Feminist Environmental Philosophy

First published Fri Aug 29, 2014; substantive revision Mon Apr 27, 2015

Early positions of “feminist environmental philosophy” focused mostly on ethical perspectives on the interconnections among women, nonhuman animals, and nature (e.g., Carol Adams 1990; Deborah Slicer 1991). As it matured, references to feminist environmental philosophy became what it is now—an umbrella term for a variety of different, sometimes incompatible, philosophical perspectives on interconnections among women of diverse races/ethnicities, socioeconomic statuses, and geographic locations, on the one hand, and nonhuman animals and nature, on the other. For the purposes of this essay, “feminist environmental philosophy” refers to this diversity of positions on the interconnections among women, nonhuman animals and nature within Western philosophy—what will be called, simply, “women-nature connections”. Unless specifically or separately identified, nonhuman animals are included in the concept of “nature”. (It is beyond the scope of this essay to consider non-Western philosophical positions concerning the environment.)

1. Key Terms and Distinctions

1.1 Nature Is A Feminist Issue

A feminist issue provides ways of understanding, eliminating, and creating alternatives to the oppression of women. Minimally, nature (used interchangeably in this essay with “the environment”) is a feminist issue because an understanding of nature and environmental problems often helps one understand how and why women's oppression is linked with the unjustified domination or exploitation of nature. (The distinction between “oppression” and “domination” is discussed in Section 3.2.) For example, data show that women—especially poor, rural women in less developed countries (LDCs) who are heads of households—suffer disproportionate harms caused by such environmental problems as deforestation, water pollution, and environmental toxins. Knowing this helps one understand how the lives and status of women are connected to contemporary environmental problems. (Greta Gaard and Lori Gruen 2005). Such data make deforestation, water pollution, and environmental toxins a feminist issue. In fact, some have claimed that “nature is a feminist issue” might be the informal slogan of feminist environmental philosophy (Warren 2000).

1.2 Canonical Western Philosophy

As used throughout the essay, “canonical Western philosophy” refers to the Western philosophical tradition traceable to Ancient Greece. It includes the works by the philosophers who are most commonly taught at the majority of colleges and universities throughout the English speaking Western world. In this tradition, there is a striking degree of agreement about the “conceptual framework”—the basic beliefs, values, attitudes, assumptions, and concepts—that define “the canon”. These include the following: (a) a commitment to rationalism, the view that reason (or rationality) is not only the hallmark of being human; it is what makes humans superior to nonhuman animals and nature; (b) a conception of humans as rational beings who are capable of abstract reasoning, entertaining objective principles, and understanding or calculating the consequences of actions; (c) conceptions of both the ideal moral agent and the knower as impartial, detached and disinterested; (d) a belief in fundamental dualisms, such as reason versus emotion, mind versus body, culture versus nature, absolutism versus relativism, and objectivity versus subjectivity; (e) an assumption that there is an ontological divide between humans and nonhuman animals and nature; and (f) universalizability as a criterion for assessing the truth of ethical and epistemological principles (see Warren 2009).

Many of these key features of canonical Western philosophy are challenged by positions in feminist environmental philosophy. When, where and how this occurs is addressed throughout the essay.

1.3 Three Kinds of Positions in Feminist Environmental Philosophy

There are three distinct kinds of positions within feminist environmental philosophy. They are: (1) positions whose historical beginnings are located in non-feminist Western environmental philosophies; (2) positions that were initially identified with “ecofeminism” (or “ecological feminism”) generally, but, since the late 1980s and early 1990s, are more accurately identified with “ecofeminist philosophy,” specifically; and (3) new or emerging “stand alone” positions that offer novel or unique perspectives on “women-nature connections” that are not identified with either (1) or (2). Discussion of these three sorts of positions constitutes the subject matter of Section 2.

2. First Kind of Position in Feminist Environmental Philosophy: One Historically Associated with a Non-Feminist Environmental Philosophy

Although environmental issues have been addressed by philosophers since Ancient Greece, Western environmental philosophies did not take shape until the early 1970s (e.g., Arne Naess 1973; John Passmore 1973). Increasingly, unsettling empirical data surfaced concerning human mistreatment of nonhuman animals (e.g., factory farming), nature (e.g., clear-cutting old growth forests), and destructive human-nature relationships (e.g., human creation of unmanaged toxic landfills, especially in communities of color). In addition, many canonical assumptions were called into question, such as the view that humans and culture are superior to nonhuman animals and nature. Western environmental philosophies, both feminist and non-feminist, emerged from such applied and theoretical concerns.

2.1 Western Environmental Philosophy

The historical beginnings of Western environmental philosophy are in environmental ethics. Unlike canonical Western ethics, Western environmental ethics (both feminist and non-feminist) is predicated on the claim that humans have moral responsibilities (or obligations) to nonhuman animals and/or nature, although they disagree about the basis of these responsibilities. Some argue that the basis is the intrinsic (or inherent) value of nonhuman animals and/or nature, in contrast with the canonical view that they have merely instrumental (or extrinsic) value. Some argue that there are properties that nonhuman animals and/or nature have (such as, sentiency, rights, or interests) by virtue of which they deserve moral consideration in their own right (or, have moral standing). Despite disagreements about the basis of these human responsibilities, Western environmental philosophy asserts what canonical philosophy denies— that humans have moral responsibilities to nonhuman animals and/or nature themselves, and not just to humans where nonhuman animals and/or nature are concerned. As a kind of Western environmental philosophy, feminist environmental philosophy supports the claim that canonical Western philosophy does not generate a bona fide environmental philosophy, since it fails to recognize that humans have moral obligations (or responsibilities) to nonhuman animals and/or nature themselves. (Throughout the remainder of the essay, any reference to philosophy, environmental philosophy or feminist environmental philosophy is to Western philosophy.)

2.2 Revised Environmental Philosophy: Feminist Perspectives on Animal Ethics

A “revised” environmental philosophy is one that uses key concepts and theories of canonical philosophy, but extends them to include nonhuman animals in the moral community. It does so by granting moral status (or, moral standing) to nonhuman animals. “Animal Ethics” is one such revised position (see the entry on the moral status of animals).

Feminist animal ethicists oppose the same practices (e.g., factory farming, vivisection, and hunting) that are opposed by the two original non-feminist versions of animal ethics, Peter Singer's utilitarian version (1975) and Tom Regan's right-based version (1982). Singer opposes these practices because they cause unnecessary pain and suffering to sentient beings. Regan opposes them because they violate the rights to life of what he calls “subjects of a life”. But feminist animal ethics goes further by providing a gendered perspective on such practices and on animal protection generally (see feminist animal ethics of care discussed in Section 3.8).

How does it do this? There are six ways feminist animal ethics has made distinct contributions to traditional, non-feminist positions in animal ethics: (1) it emphasizes that canonical Western philosophy's view of humans as rational agents, who are separate from and superior to nature, fails to acknowledge that humans are also animals—even if rational animals—and, as such, are a part of nature; (2) it makes visible the interconnections among violence against women, violence against nature, and pornography (see Adams 1990, 2004; Carol Adams and Josephine Donovan 1995; Susan Griffin 1981; Pattrice Jones 2011); (3) it demonstrates the role played by language in creating, maintaining, and perpetuating the interconnected exploitations of women and animals (See Section 3.3); (4) it shows how bedrock dualisms in canonical philosophy—such as culture versus nature and mind versus body—have historically not been gender-neutral; they have associated males/men with superior culture and mind, and both females/women and animals with inferior nature and body (Gruen and Kari Weil 2011); (5) it locates the exploitation of women and animals in mutually reinforcing systems and practices of unjustified domination, particularly sexism and speciesism (or, the prejudicial discrimination against other beings based on their membership in (allegedly) inferior nonhuman species) (Gaard 2011); and (6) it raises the issue whether the absence of a gendered perspective in traditional animal ethics makes those positions on the mistreatment of nonhuman animals incomplete or inadequate (see Adams 1994; Adams and Donovan 1995; Gaard 1993; Gruen 1996; Slicer 1991).

2.3 Expanded Environmental Philosophy: Feminist Philosophical Perspectives on Leopold's Land Ethics

An “expanded” environmental philosophy is one that does two things: it retains some of the key features of revised environmental philosophy (e.g., consequentialist and rights-based theories) while also introducing genuinely new features—ones that had not yet been part of a moral theory. This essay considers only one “expanded” environmental philosophy, Aldo Leopold's “land ethic”, published as an essay, “The Land Ethic”, in his 1949 book The Sand County Almanac. Many environmental philosophers consider Leopold's land ethic the first genuinely environmental ethic (not just an “animal ethic”). It is discussed here because many feminist environmental philosophers defend positions that draw on Leopold's land ethic (e.g., Chris Cuomo 1998; Deane Curtin 1999; Warren 2000).

Leopold's land ethic advances four key claims (stated here roughly as Leopold stated them): (1) the moral community should include soils, waters, plants, and animals, or, what Leopold calls, collectively, “the land” (Leopold 1949 [1977]: 204); (2) the role of homo sapiens should be changed from conqueror to plain member of the land community (204); (3) we can be moral only in relation to something we can see, feel, understand, love, respect, admire, or otherwise have faith in (214, 223, 225); and (4) “a thing is right when it tends to preserve the integrity, stability, and beauty of the biotic community; it is wrong when it tends otherwise” (224–225), what some regard as Leopold's ultimate moral maxim.

Many environmental philosophers regard claim (4) as the moral maxim of Leopold's land ethic; it claims that the rightness or wrongness of actions is determined by reference to the consequences of those actions—a familiar consequentialist ethical principle. However, for Leopold, the relevant consequences are the “integrity, stability, and beauty of the biotic community”. Since these consequences are new to ethics, Leopold's land ethic expands ethics into new territory—territory beyond even revised environmental philosophy. The same is true for the other three claims, (1)–(3): they introduce moral concepts that go beyond those made by either canonical philosophy or revised environmental ethics (such as animal ethics). It is this “going beyond” feature that makes Leopold's land ethic an expanded ethic.

Many feminist environmental philosophers adopt key aspects of Leopold's land ethic. For example, many defend a notion of the self as a relational, ecological being who is a member of the larger biotic (living, organic, ecological) community. Many agree that “moral emotions”, such as empathy and care, are important to any ethic, including any environmental ethic (see, for example, Cuomo 2005; Vrinda Dalmiya 2002; Mathews 1994b; Plumwood 1993; Warren 2000). In addition, many feminist environmental philosophers acknowledge that embryonic forms of a gendered environmental ethic can be found in the opening lines of “The Land Ethic”, where Leopold wrote, “The girls [Odysseus's slave girls] were property. The disposal of property was then, as now, a matter of expediency, not of right and wrong” (Leopold 1949 [1977]: 201). Lastly, some feminist environmental philosophers endorse Leopold's understanding of the interconnections between cultural diversity and ecological (or “bio”) diversity. Consider why and how understanding these interconnections is important to feminist environmental philosophy.

Leopold claimed that an ecological interpretation of history shows that “the rich diversity of the world's cultures reflects a corresponding diversity in the wilds that gave them birth” (1949 [1977]: 188). For example, Leopold wrote that cultural diversity is “often based in wildlife. Thus the plains [sic] Indian not only ate buffalo, but buffalo largely determined his architecture, dress, language, arts, and religion” (1949 [1977]: 177). Cultural diversity reflects ecological diversity. Assuming that the preservation of the rich diversity of the world's cultures—cultural diversity—is a good thing, then understanding the connections between that and the preservation of ecological (or “bio”) diversity is also a good thing. The converse is also true: ecological diversity reflects cultural diversity. For example, many Western development projects in Asia and Africa replace ecologically diverse (multispecies) indigenous forests—forests that are managed by women and are integral to maintaining subsistence (not money-based) economies—with monoculture eucalyptus and teak plantations that are managed by men and where trees are primarily a cash crop for export. Many feminist environmental philosophers argue against these development projects; the loss of ecological diversity (provided by indigenous forests) directly and disproportionately harms women, subsistence economies, and the cultural communities to which women belong. These examples illustrate ways that Leopold's insightful awareness of the interdependencies between cultural diversity and ecological (bio) diversity informs a feminist environmental perspective on women-nature connections (see also Sections 3.5 and 3.6).

2.4 Radical Environmental Philosophy: Feminist Philosophical Perspectives on Deep Ecology

A “radical” environmental philosophy challenges foundational assumptions and claims of canonical philosophy in the context of environmental issues. These challenges are “radical” in the etymological sense that they “go to the roots” of environmental problems—typically, the conceptual roots—and in the historical sense that they had never before been part of a moral theory. (This description permits that what was “radical” at one time may no longer be radical.) One of the most influential radical positions is “deep ecology”.

Norwegian philosopher Arne Naess coined the term “deep ecology” to refer to the (deep) conceptual roots of the environmental crisis (Naess 1973). Naess contrasted deep ecology with “shallow ecology”. Both are concerned, for example, with resolving such “applied” environmental problems as air and water pollution, use of natural resources, human overconsumption and overpopulation. But, according to Naess, only deep ecology provides an understanding of these issues in terms of false or problematic underlying assumptions, concepts, beliefs and values of canonical philosophy.

Historically, the emergence of ecofeminist philosophy was intimately linked to deep ecology. However, during the 1980s and 1990s, that link was contested; the so-called “deep ecology-ecofeminism debate” that emerged took centerstage in discussions of environmental philosophy (see Jim Cheney 1987; Cuomo 1994; Kheel 1990; Plumwood 1993; Salleh 1984; Warren 1999).

The ecofeminism-deep ecology debate focused on two features of special significance to ecofeminist philosophy. The first is deep ecology's criticism of canonical Western philosophy for its anthropocentric (human-centered) thinking about human-nature relationships. The second is the notion of the self that is described by deep ecology's basic “principle of self-realization”. Both features are critiqued by Val Plumwood, one of the pioneers of ecofeminist philosophy (Plumwood 1993). Her critique is summarized here since it provides insight into some basic claims of ecofeminist philosophy (Section 3).

According to deep ecology, canonical Western philosophy's unacceptable anthropocentrism is rooted in several problematic value dualisms, including the “culture versus nature” dualism. Plumwood argues that deep ecology's criticism of anthropocentrism fails to see that canonical philosophy's anthropocentrism has functioned historically as andropocentrism (male-centered thinking). She claims that its failure to see this leads deep ecologists to make two false assumptions—that one can disentangle anthropocentrism and andropocentrism as distinct and separate ways of thinking, and that one can critique the “culture versus nature” dualism without providing a gendered analysis of how this dualism has functioned historically to “justify” the dominations of women and nature. (This criticism of the “culture versus nature” dualism is discussed throughout Section 3.)

The second problematic feature of deep ecology concerns the principle of self-realization, which claims that the human self (small ‘s’) is actualized only when it becomes merged with the cosmos, a Self (capital ‘S’). Plumwood argues that this principle is false because it keeps intact “the discontinuity thesis”—the thesis that there is a clear ontological divide between humans (or the sphere of culture) and nature. Culture and nature are “discontinuous” because humans are separate from and different in kind from nature. For Plumwood, the discontinuity thesis is false and any environmental philosophy that assumes it is conceptually flawed. Plumwood argues that since deep ecology assumes, rather than denies (as deep ecologists claim), the discontinuity thesis, deep ecology is a conceptually flawed environmental philosophy.

How does deep ecology do this—presuppose a thesis that it sets out to deny? Plumwood's answer is that the discontinuity thesis is kept intact by deep ecology's commitment to three faulty conceptions of the self. She calls them “the Indistinguishable Self”, “the Expanded Self”, and “the Transcendent Self” (Plumwood 1993).

The “Indistinguishable Self” rejects any and all boundaries between humans and nature; humans are just one strand in a greater biotic web. This conception of the self presumes what Plumwood calls an “identity thesis:” the human self is an ecological self. The problem with the identity thesis is that it mistakenly solves the discontinuity problem by obliterating all divisions between humans and nature. For just this reason, Plumwood rejects the identity thesis and the notion of the Indistinguishable Self. If the principle of self-realization is about the Indistinguishable Self, the principle is false. In contrast, Plumwood defends a conception of the self that makes humans both continuous with and distinct from nature, both individual selves (who are different from nature) and ecological selves (who are a part of nature).

The “Expanded Self” distinguishes between the particular, individual human self and an expanded, greater “cosmic” Self. Plumwood claims that whatever is meant by a “cosmic Self” (it isn't clear), the Expanded Self denies the importance of individuals as individuals—as distinct human beings who have their own particular attachments and are in various dependency relationships (such as parent and child, care giver and the cared for) that are unique to each self. Plumwood argues that, given that most of the world's women lack many of the human rights, civil liberties, and educational opportunities that men have (as individual selves), it is far too early to abandon a notion of the human self as an individual (a self) in favor of some nebulous, undifferentiated, expanded, “cosmic” Self. If the principle of self-realization is about the Expanded Self, the principle is false.

The “Transcendent Self” refers to the individual self who overcomes its particularity to become a more self-aware, transformed self. Plumwood claims that the Transcendent Self presupposes a “triumph-over thesis”—the Transcendent Self triumphs over highly particularistic attachments, emotions, wants, and desires that individual selves have toward themselves and each other. The Transcendent Self falsely rejects a view of selves that Plumwood defends: human selves are emotionally interdependent, ecological, relational beings whose actualization requires a rejection of rationalism (the identification of humans with reason or rationality) and mind-body dualism. Plumwood's conception of the self is not a rejection of particularity and individuality; it is a recognition that individual selves are also interdependent beings-in-relationships, not Transcendent Selves who triumph over such interdependencies and relationships. If the principle of self-realization is about the Transcendent Self, the principle is false.

3. Second Kind of Position in Feminist Environmental Philosophy: Ecofeminist Philosophy

We already have been introduced to ecofeminist philosophy in connection with animal ethics (Section 2.2), Leopold's Land Ethic (Section 2.3), and deep ecology (Section 2.4). This section explores the nature of ecofeminist philosophy as a distinct kind of environmental philosophy.

3.1 Characterization of Ecofeminist Philosophy

French feminist Françoise d'Eaubonne coined the term “ecological feminisme” in 1974 to call attention to women's potential to bring about an ecological revolution. Initially, “ecofeminism” referred generically to a wide variety of “women-nature” connections, often based in different disciplinary perspectives (such as History, Literary Criticism, Political Science, Sociology, and Theology). This is important because ecofeminism did not emerge as a distinctly philosophical position until the late 1980s and early- to mid 1990s.

For purposes of this essay, a general, common-denominator characterization of “ecofeminist philosophy” is that it: (1) explores the nature of the connections between the unjustified dominations of women and nature; (2) critiques male-biased Western canonical philosophical views (assumptions, concepts, claims, distinctions, positions, theories) about women and nature; and (3) creates alternatives and solutions to such male-biased views.

A note about terminology is relevant here. Many ecofeminist philosophers distinguish between the oppression of women and the (unjustified) domination of nature. They do so on the grounds that only those beings that have such characteristics as rationality, cognitive capacity, or sentiency can be oppressed. In Western contexts, nonhuman natural entities such as rocks, plants, rivers, or (generically) nature are presumed to not have any such characteristics. As such, unlike women, they cannot be oppressed (although they can be unjustly dominated). What about nonhuman animals? Many ecofeminist philosophers include animals, especially domesticated animals, among those beings that are capable of being oppressed, but deny that nature has this capability. They talk about the oppression of animals (but not of nature). For purposes of this essay, the word “oppression” will not be applied to nature; its applicability to animals will be left an open question. Accordingly, for example, ecofeminist philosophical perspectives on women-nature connections will not refer to “the oppression of nature”, “the twin oppressions of women and nature,“ or “the mutually reinforcing oppressions of women and nature”. However, they will refer to the unjustified dominations of women, nonhuman animals, and nature.

3.2 Oppressive Conceptual Frameworks

A conceptual framework is a set of basic beliefs, values, attitudes, and assumptions that shape and reflect how one sees oneself and one's world (Warren 2000, 2005). Some conceptual frameworks are oppressive. An oppressive conceptual framework is one that functions to explain, maintain, and “justify” institutions, relationships and practices of unjustified domination and subordination. When an oppressive conceptual framework is patriarchal, it functions to justify the subordination of women by men.

Sexism, racism, classism, heterosexism, and ethnocentrism are examples of what Warren calls unjustified “isms of domination” (1990, 2000). Warren argues that these isms of domination share conceptual roots in five features of an oppressive conceptual framework. The first feature is value-hierarchical, Up-Down thinking that attributes greater value to that which is “Up” than to that which is “Down”. In canonical philosophy, value hierarchical thinking (typically) puts men Up and women Down, culture Up and nature Down. By attributing greater value to that which is higher, the Up-Down organization of reality serves to legitimate inequality “when, in fact, prior to the metaphor of Up-Down, one would have said only that there existed diversity” (Elizabeth Dodson Gray 1981: 20)

The second feature is oppositional (rather than complementary) and mutually exclusive (rather than inclusive) value dualisms, which place greater value (status, prestige) on one disjunct over the other. In canonical Western philosophy, the dualisms of male versus female and culture versus nature have historically done this; they have ascribed greater value to that which is identified with males or culture than to that which is identified with females or nature. According to these value dualisms, it is better to be male or culture-identified than to be female or nature-identified.

The third and fourth features of oppressive conceptual frameworks are that they conceive of power and privilege in ways that systematically advantage the Ups over the Downs (whether or not the Ups choose to exercise that power and privilege). In a classist society, wealthy people have the power and privilege to mobilize resources to self-determined ends. Sometimes this power and privilege enables the wealthy to not notice the ways socioeconomic status is a significant challenge to equality of opportunity. For example, poor people may be viewed as inferior, and thereby undeserving of the same opportunities or rights of the wealthy, often on the grounds that their poverty is “their own fault”.

The fifth and philosophically most important feature of an oppressive conceptual framework is the “logic of domination”. This is the moral premise that superiority justifies subordination. The logic of domination provides the (alleged) moral justification for keeping Downs down. Typically this justification takes the form that the Up has some characteristic (e.g., reason) that the Down lacks and by virtue of which the subordination of the Down by the Up is justified.

Note that it is possible to have the first four features of an oppressive conceptual framework yet not have a case of oppression or unjustified domination. For example, responsible parents may exercise legitimate power and privilege over their children (such as the power to decide when to put their child to bed or have the privilege to drive), without thereby being involved in any sort of oppressive parent-child relationship. Parent-child relationships are only oppressive if the logic of domination is in place; it is what provides the (alleged) justification for treating children as inferior and justifiably dominated.

Warren argues that the five features of an oppressive conceptual framework spotlight some of the shared conceptual roots of the unjustified dominations of women, nonhuman animals, and nature. Many ecofeminist philosophers explore the ways these shared conceptual roots function in real life to keep intact unjustified institutions and practices of oppression and domination.

3.3 Linguistic Perspectives

Ludwig Wittgenstein argues that the language one uses mirrors and reflects one's view of oneself and the world—one's conceptual framework. According to ecofeminist philosophers, language plays a key role in the formation of problematic concepts of women, animals, and nature—concepts that reinforce the five features of an oppressive conceptual framework and contribute to the “justification” of the dominations of women, animals, and nature. Consider some examples of how language does this.

The English language animalizes and naturalizes women in cultural contexts where women and nonhuman animals are already viewed as inferior to men and male-identified culture. Women are referred to pejoratively as dogs, cats, catty, pussycats, pussies, pets, bunnies, dumb bunnies, cows, sows, foxes, chicks, bitches, beavers, old bats, old hens, old crows, queen bees, cheetahs, vixen, serpents, bird-brains, hare-brains, elephants, and whales. Women cackle, go to hen parties, henpeck their husbands, become old biddies (old hens no longer sexually attractive or able to reproduce), and social butterflies. Animalizing women in a sexist (or, patriarchal) culture that views animals as inferior to “humans” reinforces and attempts to legitimate women's alleged inferior status to men (see Adams 1990; Joan Dunayer 1995; Warren 2000). Similarly, the English language feminizes nature in cultural contexts that view women and nature as inferior to men and male-identified culture. Mother Nature (not Father Nature) is raped, mastered, controlled, conquered, mined; her (not his) secrets are penetrated, and her womb (men don't have one) is put into the service of the man of science (not woman of science, or simply scientist). Virgin timber is felled, cut down. Fertile (not potent) soil is tilled, and land that lies fallow is useless or barren, like a woman unable to conceive a child.

In these examples, the exploitations of nature and animals are justified by feminizing (not masculinizing) them; the exploitation of women is justified by animalizing (not humanizing) and naturalizing (not “culturizing”) women. As Carol Adams argues (1990), language that feminizes nature and naturalizes women describes, reflects, and perpetuates unjustified patriarchal domination by failing to see the extent to which the dominations of women, nonhuman animals, and nature are culturally (not just metaphorically) analogous and sanctioned.

The point of these examples is not to claim that only females are denigrated by use of animal or nature language. That would be false. In the English language, animal terms also are used pejoratively against men. For example, men are called wolves, sharks, skunks, snakes, toads, jackasses, old buzzards, and goats. Nor is it to claim that all uses of animal or nature language are derogatory. That would also be false. In Western culture, it is generally complimentary to describe someone as busy as a bee, eagle-eyed, lion-hearted, or brave as a lion. Rather, the point is that, within patriarchal contexts, the majority of animal and nature terms used to describe women, and the majority of female terms used to describe animals and nature, function differently from the animal and nature terms used to describe men. Within a patriarchal context, they function to devalue women, animals, and nature in a way that reinforces the unjustified dominations of all three.

3.4 Historical Perspectives

Historical perspectives on the causes of the unjustified dominations of women and nature are conflicting and inconclusive. One of the earliest and most widely referenced is ecofeminist historian Carolyn Merchant's perspective (Merchant 1980). Merchant argues that the separation of culture from nature (or, the culture/nature dualism) is a product of the scientific revolution. She describes two conflicting images of nature: an older, Greek image of nature as organic, benevolent, nurturing female, and a newer, “modern” (1500–1800s) image of nature as inert, dead, and mechanistic. Merchant argues that the historical shift from an organic to a mechanistic model helped to justify the exploitation of the earth by conceiving of it as inert matter. For example, mining was prohibited in antiquity because it was thought to be “mining the earth's womb”; early Greek metaphors of nature as alive and “nurturing female” supported the view that mining was wrong. According to Merchant, a conception of nature as inert matter removed moral barriers to mining that were in place when nature was conceived as organic, nurturing female. For many ecofeminist philosophers, Merchant's historical perspective informs their analyses of the deep conceptual roots of the unjustified dominations of women and nature.

3.5 Socioeconomic Perspectives

According to Marxist-informed “materialist ecofeminism”, socioeconomic conditions are central to the interconnected dominations of women and nature (see Rosemary Hennessy and Chrys Ingraham 1997; Maria Mies and Vandana Shiva 1993; Ariel Salleh 1997). Mellor argues that while both men and women mediate between culture and nature, they do not do so equally. She argues against “capitalist patriarchy” by drawing on the Marxist notions of the means of production, which includes the raw materials, land and energy resources, and the forces of production, which includes the factories, machinery, technology, and accumulated skills of the workers. Mellor argues that the system of predominantly male ownership of the means and forces of production results in a male-biased allocation and distribution of a society's economic resources that systematically disadvantages women economically and exploits nature (Mellor 1997, 2000, 2005).

Socioeconomic conditions are also central to Vandana Shiva's account of Western development as “systematic underdevelopment” or “maldevelopment” (1988). Shiva argues that this maldevelopment began with European colonization throughout Asia and Africa; it resulted in the creation of cash-based economies that were modeled after Europe. The colonizers replaced native food crops and forests with such monoculture crops as sunflowers, eucalyptus, and teak, which were cash crops created primarily for export. In addition, the colonizers introduced a gendered division of labor, where men were employed in cash-based economic relationships with the colonizers and women were responsible for all the household duties associated with (non-money based) subsistence economies. By destroying subsistence economies, maldevelopment projects created material poverty where, before, there had been none. According to Shiva, it thereby contributed to the very real “feminization of poverty”, subordination of women, and degradation of nature.

3.6 Epistemological Perspectives

Ecofeminist epistemology extends feminist epistemology's concerns with ways that gender influences conceptions of knowledge, the knower, and methods of inquiry and justification (see the entry on feminist epistemology and philosophy of science). It does so by showing how these concerns involve women-nature connections.

Consider an example often discussed by ecofeminist philosophers. In 1974, twenty-seven women of Reni in northern India took simple but effective action to stop tree felling of indigenous forests. They threatened to hug the trees if the lumberjacks attempted to cut them down. The women's protest, known as “the Chipko Movement” (“chipko” in Hindi means “to embrace” or “hug”), saved 12,000 square kilometers of sensitive watershed. The Chipko movement also gave visibility to two main complaints of local people: commercial felling by contractors damages a wide variety of species of trees, and it replaces valuable, multispecies indigenous forests with monoculture plantations of teak and eucalyptus. This commercial felling also disproportionately harmed women by: increasing the amount of time women spent collecting firewood; reducing women's abilities to maintain household economies that are dependent upon trees for food, fuel, fodder, and products for the home; and, decreasing opportunities for women to make income-generating wood products for sale at local markets (Louise Fortmann and Diane Rocheleau 1985; Fortmann and John Bruce 1991).

The Chipko movement shows that often it is rural women (such as the Chipko women), not the “outside” Western-trained forester, who are the experts (“the knowers”) on how to use indigenous forests for multiple purposes (e.g., for food, fuel, fodder for cattle, dyes, herbs, medicines, building materials, and household utensils). Similarly, in Sierra Leone a study by feminist foresters revealed that, on the average, local men could name only eight different uses of local species of trees, while local women could name thirty-two uses of the same species of trees. The epistemological claim is that women of Sierra Leone have “indigenous technical knowledge” (ITK) about forest uses and production that is based on their daily, lived, gendered experiences in connection with forest use and management (Sally Fairfax and Fortmann 1990: 267). Their knowledge is borne from their situated, gendered, concrete, daily experiences as women.

An ecofeminist epistemology also shows that a gendered environmental perspective is important to understanding epistemological methods of inquiry and forms of justification concerning women and nature. Consider orthodox Western forestry. Too often it has assumed that activities that fall outside the realm of commercial fiber production are less important than those that fall inside that realm. Yet the latter are precisely the activities that rural women in many parts of Africa and India engage in on a daily basis. Failure to understand the importance of these activities often makes women “invisible”. This invisibility helps explains why many orthodox, Western foresters

literally do not see trees that are used as hedgerows or living fence poles; trees that provide materials for basketry, dyes, medicines, or decorations; trees that provide sites for honey barrels; trees that provide fodder; trees that have religious significance; trees that provide shade; or trees that provide human food.

Because many foresters literally do not see the enormous variety in the use of trees, they frequently do not see the vast number of species that are useful … that men and women may have very different uses for the same tree or may use different trees for different purposes. (Fairfax and Fortmann 1990: 268–9)

When Western foresters literally do not see these activities, they also do not see different methods women have for using different trees for different purposes. They do not see gendered environmental knowledge that is based on what local women do and know best.

These examples and data challenge canonical conceptions of knowledge as objective and of the knower as impartial, detached, and gender-neutral. They also challenge traditional research methodologies by encouraging researchers to situate themselves and their research projects within specific historical, cultural, and economic contexts. They also illustrate ways theory and practice are interdependent: theory must “fit the facts” and “the facts” (e.g., the empirical data) must inform the theory.

3.7 Political Perspectives

Feminist political philosophy critiques ways in which traditional understandings of the political world, including the nature of the public sphere, freedom, democracy, political speech, solidarity, and participation, fail to adequately address feminist concerns (see entry on feminist political philosophy). Ecofeminist political philosophy tends to expand these critiques to include ecologically informed visions for conceptualizing politics, political analyses, and the nature of democracy.

During the 1980s, women's activism in a variety of social movements—the environmental, peace, animal liberation, and environmental justice movements—came together and a new form of activism emerged, ecofeminist political activism. By the 1990s, this political activism had given rise to a diversity of ecofeminisms: liberal, Marxist, socialist, radical, cultural/spiritual, and social ecofeminisms. These different ecofeminisms are mentioned here because each is grounded in a different ecofeminist political perspective—liberalism, Marxism, socialism, radical feminism, indigenous and spiritual politics, anarchism, and social ecology. And each political perspective provides a different answer to questions about the nature of ecofeminist activism, green politics, and ecofeminism political philosophy.

Ariel Salleh, for example, claims that the basic premise of ecofeminist political analysis is that the ecological crisis

is the inevitable effect of a Eurocentric capitalist patriarchal culture built on the domination of nature, and domination of Woman ‘as nature’. Or, to turn the…equation around the other way, it is the inevitable effect of a culture constructed on the domination of women, and the domination of Nature, ‘as feminine’. (Salleh 1997: 12–13)

Catriona Sandilands' ecofeminist political perspective starts with

the premise that ecofeminism contains an inherently democratic vision…[that] needs to be located in the context of contemporary democratic theory. (Sandilands 1999: xvii)

Sandilands argues that traditional understandings of democracy, the public sphere, political speech, and coalition-building fail to adequately address the need for an ecologically informed democratic politics— an “ecological democracy”. For both Salleh and Sandilands, ecofeminist political analysis is not “politics as usual”; it is a gendered, ecologically informed perspective that uses its understanding of the unjustified dominations of women, animals and nature to reconceive notions of the public sphere, democracy, citizenship, and free speech.

Deane Curtin (1999) agrees that the environmental crisis is a crisis of citizenship and of traditional democracy. Unlike the sense of “democracy” that refers to culturally specific institutions created by Western liberalism, a feminist informed “ecological democracy” refers to a vision of democracy that recognizes that we all live in both cultural and ecological communities—in familiar, enduring, socially diverse relationships to people and places, culture and nature. Ecological communities are democratic when they are committed to reconciling culture with nature in ways appropriate to what it is to be an ecological citizen—one who exercises civic virtues that foster the health of all humans and the planet (see also Katherine Pettus 1997; Sherilyn MacGregor 2004).

There is a very different sort of ecofeminist political philosophy that is developing within Continental philosophy and phenomenology. It advances views of nature as a subject with agency, subjectivity, “voice”, and the ability to enter into political dialogue as co-interlocutor with humans. This approach to ecofeminist political theory deserves to be acknowledged, though it is not discussed further here (see Patricia Glazebrook 2001, 2008; Chaone Mallory 2008; Sandilands 1999, 2002).

3.8 Ethical Perspectives

“Ecofeminist philosophical ethics” (henceforth, “ecofeminist ethics”) is the sub-field of ecofeminist philosophy that has received the most scholarly attention. (It has already been discussed in connection with animal ethics, Leopold's land ethics, and deep ecology.) Ecofeminist ethics is a kind of feminist ethics. As such, it involves a twofold commitment to critique male bias in ethics wherever it occurs and to develop ethics that are not male-biased. As a feminist ethic, it also involves articulation of values (e.g., values of care, empathy, and friendship) often lost or underplayed in mainstream Western ethics. What makes its critiques of traditional ethical theories “ecofeminist” is that they focus on women-nature connections.

There is not one definition of ecofeminist ethics. However, there are some themes that run through ecofeminist ethics. These themes are about the nature of ecofeminist ethics generally, not about any particular ecofeminist ethic.

One theme is that ecofeminist ethics is a critique and elimination of time-honored, mutually exclusive value dualisms, especially the culture versus nature dualism. As Plumwood argues (Section 2.4), a rejection of the culture-nature dualism has implications for an ecofeminist conception of the self: humans are both individual selves that are distinct from nature and ecological selves that are continuous with nature (see also Mathews 1994b; Cuomo 2005).

A related second theme is that ecofeminist ontologies take selves to be

fundamentally relational, and therefore deeply social, historical, and ecological, without losing sight of the great ethical and political significance of individual experience, intentions and volitions. (Cuomo 2005: 203)

As Chris Cuomo argues, if one begins with the awareness that relational selves are interdependent selves, then “the stage is set to discuss the relationships between selves and others, and between community and individuality, without replicating inaccurate ideas about humans ” (2005: 203). Inaccurate views include those based only on positing human identity in terms of individual interests, autonomy, and separation from nature. Caring for oneself, for example, will involve more than protection of individual rights and liberties; it will also involve protection of the ecological well-being of others (including nature) with whom we are in relationship. For ecofeminist ethicists, relationships themselves, and not just the moral status of the relators in those relationships, have moral value and are subject to moral critique. This means that how humans are in relationship to others (including nature) matters morally.

A third theme is that ecofeminist ethics is (or at least aims to be) both inclusive and contextual: it views ethical discourse and practice as emerging from a diversity of “narratives” or “voices” (especially women's voices) of beings located in different historical and cultural circumstances. This contrasts with a view of ethical theory and discourse as imposed on situations as a derivation from some predetermined abstract rule or principle. The contextual inclusivity of ecofeminist ethics involves a shift in ethics from a monist focus on absolute ethical rules, principles, rights, and duties to a pluralist focus on a variety of values, rules, and principles in ethics, ethical decision-making, and ethical conduct.

A fourth theme is that ecofeminist ethics makes no attempt to provide an “objective” moral point of view, since it assumes that, in contemporary culture, there really is no such point of view. As such, it does not claim to be “unbiased” in the sense of gender-neutral. But it does assume that the gender bias it has is a better bias than those of other environmental ethics that do not recognize or include in their ethical theories anything about the varieties of women-nature connections that have been described in this essay.

These themes provide a general characterization of ecofeminist ethics. Consider now three kinds of positions in ecofeminist ethics that have not yet been addressed: care-focused ethics, environmental virtue ethics, and environmental justice ethics. Of these, the most widely defended positions in ecofeminist ethics are care-focused ethics (see, for example, Adams and Donovan 2008; Gruen 2011; Kheel 2007; Warren 2000).

Ecofeminist care-focused ethics hails back to the work of Carol Gilligan (1982); it often revolves around “the justice versus care debate” (see the section on care-focused approaches in the entry on feminist ethics). That debate was about two different perspectives: the “justice perspective” of canonical ethics, which emphasized individual rights and duties and appealed to universalizable rules (or principles), ascertainable through reason, for a morally assessment of human conduct; and the “care perspective”, which emphasizes such values as care and empathy that are neither reducible to individual rights or duties nor ascertained through appeal to ahistorical rules or principles.

As ecofeminist care-focused ethics matured, it included a defense of care and empathy as “moral emotions” that are necessary to ethics, ethical-decision making, and ethical conduct. It drew on the emerging body of research on “emotional intelligence”—a form of intelligence that is different from but connected to reason or “rational intelligence”—by cognitive psychologists, neuroscientists, and neurosurgeons (e.g., Daniel Goleman 1995). According to this research, “The intellect (rational mind) simply cannot work effectively without emotional intelligence” (Goleman 1995: 28). What we do and ought to do in life is determined by both. This research provides scientific evidence that those who are unable to empathize or care (e.g., because of damage to the part of the brain—the amygdala—where care and empathy reside) do not simply engage in bad ethical reasoning; they do not engage in ethical reasoning at all.

This research on emotional intelligence validated the care-focused nature of ecofeminist ethics (see Warren 2000). It affirmed, on scientific grounds, that the ability to care and empathize is necessary for ethical reasoning or practice; a failure to care about others (for example, to care about animal suffering or destruction of the planet) is a moral wrong. Humans are beings who can and must learn to care about the health or well being of others, including animals and nature.

A second kind of ecofeminist ethic is a version of environmental virtue ethics. Ecofeminist virtue ethics asks what a morally good or virtuous person would do, and which character traits, attitudes or dispositions a virtuous person would exhibit, in order to predispose the nonhuman natural environment to survive and “flourish” in a healthy way. Chris Cuomo (1998) defends a virtue-based “ethic of flourishing”. She argues that humans ought to act in ways that nurture and enhance the health and well being (or “flourishing”) of individuals, species, and communities, including ecological communities.

A third kind of ecofeminist ethic is environmental justice-focused ethics. This kind of ethic appeals to (mainly) distributive models of social justice to show why, for example, the disproportionate distribution of environmental harms to women and children (particularly poor women of color who are single heads of households with children under the age of eighteen) constitutes a social and environmental injustice. They focus on ways these harms are caused by such environmental problems as unsanitary water, the location of hazard waste sites, and environmental toxins (Gaard and Gruen 2005; Warren 2000).

4. Third Kind of Position in Feminist Environmental Philosophy: New or Emerging Positions and Perspectives

The scholarship in feminist environmental philosophy is expanding in a variety of novel ways. This expansion reveals a wide diversity in range of topics and theoretical perspectives beyond those discussed in this essay. Their mention here is intended mainly to identify and highlight some additional, and in some cases surprising, ways that feminist environmental philosophy is continuing to expand and unfold.

Some theoretical perspectives within feminist environmental philosophy (not mentioned before in this essay) that are emerging are:

  • ecofeminism as embodied materialism (Mellor 2005)
  • ecofeminist phenomenology (Glazebrook 2008)
  • ecofeminist pragmatism (Mary Jo Deegan and Christopher Podeschi 2001)
  • ecofeminist process philosophy (Christ 2006)
  • queer ecofeminism (Gaard 1998; Wendy Lynn Lee and Laura Dow 2001; Sandilands 1997; Catriona Mortimer-Sandilands and Bruce Erickson 2010)

The diversity of topics or areas of research for which an ecofeminist (or, feminist environmental) philosophical perspective is provided include the following:

  • business (Chris Crittenden 2000)
  • children and educational systems (Ruthanne Kurth-Schai 1997)
  • cities and the urban environment (Catherine Gardner 1999)
  • cloning and homophobia (Victoria Davion 2006)
  • death (Ophelia Selam 2006)
  • the digital environment (Julia Romberger 2004)
  • ecology (Warren 1987, 2000; Warren and Jim Cheney 1991)
  • environmental jurisprudence (Mallory 1999)
  • environmentally related consumption (Susan Dobscha 1993)
  • globalization (Heather Eaton 2000)
  • marketing (Pierre McDonagh and Andrea Prothero 1997)
  • rhetoric (Daniel Vakoch 2011)
  • sustainability and eco-sufficiency (Salleh 2009)
  • teaching literacy (Donald McAndrew 1996)
  • wheelchairs and disability (Alison Kafer 2005)
  • work and leisure (Karen Fox 1997, Sessions 1997)

The evolving scholarship also provides unique feminist environmental philosophical perspectives on many historical figures:

  • Theodor Adorno (D. Bruce Martin 2006 )
  • Alfred North Whitehead (Carol Christ 2006)
  • Charlotte Perkins Gilman (Deegan and Podeschi 2001)
  • Immanuel Kant (Wendy Wilson 1997)
  • Ludwig Wittgenstein (Wendy Lee-Lampshire 1996, 1997)
  • Martin Heidegger (Glazebrook 2001)
  • Mary Wollstonecraft (Sylvia Bowerbank 2003; Karen Green 1994)
  • Sigmund Freud (Green 1994)

This sampling of new or evolving perspectives in feminist environmental philosophy illustrates that feminist environmental philosophy is an expanding field of scholarship—one rich with possibilities of new ways of thinking about women, animals, and nature.


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