Johann Gottfried von Herder
Johann Gottfried von Herder (1744-1803) is a philosopher of the first importance. This claim depends largely on the intrinsic quality of his ideas (of which this article will try to give an impression). But another aspect of it is his intellectual influence. This has been immense both within philosophy and beyond it (much greater than is usually realized). For example, Hegel's philosophy turns out to be essentially an elaborate systematic development of Herderian ideas (especially concerning the mind, history, and God); so too does Schleiermacher's (concerning language, interpretation, translation, the mind, art, and God); Nietzsche is deeply influenced by Herder as well (concerning the mind, history, and values); so too is Dilthey (concerning history); even J.S. Mill has important debts to Herder (in political philosophy); and beyond philosophy, Goethe was transformed from being merely a clever but rather conventional poet into a great artist largely through the early impact on him of Herder's ideas.
Indeed, Herder can claim to have virtually established whole disciplines which we now take for granted. For example, it was mainly Herder (not, as is often claimed, Hamann) who established fundamental ideas concerning an intimate dependence of thought on language which underpin modern philosophy of language. It was Herder who, through the same ideas, through his recognition of deep variations in language and thought across historical periods and cultures, through his broad empirical approach to languages, and in other ways, inspired W. von Humboldt to found modern linguistics. It was Herder who developed modern interpretation-theory, or hermeneutics, in ways that would subsequently be taken over by Schleiermacher and then more systematically formulated by Schleiermacher's pupil Böckh. It was Herder who, by doing so, also contributed to establishing the methodological foundations of nineteenth-century German classical scholarship (which rested on the Schleiermacher-Böckh methodology), and hence of modern classical scholarship generally. It was Herder who did more than anyone else to establish the general conception and the interpretive methodology of our modern discipline of anthropology. Finally, Herder also made vital contributions to the progress of modern biblical scholarship.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. Philosophical Style
- 3. General Program in Philosophy
- 4. Philosophy of Language, Interpretation, and Translation
- 5. Role in the Birth of Linguistics and Anthropology
- 6. Philosophy of Mind
- 7. Aesthetics
- 8. Philosophy of History
- 9. Political Philosophy
- 10. Philosophy of Religion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
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Johann Gottfried von Herder (1744-1803) was born in Mohrungen in East Prussia. His father was a school teacher and he grew up in humble circumstances. In 1762 he enrolled at the University of Königsberg, where he studied with Kant, who accorded him special privileges because of his unusual intellectual abilities. At this period he also began a lifelong friendship with the irrationalist philosopher Hamann. In 1764 he left Königsberg to take up a school-teaching position in Riga. There he wrote the programmatic essay How Philosophy Can Become More Universal and Useful for the Benefit of the People (1765); published his first major work, on the philosophy of language and literature, the Fragments on Recent German Literature (1767-8); and also published an important work in aesthetics, the Critical Forests (1769). In 1769 he resigned his position and travelled — first to France, and then to Strasbourg, where he met, and had a powerful impact on, the young Goethe. In 1771 he won a prize from the Berlin Academy for his best-known work in the philosophy of language, the Treatise on the Origin of Language (published 1772). From 1771-6 he served as court preacher to the ruling house in Bückeburg. The most important work from this period is his first major essay on the philosophy of history, This Too a Philosophy of History for the Formation of Humanity (1774). In 1776, partly thanks to Goethe's influence, he was appointed General Superintendant of the Lutheran clergy in Weimar, a post he kept for the rest of his life. During this period he published an important essay in the philosophy of mind, On the Cognition and Sensation of the Human Soul (1778); a seminal work concerning the Old Testament, On the Spirit of Hebrew Poetry (1782-3); his well-known longer work on the philosophy of history, the Ideas for the Philosophy of History of Humanity (1784-91); an influential essay in the philosophy of religion, God. Some Conversations (1787); a work largely on political philosophy, written in response to the French Revolution, the Letters for the Advancement of Humanity (1793-7); a series of Christian Writings (1794-8) concerned with the New Testament; and two works opposing Kant's critical philosophy, the Metacritique (1799) (directed against the theoretical philosophy of the Critique of Pure Reason) and the Calligone (1800) (directed against the aesthetics of the Critique of Judgment). In addition to the works just mentioned, Herder also wrote many others during his career.
In certain ways Herder's philosophical texts are easier to read than others from the period. For example, he avoids technical jargon, writes in a manner that is lively and rich in examples rather than dry and abstract, and has no large, complex system for the reader to keep track of. But his texts also have certain peculiarities which can impede a proper understanding and appreciation of his thought, and it is important to be alerted to these.
To begin with, Herder's writing often seems emotional and grammatically undisciplined in ways that might perhaps be expected in casual speech but not in philosophical texts. This is intentional. Indeed, Herder sometimes deliberately “roughed up” material in this direction between drafts. When writing in this way he is in fact often using grammatical-rhetorical figures which can easily look like mere carelessness to an untutored eye but which receive high literary sanction from classical sources and are employed by him artfully (e.g. anacoluthon). Moreover, he has serious philosophical reasons for writing in this way rather than in the manner of conventional academic prose, including the following: (1) This promises to make his writing more broadly accessible and interesting to people — a decidedly non-trivial goal for him, since he believes it to be an essential part of philosophy's vocation to have a broad social impact. (2) One of his central theses in the philosophy of mind holds that thought is not and should not be separate from volition, or affect, that types of thinking which aspire to exclude affect are inherently distorting and inferior. Standard academic writing has this vice, whereas spontaneous speech, and writing which imitates it, do not. (3) Herder is opposed to any grammatical or lexical straightjacketing of language, any slavish obedience to grammar books and dictionaries. In Herder's view, such straightjacketing is inimical, not only to linguistic creativity and inventiveness, but also (and much worse), because thought is essentially dependent on and confined in its scope by language, thereby to creativity and inventiveness in thought itself.
Another peculiarity of Herder's philosophy is its unsystematic nature. This is again deliberate. For Herder is largely hostile towards systematicity in philosophy (a fact reflected both in explicit remarks and in many of his titles: Fragments … , Ideas … , etc.). He is in particular hostile to the ambitious sort of systematicity aspired to in the tradition of Spinoza, Wolff, Kant, Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel: the ideal of a comprehensive theory whose parts display some sort of strict overall pattern of derivation. He has compelling reasons for this hostility: (1) He is very skeptical that such systematic designs can be made to work (as opposed to creating, through illicit means, an illusion that they do so). (2) He believes that such system-building leads to a premature closure of inquiry, and in particular to the disregarding or distorting of new empirical evidence. Scrutiny of such systems amply bears out these concerns. Herder's well-grounded hostility to this type of systematicity established an important countertradition in German philosophy (which subsequently included e.g. F. Schlegel, Nietzsche, and Wittgenstein).
On the other hand, unlike his friend Hamann, Herder is in favor of “systematicity” in a more modest sense: the ideal of a theory which is self-consistent and maximally supported by argument. He by no means always achieves this ideal (interpreting him therefore calls for more selectivity and reconstruction than is the case with some philosophers). However, his failures to do so are frequently more apparent than real: First, in many cases where he may seem to be guilty of inconsistency he really is not. For he is often developing philosophical dialogues between two or more opposing viewpoints, in which cases it would clearly be a mistake to accuse him of inconsistency in any usual or pejorative sense. And (less obviously) in many other cases he is in effect still working in this dialogue-mode, only without bothering to distribute the positions among different interlocutors explicitly, and so is again really innocent of inconsistency (examples of this occur in How Philosophy and This Too). Moreover, he has serious motives for using this method of (implicit) dialogue: (1) Sometimes his motive is simply that when dealing with religiously or politically delicate matters it permits him to state his views but without quite stating them as his own and therefore without inviting trouble. But there are also philosophically deeper motives: (2) He takes over from the precritical Kant an idea (inspired by ancient skepticism) that the best way for the philosopher to pursue the truth is by setting contrary views on a subject into opposition with one another in order to advance towards, and hopefully attain, the truth through their mutual testing and modification. (3) Also, he develops a more original variant of that idea on the socio-historical plane: analogously, the way for humankind as a whole to attain the elusive goal of truth is through an ongoing contest between opposing positions, in the course of which the best ones will eventually win out (this idea anticipates, and inspired, a central thesis of J.S. Mill's On Liberty). This yields a further motive for the dialogue-method (even where it does not lead Herder himself to any definite conclusion), in effect warranting the rhetorical question, And what does it matter to the cause of humankind and its discovery of truth whether those various opposing positions are advanced by different people or by the same person? Second, Herder's appearance of neglecting to give arguments is often, rather, a principled rejection of arguments of certain sorts. For example, he has a general commitment to empiricism and against apriorism in philosophy which leads him to avoid familiar sorts of apriorist arguments in philosophy; and a commitment to non-cognitivism in ethics which leads him to refrain from familiar sorts of cognitivist arguments in ethics.
Hamann's influence on Herder's best thought has been greatly exaggerated by some of the secondary literature (e.g. Berlin). But Kant's was early, fundamental, and enduring. However, the Kant who influenced Herder in this way was the precritical Kant of the early and middle 1760's, not the critical Kant (against whom Herder later engaged in the — rather distracting and ineffective — public polemics of the Metacritique and the Calligone). Some of Kant's key positions in the 1760's, sharply contrasting with ones which he would later adopt in the critical period, were: a (Pyrrhonist-influenced) skepticism about metaphysics; a form of empiricism; and a (Hume-influenced) non-cognitivism in ethics. Herder took over these positions in the 1760's and retained them throughout his career. It should by no means be assumed that this debt to the early Kant is a debt to a philosophically inferior Kant, though; a good case could be made for the very opposite.
Herder's 1765 essay How Philosophy is a key text for understanding both his debt to Kant and the broad orientation of his philosophy. The essay was written under strong influence from Kant, especially, it seems, Kant's 1766 essay Dreams of a Spirit Seer, which Kant sent Herder prior to its publication.
Herder's essay answers a prize question set by a society in Bern: “How can the truths of philosophy become more universal and useful for the benefit of the people?” This question was conceived in the spirit of the Popularphilosophie that was competing with school-philosophy in the German-speaking world at the time. Kant himself tended to identify with Popularphilosophie at this period, and Herder's selection of this question shows him doing so as well, though in his case the identification would last a lifetime. Philosophy should become relevant and useful for the people as a whole — this is a basic ideal of Herder's philosophy.
Largely in the service of this ideal, Herder's essay argues in favor of two sharp turns in philosophy, turns which would again remain fundamental throughout the rest of his career. The first involves a rejection of traditional metaphysics, and closely follows an argument of Kant's in Dreams of a Spirit Seer. Herder's case is roughly this: (1) Traditional metaphysics, by undertaking to transcend experience (or strictly speaking, and a little more broadly, “healthy understanding,” which includes, in addition to empirical knowledge, also ordinary morality, intuitive logic, and mathematics), succumbs to unresolvable contradictions between claims, and hence to the Pyrrhonian skeptical problem of an equal plausibility on both sides requiring a suspension of judgment. Moreover (Herder goes on to add in the Fragments), given the truth of a broadly empiricist theory of concepts, much of the terminology of traditional metaphysics turns out to lack the basis in experience that is required in order even to be meaningful, and hence is meaningless (the illusion of meaningfulness arising through the role of language, which spins on, creating illusions of meaning, even after the empirical conditions of meaning have been left behind). (2) Traditional metaphysics is not only, for these reasons, useless; it is also harmful, because it distracts its adherents from the matters which should be their focus: empirical nature and human society. (3) By contrast, empirical knowledge (or strictly speaking, and a bit more broadly, “healthy understanding”) is free of these problems. Philosophy should therefore be based on and continuous with this.
Herder's second sharp turn concerns ethics. Here he is again indebted to the precritical Kant, but he also goes somewhat further beyond him. Herder's basic claims are these: (1) Morality is fundamentally more a matter of sentiments than of cognitions. (Herder's sentimentalism is not crude, however; in subsequent works such as the Critical Forests he emphasizes that cognition plays an important role in morality as well.) (2) Cognitivist theories of morality — of the sort espoused in this period by Rationalists such as Wolff, but also by many other philosophers before and since (e.g. Plato and the critical Kant) — are therefore based on a mistake, and so useless as means of moral enlightenment or improvement. (3) But (and here Herder's theory moves beyond Kant's), worse than that, they are actually harmful to morality, because they weaken the moral sentiments on which morality really rests. In This Too and On the Cognition Herder suggests several reasons why: (a) Abstract theorizing weakens sentiments generally, and hence moral sentiments in particular (this is perhaps Herder's least interesting reason). (b) The cognitivists' theories turn out to be so strikingly implausible that they bring morality itself into disrepute, people reacting to them roughly along the lines: If this is the best that even the experts can say in explanation and justification of morality, then morality must certainly be a sham, and I may as well ignore it and do as I please. (c) Such theories distract people from recognizing, and working to reinforce, the real foundations of morality: not an imaginary theoretical insight of some sort, but a set of causal mechanisms for inculcating and sustaining the moral sentiments. (4) More positively, Herder accordingly turns instead to discovering theoretically and promoting in practice just such a set of causal mechanisms. In How Philosophy he mainly emphasizes forms of education and an emotive type of preaching in this connection. But elsewhere he identifies and promotes a much broader set of mechanisms as well, including: the influence of morally exemplary individuals; morally relevant laws; and literature (along with other art forms). Literature is a special focus of Herder's theory and practice here. He sees literature as exerting a moral influence in several ways — e.g. not only through fairly direct moral instruction, but also through the literary perpetuation (or creation) of morally exemplary individuals (e.g. Jesus in the New Testament), and the exposure of readers to other people's inner lives and a consequent enhancement of their sympathies for them (a motive which lies behind Herder's epoch-making publication of the Volkslieder (1774), a collection of translations of popular songs from peoples around the world). Herder's development of this theory and practice of moral pedagogy was lifelong and tireless.
On the Origin from 1772 is Herder's best known work in the philosophy of language. However, it is in certain respects unrepresentative and inferior in comparison with other works, such as the Fragments and On the Cognition, and should not monopolize attention.
On the Origin is primarily concerned with the question whether the origin of language can be explained in purely natural, human terms or (as Süßmilch had recently argued) only in terms of a divine source. Herder argues in support of the former position and against the latter. His argument is quite persuasive (especially when supplemented on its positive side from the Fragments). But this argument is unlikely to constitute a modern philosopher's main reason for interest in Herder's views about language — deriving its zest, as it does, from a religious background that is, or should be, no longer ours.
Of far greater modern relevance are three related theories which Herder develops: a philosophy of language concerning the very nature of language, thought, and meaning; a theory of interpretation; and a theory of translation. These theories are found scattered through a large number of Herder's works. The following are their main features:
Philosophy of language: language, thought, meaning. Already in the mid-1760s — for example, in On Diligence in Several Learned Languages (1764) and the Fragments (1767-8) — Herder began advancing three fundamental theses in this area:
(1) Thought is essentially dependent on, and bounded in scope by, language — i.e. one can only think if one has a language, and one can only think what one can express linguistically. (To his considerable credit, Herder normally refrains from a more extreme, but philosophically untenable, version of this thesis, favored by some of his successors, which simply identifies thought with language, or with inner language.)
(2) Meanings or concepts are to be equated — not with the sorts of items, in principle autonomous of language, with which much of the philosophical tradition has equated them, e.g. the referents involved, Platonic forms, or empiricist ideas, but instead — with usages of words.
(3) Conceptualization is intimately bound up with (perceptual and affective) sensation. More precisely, according to what might be called Herder's quasi-empiricist theory of concepts, sensation is the source and basis of all our concepts, but we are able to achieve non-empirical concepts by means of a sort of metaphorical extension from the empirical ones — so that all of our concepts ultimately depend in one way or another on sensation. (On the Cognition contains one of Herder's clearer statements of this position.)
The first two of these theses dramatically overturned the sort of dualistic picture of the relation between language and thought/meaning that had predominated during the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries, and thereby essentially founded the philosophy of language as we still know it today. Hamann has often been credited with introducing something like these two revolutionary theses and then passing them on to Herder (e.g. by Berlin). But that is a mistake; Herder was already committed to them in the mid-1760's, Hamann only much later and under Herder's influence. The third thesis, quasi-empiricism, would be far less widely accepted by philosophers today. However, it may very well be correct too (contrary to first appearances, it need not conflict with thesis (2), the equation of meanings with word-usages; and the most likely modern ground for skepticism about it, a Fregean-Wittgensteinian anti-psychologism concerning meaning that is popular today, may well be mistaken). In addition to making a fundamental contribution to the philosophy of language, these three theses also underpin Herder's theories of interpretation and translation (as we are about to see).
Theory of interpretation. Herder's theory of interpretation rests on (and also in a way supports) a certain epoch-making insight:
(1) Whereas such eminent Enlightenment philosopher-historians as Hume and Voltaire had still believed that, as Hume put it, “mankind are so much the same in all times and places that history informs us of nothing new or strange,” Herder discovered, or at least saw more clearly than anyone before him, that this was false, that peoples from different historical periods and cultures often vary tremendously in their concepts, beliefs, (perceptual and affective) sensations, and so forth. He also noted that similar, albeit usually less dramatic, variations occur even between individuals within a single period and culture. (These two positions are prominent in many of Herder's works, including e.g. On the Change of Taste (1766) and On the Cognition.) Let us call this twofold principle the principle of radical difference.
(2) Given this principle of radical difference, and the gulf that consequently often initially divides an interpreter's own thought from that of the person he wants to interpret, interpretation is often an extremely difficult task, requiring extraordinary efforts on the part of the interpreter. (Note that, to his credit, Herder does not draw the more extreme — and misguided — conclusion to which some recent philosophers have been tempted that it would be impossible.)
(3) In particular, the interpreter often faces, and needs to resist, a temptation falsely to assimilate the thought which he is interpreting to someone else's, especially his own. (This theme is prominent in This Too, for example.)
How, given these challenges, is the interpreter supposed to achieve accurate interpretation? Herder makes several points in this connection:
(4) His three above-mentioned theses in the philosophy of language undergird his whole theory of interpretation and entail certain aspects of the answer to the question just posed. It is an implication of his thesis that all thought is essentially dependent on and bounded by language that an interpreted subject's language is in a certain sense bound to be a reliable indicator of the nature of his thought, so that the interpreter need not have worries about the interpreted subject entertaining ineffable thoughts or thoughts whose character is systematically distorted by his expression of them in language. It is an implication of Herder's thesis that meaning consists in word-usage that interpretation essentially and fundamentally requires pinning down an interpreted subject's word-usages, and thereby his meanings. Finally, it is an implication of Herder's quasi-empiricist thesis concerning concepts that an interpreter's understanding of an interpreted subject's concepts must involve somehow recapturing their basis in the interpreted subject's sensation.
Herder also espouses three further basic principles in interpretation-theory which contribute to answering the question posed above:
(5) A principle of secularism in interpretation: Contrary to a practice that was still common in Herder's day in relation to the Bible, the interpretation of texts must never rely on religious assumptions or means, even when the texts are sacred ones, but must instead rely only on secular ones. (Herder already advances this principle forcefully in works from the 1760's.)
(6) A principle of generic interpretation. In addition to the nature of a work's meanings, interpretation must also pay close attention to the nature of its genre (i.e. roughly, a set of general purposes and rules which it aims to realize). As in the case of meanings, genres vary from age to age, culture to culture, and even individual to individual, and the interpreter therefore faces, and needs to resist, constant temptations falsely to assimilate a work's genre to other ones with which he is more familiar (e.g. Shakespearean “tragedy” to Sophoclean “tragedy,” or vice versa). (This principle is already prominent in works from the 1760's, but finds its classic statement in the essay Shakespeare from 1773.)
(7) A principle of methodological empiricism in interpretation: interpretation must always be based on, and kept strictly faithful to, exact observations of relevant linguistic (and other) evidence. (This principle is again already prominent in the 1760's, e.g. in the Fragments and On Thomas Abbt's Writings (1768).)
Beyond this, though, Herder also advances a further set of interpretive principles which are liable to sound much more “touchy-feely” at first hearing (the first of them rather literally so!), but which are in fact on the contrary quite “hard-nosed”:
(8) Herder proposes (e.g. prominently in This Too) that the way to bridge radical difference when interpreting is through Einfühlung, “feeling one's way in.” This proposal has often been thought (e.g. by Meinecke) to mean that the interpreter should perform some sort of psychological self-projection onto texts. However, that is emphatically not Herder's idea — for that would amount to just the sort of distorting assimilation of the thought in a text to one's own which he is above all concerned to avoid. As can be seen from This Too, what he has in mind is instead an arduous process of historical-philological inquiry. What, though, more specifically, is the cash value of his metaphor of Einfühlung? It has at least five components, and they are quite various in nature: (a) Note, first, that the metaphor implies (once again) that the interpreter typically faces radical difference, a gulf, between his own mentality and that of the interpreted subject, making interpretation a difficult, laborious task (it implies that there is an “in” there that the interpreter must carefully and laboriously “feel his way into”). (b) It also implies more specifically (This Too shows) that the “feeling one's way in” should include thorough research not only into a text's use of language but also into its historical, geographical, and social context. (c) It also implies a claim — based on Herder's quasi-empiricist theory of concepts — that in order to understand an interpreted subject's language the interpreter must achieve an imaginative reproduction of his (perceptual and affective) sensations. (d) It also implies (This Too again shows) that hostility in an interpreter towards the people he interprets will generally distort his interpretation, and must therefore be avoided (note, though, that Herder is equally opposed to excessive identification with them for the same reason). (e) Finally, it also implies that the interpreter should strive to develop his grasp of linguistic usage, contextual facts, and relevant sensations to the point where it achieves something like the same immediacy and automaticness that it had for a text's original author and audience when they understood the text in light of such things (so that it acquires for him, as it had for them, the phenomenology more of a feeling than a cognition).
(9) In addition, Herder insists (e.g. in the Critical Forests) on a principle of holism in interpretation. This principle rests on several motives, including the following: (a) Pieces of text taken in isolation are typically ambiguous in various ways (in relation to background linguistic possibilities). In order to resolve such ambiguities, one needs the guidance provided by surrounding text. (b) That problem arises once a range of possible linguistic meanings, etc. is established for a piece of text. But in the case of a text separated from the interpreter by radical difference, knowledge of such a range itself presents a problem. How, for example, is he to pin down the range of possible meanings, i.e. possible usages, for a word? This requires a collation of the word's actual uses and an inference from these to the rules that govern them, i.e. to their usages, a collation which in turn requires looking to remoter contexts in which the same word occurs (other parts of the text, other works in the author's corpus, works by other contemporaries, etc.), or in short: holism. (c) Authors typically write a work as a whole, conveying ideas not only in its particular parts but also through the way in which these fit together to make up a whole (whether in instantiation of a general genre or in a manner more specific to the particular work). Consequently, readings which fail to interpret the work as a whole will miss essential aspects of its meaning — both the ideas in question themselves and meanings of the particular parts on which they shed important light.
(10) In On Thomas Abbt's Writings, On the Cognition, and elsewhere Herder makes one of his most important innovations: interpretation must supplement its focus on word-usage with attention to authorial psychology. Herder implies several reasons for this: (a) As already mentioned, he embraces a quasi-empiricist theory of concepts which implies that in order to understand an author's concepts an interpreter must imaginatively recapture his relevant sensations. (b) As Quentin Skinner has recently emphasized, understanding the linguistic meaning of an utterance or text is only a necessary, not a sufficient, condition for understanding it tout court — one needs, in addition, to establish the author's illocutionary intentions. For example, I meet a stranger by a frozen lake who tells me, “The ice is thin over there”; I understand his linguistic meaning perfectly; but is he simply informing me?, warning me?, threatening me?, joking? … (c) Skinner tends to imply that one can determine linguistic meanings prior to establishing authorial intentions. That may sometimes be so (e.g. in the example just given). But is it generally? Herder implies not. And this seems right, because commonly the linguistic meaning of a formula is ambiguous (in terms of background linguistic possibilities), and in order to identify the relevant meaning one must turn, not only (as already mentioned) to larger bodies of text, but also to hypotheses, largely derived therefrom, concerning the author's intentions (e.g. concerning the subject-matter he intends to treat). This is a further reason why interpreters must invoke psychology. (d) Herder also (as already mentioned) implies that an author often conveys ideas in his work, not explicitly in its verbal expressions, but rather via these and the way in which they are put together to form a textual whole (whether in instantiation of a general genre or in a manner more specific to the particular text). It is necessary for the interpreter to capture these ideas, both for their own sakes and because doing so is frequently essential for resolving ambiguities at the level of particular verbal expressions. (e) Herder also refers to the second limb of his doctrine of radical difference — individual variations in mode of thought even within a single period and culture — as a source of the need for psychological interpretation. Why does any special need arise here? Part of the answer seems to be that when one is dealing, for example, with a concept that is distinctive of a particular author rather than common to a whole culture, one typically faces a problem of relative paucity and lack of contextual variety in the actual uses of the word available as empirical evidence from which to infer the rule for use, or usage, constitutive of its meaning. Hence one needs extra help — and the author's general psychology may provide this.
(11) In On Thomas Abbt's Writings, On the Cognition, and elsewhere Herder also indicates that interpretation, especially in its psychological aspect, requires the use of divination. This is another principle which is liable to sound disturbingly “touchy-feely” at first hearing — in particular, it can sound as though Herder means some sort of prophetic process that has a religious basis and is perhaps even infallible. However, what he really has in mind here is (far more sensibly) a process of hypothesis, based on meager empirical evidence, but also going well beyond it, and therefore vulnerable to subsequent falsification, and abandonment or revision if falsified.
Finally, Herder also makes an important additional point concerning the general nature of interpretation:
(12) After Herder, the question was raised whether interpretation was a science or an art. Herder does not explicitly address this question. But his strong inclination would clearly be to say that it is like rather than unlike natural science (pace a popular reading in the German secondary literature, developed especially by Irmischer, which sees him as a sort of proto-Gadamer). He has several reasons for this inclination: (a) He assumes (as did virtually everyone at this period) that the meaning of an author's text is as much an objective matter as the subjects addressed by the natural scientist. (b) The difficulty of interpretation which results from radical difference, and the consequent need for a methodologically subtle and laborious approach to interpretation in many cases, make for further points of similarity between interpretation and natural science. (c) The essential role of “divination,” qua hypothesis, in interpretation constitutes a further point of similarity between interpretation and natural science. Moreover, (d) even the subject-matter of interpretation is not, in Herder's view, sharply different from that dealt with by natural science: the latter investigates physical processes in nature in order to determine the forces that underlie them, but similarly interpretation investigates human verbal (and non-verbal) physical behavior in order to determine the forces that underlie it (Herder explicitly identifying mental conditions, including conceptual understanding, as “forces”).
Herder's theory of interpretation had an enormous beneficial impact on subsequent hermeneutics. His theory was taken over almost in its entirety by Schleiermacher in the latter's much more famous hermeneutics lectures, delivered during the first third of the nineteenth century. Admittedly, Schleiermacher's theory is also directly influenced by sources which he shares with Herder, especially Ernesti. However, such fundamental and famous positions in it as his supplementing of “linguistic” with “psychological” interpretation and his identification of “divination” as the method pertaining especially to the latter are due entirely to Herder. Moreover, where Herder and Schleiermacher do occasionally disagree on issues concerning interpretation, Herder's position almost always turns out to be philosophically superior on close inspection. By decisively influencing Schleiermacher's hermeneutic theory Herder also exercised an indirect decisive influence on the hermeneutic theory of Schleiermacher's greatest pupil Böckh, whose Encyclopedia and Methodology of the Philological Sciences (1877) essentially reproduced Schleiermacher's theory with only modest elaborations, and became the standard methodological work for classical scholars. Moreover, Böckh's most significant departure from Schleiermacher's theory, his supplementing of the aspects of interpretation which Schleiermacher had already distinguished with generic interpretation, in effect simply takes up and incorporates the strong emphasis that Herder had already placed on this.
Theory of translation. The following are some key theses concerning translation which Herder already developed in the Fragments of 1767-8, and which would subsequently have an enormous beneficial impact on both the theory and practice of translation in Germany:
(1) Translation faces a deep challenge due to the fact that there exist radical mental differences — including in particular, conceptual differences — between different historical periods and cultures, and even to some extent between individuals within a single period and culture.
(2) Consequently, translation is in many cases an extremely difficult undertaking.
(3) Consequently again, translation commonly confronts a choice between two possible approaches: what Herder calls a “lax” approach (i.e. one in which the language and thought of the target text are allowed to diverge rather freely from those of the source text) and an “accommodating” approach (i.e. one in which the language and thought of the target text are made to accommodate to those of the source text).
(4) Herder firmly rejects the former approach, largely because it entails sacrificing semantic faithfulness (arguably the most fundamental and commonly accepted goal of translation).
(5) He in particular rejects a certain rationale for it which Dryden and others had advocated, namely that a translation should provide the work that the author would have written had his native language not been the one he actually had but instead the target language. Herder objects to this that in such a case as that of translating Homer, for example, the author could not have written his work in the modern target language.
(6) So Herder urges that the translator should instead err in the other direction, towards “accommodating.”
But how is this to be achieved?
(7) One necessary means to achieving it which Herder identifies is interpretive expertise in the translator. So Herder requires this.
(8) Another, and much less obvious, means is a certain vitally important technique which Herder develops for overcoming conceptual discrepancies between the source language and the target language. That might seem simply impossible (indeed, some recent philosophers, such as Donald Davidson, have mistakenly assumed that it would be). But Herder, drawing on his novel philosophy of language, finds a solution: Since meanings or concepts are word-usages, in order to reproduce (or at least optimally approximate) in the target language a concept from the source language which the target language currently lacks, the translator should take the most closely corresponding word in the target language and “bend” its usage for the course of the translation in such a way as to make it mimic the usage of the source word. This technique essentially requires that the source word be translated uniformly throughout its multiple occurrences in a work (and that the single target word chosen not be used to translate any other source words). Such an approach is far from being a commonplace in translation practice, so far indeed that it is rarely actually found in translations. However, Herder scrupulously uses it in his own translations, as does an important subsequent tradition which has followed him in espousing it (including Schleiermacher, Rosenzweig, and Buber).
(9) Herder is well aware that using this “bending” approach will inevitably make for translations which are more difficult to read than those that can be produced by a more “lax” method (e.g. by using multiple words in the target language to translate a single word in the source language). However, he considers this price worth paying in order to achieve maximal semantic accuracy.
(10) Another key means which Herder espouses is to complement the goal of semantic faithfulness with that of faithfulness to the musical form of a literary work (e.g. meter and rhyme). His motives for doing this are partly extra-semantic: in particular, aesthetic fidelity, and fidelity to the exact expression of feelings which is effected by means of a literary work's musical features. But they are also in part semantic: in his view, musical form and semantic content are strictly inseparable, so that fully realizing even the goal of semantic faithfulness in fact requires that a translation also be faithful to the work's musical form. Why does Herder believe that form and content are inseparable in this way? He has two main reasons: First, musical forms often carry their own meanings (think, for example, of the humorous and bawdy connotations of the meter/rhyme-scheme of a limerick). Second, as was recently mentioned, Herder believes that musical form is essential to an exact expression of feelings; but, as we saw earlier, he also thinks that feelings are internal to meanings (this is the force of his quasi-empiricism in the philosophy of language); so that reproducing a work's musical form in translation turns out to be essential even for accurately conveying the meanings of its words and statements in translation.
(11) In addition to being necessary in order to achieve as fully as possible translation's traditional fundamental goal of exactly reproducing meaning (as well as aesthetic fidelity and fidelity in the expression of feelings), the sort of “accommodating” translation that has just been explained is also necessary, in Herder's view, in order to achieve certain further important goals. One of these lies in a potential that translation has for enriching the target language (both conceptually and in musical forms). Herder argues convincingly that, in contrast to “accommodating” translation, “lax” translation forgoes this opportunity.
(12) Another of these further goals lies in expressing, and cultivating in the translation's readership, a cosmopolitan respect for the Other — something which requires that the translation reproduce the Other's meanings (and musical forms) as accurately as possible.
(13) Herder holds that the preferred “accommodating” sort of translation requires the translator to be in a sense a “creative genius,” i.e. skilled and creative enough to satisfy the heavy demands which this sort of translation imposes on him, in particular creative enough to invent the needed novel conceptual and musical forms in the target language.
(14) Despite his commitment to the central importance of this sort of translation (largely, as we have seen, due to its necessity for achieving translation's traditional fundamental goal of faithfully reproducing meaning), Herder is also in the end quite liberal about the forms that translation (or interlinguistic transfer more generally, including for example what he distinguishes from “translation [Übersetzung]” proper as “imitation [Nachbildung]”) can legitimately take, allowing that its possible forms are quite various, and that which is most appropriate in a particular case will depend largely on the author or genre in question and on the translator's purposes.
Herder's theory of translation (as just summarized), and his demonstration of its viability in practice, for example in his sample translations of Shakespeare in the Volkslieder, had an enormous beneficial impact on a whole generation of German translation theorists and practitioners — including Voss (the great translator of Homer), A.W. Schlegel (the translation theorist, and great translator of Shakespeare), Goethe (an important theorist of translation), W. von Humboldt (a significant translator and theorist of translation), and Schleiermacher (an important theorist of translation, and Germany's great translator of the Platonic dialogues). Herder's principle of complementing semantic faithfulness with faithfulness in the reproduction of musical form had an especially powerful impact on these successors. His principle of “bending” word-usages in order to cope with conceptual incommensurabilities was less widely followed, but was adopted by Schleiermacher among others.
Herder's philosophies of language, interpretation, and translation certainly owe significant debts to predecessors — for example, his philosophy of language is indebted to Leibniz and Wolff, his theory of interpretation to Ernesti, and his theory of translation to Abbt. However, even his borrowings incorporate important refinements, and his overall contribution is enormous.
Herder's philosophies of language and interpretation made an important contribution to the birth of two whole academic disciplines which we today take for granted. Through emphasizing thought's essential dependence on and bounding by language, the radically different forms of thought supported by different languages, the need for a rigorously empirical approach to the investigation of such differences, and in other ways, Herder made a fundamental contribution to the birth of modern linguistics. That birth occurred above all in two thinkers who were both profoundly influenced by Herder: F. Schlegel, whose main work in this connection is his On the Language and Wisdom of the Indians (1808), and W. von Humboldt, whose main work in this connection is his The Diversity of Human Language Structures and Its Influence on the Mental Development of Mankind (1836). Schlegel and von Humboldt were in particular both fundamentally motivated by the Herder-inspired insight that because of thought's essential dependence on and bounding by language and the radically different ways of thinking supported by different languages, the empirical study of languages can afford a sort of window onto the radically different ways of thinking in question.
Less obviously, but no less importantly, Herder's theories about language and interpretation (together with his distinctive values, especially the pluralistic cosmopolitanism discussed later in this article) also played a fundamental role in the birth of modern anthropology. Several of Herder's writings, especially the 10th Collection of the Letters, contain a virtual blueprint for that future discipline. His specific contributions were many and deep; but they include, for example, his principle of radical difference, his principle of thought's essential dependence on and bounding by language, and his principle of holistic interpretation. The channels through which his contributions influenced the development of the discipline include the following. Franz Boas, the father of American anthropology, was German by birth and education, and had his intellectual roots in the German tradition, including not only Herder himself (whom he sometimes mentions by name) but also other Germans who were either directly or indirectly influenced by Herder in profound ways, such as W. von Humboldt, Steinthal, Bastian, Dilthey, and W. Wundt. Through Boas, this intellectual inheritance was passed on to his students in American anthropology (including Sapir, Lowie, Kroeber, Benedict, and Mead), and then to their students. On the other side of the Atlantic, Bronislaw Malinowski, the father of modern British anthropology as a discipline grounded in intensive fieldwork, had deep German intellectual roots that lead back to Herder as well. Malinowski sometimes explicitly mentions Herder and Herder's follower W. von Humboldt in a positive way. But that is only the tip of the iceberg. Malinowski's father, who held the chair in Slavonic philology at the same university Malinowski attended in Poland, was a German-trained expert in philology and comparative grammar with a special interest in collecting folksongs and folklore — an intellectual profile which immediately places him under Herder's sphere of influence. Also, Malinowski himself studied in Leipzig with W. Wundt, the author of the massive work Völkerpsychologie (1900-9), and even began writing a dissertation there on Völkerpsychologie. Now Wundt's work has deep Herderian roots. The discipline of Völkerpsychologie had originally been founded by Lazarus and Steinthal under the influence of Herder and W. von Humboldt. And it would hardly be an exaggeration to say that Wundt's work is essentially just a sort of grand re-writing of Herder's Ideas. In short, Malinowski was deeply steeped in Herder's influence. He subsequently passed on his Herderian intellectual legacy to his students in British anthropology (including Evans-Pritchard, Firth, and Leach).
In On the Cognition of 1778 and elsewhere Herder also develops an extremely interesting and influential position in the philosophy of mind. The following are some of its central features.
Herder's position is uncompromisingly naturalistic and anti-dualistic in intent. In On the Cognition he tries to erase the traditional sharp division between the mental and the physical in two specific ways: First, he advances a theory that minds consist in forces [Kräfte] which manifest themselves in people's bodily behavior — just as physical nature contains forces which manifest themselves in the behavior of bodies. (The general notion of mental “forces” was not entirely new with Herder, but can already be found before him in Rationalists such as Wolff and Süßmilch.) He is officially agnostic on the question of what force is, except for conceiving it as something apt to produce a type of bodily behavior, and as a real source thereof (not merely something reducible thereto). This, strictly speaking, frees his theory from some common characterizations and objections (e.g. vitalism). But it also leaves it with enough content to have great virtues over rival theories: (1) The theory ties mental states conceptually to corresponding types of bodily behavior — which seems correct, and therefore marks a point of superiority over dualistic theories, and indeed over mind-brain identity theories as well. (2) On the other hand, the theory also avoids reducing mental states to bodily behavior — which again seems correct, in view of such obvious facts as that we can be, and indeed often are, in particular mental states that happen to receive no behavioral manifestation, and which hence marks a point of superiority over outright behaviorist theories.
Second, Herder also tries to explain the mind in terms of the phenomenon of irritation [Reiz], a phenomenon which had recently been identified by Haller, and which is paradigmatically exemplified by muscle fibers contracting in response to direct physical stimuli and relaxing upon their removal — in other words, a phenomenon which, while basically physiological, also seems to exhibit a transition to mental characteristics. There is an ambiguity in Herder's position here: Usually, he wants to resist physicalist reductionism, and so would resist saying that irritation is purely physiological and fully constitutes mental states. However, in the 1775 draft of On the Cognition and even in some parts of the published version this is his position. And from a modern standpoint, this is arguably a further virtue of his account (though we would certainly today want to recast it in terms of different, and more complex, physiological processes than irritation).
This second line of thought might seem at odds with the first one (forces). But it need not be. For, given Herder's official agnosticism about what forces are, it could, so to speak, fill in the “black box” of the hypothesized real forces, namely in physicalist terms. In other words, it turns out (not as a conceptual matter, but as a contingent one) that the real forces in question consist in physiological processes.
Herder's philosophy of mind also advances a thesis that the mind is a unity, that there is no sharp division between its faculties. This thesis contradicts theorists such as Sulzer and Kant. However, it was not in itself new with Herder, having already been central to Rationalism, especially Wolff. Where Herder (together with Hamann) is more original is in rejecting the Rationalists' reduction of sensation and volition to cognition; establishing the unity thesis in an empirical rather than apriorist way; and adding a normative dimension to it — this is not only how the mind is but also how it ought to be. This last feature can sound incoherent, since if the mind is this way by its very nature, what sense can there be in prescribing to people that it should be so rather than otherwise? However, Herder's idea is in fact the coherent one that, while the mind is indeed this way by its very nature, people sometimes behave as though one faculty could be abstracted from another, and try to effect that, and this then leads to various malfunctions, and should therefore be avoided.
Herder's overall thesis of the mind's unity rests on three more specific doctrines concerning intimate mutual involvements between mental faculties, and malfunctions that arise from striving against these, doctrines which are in large part empirically motivated and hence lend the overall thesis a sort of empirical basis:
A first concerns the relation between thought and language: Not only does language of its very nature express thought (this is an uncontroversial point), but also (as noted earlier) for Herder thought is dependent on and bounded by language. Herder bases this further claim largely on empirical grounds (e.g. concerning how children's thought develops in step with language acquisition). The normative aspect of his position here is that attempts (in the manner of some metaphysics, for example) to cut language free from the constraints of thought or vice versa lead to nonsense.
A second area of intimate mutual involvement concerns cognition and volition, or affects. The claim that volition is and should be based on cognition is not particularly controversial. But Herder also argues the converse, that all cognition is and should be based on volition, on affects — and not only on such relatively anemic ones as the impulse to know the truth, but also on much less anemic ones. He is especially concerned to combat the idea that theoretical work in philosophy or the sciences is or should be detached from volition, from affects. In his view, it never really is even when it purports to be, and attempts to make it so merely impoverish and weaken it. His grounds for this whole position are again mainly empirical in nature.
A third area of intimate mutual involvement concerns thought and sensation. Conceptualization and belief, on the one hand, and sensation, on the other, are intimately connected according to Herder. Thus, he advances the quasi-empiricist theory of concepts mentioned earlier, which entails that all our concepts (and hence also all our beliefs) ultimately depend in one way or another on sensation. But conversely, he also argues (anticipating much important twentieth-century work in philosophy) that there is a dependence in the other direction as well, that the character of our sensations depends on our concepts and beliefs. Normatively, he sees attempts to violate this interdependence as inevitably leading to intellectual malfunction — e.g., as has already been mentioned, he thinks that metaphysicians' attempts to cut entirely free from the empirical origin of our concepts lead to meaninglessness. His grounds for this whole position are again largely empirical in character.
In a further seminal move which Herder makes in the philosophy of mind he argues that (linguistic) meaning is fundamentally social — so that thought and other aspects of human mental life (since these are essentially articulated in terms of meanings), and therefore also the very self (since this is essentially dependent on thought and other aspects of human mental life, and moreover defined in its specific identity by theirs), are so too. Herder's version of this position seems to be intended only as an empirically-based causal claim. It has since fathered a long tradition of attempts to generate more ambitious arguments for stronger versions of the claim that meaning — and hence also thought and the very self — is at bottom socially constituted (e.g. by Hegel, Wittgenstein, Kripke, Burge, and Brandom). However, it may well be that these more ambitious arguments and versions do not work, and that Herder's version is exactly what should be accepted.
Herder also, in tension though not contradiction with this principle of sociality, holds that (even within a single period and culture) human minds are as a rule deeply individual, deeply different from each other — so that in addition to a generalizing psychology we also need a psychology oriented to individuality. This is an important idea which has strongly influenced many subsequent continental thinkers (e.g. Schleiermacher, Nietzsche, Proust, Sartre, and Manfred Frank). Herder advances it only as an empirical rule of thumb. By contrast, a prominent strand in Schleiermacher and Frank purports to establish it as an a priori universal truth. However, Herder's version is again arguably the more plausible one.
Finally, like predecessors in the Rationalist tradition and Kant, Herder sharply rejects the Cartesian idea of the mind's self-transparency — instead insisting that much of what occurs in the mind is unconscious, so that self-knowledge is often deeply problematic. This is another compelling position which has had a strong influence on subsequent thinkers.
This whole Herderian philosophy of mind certainly owes much to predecessors, especially ones in the Rationalist tradition. But it is in many ways original. The theory is important in its own right. And it exercised an enormous influence on successors (e.g. on Hegel in connection with anti-dualism, the role of physical behavior in mental conditions, faculty-unity, and the sociality of meaning, thought, and self; on Schleiermacher in connection with anti-dualism and faculty-unity; and on Nietzsche in connection with the interdependence of cognition and volition, or affects, the individuality of the mind and the consequent need for an individualistic psychology, and the mind's lack of self-transparency).
In the Critical Forests (1769, though the important fourth part was not published until the middle of the nineteenth century) Herder initially set out to argue for the following aesthetic theory: whereas music is a mere succession of objects in time, and sculpture and painting are merely spatial, poetry has a sense, a soul, a force; whereas music, sculpture, and painting belong solely to the senses (to hearing, feeling, and vision, respectively), poetry not only depends on the senses but also relates to the imagination; whereas music, sculpture, and painting employ only natural signs, poetry uses voluntary and conventional signs. This theory was subsequently taken over (with only minor modifications) by Schleiermacher in his aesthetics lectures, and it has sometimes been touted as Herder's main achievement in aesthetics (e.g. by Norton). But it is a naive theory, and Herder's real achievements in aesthetics are other than and contrary to it.
As discussed earlier, Herder's philosophy of language is committed to the two doctrines that thought is essentially dependent on and bounded by language, and that meaning is word-usage. This invites certain questions: These doctrines plausibly break with an Enlightenment assumption that thought and meaning are in principle autonomous of whatever material, perceptible expressions they may happen to receive. Following Charles Taylor, we might call such a move one to “expressivism.” But what form should expressivism take exactly? Is the dependence of thought and meaning on external symbols strictly one on language (in the usual sense of “language”)? Or is it not rather a dependence on a broader range of symbolic media including, besides language, also such things as painting, sculpture, and music — so that a person might be able to entertain thoughts which he was not able to express in language but only in some other symbolic medium? Let us call the former position narrow expressivism and the latter broad expressivism.
Also, is Herder's own position narrow expressivism or broad expressivism? It might seem at first sight that his two doctrines themselves already answer this question in favor of narrow expressivism because of their reference to “language” and “words.” However, matters are not quite so simple. For one thing, such terms easily lend themselves to broadened uses which might include media beyond language in the usual sense. For another thing, precisely such a broadening actually occurs in a philosopher closely connected with Herder: Hamann. In his Metacritique (1784), Hamann is no less verbally committed to the two doctrines in question than Herder. But he embraces broad expressivism. And he does so quite consistently, because he understands the terms “language” and “word” as they occur in the doctrines in unusually broad senses — for example, he explicitly includes as forms of the “language” on which he says thought depends not only language in the usual sense but also painting, drawing, and music.
Nonetheless, Herder's considered position is in fact the narrow expressivism that his two doctrines initially seem to suggest (so that his verbal sharing of them with Hamann in fact masks a significant difference of philosophical position between the two men).
Moreover, after much wrestling with the subject, Herder eventually developed a particularly compelling version of narrow expressivism. The key work in this connection is again the Critical Forests. By the time of writing this work, Herder was already committed to the two doctrines in question, and, as this would suggest, from the start in the Critical Forests he is committed to narrow expressivism. However, his commitment to it is initially unsatisfactory and even inconsistent. For one thing, it initially takes the extreme and implausible form of denying to the non-linguistic arts any capacity to express thoughts autonomously of language by denying that they can express thoughts at all. This is the force of the naive theory recently described which the work initially set out to develop. Adding outright inconsistency to this unsatisfactoriness, Herder is from the start in the work also committed to saying (far more plausibly) that visual art often does express thoughts — e.g. he intervenes in a quarrel between Lessing and Winckelmann on the question of whether linguistic art (especially poetry) or visual art (especially sculpture) is expressively superior in ways which tend to support Winckelmann's case for visual art. This unsatisfactoriness and inconsistency mainly result from Herder's oversight of a single fact: that it is perfectly possible to reconcile narrow expressivism with the attribution of thoughts to non-linguistic art, namely by insisting that the thoughts expressed by non-linguistic art must be derivative from and bounded by the artist's capacity for linguistic expression. However, by the time Herder writes the later parts of the Critical Forests, he has found this solution. Thus in the third part, focusing on a particularly instructive example, he notes that the pictorial representations on Greek coins are typically allegorical in nature. And by the time of writing the fourth part he is prepared to say something similar about much painting as well, writing there, for example, of “the sense, the allegory, the story/history which is put into the whole of a painting.” By 1778 he extends this account to sculpture as well. Thus in the Plastic of 1778 he abandons the merely sensualistic conception of sculpture that had predominated in the Critical Forests and instead argues that sculpture is essentially expressive of, and therefore needs to be interpreted by, a soul, but this no longer forces him into unfaithfulness to his principle that thought is dependent on, and bounded by, language, for he now conceives the thoughts expressed by sculpture to have a linguistic source: “The sculptor stands in the dark of night and gropes towards the forms of gods. The stories of the poets are before and in him.” Subsequently, in the Theological Letters (1780-1) and the Letters for the Advancement of Humanity, Herder extends the same solution to music as well.
In the considered position at which he eventually arrives Herder also implies that “non-linguistic” art is dependent on thought and language in another way: In the fourth part of the Critical Forests he develops the point (already alluded to earlier) that human perception is of its nature infused with concepts and beliefs, and consequently with language — which of course implies that the same is true of the perception of “non-linguistic” artworks in particular. So “non-linguistic” art is really doubly dependent on thought and language: not only for the thoughts which it expresses but also for those which it presupposes in perception.
With Herder's achievement of this refined form of narrow expressivism and Hamann's articulation of his broad expressivism, there were now two plausible but competing theories available. Nineteenth-century theorists (e.g. Hegel, Schleiermacher, and Dilthey) would subsequently be deeply torn between them, and the dispute remains an important one today. While the philosophical issues involved are difficult, I believe that Herder's position is the correct one.
Since for Herder thought and language play important roles not only in linguistic but also in “non-linguistic” art, both for him present similar interpretive challenges, requiring similar interpretive solutions. One aspect of this which deserves special emphasis is genre.
Herder believes, plausibly, that a work of art is always written or made to exemplify a certain genre, and that it is vitally important for the interpreter to identify its genre in order to understand it. Herder's basic conception of genre is that it consists in an overall purpose together with certain rules of composition dictated thereby. For Herder, genres are in large measure socially pregiven, but they always play their role in a work via the intention of the artist (not autonomously thereof), and are not something that he is inexorably locked into but rather something that he can and often does modify.
Why does Herder believe that it is vitally important to identify a work's genre correctly in order to understand the work properly? He has three main reasons (all good ones): First, grasping a work's genre is itself an essential constituent of understanding the work and its contents (in much the same way as grasping a sentence's illocutionary force is itself an essential constituent of understanding the sentence and its contents). Second, because an author intends his work to exemplify a certain genre, there will normally be aspects of the work's meaning which are expressed, not explicitly in any of its parts, but rather through its intended exemplification of the genre. For instance, Lessing had argued that the purpose of Aesop's fables as a genre was to illustrate through a concrete example a universal moral principle, whereas Herder argues that it was instead to illustrate general rules of life, experience, or prudence — so the full interpretation of any particular fable must include either the idea of a universal moral principle (if Lessing is right) or the idea of a general rule of life, experience, or prudence (if Herder is right). Or to cite a “non-linguistic” example, Herder argues that Egyptian sculpture (unlike Greek) had the purpose as a genre of expressing certain ideas about death and eternity — so that the full interpretation of a piece of Egyptian sculpture must include this aspect of its meaning deriving from the general genre. Third, correctly identifying the genre is also vitally important for accurately interpreting things that are expressed explicitly in parts of a work. Hence, for example, in the Critical Forests Herder argues that in order to achieve a proper understanding of “ridiculous” passages in Homer (such as the Thersites episode in Iliad, book 2) it is essential to understand them in light of the nature of the whole text and their contribution thereto.
Just as Herder insists on a scrupulous methodological empiricism in interpretation generally, so he insists on it in determining genres in particular. He therefore sharply rejects apriorism here — not only the absolute apriorism of refusing in one's definition of a genre to be guided by the observation of examples at all, but also the more seductive relative apriorism of allowing oneself to be guided by the observation of examples but excluding from these particular cases, or even whole classes of cases, to which the resulting genre-conception is to be applied in interpretation. The latter procedure is still disastrous, in Herder's view, because the superficial appearance of a similar genre shared by different historical periods or cultures, or even by different authors within one period and culture, or indeed even by a single author in one work and the same author in another commonly in fact masks vitally important differences. Herder identifies this sort of misguided apriorism in the definition of genres in many areas of interpretation. For example, in the essay Shakespeare (1773) he detects it in the French critics' approach to tragedy, an approach which assumes the universal validity of Aristotelian genre-rules that were originally derived exclusively from ancient tragedies (sometimes even overlooking this empirical derivation), and consequently assumes that they provide an appropriate yardstick for interpreting Shakespearean tragedy as well, whereas the latter's genre-conception is in fact quite different. And in This Too and other pieces he detects it in Winckelmann's treatment of Egyptian sculpture: Winckelmann implicitly assumes the universal validity of a genre-conception for sculpture which he has derived from the Greeks, namely one dominated by the genre-purpose of a this-worldly portrayal of life and beauty, and he then applies this in the interpretation of Egyptian sculpture, where the genre-conception is in fact quite different, in particular involving a contrary genre-purpose of conveying ideas of death and eternity.
Furthermore, Herder emphasizes that getting questions of genre right is vitally important not only for the correct interpretation of artworks, but also for their correct critical evaluation. The French critics not only make an interpretive mistake when they go to Shakespeare with a genre dogmatically in mind that was not his, but they also, on this basis, make an evaluative one: because they falsely assume that he somehow must be aspiring to realize the genre-purpose and -rules which Aristotle found in ancient tragedy, they fault him for failing to realize them, while at the same time they overlook the quite different genre-purpose and -rules which he really aspires to realize and his success in realizing these. Similarly, Winckelmann not only makes an interpretive mistake when he implicitly imputes to the Egyptians a Greek genre-conception for sculpture that was not theirs, but also, on this basis, an evaluative one: because he falsely assumes that the Egyptians somehow must be aspiring to realize the Greek genre-purpose and -rules, he faults them for failing to realize these, and at the same time he overlooks their success in realizing the very different genre-purpose and -rules which they really do aspire to realize.
Nothing has yet been said about beauty, the concept that is often thought to be the central concern of aesthetics. Herder has several interesting ideas on this subject too. A first, which he develops in the Critical Forests, concerns the very concept of beauty. He argues, plausibly, that this concept's origin lies in visual experience, but that it has been extended from that domain to cover virtually “everything that has a pleasurable effect on the soul,” that in this sense “sight … allegorizes the images, the representations, the conceits of the soul,” and beauty becomes our most general term of approval for whatever we find pleasing in relation to any of the senses and indeed to mental life more generally.
A second interesting idea of Herder's concerning beauty (prima facie somewhat at odds with the first one, but potentially reconcilable with it, and perhaps even encouraged by it) is developed in his later work the Calligone. There he suggests, in opposition to the great emphasis traditionally placed on beauty in the philosophy of art, that beauty is not in fact nearly as essential to art as it is often taken to be. In particular, he argues that art is much more essentially a matter of Bildung — cultural formation or education (especially in moral respects).
A third important idea of Herder's concerning beauty (both as it relates to art and more generally) is that standards of beauty vary greatly from one historical period and culture to another. This at least is his usual position, from early works such as On the Change of Taste to late ones such as the Calligone (where he invokes it against Kant's Critique of Judgment). There is also occasionally a counterstrand in Herder's works in which he argues for a deeper unity in standards of beauty across historical periods and cultures (e.g. in the Critical Forests). However, the former, usual position seems to be his considered one, and is much the more plausible one.
Finally, a position closely connected with the point recently mentioned that the fundamental role of the arts is one of Bildung: In On the Effect of Poetic Art on the Ethics of Peoples in Ancient and Modern Times (1778) and again later in the Calligone Herder argues more specifically that the fundamental role of the arts both has been historically and moreover should be one of moral character formation.
He has a nuanced account of how the arts do and should perform this function. For example, in On the Influence of the Beautiful Sciences on the Higher Sciences (1781) he specifies three ways in which poetry and literature promote moral character formation: First, they do so “through light rules,” in other words through subtly conveying ethical principles directly in explicit or implicit ways. Second, and more important, they do so by presenting in an attractive light good moral exemplars for people to emulate: “still better, through good examples.” Third, they also convey a broad range of practical experience relevant to the formation of moral character which would otherwise have to be acquired, if at all, by the more arduous route of first-hand experience. In the Calligone Herder also notes concerning non-linguistic art that music has a power to affect moral character for good or ill depending on the principles with which it is associated, and that visual art has a power to make moral ideals attractive by presenting them blended with physical beauty.
Herder's conception that it is and should be the primary function of art to form moral character serves him as a criterion for evaluating artworks. Thus when he observes in On the Effect that in contrast to earlier poetry modern poetry has typically lost this function, he means this as a serious criticism of modern poetry. And he even applies this criterion as a ground for criticizing certain works by his friends Goethe and Schiller which he considers immoral or amoral in content.
Herder's philosophy of history appears mainly in two works: This Too and the later Ideas. His philosophy of history is initially likely to seem striking and interesting mainly for its development of a teleological conception of history as the progressive realization of “reason” and “humanity” — a conception which anticipated and strongly influenced Hegel, among others. However, this conception is highly dubious on reflection, and is arguably not one of Herder's main achievements in this area.
His most intrinsically important achievement in this area arguably rather lies in his development of the thesis mentioned earlier — contradicting such Enlightenment philosopher-historians as Hume and Voltaire — that there exist radical mental differences between different historical periods (and cultures), that people's concepts, beliefs, sensations, etc. differ in deep ways from one period (or culture) to another. This thesis is already prominent in On the Change of Taste (1766) and persists throughout Herder's career. It had an enormous influence on successors such as the Schlegels, Schleiermacher, Hegel, Nietzsche, and Dilthey.
Herder makes the empirical exploration of the realm of mental diversity posited by this thesis the very core of the discipline of history. For, as has often been noted, he takes relatively little interest in the so-called “great” political and military deeds and events of history, focusing instead on the “innerness” of history's participants. This choice is deliberate and self-conscious. Because of it, psychology and interpretation inevitably take center-stage in the discipline of history for Herder.
Herder has deep philosophical reasons for this choice, and hence for assigning psychology and interpretation a central role in history. To begin with, he has negative reasons directed against traditional political-military history. Why should history focus on the “great” political and military deeds and events of the past, after all? There are several possible answers: (1) A first would be that they are fascinating or morally edifying. But Herder will not accept this. For one thing, he denies that mere fascination or curiosity is a sufficiently serious motive for doing history. For another thing, his antiauthoritarianism, antimilitarism, and borderless humanitarianism cause him to find the acts of political domination, war, and empire which make up the vast bulk of these “great” deeds and events not morally edifying but morally repugnant.
This leaves two other types of motivation that might be appealed to for doing the sort of history in question: (2) because examining the course of such deeds and events reveals some sort of overall meaning in history, or (3) because it leads to efficient causal insights which enable us to explain the past and perhaps also predict or control the future. Herder is again skeptical about these rationales, however. This skepticism is perhaps clearest in the Older Critical Forestlet (1767-8) where, in criticism of rationale (2), he consigns the task of “the whole ordering together of many occurrences into a plan” not to the historian but to the “creator, … painter, and artist,” and in criticism of rationale (3), he goes as far as to assert (on the basis of a Hume- and Kant-influenced general skepticism about causal knowledge) that with the search for efficient causes in history “historical seeing stops and prophecy begins.” His later writings depart from this early position in some obvious ways, but they also in less obvious ways remain faithful to it. They by no means officially stay loyal to the view that history has no discernible meaning; famously, This Too insists that history does have an overall purpose, and that this fact (though not the nature of the purpose) is discernible from the cumulative way in which cultures have built upon one another, and the Ideas then goes on to tell a long story to the effect that history's purpose consists in its steady realization of “reason” and “humanity.” However, Herder clearly still harbors grave doubts just below the surface. This is visible in This Too from the work's ironically self-deprecating title; Pyrrhonian-spirited motto; vacillation between several incompatible models of history's direction (progressive?, progressive and cyclical?, merely cyclical?, even regressive?); and morbid dwelling on, and unpersuasive attempt to rebut, the “skeptical” view of history as meaningless “Penelope-work.” (A few years later in his Theological Letters (1780-1) Herder would write that history is “a textbook of the nullity of all human things.”) It is also visible in the Ideas from the fact that Herder's official account there of the purposiveness of history gets contradicted by other passages which insist on the inappropriateness of teleological (as contrasted with efficient causal) explanations in history. Herder's official position certainly had a powerful influence on some successors (especially Hegel), but it is this quieter counterstrand of skepticism that represents his better philosophical judgment. Concerning efficient causal insights, Herder's later works again in a sense stay faithful to his skeptical position in the Older Critical Forestlet — but they also modify it, and this time for the better philosophically speaking. The mature Herder does not, like the Herder of that early work, rest his case on a general skepticism about the role or discernibility of efficient causation in history. On the contrary, he insists that history is governed by efficient causation and that we should try to discover as far as possible the specific ways in which it is so. But he remains highly skeptical about the extent to which such an undertaking can be successful, and hence about how far it can take us towards real explanations of the past, and towards predicting or controlling the future. His main reason for this skepticism is that major historical deeds and events are not the products of some one or few readily identifiable causal factors (as political and military historians tend to assume), but rather of chance confluences of huge numbers of different causal factors, many of which, moreover, are individually unknown and unknowable by the historian (e.g. because in themselves too trivial to have been recorded, or, in the case of psychological factors, because the historical agent failed to make them public, deliberately misrepresented them, or was himself unaware of them due to the hidden depths of his mind).
Complementing this negative case against the claims of traditional political-military history to be of overriding importance, Herder also has positive reasons for focusing instead on the “innerness” of human life in history. (1) One reason is certainly just the sheer interest of this subject-matter — though, as was mentioned previously, that would not be a sufficient reason in his eyes. (2) Another reason is that his discovery of radical diversity in human mentality has shown there to be a much broader, less explored, and more intellectually challenging field for investigation here than previous generations of historians have realized. Two further reasons are moral in nature: (3) He believes, and plausibly so, that studying people's minds through their literature, visual art, etc. generally exposes one to them at their moral best (in sharp contrast to studying their political-military history), so that there are benefits of moral edification to be gleaned here. (4) He has cosmopolitan and egalitarian moral motives for studying people's minds through their literature, visual art, etc.: (in sharp contrast to studying unedifying and elite-focused political-military history) this promises to enhance our sympathies for peoples, and moreover for peoples at all social levels, including lower ones. Finally, doing “inner” history is also important as an instrument for our non-moral self-improvement: (5) It serves to enhance our self-understanding. One important reason for this is that it is by, and only by, contrasting one's own outlook with the outlooks of other peoples that one recognizes what is universal and invariant in it and what by contrast distinctive and variable. Another important reason is that in order fully to understand one's own outlook one needs to identify its historical origins and how they developed into it (this is Herder's justly famous “genetic method” — first discussed by him in the Fragments in connection with language, but also applied by him much more broadly — which subsequently became fundamental to the work of Hegel, Nietzsche, and Foucault). (6) Herder believes that an accurate investigation of the (non-moral) ideals of past ages can serve to enrich our own ideals and happiness. This motive finds broad application in his work. One example is his exploration of past literatures in the Fragments largely with a view to drawing from them lessons about how better to develop modern German literature.
Herder's decision to focus on the “innerness” of history's participants, and his consequent emphasis on psychology and interpretation as historical methods, strikingly anticipated and strongly influenced Dilthey. So too did his rationale for this decision, as described above, which is indeed arguably superior to Dilthey's, especially on its positive side. (Dilthey's positive reasons are alarmingly thin — mainly that our interest in narrative is more fundamental than our interest in explanation; and that we can enrich our drab lives by encountering the different experiences of historical Others — whereas, as we have just seen, Herder's are by contrast rich and compelling.)
Finally, Herder is also impressive for having recognized, and, though not solved, at least grappled with, a problem that flows from his picture of history (and intercultural comparison) as an arena of deep variations in human mentality. This is the problem of skepticism. He tends to run together two problems in this connection: (1) the problem of whether there is any meaning to the seemingly anarchic and endless series of changes from epoch to epoch (or culture to culture); (2) the problem that the multiplication of conflicting viewpoints on virtually all subjects that is found in history (or in intercultural comparison) causes, or at least exacerbates, the ancient skeptic's difficulty of unresolvable disputes forcing one to suspend belief. Problem (1) has already been discussed. Here it is problem (2) that concerns us. This is a problem that Troeltsch would make much of in the twentieth century. But Herder had already clearly seen it.
Herder is determined to avoid this sort of skepticism. He has two main strategies for doing so, but they are inconsistent with each other, and neither in the end works: His first is to try to defuse the problem at source by arguing that, on closer inspection, there is much more common ground between different periods and cultures than it allows. This strategy already occurs in the Critical Forests, where (as was mentioned earlier) Herder argues that different standards of beauty have an underlying unity, and it plays a central role in the Ideas, where in particular “humanity” is presented as a shared ethical value. Herder's second strategy is instead to acknowledge the problem in an unmitigated form and to respond with relativism: especially in This Too he argues that — at least where questions of moral, aesthetic, and prudential value are concerned — the different positions taken by different periods and cultures are equally valid, namely for the periods and cultures to which they belong, and that there can be no question of any preferential ranking between them. The later Letters vacillates between these two strategies.
Neither of these strategies is satisfactory in the end. The first, that of asserting deep commonalities, is hopeless (notwithstanding its seemingly eternal appeal to empirically underinformed Anglophone philosophers). It flies in the face of the empirical evidence — for example, Herder in this mode sentimentally praises Homer for his “humanity,” and thereby lays himself open to Nietzsche's more just retort in Homer's Contest that what is striking about Homer and his culture is rather their cruelty. And indeed, it flies in the face of Herder's own better interpretive judgments about the empirical evidence — for example, his observation in On the Change of Taste that basic values have not only changed over the course of history but in some cases actually been inverted (an observation which strikingly anticipates a brilliant insight of Nietzsche's concerning a systematic inversion of Homeric ethical values that occurred in later antiquity with Socrates/Plato and especially Christianity).
Herder's alternative, relativist, strategy is more interesting, but is not in the end satisfactory either (even concerning values, where its prospects look best). There are several potential problems with it. One, which is of considerable historical interest but probably not in the end fatal, is this: Hegel in the Phenomenology of Spirit and then Nietzsche in his treatment of Christian moral values saw the possibility that one might accept Herder's insight that there were basic differences in values but nonetheless avoid his relativism by subjecting others' values to an internal critique, a demonstration that they were internally inconsistent. For example, Nietzsche (whose version of this idea is the more plausible) traced back such Christian values as love and forgiveness to a contrary underlying motive of resentment [Ressentiment]. However, in order to work, such a response would need to show that the inconsistency was essential to the values in question, not merely a contingent one that could disappear leaving the values consistently held — and this it probably cannot do. A more serious problem with this strategy is rather a twofold one, which Nietzsche again saw: First, we cannot in fact sustain such a relativist indifference vis-à-vis others' values. Do we, for example, really think that a moral rule requiring the forcible burning of dead men's wives is no better and no worse than one forbidding it? (As Nietzsche memorably puts it, “Is life not passing judgment, preferring, being unfair … ?”) Second, nor does the phenomenon of fundamental value variations require us to adopt such an indifference. For, while it may indeed show that there are no universal or objective values, it leaves us with a better alternative to indifference: continuing to hold our values and to judge others' values in light of them only now in a self-consciously non-universal, non-objective way. (As Nietzsche puts it, “My judgment is my judgment.” Or if we reject Nietzsche's extreme individualism, “Our judgment is our judgment,” for some less-than-universal us.)
Herder is not usually thought of as a political philosopher. But he was one, and moreover one whose political ideals are arguably more admirable, theoretical stances more defensible, and thematic emphases of more enduring relevance than those of any other German philosopher of the period. His most developed treatment of political philosophy occurs relatively late, in a work prompted by the French Revolution of 1789: the Letters (including the early draft of 1792, which is important for its frank statement of his views about domestic politics).
What are the main features of Herder's political philosophy? Let us begin with his political ideals, first in domestic and then in international politics: In domestic politics, the mature Herder is a liberal, a republican, a democrat, and an egalitarian (this, it should be noted, in historical circumstances where such positions were by no means commonplace, and were embraced at a personal cost). His liberalism is especially radical in advocating virtually unrestricted freedom of thought and expression (including freedom of worship). He has several reasons for this position: (1) He feels that such freedom belongs to people's moral dignity. (2) He believes that it is essential for individuals' self-realization. (3) As was mentioned earlier, he believes that human beings' capacities for discerning the truth are very limited and that it is through, and only through, an ongoing contest between opposing viewpoints that the cause of truth gets advanced. (J.S. Mill would later borrow from these considerations — partly via intermediaries such as von Humboldt — to form the core of his case for freedom of thought and expression in On Liberty.)
Herder is also committed to republicanism and democracy (advocating a much broader franchise than Kant did, for example). He has several reasons for this position, ultimately deriving from an egalitarian concern for the interests of all members of society: (1) He feels it to be intrinsically right that the mass of people should share in their government, rather than having it imposed upon them. (2) He believes that this will better serve their other interests as well, since government by also tends to be government for. (3) He in particular believes that it will diminish the warfare that is pervasive under the prevailing autocratic political régimes of Europe, where it benefits the few rulers who decide on it but costs the mass of people dearly.
Finally, Herder's egalitarianism also extends beyond this. He does not reject class differences, property, or inequalities of property outright. But he does oppose all hierarchical oppression; argue that all people in society have capacities for self-realization, and must receive the opportunity to fulfill them; and insist that government must intervene to ensure that they do receive it, e.g. by guaranteeing education and a minimum standard of living for the poor.
Concerning international politics, Herder has often been classified as a “nationalist” or (perhaps even worse) a “German nationalist.” Some other philosophers from the period deserve such a slur (e.g. Fichte). But where Herder is concerned it is deeply misleading and unjust. On the contrary, his fundamental position in international politics is a committed cosmopolitanism, an impartial concern for all human beings. This is a large part of the force of his ideal of “humanity.” Hence, for example, in the Letters he approvingly quotes Fénelon's remark, “I love my family more than myself; more than my family my fatherland; more than my fatherland humankind.” Moreover, unlike Kant's cosmopolitanism, Herder's is genuine. Kant's cosmopolitanism is vitiated by a set of empirically ignorant and morally inexcusable prejudices that he harbors — in particular, racism, antisemitism, and misogyny. By contrast, Herder's is entirely free of these prejudices, which he indeed works tirelessly to combat.
Herder does indeed also insist on respecting, preserving, and advancing national groupings. However, this is entirely unalarming, for the following reasons: (1) For Herder, this is emphatically something that must be done for all national groupings equally (not just or especially Germany!). (He memorably insists that there must be no Favoritvolk.) (2) The “nation” in question is not racial but linguistic and cultural (in the Ideas and elsewhere Herder indeed rejects the very concept of race). (3) Herder does not seek to seal off nations from each other's influence or to keep them static; he recognizes and welcomes the facts of normal interlinguistic and intercultural exchange, and of linguistic-cultural development. (4) Nor does his commitment to national groupings involve a centralized or militaristic state (in the Ideas and elsewhere he strongly advocates the disappearance of such a state and its replacement by loosely federated local governments with minimal instruments of force). (5) In addition, Herder's insistence on respecting national groupings is accompanied by the strongest denunciations of military conflict, colonial exploitation, and all other forms of harm between nations; a demand that nations instead peacefully cooperate and compete in trade and intellectual endeavors for their mutual benefit; and a plea that they should indeed actively work to help each other.
Moreover, Herder has compelling reasons for this insistence on respecting national groupings: (1) The deep diversity of values between nations entails that homogenization is ultimately impracticable, only a fantasy. (2) Such diversity also entails that, to the extent that it is practicable, it cannot occur voluntarily but only through external coercion. (3) In practice, attempts to achieve it, e.g. by European colonialism, are moreover coercive from, and subserve, ulterior motives of domination and exploitation. (4) Furthermore, real national variety is positively valuable, both as affording individuals a vital sense of local belonging and in itself.
Herder's pluralistic cosmopolitanism is an important and attractive alternative to the homogenizing forms of cosmopolitanism, based on delusions concerning either the fact or the prospect of universally shared values, which have predominated since the Enlightenment and still find much favor today, not only among philosophers (especially those in the Anglophone world) but also in international political organizations such as the United Nations.
It might still be objected that all this does not yet really amount to a political theory — such as other philosophers have provided, including some of Herder's contemporaries in Germany. In a sense that is true, but philosophically defensible; in another sense it is false. It is true in the following sense: There is indeed no grand metaphysical theory underpinning Herder's position — no Platonic theory of forms, no correlation of political institutions with “moments” in a Hegelian Logic, no “deduction” of political institutions from the nature of the self or the will à la Fichte and Hegel, etc. But that is quite deliberate, given Herder's skepticism about such metaphysics. And is it not indeed philosophically a good thing? Nor does Herder have any elaborate account purporting to justify the moral intuitions at work in his political position as a sort of theoretical insight (in the manner of Kant's theory of the “categorical imperative” or Rawls's theory of the “original position,” for example). But that is again quite deliberate, given his non-cognitivism in ethics, and his rejection of such theories as not only false but also harmful. And is he not again right about this, and the absence of such an account therefore again a good thing? Nor is Herder sympathetic with such tired staples of political theory as the state of nature, the social contract, natural rights, the general will, and utopias for the future. But again, he has good specific reasons for skepticism about these things. This, then, is the sense in which the objection is correct; Herder does indeed lack a “political theory” of these sorts. But he lacks it on principle, and is arguably quite right to do so.
On the other hand, he does have a “political theory” of another, and arguably more valuable, sort. First, consistently with his general empiricism, his position in political philosophy is deeply empirically informed. For instance, as can be seen from the Dissertation on the Reciprocal Influence of Government and the Sciences (1780), his thesis concerning the importance of freedom of thought and expression, and the competition between views which it makes possible, for producing intellectual progress is largely based on the historical example of ancient Greece and in particular Athens (as contrasted with later societies which lacked the freedom and competition in question). And in the 1792 draft of the Letters he even describes the French Revolution and its attempts to establish a modern democracy as a sort of “experiment” from which we can learn (e.g. whether democracy can be successfully extended to nations that are much larger than ancient Athens). Second, in conformity with his general non-cognitivism about morals, he is acutely aware that his political position ultimately rests on moral sentiments — his own and, for its success, other people's as well. For example, in the 10th Collection of the Letters he emphasizes that people's moral “dispositions” or “feelings” play a fundamental role as required supports for his political position's realization. As has been mentioned, this standpoint absolves him of the need to do certain sorts of theorizing. However, it also leads him to engage in theorizing of another sort, namely theorizing about how, and by which causal means, people's moral sentiments should be molded in order to realize the ideals of his political position. His discussion of moral “dispositions” in the 10th Collection is an example of such theorizing — concerning the how, rather than the causal means. And some of his extensive theorizing about causal means has already been sketched earlier in this article. These two sorts of political theorizing (empirical theorizing and theorizing about moral sentiments) are deeply developed in Herder. And they are arguably much more pointful than the sorts which are not.
In short, to the extent that Herder's political philosophy really is theoretically superficial, it is, to borrow a phrase of Nietzsche's, “superficial — out of profundity” (whereas more familiar forms of political philosophy are profound — out of superficiality). And in another, more important, sense it is not theoretically superficial at all.
In Herder's day German philosophy was still deeply committed to a game of trying to reconcile the insights of the Enlightenment, especially those of modern natural science, with religion, and indeed more specifically with Christianity. Leibniz, Kant, Hegel, Schleiermacher, and many others played this game — each proposing some new reconciliation or other. Herder was part of this game as well. This was not a good game for philosophers to be playing. But it was only in the nineteenth century that German philosophy found the courage to cut the Gordian knot and turn from apologetics for religion and Christianity to thoroughgoing criticism of them (the prime examples being Marx and Nietzsche). This situation imposes certain limits on the interest of Herder's philosophy of religion, as on that of the other reconciling philosophers mentioned.
Also, while Herder's philosophy of religion was generally very enlightened and progressive in both his early and his late periods, there was a spell in the middle, the years 1771-6 in Bückeburg, during which he fell into the sort of religious irrationalism that is more characteristic of his friend Hamann. This happened as the result of what we would today classify as a mild nervous breakdown (documentable from his correspondence at the time), and should basically be discounted.
Despite these qualifications, Herder did make important contributions to the philosophy of religion — i.e. important in terms of their influence, their intrinsic value, or both. One of these (important mainly for its influence) lies in his neo-Spinozism. Herder's serious and sympathetic engagement with Spinoza's work goes back at least as far as 1769. But its main expression is found in God. Some Conversations from 1787. Herder published this work in the wake of Jacobi's Letters on the Doctrine of Spinoza (1785), a work in which Jacobi had revealed that the highly respected philosopher, critic, and dramatist Lessing — who was much admired by Herder in particular — had confessed to him shortly before his death that he had abandoned orthodox religious conceptions in favor of Spinozism. Jacobi had argued, sharply to the contrary, that Spinozism, and indeed all fundamental reliance on reason, implied atheism and fatalism, and should therefore be rejected in favor of a leap of faith to a conventional Christian theism. Jacobi's work (along with a reply by Moses Mendelssohn) caused a public furor. In God. Some Conversations Herder intervened. In this work he supports Lessing's side of the debate by developing a version of “Spinozism” which modifies the original in some significant respects, largely with a view to defusing Jacobi's objections. Herder shares with Spinoza the basic thesis of monism, and like Spinoza equates the single, all-encompassing principle in question with God (which of course immediately calls into question Jacobi's charge of atheism). But whereas Spinoza had characterized this single, all-encompassing principle as substance, Herder instead characterizes it as force, or primal force. This fundamental modification involves several further ones which Herder also finds attractive, including the following: (1) Whereas Spinoza had conceived the principle in question as an inactive thing, Herder's revision effectively turns it into an activity. (2) Spinoza's theory had attributed thought to the principle in question, but had rejected conceptions that it had intentions or was a mind. By contrast, Herder claims that it does have intentions. And given that his general philosophy of mind identifies the mind with force, his identification of the principle in question with force also imports an implication that it is a mind (he does not yet quite say this in God. Some Conversations, but a few years later in On the Spirit of Christianity (1798) he explicitly describes God as a Geist, a mind). In these two ways, Herder in effect re-mentalizes Spinoza's God (thereby still further undermining Jacobi's charge of atheism). (3) Whereas Spinoza had conceived nature mechanistically, in keeping with his Cartesian intellectual heritage (and had thereby invited Jacobi's charge of fatalism), Herder (though officially still agnostic about what force is) rather inclines to conceive the forces at work in nature as living, or organic (a conception of them which he mainly owes to Leibniz). (4) Herder believes that Spinoza's original theory contained an objectionable residue of dualism (again inherited from Descartes), in its conception of the relation between God's two known attributes, thought and extension (and similarly, in its conception of the relation between finite minds and bodies). By contrast, Herder's own conception of God as a force (and of finite minds as likewise forces) is designed to overcome this alleged residual dualism. For forces are of their very nature expressed in the behavior of extended bodies. (5) Herder also sketches a more detailed account of nature as a system of living forces based in the primal force, God — an account which in particular ascribes an important role in this system to the sort of opposition between forces that is exemplified by the magnet, and characterizes the system as a self-development towards higher and higher forms of articulation.
During the last quarter or so of the eighteenth century and then well into the nineteenth century a wave of neo-Spinozism swept through German philosophy and literature: in addition to Lessing and Herder, further enthusiasts for Spinozism included Goethe, Schelling, Hegel, Schleiermacher, Hölderlin, Novalis, and F. Schlegel. This wave was largely a result of Herder's embrace of neo-Spinozism in God. Some Conversations (and in Goethe's case, of Herder's sympathy with Spinozism even before that work), and it largely took over Herder's modifications of Spinoza's position.
However, Herder's most intrinsically valuable contribution to the philosophy of religion rather concerns the interpretation of the Bible. In this connection, as was previously mentioned, he champions a strict secularism. This was already his position in the 1760's. At that period he argued vigorously, in the spirit of Galileo, for disallowing revelation any jurisdiction over natural science — though he did so not in an anti-religious spirit but in the hope and expectation that an autonomous natural science would confirm religion. And he made a parallel case for the autonomy of interpretation: Religious assumptions and means have no business interfering in the interpretation of texts either, even when the texts are sacred ones. Instead, even biblical texts must be interpreted as the works of human beings, and by means of the same sorts of rigorous hermeneutical methods that are employed for interpreting other ancient texts — any religious enlightenment coming as a result of such interpretation, not entering into the process itself. This whole position remained Herder's considered one in his later period as well.
The general idea that the Bible should be interpreted in the same way as other texts was by no means the commonplace in Herder's day that it has become since, but nor was it new with him. In adopting this principle he was self-consciously following the lead of several recent Bible scholars — in particular, Ernesti, Michaelis, and Semler. However, Herder's secularism is more consistent and radical than theirs.
This can be illustrated by a comparison with Ernesti (the most important of the Bible scholars just mentioned, and the one most consistently admired by Herder). Ernesti's great work, Institutio interpretis Novi Testamenti (1761), which Herder singles out for special praise, is a key statement of the sort of secularism in question. Initially, this work seems to advocate a secularism identical in spirit to Herder's, arguing that we must interpret biblical books in the same way as profane texts, and thereby learn whatever religious truth they contain. However, as the work develops, matters become much cloudier. In this connection, it is important to distinguish two questions which can be asked concerning the relation between divine inspiration and interpretation: (1) May readers of sacred texts rely on a divine inspiration of themselves (e.g. by the Holy Spirit) bringing them to a correct interpretation rather than on more usual interpretive means? (2) May they assume in interpretation that because the texts' authors are divinely inspired the texts must be completely true and therefore also (a fortiori) completely self-consistent? When Ernesti develops the details of his position it becomes clear that he has really only advanced as far towards secularism as consistently answering question (1) in the negative, not question (2). His failure to give a consistently negative answer to question (2) lands him in flat contradiction with his official commitment to interpreting sacred texts in exactly the same way as profane texts (for, of course, as he indeed himself implies, in interpreting profane texts we may not assume that the texts are throughout true and therefore also self-consistent). It also seems intellectually indefensible in itself — merely a rather transparent refusal to stop, so to speak, “cooking the books” in favor of the Bible when interpreting it. By contrast, the young Herder advances in his secularism beyond Ernesti because he consistently answers both questions in the negative, and thereby, unlike Ernesti, achieves a position which is both self-consistent and otherwise intellectually defensible. Moreover, Herder's actual interpretations of the Bible admirably conform to this theoretical position, not only refraining from any reliance on divine inspiration and instead employing normal interpretive techniques, but also frequently attributing false and even inconsistent positions to the Bible (both to the Old and to the New Testaments).
Another noteworthy aspect of Herder's strict secularism is his insistence that interpreters of the Bible must resist the temptation to read the Bible as allegory (except in those few cases — e.g. the parables of the New Testament — where there is clear textual evidence of a biblical author's intention to convey an allegorical meaning). In On God's Son, the World's Savior (1797) Herder gives a perceptive general diagnosis of the temptation to allegorical interpretation: over the course of history people's beliefs and values change, leading to discrepancies between the claims made by their traditional texts and their own beliefs and values, but they expect and want to find their traditional texts correct, and so they try to effect a reconciliation of them with their own beliefs and values by means of allegorical readings.
Herder's theoretical commitment to strict secularism in biblical interpretation led him to interpretive discoveries concerning the Bible which were themselves of epoch-making importance. For example, concerning the Old Testament, his commitment to applying normal interpretive methods enabled him to distinguish and define the different genres of poetry in the Old Testament in a way that was superior to anything that had been done before him. Also, the same commitment, and in particular his consequent readiness to find falsehood and even inconsistency in the Bible, allowed him to make such important interpretive observations as that the ancient Jews' conceptions about death, the afterlife, the mind, and the body had changed dramatically over time. (For these two achievements, see especially On the Spirit of Hebrew Poetry.) Again, the same commitment, and in particular Herder's consequent rejection of unwarranted allegorical interpretations, allowed him to substitute for the prevailing interpretation of the Song of Solomon as religious allegory an interpretation of it as simple erotic love poetry which is today generally accepted as correct. Similarly concerning the New Testament, Herder's commitment to applying normal interpretive methods, including his consequent readiness to discover falsehood and inconsistency, enabled him to treat the authors of the four gospels as individual human authors rather than as mere mouthpieces of the deity, to perceive inconsistencies between their accounts, to establish the relative dates of the gospels correctly for the first time (Mark first, Matthew and Luke in the middle, John last and late), and to give a broadly correct account of their genesis in oral sermon and of their likely relations to each other — achievements which he attained above all in two late works from 1796-7, On the Savior of Mankind and On God's Son, the World's Savior.
Herder's strict secularism in interpretation would shortly afterwards be adopted by Schleiermacher, who similarly embraced the principle that the interpretation of sacred texts must treat them as the works of human authors and by applying exactly the same interpretive methods as are applied to profane texts, and who similarly followed through on this commitment, in particular finding not only falsehoods but also inconsistencies in the Bible.
Herder's great achievements in this area also have something of the character of the early acts of an inexorable tragedy, however. As has been mentioned, he did not by any means intend his championing of the cause of intellectual conscience in insisting on the autonomy of natural science and interpretation to undermine religion in general or Christianity in particular; on the contrary, his hope and expectation was that both sorts of autonomy would in the end support religion and Christianity. However, this hope has been sorely disappointed. Autonomous natural science has increasingly made religion generally and Christianity in particular look untenable. And Herder's policy of reading the Bible as a collection of human texts, with all the foibles of human texts, has increasingly led to an undermining of the Bible's claims to intellectual authority. Much of what Herder has ultimately achieved in this area would therefore be deeply unwelcome to him.
There are two main German editions of Herder's works:
- Johann Gottfried Herder Sämtliche Werke, B. Suphan et al. (eds.), Berlin, 1887-.
- Johann Gottfried Herder Werke, U. Gaier et al. (eds.), Frankfurt am Main, 1985-.
The latter edition includes very helpful notes.
- Adler, H., and Menze, E.A., On World History, Armonk,
(Contains short excerpts on history from a variety of works, prominently including the Ideas.)
- Barnard, F.M., J.G. Herder on Social and Political
Culture, Cambridge, 1969.
(Includes (partial) translations of Herder's 1769 Journal, On the Origin, This Too, the Dissertation on the Reciprocal Influence of Government and the Sciences, and the Ideas, plus a very good introduction.)
- Burkhardt, F.H., God. Some Conversations, New York, 1940.
- Churchill, T., Outlines of a Philosophy of the History of
Man, London, 1800.
(A translation of the Ideas.)
- Forster, M.N., J.G. Herder: Philosophical Writings,
(Contains full translations of How Philosophy, On the Origin, On the Cognition, and This Too, as well as other pieces.)
- Gaiger, J., Sculpture: Some Observations on Shape and Form from Pygmalion's Creative Dream, Chicago, 2002.
- Manuel, F.E., Reflections on the Philosophy of History of
Mankind, Chicago, 1968.
(Contains excerpts from Churchill's 1800 translation of the Ideas.)
- Marsh, J., The Spirit of Hebrew Poetry, Burlington, Vt., 1833.
- Menze, E.A., Menges, K., Palma, M., Johann Gottfried Herder:
Selected Early Works, 1764-7, Pennsylvania, 1992.
(Contains several early essays, including On Diligence in Several Learned Languages, and selections from the Fragments.)
- Moore, G., Selected Writings on Aesthetics, Princeton,
(Contains the first and fourth books of the Critical Forests, the essays Shakespeare and On the Influence of the Beautiful Sciences on the Higher Sciences, and several other pieces on aesthetics.)
- Moran, J.H., and Gode, A., On the Origin of Language,
(Contains a partial translation of On the Origin.)
- Nisbet, H.B., German Aesthetics and Literary Criticism:
Winckelmann, Lessing, Hamann, Herder, Schiller, Goethe,
(Contains two pieces of Herder's in aesthetics, including his important essay Shakespeare.)
By far the most helpful single item remains:
- Haym, R., Herder nach seinem Leben und seinen Werken,
(A classic, detailed intellectual biography.)
A helpful short overview:
- Irmischer, H.D., Johann Gottfried Herder, Stuttgart, 2001.
Three useful collections of essays covering a broad range of topics:
- Bollacher, M. (ed.), Johann Gottfried Herder: Geschichte und Kultur, Würzburg, 1994.
- Otto, R., and Zammito, J. (eds.), Vom Selbstdenken: Aufklärung und Aufklärungskritik in Herders “Ideen zur Philosophie der Geschichte der Menschheit,” Heidelberg, 2001.
- Sauder, G. (ed.), Johann Gottfried Herder 1744-1803, Hamburg, 1987.
H.D. Irmischer has written several important and influential articles on topics covered here, including:
- Irmischer, H.D., “Grundzüge der Hermeneutik Herders,” in Bückeburger Gespräche über J.G. Herder 1971, Bückeburg, 1973.
- Irmischer, H.D., “Grundfragen der Geschichtsphilosophie Herders bis 1774,” in Bückeburger Gespräche über J.G. Herder 1983, Bückeburg, 1984.
A helpful treatment of Herder's interest in world literature, and in particular his theory and practice of translation:
- Kelletat, A.F., Herder und die Weltliteratur, Frankfurt am Main, 1984.
A helpful treatment of Herder's approach to the Old Testament:
- Willi, T., Herders Beitrag zum Verstehen des Alten Testaments, Tübingen, 1971.
- Beiser, F.C., The Fate of Reason, Cambridge, Mass.,
(Ch. 5 covers several topics helpfully, including Herder's philosophies of language, mind, and religion.)
- Berlin, I., Vico and Herder, New York, 1976.
(Concise and excellent.)
- Clark Jr., R.T., Herder: His Life and
Thought, Berkeley, 1955.
(Detailed and useful but unimaginative.)
Herder's general philosophical program and debts to the precritical Kant:
- Zammito, J.H., Kant, Herder, and the Birth of Modern
Anthropology, Chicago, 2001.
(An excellent, thorough study.)
Philosophy of language, interpretation, and translation:
- Forster, M.N., “Herder's Philosophy of Language, Interpretation, and Translation: Three Fundamental Principles,” The Review of Metaphysics 56 (2002).
- Forster, M.N., “Gods, Animals, and Artists: Some Problem Cases in Herder's Philosophy of Language,” Inquiry 45/1 (2003).
- Forster, M.N., “Herder's Importance as a Philosopher,” in R. Bubner and G. Hindrichs (eds.), Von der Logik zur Sprache, Stuttgart, 2007.
- Forster, M.N., “Hermeneutics,” in B. Leiter and M. Rosen (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Continental Philosophy, Oxford, 2007.
- Forster, M.N., After Herder: Essays on Philosophy of Language
in the German Tradition, forthcoming, Oxford, 2009.
(In addition to reprints of the above articles, this book will contain articles on Herder's theory of genre, theory of translation, role in the birth of modern anthropology, and several other relevant topics.)
- Taylor, C., “The Importance of Herder,” in E. and A. Margalit (eds.), Isaiah Berlin: A Celebration, Chicago, 1991.
- Taylor, C., “Language and Human Nature,” in C. Taylor, Human Agency and Language: Philosophical Papers I, Cambridge, 1996.
- Forster, M.N., “Hegel and Some (Near) Contemporaries: Narrow or Broad Expressivism?” in W. Welsch and K. Vieweg (eds.), Das Interesse des Denkens: Hegel aus heutiger Sicht, Munich, 2003.
- Norton, R.E., Herder's Aesthetics and the European
Enlightenment, Ithaca, 1991.
(Helpful both on aspects of Herder's aesthetic theory and on Herder's general relation to the Enlightenment.)
Philosophy of history:
- Lovejoy, A.O., “Herder and the Enlightenment Philosophy of
History,” in A.O. Lovejoy, Essays on the History of Ideas,
(A helpful short treatment.)
- Meinecke, F., Historism: The Rise of a New Historical
Outlook, London, 1972.
(Ch. 9 is very helpful.)
- Barnard, F.M., Herder's Social and Political Thought: From
Enlightenment to Nationalism, Oxford, 1965.
(Chs. 3-5 deal helpfully with Herder's political thought.)
- Beiser, F.C., Enlightenment, Revolution, and Romanticism,
Cambridge, Mass., 1992.
(Ch. 8 on Herder's political philosophy is excellent.)
- Ergang, R., Herder and the Foundations of German
Nationalism, New York, 1931.
(Helpful both on Herder's political thought and on his general intellectual influence. Marred, however, by a false assimilation of Herder's nationalism to later German nationalism, and by an unduly warm assessment of such a position — for both of which flaws Barnard, Beiser, and Berlin are useful correctives.)
- Forster, M.N., “The Liberal Temper in Classical German Philosophy. Freedom of Thought and Expression,” Internationales Jahrbuch des Deutschen Idealismus 2 (2004).
- Nisbet, H.B., Herder and the Philosophy and History of
Science, Cambridge, Mass., 1970.
(A helpful account of Herder's position on science. Zammito is also helpful on this subject.)
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- Herder Bibliography, maintained by Tino Markworth.
cosmopolitanism | Dilthey, Wilhelm | dualism | egalitarianism | Hamann, Johann Georg | Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich | hermeneutics | history, philosophy of | Humboldt, Wilhelm von | Kant, Immanuel | Kant, Immanuel: aesthetics and teleology | liberalism | Mill, John Stuart | mind: philosophy of | nationalism | naturalism | Nietzsche, Friedrich | physicalism | rationalism vs. empiricism | relativism | religion: philosophy of | Schlegel, Friedrich | Schleiermacher, Friedrich Daniel Ernst | skepticism | Spinoza, Baruch | Wolff, Christian