Intellectual Property

First published Tue Mar 8, 2011; substantive revision Mon Sep 22, 2014

Intellectual property is generally characterized as non-physical property that is the product of original thought. Typically, rights do not surround the abstract non-physical entity; rather, intellectual property rights surround the control of physical manifestations or expressions of ideas. Intellectual property law protects a content-creator's interest in her ideas by assigning and enforcing legal rights to produce and control physical instantiations of those ideas.

Legal protections for intellectual property have a rich history that stretches back to ancient Greece and before. As different legal systems matured in protecting intellectual works, there was a refinement of what was being protected within different areas. Over the same period several strands of moral justification for intellectual property were offered: namely, personality-based, utilitarian, and Lockean. Finally, there have been numerous critics of intellectual property and systems of intellectual property protection. This essay will discuss all of these topics, focusing on Anglo-American and European legal and moral conceptions of intellectual property.

1. History of Intellectual Property

One of the first known references to intellectual property protection dates from 500 B.C.E., when chefs in the Greek colony of Sybaris were granted year-long monopolies for creating particular culinary delights. There are at least three other notable references to intellectual property in ancient times—these cases are cited in Bruce Bugbee's formidable work The Genesis of American Patent and Copyright Law (Bugbee 1967). In the first case, Vitruvius (257–180 B.C.E.) is said to have revealed intellectual property theft during a literary contest in Alexandria. While serving as judge in the contest, Vitruvius exposed the false poets who were then tried, convicted, and disgraced for stealing the words and phrases of others.

The second and third cases also come from Roman times (first century C.E.). Although there is no known Roman law protecting intellectual property, Roman jurists did discuss the different ownership interests associated with an intellectual work and how the work was codified—e.g., the ownership of a painting and the ownership of a table upon which the painting appears. There is also reference to literary piracy by the Roman epigrammatist Martial. In this case, Fidentinus is caught reciting the works of Martial without citing the source.

These examples are generally thought to be atypical; as far as we know, there were no institutions or conventions of intellectual property protection in Ancient Greece or Rome. From Roman times to the birth of the Florentine Republic, however, there were many franchises, privileges, and royal favors granted surrounding the rights to intellectual works. Bugbee distinguishes between franchises or royal favors and systems of intellectual property in the following way: franchises and royal favors restrict access to intellectual works already in the public domain, thus these decrees take something from the people. An inventor, on the other hand, deprives the public of nothing that existed prior to the act of invention (Bugbee 1967). One of the first statutes that protected authors' rights was issued by the Republic of Florence on June 19, 1421, to Filippo Brunelleschi, a famous architect. This statute not only recognized the rights of authors and inventors to the products of their intellectual efforts; it built in an incentive mechanism that became a prominent feature of Anglo-American intellectual property protection. For several reasons, including Guild influence, the Florentine patent statute of 1421 issued only the single patent to Brunelleschi. The basis of the first lasting patent institution of intellectual property protection is found in a 1474 statute of the Venetian Republic. This statute appeared 150 years before England's Statute of Monopolies; moreover, the system was sophisticated. The rights of inventors were recognized, an incentive mechanism was included, compensation for infringement was established, and a term limit on inventors' rights was imposed.

American institutions of intellectual property protection are based on the English system that began with the Statute of Monopolies (1624) and the Statute of Anne (1710). The Statute of Monopolies granted fourteen-year monopolies to authors and inventors and ended the practice of granting rights to “non-original/new” ideas or works already in the public domain. In contrast to patent institutions in Europe, literary works remained largely unprotected until the arrival of Gutenberg's printing press in the fifteenth century. Even then there were few true copyrights granted—most were grants, privileges, and monopolies.

The Statute of Anne (1710) is considered by scholars to be the first statute of modern copyright. The statute begins:

“Whereas printers, booksellers, and other persons have lately frequently taken the liberty of printing, reprinting, and publishing books without the consent of the authors and proprietors … to their very great detriment, and too often to the ruin of them and their families: for preventing therefore such practices for the future, and for the encouragement of learned men to compose and write use books, be it enacted …” (Great Britain, Statute of Anne, 1710)

The law gave protection to the author by granting fourteen-year copyrights, with a fourteen-year renewal possible if the author was still alive.

In the landmark English case Miller v. Taylor (1769), the inherent rights of authors to control what they produce, independent of statute or law, was affirmed. While this case was later overruled in Donaldson v. Becket (1774), the practice of recognizing the rights of authors had begun. Other European countries, including Belgium, Holland, Italy, and Switzerland, followed the example set by England (Bugbee, 1967). Various more recent international treaties like the Berne Convention treaty and the TRIPS agreement have expanded the geographic scope of intellectual property protection to include most of the globe (Moore 2001).

2. The Domain of Intellectual Property

At the most practical level, the subject matter of intellectual property is largely codified in Anglo-American copyright, patent, and trade secret law, as well as in the moral rights granted to authors and inventors within the continental European doctrine. Although these systems of property encompass much of what is thought to count as intellectual property, they do not map out the entire landscape. Even so, Anglo-American systems of copyright, patent, trade secret, and trademark, along with certain continental doctrines, provide a rich starting point for understanding intellectual property (Moore 1998, 2001). We'll take them up in turn.

2.1 Copyright

The domain of copyright protection is original works of authorship fixed in any tangible medium of expression (17 U.S.C. §102 (1988)). Works that may be copyrighted include literary, musical, artistic, photographic, architectural, and cinematographic works; maps; and computer software. For something to be protected, it must be “original”—the work must be the author's own production; it cannot be the result of copying (Bleistein v. Donaldson Lithographing Co., 188 U.S. 239 (1903)). A further requirement that limits the domain of what can be copyrighted is that the expression must be “non-utilitarian” or “non-functional” in nature. Utilitarian products, or products that are useful for work, fall, if they fall anywhere, within the domain of patents. Finally, rights only extend over the actual concrete expression and the derivatives of the expression—not to the abstract ideas themselves For example, Einstein's Theory of Relativity, as expressed in various articles and publications, is not protected under copyright law. Someone else may read these publications and express the theory in her own words and even receive a copyright for her particular expression. Some may find this troubling, but such rights are outside the domain of copyright law. The individual who copies abstract theories and expresses them in her own words may be guilty of plagiarism, but she cannot be held liable for copyright infringement.

There are five exclusive rights that copyright owners enjoy, and three major restrictions on the bundle. The five rights are: the right to reproduce the work, the right to adapt it or derive other works from it, the right to distribute copies of the work, the right to display the work publicly, and the right to perform it publicly. Under U.S. copyright law, each of these rights may be individually parsed out and sold separately by the copyright owner. All five rights lapse after the lifetime of the author plus 70 years—or in the case of works for hire, the term is set at 95 years from publication or 120 years from creation, whichever comes first. Aside from limited duration (17 U.S.C. §302), the rules of fair use (17 U.S.C. §107) and first sale (17 U.S.C. §109(a)) also restrict the rights of copyright owners. Although the notion of “fair use” is notoriously hard to spell out, it is a generally recognized principle of Anglo-American copyright law that allows anyone to make limited use of another's copyrighted work for such purposes as criticism, comment, news reporting, teaching, scholarship, and research. The “first sale” rule prevents a copyright holder who has sold copies of a protected work from later interfering with the subsequent sale of those copies. In short, the owners of copies can do what they like with their property, short of violating the copyrights mentioned above.

2.2 The Creative Commons, Copyleft, and Licensing

As a modern workaround for the first sale rule, many online content providers, rather than selling a copy of a work, simply offer licensing agreements (through click-wrap, shrink-wrap, etc.) that allow only specific uses of protected content. These approaches to protecting intellectual works are relatively new and seemingly build upon the copyright systems already in place. For example, by using licensing agreements to guarantee different levels of downstream access, the Creative Commons and Copyleft models seek to expand the commons of thought and expression (Stallman 1997; Lessig 2004). An owner may allow others to build upon a protected work provided that the “new” work is similarly accessible or usable.

2.3 Patents

The domain or subject matter of patent law is the invention and discovery of new and useful processes, machines, articles of manufacture, or compositions of matter. There are three types of patents recognized by patent law: utility patents, design patents, and plant patents. Utility patents protect any new, useful, and nonobvious process, machine, article of manufacture, or composition of matter, as well as any new and useful improvement thereof. Design patents protect any new, original, and ornamental design for an article of manufacture. Finally, the subject matter of a plant patent is any new variety of plant. Patent protection is the strongest form of intellectual property protection, in that a twenty-year exclusive monopoly is granted to the owner over any expression or implementation of the protected work (35 U.S.C. §101 (1988) and 35 U.S.C. §154(a)(2)).

As with copyright, there are restrictions on the domain of patent protection. The U.S. Patent Act requires usefulness, novelty, and non-obviousness of the subject matter. The usefulness requirement is typically deemed satisfied if the invention can accomplish at least one of its intended purposes. Needless to say, given the expense of obtaining a patent, most machines, articles of manufacture, and processes are useful in this minimal sense.

A more robust requirement on the subject matter of a patent is that the invention defined in the claim for patent protection must be new or novel. There are several categories or events, all defined by statute, that can anticipate and invalidate a claim of a patent (35 U.S.C. §101 (1988)). In general, the novelty requirement invalidates patent claims if the invention was publicly known before the patent applicant invented it.

In addition to utility and novelty, the third restriction on patentability is non-obviousness. United States patent law requires that the invention not be obvious to one ordinarily skilled in the relevant art at the time the invention was made. A hypothetical individual is constructed and the question is asked, “Would this invention be obvious to an expert in the relevant field?” If it would be obvious to this imaginary individual then the patent claim fails the test (35 U.S.C. §103).

In return for public disclosure and the ensuing dissemination of information, the patent holder is granted the right to make, use, sell, and authorize others to sell the patented item (35 U.S.C. §154 (1984 and Supp. 1989)). The bundle of rights conferred by a patent excludes others from making, using, or selling the invention regardless of independent creation. Like copyright, patent rights lapse after a given period of time—20 years for utility and plant patents, 14 for design patents. But unlike copyright protection, during their period of applicability these rights preclude others who independently invent the same process or machine from being able to patent or market their invention.

2.4 Trade Secret

The subject matter of trade secret law is almost unlimited in terms of the content or subject matter that may be protected and typically relies on private measures, rather than state action, to preserve exclusivity. “A trade secret is any information that can be used in the operation of a business or other enterprise and that is sufficiently valuable and secret to afford an actual or potential economic advantage over others” (U.S. Legal Code, The Restatement (Third) of Unfair Competition, 1995, §39). The secret may be a formula for a chemical compound; a process of manufacturing, treating, or preserving materials; a pattern for a machine or other device; or a list of customers.

The two major restrictions on the domain of trade secrets are the requirements of secrecy and competitive advantage. An intellectual work is not a secret if it is generally known within the industry, published in trade journals, reference books, etc., or readily copyable from products on the market.

Although trade secret rights have no built-in expiration, they are extremely limited in one important respect. Owners of trade secrets have exclusive rights to make use of the secret only as long as the secret is maintained. If the secret is made public by the owner, then trade secret protection lapses and anyone can make use of it. Moreover, owners' rights do not exclude independent invention or discovery. Within the secrecy requirement, owners of trade secrets enjoy management rights and are protected from misappropriation. This latter protection is probably the most important right granted, given the proliferation of industrial espionage and employee theft of intellectual works.

2.5 Trademark

The domain or subject matter of trademark is, generally speaking, the good will or good name of a company. A trademark is any word, name, symbol, or device, or any combination thereof, adopted by a manufacturer or merchant to identify her goods and distinguish them from goods produced by others (15 U.S.C. §1127 (1988)).

A major restriction on what can count as a trademark is whether or not the symbol is used in everyday language. In this respect, owners of trademarks do not want their symbols to become too widely used because once this occurs, the trademark lapses. An example of this restriction eliminating a word from trademark protection is “aspirin”—as the word became a part of the common culture, rights to exclusively use the trademark lapsed.

Ownership of a trademark confers upon the property holder the right to use a particular mark or symbol and the right to exclude others from using the same (or similar) mark or symbol. The duration of these rights is limited only in cases where the mark or symbol ceases to represent a company or interest, or becomes entrenched as part of the common language or culture.

2.6 Protecting Mere Ideas

Outside of the regimes of copyright, patent, trade secret, and trademark, there is a substantial set of case law that allows individuals to protect mere ideas as personal property. This system of property is typically called the “law of ideas” (Epstein 1992). A highly publicized case in this area is Buchwald v. Paramount Pictures (13 U.S.P.Q. 2d 1497 (Cal. Super. Ct. 1990)), concerning the Eddie Murphy movie Coming to America.

The law of ideas is typically applied in cases where individuals produce ideas and submit them to corporations expecting to be compensated. In certain cases, when these ideas are used by the corporation (or anyone) without authorization, compensation may be required. Before concluding that an author has property rights to her idea(s), courts require the idea(s) to be novel or original (Murray v. National Broadcasting, 844 U.S. F2d 988 (Second Cir. 1988)) and concrete (Hamilton Nat'l Bank v. Belt (D.C. Cir. 1953)). Compensation is offered only in cases of misappropriation (Sellers v. American Broadcasting Co. (11th Cir. 1982)).

2.7 Droits Morals: Continental Systems of Intellectual Property

Article 6bis of the Berne Convention articulates the notion of “moral rights” that are included in continental European intellectual property law. The doctrine protects the personal rights of creators, as distinguished from their economic rights, and is generally known in France as “droits morals” or “moral rights.” These moral rights consist of the right to create and to publish a work in any form desired, the creator's right to claim the authorship of his work, the right to prevent any deformation, mutilation or other modification thereof, the right to withdraw and destroy the work, the prohibition against excessive criticism, and the prohibition against all other injuries to the creator's personality (Roeder 1940).

3. Justifications and Critiques

Arguments for intellectual property rights have generally taken one of three forms (Hughes 1988; Moore 2008). Personality theorists maintain that intellectual property is an extension of individual personality. Utilitarians ground intellectual property rights in social progress and incentives to innovate. Lockeans argue that rights are justified in relation to labor and merit. While each of these strands of justification has its weaknesses, there are also strengths unique to each.

3.1 Personality-Based Justifications of Intellectual Property

Personality theorists such as Hegel maintain that individuals have moral claims to their own talents, feelings, character traits, and experiences. We are self-owners in this sense. Control over physical and intellectual objects is essential for self-actualization—by expanding our selves outward beyond our own minds and mixing these selves with tangible and intangible items, we both define ourselves and obtain control over our goals and projects. For Hegel, the external actualization of the human will requires property (Hegel, 1821). Property rights are important in two ways according to this view. First, by controlling and manipulating objects, both tangible and intangible, our will takes form in the world and we obtain a measure of freedom. Individuals may use their physical and intellectual property rights, for example, to shield their private lives from public scrutiny and to facilitate life-long project pursuit. Second, in some cases our personality becomes fused with an object—thus moral claims to control feelings, character traits, and experiences may be expanded to intangible works (Humboldt, 1792; Kohler, 1969).

3.1.1 Problems for Personality-Based Justifications of Intellectual Property

There are at least four problems with this view (Hughes 1988; Palmer 2005; Schroeder 2006). First, it is not clear that we own our feelings, character traits, and experiences. While it is true that we have possession of these things or that they are a part of each of us, an argument is needed to establish the relevant moral claims.

Second, even if it could be established that individuals own or have moral claims to their personality, it does not automatically follow that such claims are expanded when personalities become infused in tangible or intangible works. Rather than establishing property claims to such works, perhaps we should view this as an abandonment of personality—similar to the sloughing off of hair and skin cells. Moreover, misrepresenting an intellectual work (assuming there are no moral rights to these expressions) might change the perception of an author's personality, but it would not in fact change their personality.

Third, assuming that moral claims to personality could be expanded to tangible or intangible items, we would still need an argument justifying property rights. Personality-based moral claims may warrant nothing more than use rights or prohibitions against alteration. Finally, there are many intellectual innovations in which there is no evidence of a creator's personality—a list of customers or a new safety-pin design, for instance (Hughes 1988). Given these challenges, personality-based theories may not provide a strong moral foundation for legal systems of intellectual property.

3.1.2 The Personality Theorist's Rejoinder

Even if we acknowledge the force of these objections, there does seem to be something intuitively appealing about personality-based theories of intellectual property rights (Moore 2008). Suppose, for example, that Mr. Friday buys a painting at a garage sale—a long-lost Crusoe original. Friday takes the painting home and alters the painting with a marker, drawing horns and mustaches on the figures in the painting. The additions are so clever and fit so nicely into the painting that Friday hangs it in a window on a busy street. There are at least two ethical worries to consider in this case. First, the alterations by Friday may cause unjustified economic damage to Crusoe. Second, and independent of the economic considerations, Friday's actions may damage Crusoe's reputation. The integrity of the painting has been violated without the consent of the author, perhaps causing long-term damage to his reputation and community standing. If these claims are sensible, then it appears that we are acknowledging personality-based moral “strings” attaching to certain intellectual works. By producing intellectual works, authors and inventors put themselves on display, so-to-speak, and incur certain risks. Intellectual property rights afford authors and inventors a measure of control over this risk. To put the point a different way, it is the moral claims that attach to personality, reputation, and the physical embodiments of these individual goods that justify legal rules covering damage to reputation and certain sorts of economic losses.

Moreover, personality-based theories of intellectual property often appeal to other moral considerations. Hegel's personality-based justification of intellectual property rights included an incentive-based component as well—he asserts that protecting the sciences promotes them, benefiting society (Hegel, 1821). Perhaps the best way to protect these intuitively attractive personality-based claims to intangible works is to adopt a more comprehensive system designed to promote progress and social utility.

3.2 The Utilitarian Incentives-Based Argument for Intellectual Property

In terms of “justification,” modern Anglo-American systems of intellectual property are typically modeled as incentive-based and utilitarian (Oppenheim 1951; Machlup 1962; Boonin 1989; Hettinger 1989; Mackaay 1990; Coskery 1993; Palmer 1997; Moore 2001, 2003). On this view, a necessary condition for promoting the creation of valuable intellectual works is granting limited rights of ownership to authors and inventors. Absent certain guarantees, authors and inventors might not engage in producing intellectual property. Thus control is granted to authors and inventors of intellectual property, because granting such control provides incentives necessary for social progress. Although success is not ensured by granting these rights, failure is inevitable if those who incur no investment costs can seize and reproduce the intellectual effort of others (Moore 2001, 2003). Adopting systems of protection like copyright, patent, and trade secret yields an optimal amount of intellectual works being produced, and a corresponding optimal amount of social utility. Coupled with the theoretical claim that society ought to maximize social utility, we arrive at a simple yet powerful argument for the protection of intellectual property rights.

3.2.1 The Character of the Utilitarian Incentives-Based Argument: A Problem Shared by Both Sides

It is crucial to note that the issue of whether intellectual property protection does, or does not, sufficiently promote human happiness or well-being is an empirical question that requires empirical data in the form that the appropriate sociological and economic studies would provide. Whether or not, for example, intellectual property protection provides an incentive that elicits some optimal output of content creation can be settled only by looking to the empirical evidence. Likewise, whether or not intellectual property protection has the effect of hindering innovation and inhibiting the production of novel valuable content can be settled only by empirical evidence.

At this point, more empirical research is needed by economists and sociologists, one way or another, to determine the effects of IP protection on technological and artistic development. It is helpful to note that more empirically based research is being done to resolve these questions. Carrier (2012), one especially noteworthy recent example, presents the results of interviews with 31 CEOs about the results of the Napster case, as well as examines the effects of copyright litigation. Although a step in the right direction, Carrier (2012) illustrates some of the difficulties in obtaining persuasive empirical evidence. Interviews, even with CEOs, are anecdotal in character on an issue that would seem to require, among other things, a comprehensive examination of the relative effects of providing various forms of protection to intellectual property on important indicators of economic efficiency. The difficulties involved in obtaining such evidence suggest that the empirical question will remain debated for some time.

3.2.2 Problems for the Utilitarian Incentives-Based Argument

Given that this argument rests on providing incentives, what is needed to critique it are cases that illustrate better ways, or equally good ways, of stimulating production without granting private property rights to authors and inventors. It would be better to establish equally powerful incentives for the production of intellectual property that did not also require initial restricted use guaranteed by rights (Polanyi 1943; Machlup 1962; Hettinger 1989; Waldron 1993; Moore 2001, 2003; Wright 1998).

One alternative to granting intellectual property rights to inventors as incentive is government support of intellectual labor (Hettinger, 1989; Calandrillo, 1998). This could take the form of government-funded research projects, with the results immediately becoming public property. The question becomes: can government support of intellectual labor provide enough incentive to authors and inventors so that an equal or greater amount of intellectual products are created compared to what is produced by conferring limited property rights? Better results may also be had if fewer intellectual works of higher quality were distributed to more people.

Unlike the current government-supported system of intellectual property rights, reward models may be able to avoid the problems of allowing monopoly control and restricting access, and at the same time provide incentives to innovate (Shavell and Van Ypersele 2001). In this model, innovators would still burn the midnight oil chasing that pot of gold, and governments would not have to decide which projects to fund or determine the amount of the rewards before the works' “social value” was known. Funds necessary to pay the rewards could be drawn from taxes or collecting percentages of the profits of these innovations. Reward models may also avoid the disadvantages of monopoly pricing, and obstructions to further adaptation and innovation.

Trade secret protection appears to be the most troubling from a utilitarian incentives-based perspective (Hettinger 1989). Given that no disclosure is necessary for trade secret protection, promoting trade secrets through incentives yields no reciprocal long-term social benefit. Trade secret protection allows authors and inventors the right to slow the dissemination of protected information indefinitely—a trade secret necessarily requires secrecy.

Finally, empirical questions about the costs and benefits of copyright, patent, and trade secret protection are notoriously difficult to determine. Economists who have considered the question indicate that either the jury is out, or that other arrangements would be better (Machlup 1962; Priest 1986; Long 2000). If we cannot appeal to the progress-enhancing features of intellectual property protection, then the utilitarian can hardly appeal to such progress as justification.

3.2.3 The Utilitarian Rejoinder

The utilitarian may well agree with many of these criticisms and still maintain that intellectual property rights, in some form, are justified—a system of protection is better than nothing at all. Putting aside the last criticism, all of the worries surrounding the incentive-based approach appear to focus on problems of implementation. We could tinker with our system of intellectual property, cutting back on some legal protections and strengthening others (Coskery 1993). Perhaps we could include more personality-based restrictions on what can be done with an intangible work after the first sale, limit the term of copyrights, patents, and trade secrets to something more reasonable, and find ways to embrace technologies that promote access while protecting incentives to innovate. The utilitarian might also remind us of the costs of changing our system of intellectual property.

3.3 Lockean Justifications of Intellectual Property

A final strategy for justifying intellectual property rights begins with the claim that individuals are entitled to control the fruits of their labor (Hettinger 1989; Becker 1993; Gordon 1993; Moore 1997, 1998, 2001, 2012; Hughes 1988; Palmer 2005; Himma 2005, 2006, 2008). Laboring, producing, thinking, and persevering are voluntary, and individuals who engage in these activities are entitled to what they produce. Subject to certain restrictions, rights are generated when individuals mix their labor with an unowned object. The intuition is that the person who clears unowned land, cultivates crops, builds a house, or creates a new invention obtains property rights by engaging in these activities.

Consider a more formal version of Locke's famous argument. Individuals own their own bodies and labor—i.e., they are self-owners. When an individual labors on an unowned object, her labor becomes infused in the object and for the most part, the labor and the object cannot be separated. It follows that once a person's labor is joined with an unowned object, assuming that individuals exclusively own their body and labor, rights to control are generated. The idea is that there is an expansion of rights: we each own our labor and when that labor is mixed with objects in the commons, our rights are expanded to include these goods.

3.3.1 Objections to Locke

Locke's argument is not without difficulties. Jeremy Waldron (1983) argued that the idea of mixing one's labor is incoherent—actions cannot be mixed with objects. P. J. Proudhon (1840) argued that if labor was important, the second labor on an object should ground a property right in an object as reliably as the first labor. Nozick (1974) asked why labor mixing generated property rights rather than a loss of labor. Waldron (1983) and Perry (1978) have argued that mixing one's labor with an unowned object should yield more limited rights than rights of full ownership. Finally, if the skills, tools, and inventions used in laboring are social products, then perhaps individual claims to title have been undermined (Grant 1987; Hettinger 1989).

3.3.2 The Lockean Rejoinder

Among defenders of Lockean-based arguments for private property, these challenges have not gone unnoticed (Spooner 1855; Schmidtz 1990; Mack 1990; Simmons 1992; Child 1990; Moore 1997, 2001, 2012). Rather than rehearsing the points and counterpoints, consider a modified version of the Lockean argument—one that does not so easily fall prey to the objections mentioned above (Moore, 2001, 2012):

After weeks of effort and numerous failures, suppose Ginger comes up with an excellent new recipe for spicy Chinese noodles—a recipe that she keeps in her mind and does not write down. Would anyone argue that Ginger does not have at least some minimal moral claim to control the recipe? Suppose that Fred samples some of Ginger's noodles and desires to purchase the recipe. Is there anything morally suspicious with an agreement between them that grants Fred a limited right to use Ginger's recipe provided that Fred does not disclose the process? Alas, Fred didn't have to agree to the terms and, no matter how tasty the noodles, he could eat something else or create his own recipe. Arguably, part of the moral weightiness of the agreement between Ginger and Fred relies on the fact that Ginger holds legitimate title to the recipe.

In small communities it may even be possible to contract with all of one's fellows securing all or some of the bundle of full ownership. In this sort of example, every single member of the community would be directly part of the agreement. Ginger says to her peers, “if you want access to my recipe, then you will have to agree to my right to enjoy income” and they reply “but such rights can't be indefinite … we as a community won't be on the hook for defending this agreement indefinitely.” In the ensuing give-and-take an agreement is hammered out. It is important to note that the moral bindingness of such an agreement is crucially dependent on the initial set of entitlement claims generated by labor, desert, and non-worsening. If Ginger, in this case, was not the author of the recipe — suppose she took it from someone else — it is not at all clear that the resulting contract would be morally or legally binding.

Moving from small communities to larger ones a more general form of agreement between authors, inventors, and society can be considered. If intellectual works are to be held as anything other than trade secrets, walled off with narrow contracts like non-disclosure agreements or non-competition arrangements, there must be a way of securing access. Society may purchase access by offering limited rights to authors and inventors. Moreover, if some society does not offer this sort of protection, then innovators would likely employ their talents in other areas or simply move to a society where such agreements are recognized (Moore 2012).

4. General Critiques of Intellectual Property

Putting aside the strands of argument that seek to justify moral claims to intangible works and the rather focused problems with these views, there are several general critiques of the rights to control intellectual property to consider.

4.1 Information is Not Property

Critics argue that information is not the kind of thing that can be owned or possessed and is not something that can be property, as that notion is typically defined. Information objects, such as numbers and propositions are abstract objects, which cannot causally interact with material objects, and hence cannot be owned or possessed. The idea, for example, that one could, in the relevant sense, possess and hence own the novel expressed by the book A Tale of Two Cities makes as little sense as the idea that one could possess and hence own the entity denoted by the symbol “2.” Whatever concepts might properly be applied to abstract objects, on this view, the concept of property, according to these theorists, does not. As a conceptual matter, the term “intellectual property,” at best, applies to nothing and, at worst, is incoherent.

This analysis is vulnerable to at least two objections. First, it is not clear that ownership, as a conceptual matter, requires physical possession. One can argue that the essence of ownership consists in a power — the power to exclude others from certain behaviors involving the relevant entity — and not in physical control or possession of the entity. Second, the claim that information objects cannot be property does not imply that it is illegitimate to grant to authors or content-creators a legal right to exclude others from appropriating those objects without their consent. That some entity E is not “property” implies only that it should not be legally protected qua property; it does not imply that E should not be protected in very similar ways. It might be that such legal rights should be called something other than “intellectual property rights,” but these rights could be called something else, such as, for example, “intellectual content rights.”

4.2 Information is Non-Rivalrous

Many have argued that the non-rivalrous nature of intellectual works grounds a prima facie case against rights to restrict access. Since intellectual works are not typically consumed by their use and can be used by many individuals concurrently (making a copy does not deprive anyone of their possessions), we have a strong case against moral and legal intellectual property rights (Kuflik 1989; Hettinger 1989; Barlow 1997). One reason for the widespread pirating of intellectual works is that many people think restricting access to these works is unjustified. Consider a more formal version of this argument:

P1.
If a tangible or intangible work can be used and consumed by many individuals concurrently (is non-rivalrous), then maximal access and use should be permitted.
P2.
Intellectual works falling under the domains of copyright, patent, and trade secret protection are non-rivalrous.
C3.
It follows that there is an immediate prima facie case against intellectual property rights, or for allowing maximal access to intellectual works.

The weak point in this argument is the first premise (Moore 2001, 2010, 2012; Himma, 2005). Consider sensitive personal information. Moore argues that it false to claim that just because this information can be used and consumed by many individuals concurrently, a prima facie moral claim to maximal access is established. This argument applies as well to snuff films, obscene pornography, information related to national security, personal financial information, and private thoughts; each are non-rivalrous, but this fact does not by itself generate prima facie moral claims for maximal access and use. Moreover, it is not clear that unauthorized copying does no harm to the owner even in cases where the copier would not have purchased a copy legitimately (and thus is not denying the owner economic compensation they would otherwise receive). Unauthorized copying creates un-consented to risks that owners must shoulder.

Himma points out that, by itself, the claim that consumption of information is non-rivalrous does not imply that we have a right of any kind to those objects. While this certainly provides a reason against thinking protection of intellectual property is morally justified, it does not tell us anything about whether we have a right of some sort because it does not contain any information about morally relevant properties of human beings—and the justification of general rights-claims necessarily rests on attributions of value that implicitly respond to interests of beings with the appropriate level of moral standing—in our case, our status as persons (Himma 2005).

4.3 Information Wants to be Free

Barlow (1997) argues that information is entitled to moral consideration in virtue of being alive. On his view, information is a form of life with a claim to be free that is grounded in interests and “wants” of its own. As he puts the point, information objects “are life forms in every respect but a basis in the carbon atom. They self-reproduce, they interact with their surroundings and adapt to them, they mutate, they persist.” Further, these living information objects have some sort of interest in being made available to everyone free of charge.

Barlow's argument can be challenged on a couple of grounds. First, Himma (2005) argues that it is simply implausible to think of abstract objects as having wants — or even interests. The concept of desire is such that only conscious beings are capable of having desires; although a conscious being can have subconscious desires, non-sentient entitles are no more accurately characterized as having desires than as having hopes. Second, even if information objects had wants or interests, Barlow gives no reason for thinking that they have a desire to, or interest in being made freely available to all. Certainly, the claim that being made freely available to all somehow benefits information objects needs an argument if for no other reason than that it is counterintuitive.

4.4 The Free Speech Argument against Intellectual Property

According to some, permitting intellectual property rights are inconsistent with our commitment to freedom of thought and speech (Nimmer 1970; Hettinger 1989; Waldron 1993). Hettinger argues that intellectual property “restricts methods of acquiring ideas (as do trade secrets), it restricts the use of ideas (as do patents), and it restricts the expression of ideas (as do copyrights)—restrictions undesirable for a number of reasons” (Hettinger 1989). Hettinger singles out trade secrets as the most troublesome because, unlike patents and copyrights, they do not require disclosure.

Three sorts of replies have been offered to this kind of worry (Himma 2006, Moore 2010, 2012). The first notes that it is the incentives found in providing limited protection that fosters the creation and dissemination of information—a system of intellectual property protection may cause restricted access in the short run, but overall, the commons of thought and expression is enhanced.

Second, it is not at all clear that free speech is so presumptively weighty that it nearly always trumps other values. Shouting at someone over a bullhorn all day is not something we would countenance as protected free speech (Moore 2010, 2012). Hate speech, obscene expressions, sexual harassment, and broadcasting private medical information about others are each examples of speech that we are willing to limit for various reasons—perhaps intellectual property rights can be viewed in this light.

Finally, consider the contentious, yet established, idea/expression rule of copyright. Copyright only applies to fixed expressions, not to the ideas that may make up a fixed expression. For example, someone may read Darwin's original writings on evolution, express these ideas in her own words, and obtain a copyright in the new expression. This individual may be guilty of plagiarism, but so long as her expressions are not copied from Einstein's original or substantially similar to the original, she can obtain a copyright (Moore 2012).

4.5 The Social Nature of Information Argument

According to this view, information is a social product and enforcing access restrictions unduly benefits authors and inventors. Individuals are raised in societies that endow them with knowledge which these individuals then use to create intellectual works of all kinds. On this view the building blocks of intellectual works—knowledge—is a social product. Individuals should not have exclusive and perpetual ownership of the works that they create because these works are built upon the shared knowledge of society. Allowing rights to intellectual works would be similar to granting ownership to the individual who placed the last brick in a public works dam. The dam is a social product, built up by the efforts of hundreds, and knowledge, upon which all intellectual works are built, is built up in a similar fashion (Proudhon 1840; Grant 1987; Shapiro 1991; Simmons 1992).

Beyond challenging whether the notion of “society” employed in this view is clear enough to carry the weight that the argument demands, critics have questioned the view that societies can be owed something or that they can own or deserve something (Spooner 1855; Nozick 1974; Moore 2001, 2010, 2012). Lysander Spooner writes

What rights society has, in ideas, which they did not produce, and have never purchased, it would probably be very difficult to define; and equally difficult to explain how society became possessed of those rights. It certainly requires something more than assertion, to prove that by simply coming to a knowledge of certain ideas—the products of individual labor—society acquires any valid title to them, or, consequently, any rights in them” (Spooner 1855).

Moore charges that defenders of this sort of argument fail to see that it may prove too much.

But like the defender of the first cause argument for the existence of God who rides the principle of sufficient causation to a certain point and then conveniently abandons it (every event or object needs a sufficient cause and nothing is self-caused except God) the proponent of the “shared culture” view is guilty of a similar trick. “Shared culture” or the social nature of intellectual property view is sufficient for undermining intellectual property rights or robust control of intellectual works but conveniently not strong enough to undermine student desert for a grade, criminal punishment, or other sorts of moral evaluation (Moore 2012).

Finally, even if a defender of this view can justify societal ownership of general pools of knowledge and information, it could be argued that we have already paid for the use of this collective wisdom when we pay for education and the like (Moore 1998, 2001, 2012).

4.6 The Cost of Publishing Digital Information

Coy (2007) argues is that, in a competitive market, the cost of information should properly reflect the cost of making it available to users. On this line of analysis, while the cost of making publishing information in traditional material media like books might be sufficiently high to justify charging users a price for it, the cost (per user) of making information available on digital media approaches zero as the number of users grow larger. For example, there might be some fixed cost involved in making information available on a website, but no additional cost is required beyond that to make that content available to any number of users; the more users appropriating the information, the lower the cost of making it available to any particular user. Thus, the argument concludes, it would be unfair to charge users a fee for appropriating any piece of (digital) information; information should be free (or nearly free) so as to reflect its dissemination costs.

There are two problems with this argument. First, if one accepts the legitimacy of free enterprise, as appears to be presupposed by the above argument, then what is a fair price will be determined by the voluntary interactions of buyers and sellers in a competitive market: the fair price is that which is set by the contractual transactions of free, prudentially-rational buyers and sellers. If buyers in a competitive market are willing to pay a price for digital information that is significantly higher than the seller's marginal cost, then that price can be presumed fair. Second, the argument overlooks the fact that the fixed costs associated with producing and distributing intellectual content can be quite high. For example, the Disney Company spent more than $100 million in making the film Pearl Harbor. If one assumes that a fair price is such as to allow the producer to recover the fixed development costs associated with producing and distributing intellectual content, this would entail that it is fair for content producers to charge a price that is sufficiently above the marginal costs to allow them to recover these fixed costs.

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Adam Moore <moore2@u.washington.edu>
Ken Himma <himma@uw.edu>

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