inadequate in isolation to account for the developmental origin of morphology; heredity (genetics) was also a necessary causal factor.[12] Yet Thompson was quick to highlight that mechanical modes of causation might be neglected in the midst of growing attention to heredity (genetics):

it is no less of an exaggeration if we tend to neglect these direct physical and mechanical modes of causation altogether, and to see in the characters of a bone merely the results of variation and of heredity. (Thompson 1992 [1942]: 1023)

Despite this latter form of exaggeration manifesting itself through much of the 20th century, an agenda to combine or integrate the two approaches is now explicit.[13]

There is no controversy about whether genetic and physical modes of causation are at work simultaneously:

both the physics and biochemical signaling pathways of the embryo contribute to the form of the organism. (Von Dassow et al. 2010: 1)

They are not competing causal explanations of the same phenomenon. Explanations should capture how their productive interactions yield developmental outcomes:

an increasing number of examples point to the existence of a reciprocal interplay between expression of some developmental genes and the mechanical forces that are associated with morphogenetic movements. (Brouzés and Farge 2004: 372)

Genetic causes can lead to physical causation and vice versa. Physical causation brings about genetic causation through mechanotransduction. Stretching, contraction, compression, fluid shear stress, and other physical dynamics are sensed by different molecular components inside and outside of cells that translate these environmental changes into biochemical signals (Hoffman et al. 2011; Wozniak and Chen 2009). Genetic causation brings about physical causation by creating different physical properties of cells and tissues through the presence, absence, or change in frequency of particular proteins. For example, different patterns of expression for cell adhesion molecules (e.g., cadherins) can lead to differential adhesion across epithelial sheets of tissue and thereby generate phase separations or compartments via surface tension variation (Newman and Bhat 2008). If these modes of causation are not competing, then how might one combine genetic and physical difference makers into an integrated causal explanation? How much explanatory unity can be achieved for this “reciprocal interplay”?

Finding philosophical models for the explanatory integration of genetics and physics remains an open question (Love forthcoming). Apportioning causal responsibility in the sense of determining relative contributions (e.g., the composition of causal magnitudes among different physical forces in Newtonian mechanics) is problematic because this requires commensurability with respect to how causes produce their effects (Sober 1988). In the context of causation understood in terms of difference makers, the difficulty of integration is a variation on a problem in causal reasoning identified by John Stuart Mill and labeled the “intermixture of effects,” which involves multiple causes contributing in a blended fashion to yield an outcome.

This difficulty is most of all conspicuous in the case of physiological phenomena; it being seldom possible to separate the different agencies which collectively compose an organized body, without destroying the very phenomena which it is our object to investigate. (Mill 1843 [1974]: 456 [book 3, chapter 11, section 1, paragraph 7])

Careful statistical methodology in experiments can answer whether one type of difference maker accounts for more of the variation in the effect variable for a particular population. But a ranking of causal factors with respect to how much of a difference they made is not the same as combining two modes of causation into an integrated account. Another response is to dissolve the integration problem by reducing all of the causal interactions to one of the two distinct modes, thereby achieved a kind of explanatory unity (Rosenberg 2006). But this approach is eschewed by working biologists who take both genetic and physical modes of causation as significant and not reducible one to the other.

A different strategy is integrative pluralism (Mitchell 2002). This involves a two-step procedure for explaining complex phenomena whose features are the result of multiple causes: (a) formulate idealized models where particular causal factors operate in isolation (“theoretical modeling”); and, (b) integrate idealized models to explain how particular, concrete phenomena originate from these causes in combination. This model is suggestive but also has key drawbacks that include the fact that genetic causal reasoning in developmental biology does not involve formulating idealized models and the precise nature of the integration is underspecified. Integration of genetic and physical difference makers in a single mechanism offers a further possibility (Darden 2006; Craver 2007). Although this valuably highlights the productive continuity between difference makers through stages in a sequence (i.e., their reciprocal interplay), it also has handicaps. These include:

  1. Divergent approaches to measuring time. Instead of time “in the mechanism,” time is measured with external standardized stages (see below, Section 5.2). Stages facilitate the study of different kinds of developmental mechanisms, with different characteristic rates and durations for their stages, within a common framework for a model organism (e.g., Drosophila), while also permitting conserved molecular mechanisms to be studied in different species because the corresponding mechanism description is not anchored to the temporal sequence of the model organism.

  2. An expectation that mechanism descriptions “bottom-out” in lowest level activities of molecular entities (Darden 2006). In the case of combining genetic and physical difference makers, the reciprocal interplay means that there is a studious avoidance of bottoming out in one or the other mode of causation.

  3. The requirement of stable, compositional organization for mechanisms:

    Mechanistic explanations are constitutive or componential explanations: they explain the behavior of the mechanism as a whole in terms of the organized activities and interaction of its components. (Craver 2007: 128)

    But these mechanism descriptions are often embedded in different developmental contexts (at different times in ontogeny) with distinct compositional relations (within and between species). The reciprocal interplay between genetic and physical difference makers is not maintained precisely because these compositional differences alter relationships of physical causation (fluid flow, tension, etc.). Developmental biologists have been able to generalize relationships of genetic causation (in terms of genetic mechanisms) across species quite widely, but the attempt to combine these with physical causation has necessitated narrowing the scope of the causal claims.

Adequate philosophical models of the systematic dependence between genetic and physical difference makers in ontogeny need to account for how the temporal relations necessary for making causal claims are anchored in an external periodization used by developmental biologists. The imposition of different temporal scales can lead to distinct factors being significant or salient, which matters for ascertaining how different kinds of causes can be combined into integrated explanations. One possibility is to juxtapose these difference makers at distinct stages via experimental verification such that they exhibit productive continuity within the constraints of the external periodization (Love forthcoming). This facilitates representing symmetry between causal factors because genetic difference makers can be placed before or after physical difference makers (and vice versa). Although this does not provide a way to combine causal magnitudes (as in vector addition from Newtonian mechanics), it offers an explicit strategy for assigning responsibility among different kinds of causes through the vehicle of temporal organization that goes beyond ranking difference makers. The periodization serves as a template from the practices of developmental biologists for providing wholeness or unity to the different modes of causation to yield a kind of integrated explanation of the morphology that results from a sequence of developmental processes.

Not all types of causal explanation involve an external periodization and there are other ways to combine causes in order to produce more integrated explanatory frameworks. One area where combined explanations for developmental phenomena are being analyzed pertains to mechanism descriptions and mathematical modeling in systems biology (Brigandt 2013; Fagan 2013). For example, Fagan (2013: ch. 9) shows how an integrated explanation emerges from a step-wise procedure that starts with a detailed description of a molecular mechanism followed by the formulation of an abstracted wiring diagram of component interactions, which is then translated into a system of equations that can account for changes in component interactions over time. Solutions to these systems of equations and a mapping of solutions for the interactions among components of the system onto the behavior of the overall system within a shared landscape representation more systematically explains cellular differentiation.[14]

4. Model Organisms for the Study of Development

Model organisms are central to contemporary biology and studies of embryogenesis (Ankeny and Leonelli 2011; Steel 2008; Bier and McGinnis 2003; Davis 2004). Biologists utilize only a small number of species to experimentally elucidate various properties of ontogeny (e.g., C. elegans, Drosophila, and Brachydanio [zebrafish]; see Figure 4). These experimental models permit researchers to investigate development in great depth and facilitate a precise dissection of causal relationships. Critics have questioned whether these models are good representatives of other species because of inherent biases involved in their selection, such as rapid development and short generation time (Bolker 1995), and problematic presumptions about the conservation of gene functions and regulatory networks (Lynch 2009). For example, C. elegans embryogenesis is not representative of nematodes in terms of pattern formation and cell specification (Schulze and Schierenberg 2011) and zebrafish appendage formation is a poor proxy for the development of appendages in tetrapods (Metscher and Ahlberg 1999).

[a color photo showing from the side a 0.1 x 0.03 inch (2.5 x 0.8 mm) small male Drosophila melanogaster fly with red eyes facing left.]

Figure 4: Drosophila melanogaster (the common fruit fly) is one of the standard model organisms used in developmental biology.

One response to this criticism is to emphasize the conserved genetic mechanisms shared by all animals despite differences in developmental phenomena (Gerhart and Kirschner 2007; Ankeny and Leonelli 2011; Weber 2005). Fruit flies may be unrepresentative in exhibiting syncytial development, but they use the collinear expression of Hox genes to specify their body axes. This response indicates that whether an entire model organism is representative per se is too coarse-grained a criterion to capture the rationale behind their use. We have to ask about representative with respect to what, and some accounts have moved in this direction. Jessica Bolker has distinguished exemplary and surrogate modes of representation (Bolker 2009), where the former serve basic research by exemplifying a larger group and the latter correspond to models designed to provide indirect experimental access to otherwise inaccessible phenomena, such as mouse models of human psychological disorders (e.g., schizophrenia). Surrogate models are adopted in biomedical contexts where the phenomena of interest are manifested in humans. Most developmental biologists consider model organisms as exemplars, not surrogates.[15] Thus, in order to respond to a criticism of non-representativeness, the criterion of representation must be explored in more detail.[16]

A basic presumption about model organisms is that they bear appropriate similarity relationships to larger groups of animals. This presumption is an instantiation of what is discussed generally for models in science meant to represent phenomena. Model organisms represent developmental phenomena in species that are either studied little or never studied at all: “we study flies and frogs as examples for the development of animals in general” (Nüsslein-Volhard 2006: 87). One source of confidence in treating them as exemplars derives from an inductive inference over discovered patterns of evolutionary conservation with respect to developmental phenomena (e.g., gastrulation or somite formation). If all or most model organisms share a developmental feature, then all or most animals will share the feature. This inference can be circumscribed more or less narrowly (e.g., if all or most vertebrate model organisms share somite formation, then all or most vertebrates will share it).

As a consequence of this confidence, the model organism (“source”) can represent these other unstudied species (“targets”). This basic distinction between the model or source and the phenomena or target it is supposed to represent is ubiquitous in reasoning with model organisms (Ankeny and Leonelli 2011). Zebrafish is a model or representation of vertebrate development, the target phenomena, because we expect to learn about vertebrate development generally by studying ontogeny in zebrafish specifically. We do not invest time and resources into zebrafish as a model organism only because we are interested in zebrafish. We plan to make claims about somite formation from observations in zebrafish that will apply to somite formation in other vertebrates that we will never have the time or money to investigate.

Developmental biologists often speak of investigating mechanisms that account for phenomena in ontogeny, and focus on conserved genetic and cellular mechanisms in model organisms (Gerhart and Kirschner 2007; Ankeny and Leonelli 2011; Weber 2005). This suggests a distinction between representation with respect to developmental phenomena and representation with respect to genetic and cellular mechanisms operating in development. If we are interested in explaining how hearts (phenomena) develop, then we might investigate the molecular or cellular mechanisms occurring in the heart field during zebrafish ontogeny. Some of these mechanisms could be conserved even though the phenomena are not. Drosophila has only one cardiac cell type, no neural crest cells, and a heart with no atrial or ventricular chamber morphology (Kirby 1999). But cardiogenesis in all invertebrates and vertebrates investigated thus far depends essentially on the expression of the homeobox gene Nkx2-5/tinman (Gajewski and Schulz 2002). The reverse situation can also hold: similar phenomena may be manifested but genetic and cellular mechanisms might differ. Amphibians form a neural tube (neurulation) through a process of invagination (the folding of an epithelial sheet), whereas teleost fishes form a neural tube via cavitation (the hollowing out of a block of tissue via cell death). The neural tube is homologous across vertebrates (i.e., a conserved phenomenon), but the cellular and genetic mechanisms involved in invagination versus cavitation are distinct (Davies 2005: ch. 4).

The distinction between phenomena and mechanisms assumes specificity; i.e., there are specific phenomena (somite formation in vertebrates) or mechanisms (collinear Hox gene expression) in view when judging the relationship between source (model) and target. But animal development consists of a multitude of different processes that involve a host of different mechanisms. Therefore, another distinction operating in the representational criterion pertains to questions of specificity versus variety when selecting and using model organisms. A model might represent one type of target phenomena (differentiation or growth) or mechanism (cell signaling or cell cycling) but not others—specificity—or may do so better or worse with respect to particular types of phenomena or mechanisms. A model might represent several types of target phenomena and mechanisms simultaneously—variety—with variability in how each type is represented. Trade-offs exist with respect to how well different phenomena or mechanisms are co-instantiated in a model organism. Note that experimental organisms may be selected with respect to variety and specificity simultaneously, such as when a biologist working on a specific phenomenon intends to work on others using the same model in the future. They also may be selected with one or the other of these two aspects predominant. A model might be desirable if it has representational variety in both mechanisms and phenomena even if it is not the best representative for every specific mechanism or phenomenon. Conversely, a model organism might be desirable if it is the best representative for a specific mechanism despite being a very poor model for other phenomena or mechanisms. Variety is indicative of the “whole organism” being the model.[17] A further distinction can be introduced between “model organisms” and “experimental organisms” (Ankeny and Leonelli 2011) or “general model organisms” and “Krogh-principle model organisms” (Love 2010a). General model organisms are selected and used with the variety aspect of the representational criterion preeminent; experimental or Krogh-principle model organisms are selected and used with specificity preeminent.

Other issues relevant to the representation criterion include how the use of model organisms constitutes an example of case-based reasoning (Ankeny 2012) and how model organisms involve idealizations or known departures from features present in the model’s target as the result of laboratory cultivation (Ankeny 2009). Preparing model organisms for experimental analysis involves intentionally misrepresenting mechanisms or phenomena, such as the standardized staging of ontogeny that misrepresents the degree and kinds of variation present in development (Love 2010a; Section 5.2). Additionally, the question of representation is not the only one germane to understanding model organism use. Because model organisms are utilized for experimental intervention, questions of representation must be juxtaposed with questions of manipulation (see the supplement on Model Organisms and Manipulation).

5. Development and Evolution

The relationships that obtain between development and evolution are complicated and under ongoing investigation (for a review, see Love 2015). Two main axes dominate within a loose conglomeration of research programs (Raff 2000; Müller 2007): (a) the evolution of development, or inquiry into the pattern and processes of how ontogeny varies and changes over time; and, (b) the developmental basis of evolution, or inquiry into the causal impact of ontogenetic processes on evolutionary trajectories—both in terms of constraint and facilitation. Two examples where the concepts and practices of developmental and evolutionary biology clash are treated here: the problematic appeal to functional homology in developmental genetics that is meant to underwrite evolutionary generalizations about ontogeny (Section 5.1) and the tension between using normal stages for developmental investigation and determining the evolutionary significance of phenotypic plasticity (Section 5.2). These cases expose some of the philosophical issues inherent in how development and evolution can be related to one another.

5.1 Functional Homology in Developmental Genetics

The conserved role of Hox genes in axial patterning is referred to as functionally homologous across animals (Manak and Scott 1994), over and above the relation of structural homology that obtains between DNA sequences. And yet “functional homology” is a contradiction in terms (Abouheif et al. 1997) because the definition of a homologue is “the same organ in different animals under every variety of form and function” (Owen 1843: 379)—the descendant, evolutionary distinction between homology (structure) and analogy (function) is founded on this recognition. Therefore, the idea of functional homology appears theoretically confused and there is conceptual tension in its use by molecular developmental biologists.

[three skeletons each with the left wing outstretched and the outline of the wing shaded in. The skeleton labeled 1 is of a pterodactyl; that labeled 2 is a bat; and that of 3 is a bird.]

Figure 5: Vertebrate wings are homologous as forelimbs; they are derived by common descent from the same structure. The function of vertebrate wings (i.e., flight) is analogous; although the wings fulfill similar functions, their role in flight has evolved separately.

The reference to “organ” in Owen’s definition is indicative of a structure (an entity) found in an organism that may vary in its shape and composition (form) or what it is for (function) in the species where it occurs. Translated into an evolutionary context, sameness is cashed out by reference to common ancestry. Since structures also can be similar by virtue of natural selection operating in similar environments, homology is contrasted with analogy. Homologous structures are the same by virtue of descent from a common ancestor, regardless of what functions these structures are involved in, whereas analogous structures are similar by virtue of selection processes favoring comparable functional outcomes, regardless of common descent (Figure 5).

This is what makes similarity of function an especially problematic criterion of homology (Abouheif et al. 1997). Because functional similarity is the appropriate relation for analogy, it is not necessary for analogues to have the same function as a consequence of common ancestry—similarity despite different origins suffices (Ghiselin 2005). Classic cases of analogy involve taxa that do not share a recent common ancestor that exhibits the structure, such as the external body morphology of dolphins and tuna (Pabst 2000). Thus, functional homology seems to be a category error because what a structure does should not enter into an evaluation of homologue correspondence and similarity of function is often the result of adaptation via natural selection to common environmental demands, not common ancestry.

Although we might be inclined to simply prohibit the terminology of functional homology, its widespread use in molecular and developmental biology should at least make us pause: “Functional homology among human and fission yeast Cdc14 phosphatases” (Vázquez-Novelle et al. 2005).[18] While it is important to recognize this pervasive practice, some occurrences may be illicit. Swapping structurally homologous genes between species to rescue mutant or null phenotypes is not a genuine criterion of functional homology, especially when there is little or no attention to establishing a phylogenetic context. This makes many claims of functional homology between model organisms suspect. To not run afoul of the conceptual tension, explicit attention must be given to the meaning of “function.” Biological practice harbors at least four separate meanings of function (Wouters 2003, 2005): activity (what something does), causal role (contribution to a capacity), fitness advantage or viability (value of having something), and selected effect or etiology (origination and maintenance via natural selection). Debate has raged about which of them (if any) is most appropriate for different aspects of biological and psychological reasoning or most general in scope (i.e., what makes them all function concepts?), but here the only issue is whether we can identify a legitimate concept of homology of function.

If we are to avoid mixing homology and analogy, then the appropriate notion of function cannot be based on selection history, which is allied with the concept of analogy and concerns a particular variety of function. Similarly, viability interpretations concentrate on features where the variety of function is critical because of conferred survival advantages. Any interpretation of function that relies on a particular variety of function (because it was selected or because it confers viability) clashes with the demand that homology concern something “under every variety of form and function.” A causal role interpretation emphasizes a systemic capacity to which a function makes a contribution. It too focuses on a particular variety of function, though in a way different from either selected effect or viability interpretations. Only an activity interpretation (‘what something does’) accents the function itself, apart from its specific contribution to a systemic capacity and position in a larger context. Therefore, the most appropriate meaning to incorporate into homology of function is “activity-function” because it is at least possible for activity-functions to remain constant under every variety. An evaluation of sameness due to common ancestry is made separately from the role the function plays (or its use), whether understood in terms of a causal role, a fitness advantage, or a history of selection.[19] Activity-functions can be put to different uses while being shared via common descent (i.e., homologous). More precisely, homology of function can be defined as the same activity-function in different animals under every variety of form and use-function (Love 2007). This unambiguously removes the tension that plagued functional homology.

Careful discussions of regulatory gene function in development and evolution recognize something akin to the distinction between activity- and use-function (i.e., between what a gene does and what it is for in some process within the organism).

When studying the molecular evolution of regulatory genes, their biochemical and developmental function must be considered separately. The biochemical function of PAX-6 and eyeless are as general transcription factors (which bind and activate downstream genes), but their developmental function is their specific involvement in eye morphogenesis (Abouheif 1997: 407).

The biochemical function is the activity-function and the developmental function is the use-function. This distinction helps to discriminate between divergent evolutionary trajectories. Biochemical (activity-functions) of genes are often conserved (i.e., homologous), while simultaneously being available for co-option to make causal role contributions (use-functions) to distinct developmental processes. The same regulatory genes are evolutionarily stable in terms of activity-function and evolutionarily labile in terms of use-function.[20] By implication, claims about use-function homology for genes qua developmental function are suspect compared to those concerning activity-function homology for genes qua biochemical function because developmental functions are more likely to have changed as phylogenetic distance increases.

The distinction between biochemical (activity) function and developmental (use) function is reinforced by the hierarchical aspects of homology (Hall 1994). A capacity defining the use-function of a regulatory gene at one level of organization, such as axial patterning, must be considered as an activity-function itself at another level of organization, such as the differentiation of serially repeated elements along a body axis. (Note that “level of organization” need not be compositional and thus the language of “higher” and “lower” levels may be inappropriate.) The developmental roles of Hox genes in axial patterning may be conserved by virtue of their biochemical activity-function homologies but Hox genes are not use-function homologues because of these developmental roles. Instead of focusing on the activity of a gene component and its causal role in axial patterning, we shift to the activity of axial patterning and its causal role elsewhere (or elsewhen) in embryonic development.

Introducing a conceptually legitimate idea of homology of activity-function is not about keeping the ideas of developmental biology tidy. It assists in the interpretation of evidence and circumscribes the inferences drawn. For example, NK-2 genes are involved in mesoderm specification, which underlies muscle morphogenesis. In Drosophila, the expression of a particular NK-2 gene (tinman) is critical for both cardiac and visceral mesoderm development. If tinman is knocked out and transgenically replaced with its vertebrate orthologue, Nkx2-5, only visceral mesoderm specification is rescued; the regulation of cardiac mesoderm is not (Ranganayakulu et al. 1998). A region of the vertebrate protein near the 5′ end of the polypeptide differs enough to prevent appropriate regulation in cardiac morphogenesis. The homeodomains (stretches of sequence that confer DNA binding) for vertebrate Nkx2-5 and Drosophila tinman are interchangeable. The inability of Nkx2-5 to rescue cardiac mesoderm specification is not related to the activity-function of differential DNA binding. One component of the orthologous (homologous) proteins in both species retains an activity-function homology related to visceral mesoderm specification but another component (not the homeodomain) has diverged. This homeobox gene does not have a single use-function (as expected), but it also does not have a single activity-function. Any adequate evaluation of these cases must recognize a more fine-grained decomposition of genes into working units to capture genuine activity-function conservation. We can link activity-function homologues directly to structural motifs within a gene but there is not necessarily a single activity-function for an entire open reading frame.

Defusing the conceptual tensions between developmental and evolutionary biology with respect to homology of function has a direct impact on the causal generalizations and inferences made from model organisms (Section 4). Activity-function homology directs our attention to the stability or conservation of activities. This conservation is indicative of when the study of mechanisms in model organisms will produce robust and stable generalizations. The widespread use of functional homology in developmental biology is aimed at exactly this kind of question, which explains its persistence in experimental biology despite conceptual ambiguities. Generalizations concerning molecular signaling cascades are underwritten by the coordinated biochemical activities in view, not the developmental roles (though sometimes they may coincide). Thus, activity-function details about a signaling cascade gleaned from a model organism can be generalized via homology to other unstudied organisms even if the developmental role varies for the activity-function in other species.

5.2 Normal Stages and Phenotypic Plasticity

All reasoning strategies combine distinctive strengths alongside of latent weaknesses. For example, decomposing a system into its constituents to understand the features manifested by the system promotes a dissection of the causal interactions of the localized constituents, while downplaying interactions with elements external to the system (Wimsatt 1980; Bechtel and Richardson 1993). Sometimes the descriptive and explanatory practices of the sciences are successful precisely because they intentionally ignore aspects of natural phenomena or use a variety of approximation techniques. Idealization is one type of reasoning strategy that scientists use to describe, model, and explain that purposefully departs from features known to be present in nature. For example, the interior space of a cell is often depicted as relatively empty even though intracellular space is known to be crowded (Ellis 2001); the variable of cellular volume takes on a value that is known to be false (i.e., relatively empty). Idealizations involve knowingly ignoring variations in properties or excluding particular values for variables, in a variety of different ways, for descriptive and explanatory purposes (Jones 2005; Weisberg 2007).

The study of ontogeny in model organisms (Section 4) is usually executed by establishing a set of normal stages for embryonic development (see Other Internet Resources). A developmental trajectory from fertilized zygote to fully-formed adult is broken down into distinct temporal periods by reference to the occurrence of major events, such as fertilization, gastrulation, or metamorphosis (Minelli 2003: ch. 4; see Section 1.2). This enables researchers in different laboratory contexts to have standardized comparisons of experimental results (Hopwood 2005, 2007). They are critical to large communities of developmental biologists working on well-established models, such as chick (Hamburger and Hamilton 1951) or zebrafish (Kimmel et al. 1995): “Embryological research is now unimaginable without such standard series” (Hopwood 2005: 239). These normal stages are a form of idealization because they intentionally ignore kinds of variation in development, including variation associated with environmental variables. While facilitating the study of particular causal relationships, this means that specific kinds of variation in developmental features that might be relevant to evolution are minimized in the process of rendering ontogeny experimentally tractable (Love 2010a).

Phenotypic plasticity is a ubiquitous biological phenomenon. It involves the capacity of a particular genotype to generate phenotypic variation, often in the guise of qualitatively distinct phenotypes, in response to differential environmental cues (Pigliucci 2001; DeWitt and Scheiner 2004; Kaplan 2008; Gilbert and Epel 2009). One familiar example is seasonal caterpillar morphs that depend on different nutritional sources (Greene 1989). Some of the relevant environmental variables include temperature, nutrition, pressure/gravity, light, predators or stressful conditions, and population density (Gilbert and Epel 2009). The reaction norm is a summary of the range of phenotypes, whether quantitatively or qualitatively varying, exhibited by organisms of a given genotype for different environmental conditions. When the reaction norm exhibits discontinuous variation or bivalent phenotypes (rather than quantitative, continuous variation), it is often labeled a polyphenism (Figure 6).

[two color photos of leafed twigs each with a well camouflaged caterpillars (Biston betularia) looking like a branch, one green (on willow, right) and one brown (on birch, left).]

Figure 6: A color polyphenism in American Peppered Moth caterpillars that represents an example of phenotypic plasticity.

Phenotypic plasticity has been of recurring interest to biological researchers and controversial in evolutionary theory. Extensive study of phenotypic plasticity has occurred in the context of quantitative genetic methods and phenotypic selection analyses, where the extent of plasticity in natural populations has been demonstrated and operational measures delineated for its detection (Scheiner 1993; Pigliucci 2001). Other aspects of plasticity require different investigative methods to ascertain the sources of plasticity during ontogeny, the molecular genetic mechanisms that encourage plasticity, and the kinds of mapping functions that exist between the genotype and phenotype (Pigliucci 2001; Kirschner and Gerhart 2005: ch. 5). These latter aspects, the origin of phenotypic variation during and after ontogeny, are in view at the intersection of development and evolution: How do molecular genetic mechanisms produce (or reduce) plasticity? What genotype-phenotype mapping functions are prevalent or rare? Does plasticity contribute to the origination of evolutionary novelties (West-Eberhard 2003)?

In order to evaluate these questions experimentally, we need to alter development through the manipulation of environmental variables and observe how a novel phenotype can be established within the existing plasticity of an organism (Kirschner and Gerhart 2005: ch. 5). This manipulation could allow for the identification of patterns of variation through the reliable replication of particular experimental alterations within different environmental regimes. But without measuring variation across different environmental regimes, you cannot observe phenotypic plasticity. These measurements are required to document the degree of plasticity and its patterns for a particular trait, such as qualitatively distinct morphs. An evaluation of the significance of phenotypic plasticity for evolution requires answers to questions about where plasticity emerges, how molecular genetic mechanisms are involved in the plasticity, and what genotype-phenotype relations obtain.

Developmental stages intentionally ignore variation associated with phenotypic plasticity. Animals and plants are raised under stable environmental conditions so that stages can be reproduced in different laboratory settings and variation is often viewed as noise that must be reduced or eliminated if one is to understand how development works (Frankino and Raff 2004). This practice also encourages the selection of model organisms that exhibit less plasticity (Bolker 1995). The laboratory domestication of a model organism may also reduce the amount or type of observable phenotypic variation (Gu et al. 2005), though laboratory domestication also can increase variation (e.g., via inbreeding). Despite attempts to reduce variation by controlling environmental factors, some of it always remains and is displayed by the fact that absolute chronology is not a reliable measure of time in ontogeny, and neither is the initiation or completion of its different parts (Mabee et al. 2000; Sheil and Greenbaum 2005). Developmental stages allow this recalcitrant variation to be effectively ignored by judgments of embryonic typicality. Normal stages also involve assumptions about the causal connections between different processes across sequences of stages (Minelli 2003: ch. 4). Once these stages have been constructed, it is possible to use them as a visual standard against which to recognize and describe variation as a deviation from the norm (DiTeresi 2010). But, more typically, variation ignored in the construction of these stages is also ignored in the routine consultation of the stages in day-to-day research contexts (Frankino and Raff 2004).

Normal stages fulfill a number of goals related to descriptive and explanatory endeavors that developmental biologists engage in (Kimmel et al. 1995). They yield a way to measure experimental replication, enable consistent and unambiguous communication among researchers, especially if stages are founded on commonly observable morphological features, facilitate accurate predictions of developmental phenomena, and aid in making comparisons or generalizations across species. As idealizations of ontogeny, normal stages allow for a classification of developmental events that is comprehensiveness with suitably sized and reasonably homogeneous stages, reasonably sharp boundaries between stages, and stability under different investigative conditions (Dupré 2001), which encourages more precise explanations within particular disciplinary approaches (Griesemer 1996). Idealizations also can facilitate abstraction and generalization, both of which are a part of extrapolating findings from the investigative context of a model organism to other domains (Steel 2008; see Section 4 and 5.1).

There are various weaknesses associated with normal stages that accompany the fulfillment of these investigative and explanatory goals. Key morphological indicators sometimes overlap stages, terminology that is useful for one purpose may be misleading for another, particular terms can be misleading in cross-species comparisons, and manipulation of the embryo for continued observation can have a causal impact on ontogeny. Avoiding variability in stage indicators can encourage overlooking the significance of this variation, or at least provide a reason to favor its minimization.

Thus, there are good reasons for adopting normal stages to periodize model organism ontogeny, and these help explain why their continued use yields empirical success. At the same time, there are ways in which the practice of staging involves idealizations—decisions to intentionally misrepresent particular kinds of variation. Similar to other standard (successful) practices in science, normal stages are often taken for granted, which means their biasing effects are neglected (Wimsatt 1980), some of which are relevant to evolutionary questions (e.g., systematically underestimating the extent of variation in a population). This is critical to recognize because the success of a periodization is not a function of the eventual ability to relax the idealizations; periodizations are not slowly corrected so that they become less idealized. Instead, new periodizations are constructed and used alongside the existing ones because different idealizations involve different judgments of typicality that serve diverse descriptive and explanatory aims. In addition to the systematic biases involved in developmental staging, most model organisms are poorly suited to inform us about how environmental effects modulate or combine with genetic or other factors in development—they make it difficult to discover details about mechanisms underlying reaction norms. Short generation times and rapid development are tightly correlated with insensitivity to environmental conditions through various mechanisms such as prepatterning (Bolker 1995).

The tension between the specific practice of developmental staging in model organisms and uncovering the relevance of variation due to phenotypic plasticity for evolution can be reconstructed as an argument.

  1. Variation due to phenotypic plasticity is a normal feature of ontogeny.
  2. The developmental staging of model organisms intentionally downplays variation in ontogeny associated with the effects of environmental variables (e.g., phenotypic plasticity) by strictly limiting the range of values for environmental variables and by removing variation in characters utilized to establish the comprehensive periodization.
  3. Therefore, using model organisms with specified developmental stages will make it difficult, if not impossible, to observe patterns of variation due to phenotypic plasticity.

Although this tension obtains even if the focus is not on evolutionary questions, sometimes encouraging developmental biologists to interpret absence of evidence as evidence of the developmental insignificance of phenotypic plasticity, it is exacerbated for evolutionary researchers. The documentation of patterns of variation is precisely what is required to gauge the evolutionary significance of phenotypic plasticity. Practices of developmental staging in model organisms can retard our ability to make either a positive or negative assessment. Developmental staging, in conjunction with the properties of model organisms, tends to encourage a negative assessment of the evolutionary importance of phenotypic plasticity because the variation is not manifested and documented, and therefore is unlikely to be reckoned as substantive. Idealizations involving normal stages discourage a robust experimental probing of phenotypic plasticity, which is an obstacle to determining its evolutionary significance.

The consequences of this tension for the intersection of development and evolution are two-fold. First, the most powerful experimental systems for studying development are set up to minimize variation that may be critical to comprehending how evolutionary processes occur in nature. Second, if evolutionary investigations revolve around a character that was assessed for typicality to underwrite the temporal partitions that we call stages, then much of the variation in this character was conceptually removed as a part of rendering the model organism experimentally tractable.[21]

The identification of drawbacks that accompany strategies of idealization used to study development should not leave us paralyzed. It invites consideration of ways to address the liabilities identified (Love 2006). We can construct a principled perspective on how to address these liabilities by adding three further premises:

  1. Reasoning strategies involving idealization, such as (2), are necessary to the successful prosecution of biological investigations of ontogeny.
  2. Therefore, compensatory tactics should be chosen in such a way as to specifically redress the blind spots arising from the kind of idealizations utilized.
  3. Given (1)–(3), compensatory tactics must be related to the effects of ignoring variation due to phenotypic plasticity that result from the developmental staging of model organisms.

At least two compensatory tactics can promote observations of variation due to phenotypic plasticity that is typically ignored when developmental stages are constructed for model organisms: the employment of diverse model organisms and the adoption of alternate periodizations.

Variation often will be observable in non-standard model organisms because experimental organisms that do not have large communities built around them are less likely to have had their embryonic development formally staged, and thus the effects of idealization on phenotypic plasticity would not be operative. In turn, researchers are sensitized to the ways in which these kinds of variation are being muted in the study of standard models. Stages can be used then as visual standards to identify variation as deviations from a norm and thereby characterize patterns of variability.[22]

A second compensatory tactic is the adoption of alternative periodizations. This involves choosing different characters to construct new temporal partitions, thereby facilitating the observation of variation with respect to characteristics previously stabilized in the normal stage periodization. These alternative periodizations often divide a subset of developmental events according to processes or landmarks that differ from those used to construct the normal stages, and they may not map one-one onto the existing normal stages, especially if they encompass events beyond the trajectory from fertilization to a sexually mature adult. This lack of isomorphism between periodizations also will be manifested if different measures of time are utilized, whether sequence (event ordering) or duration (succession of defined intervals), and whether sequences or durations are measured relative to one another or against an external standard, such as absolute chronology (Reiss 2003; Colbert and Rowe 2008). These incompatibilities prevent assimilating the alternative periodizations into a single, overarching staging scheme. In all of these cases, idealization is involved and therefore each new periodization is subject to the liabilities of ignoring kinds of variation. But alternative periodizations require choosing different characters to stabilize and typify when defining its temporal partitions, which means different kinds of variation will be exposed than were previously observable.[23]

The compensatory tactics of employing a diversity of model organisms and adopting alternative periodizations may be conceptually appropriate for addressing how the practice of developmental staging has an impact on the detection of phenotypic plasticity, but this does not remove associated costs (human, financial, and otherwise) or controversy. The advantages of a single, comprehensive periodization for a general model organism (e.g., zebrafish normal stages) must be weighed in light of the advantages of alternative, process-specific periodizations. But by openly scrutinizing these practices in relation to the phenomenon of interest, recognizing both advantages and drawbacks involved in the idealizations utilized, developmental and evolutionary biologists are better positioned to offer systematic descriptions and comprehensive explanations of biological phenomena.

6. Conclusion

This entry has only sampled a small portion of work relevant to the import and promise of conceptual reflection on the epistemology of developmental biology. Much more could be said about each of the above domains, such as a more fine-grained analysis of how normal stages operate as types in developmental biology (DiTeresi 2010). Additionally, little has been said about how evidence works in developmental biological experimentation or differences between confirmatory and exploratory experimentation (Hall 2005; Waters 2007b), nor have I treated the role of metaphors and models that characterize key practices in developmental biology (Fagan 2013; Keller 2002). The latter have been perspicuously analyzed via increased attention to the details of particular research programs. Finally, nothing has been said about the metaphysical implications of developmental phenomena (a key input for Aristotle’s metaphysics). Concepts of potentiality are very natural in developmental biology (e.g., the pluripotency of stem cells or the potential of a germ layer to yield different kinds of tissue lineages). This bears on how we understand dispositions (see the entry on dispositions) because the triggering conditions are often complex and multiply realized (including manifestations without a trigger), as well as the fact that cells exhibit dispositions with multiple possible manifestations (cell types) in specific sequential orderings (Hüttemann and Kaiser forthcoming). Thus, developmental biology displays not only a rich array of material and conceptual practices that can be analyzed to better understand the scientific reasoning exhibited in experimental life science, but also points in the direction of new ideas for metaphysics, especially when that endeavor explicitly considers the input of empirically successful sciences.


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Thanks to the many philosophical and scientific colleagues who have given me extensive comments on different aspects of this material in the past. I also am grateful to an anonymous referee for helpful feedback that considerably improved the final version of the entry.

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