Kant's Social and Political Philosophy

First published Tue Jul 24, 2007; substantive revision Thu Sep 1, 2016

Kant wrote his social and political philosophy in order to champion the Enlightenment in general and the idea of freedom in particular. His work came within both the natural law and the social contract traditions. Kant held that every rational being had both an innate right to freedom and a duty to enter into a civil condition governed by a social contract in order to realize and preserve that freedom.

His writings on political philosophy consist of one book and several shorter works. The “Doctrine of Right”, Part One of his two-part Metaphysics of Morals and first published as a stand-alone book in February 1797, contains virtually every directly political topic he treats. Other shorter works include a useful short summary of his discussion of the basis and role of the state in the second section of the essay “Theory and Practice”, an extended discussion of international relations in the essay “Toward Perpetual Peace”, and the essay “An Answer to the Question: What is Enlightenment?.” Other published material relevant to the topics include material on history, on practical philosophy in general, and, for his social philosophy, his work on religion, education, and anthropology. Kant also offered a biannual lecture course on “Natural Right”, a student’s (Feyerabend) transcript of which is available in English translation.

1. The Place of Political Philosophy within Kant’s Philosophical System

Kant’s political philosophy is a branch of practical philosophy, one-half of one of the broadest divisions in Kant’s thought between practical and theoretical philosophy. Political philosophy is also to be distinguished within practical philosophy from both empirical elements and from virtue proper. The separation from virtue is treated later in this section. Regarding the empirical elements, it is worth mentioning that practical philosophy, as a set of rules governing free behavior of rational beings, covers all human action in both its pure and applied (empirical, or “impure”) aspects. Pure practical philosophy, the rational elements of practical philosophy in abstraction from anything empirical, is called by Kant “metaphysics of morals” (4:388). Kant so emphasized the priority of the pure aspect of political philosophy that he wrote part of his essay “On the Common Saying: That May be Correct in Theory, but it is of No Use in Practice” in opposition to the view he associates with Hobbes that the politician need not be concerned with abstract right but only with pragmatic governance (8:289–306). Yet Kant also included the more pragmatic, impure, empirical study of human behavior as part of practical philosophy. For ethics in general, Kant called the empirical study of human beings as agents within particular cultures and with particular natural capacities “anthropology”. Some of Kant’s social philosophy fits into this rubric (see section 10).

Political philosophy is not only a branch of Kant’s practical philosophy, it strongly depends upon Kant’s core practical philosophy for its basis. Kant’s practical philosophy and the categorical imperative that governs it were intended to form the ground not only for what is thought today to be ethics proper but also for everything that broadly speaking had to do with deliberative human behavior. He defined practical philosophy as that concerned with “rules of behavior in regard to free choice”, as opposed to theoretical philosophy that concerned “the rule of knowledge” (Kant 27: 243). Practical philosophy provided rules to govern human deliberative action. The Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals provided Kant’s main arguments that the categorical imperative is the supreme rule for human deliberative action. In its Preface, he notes that the Groundwork is to be a preparatory book for a future Metaphysics of Morals. Twelve years later he published that Metaphysics of Morals in two parts, the “Doctrine of Right” and the “Doctrine of Virtue”. Both are equally parts of Kant’s practical philosophy, and both thus have the categorical imperative as their highest principle.

The book Metaphysics of Morals has two distinct parts: the “Doctrine of Right” and the “Doctrine of Virtue”. Kant sought to separate political rights and duties from what we might call morals in the narrow sense. He limits right by stating three conditions (6:230) that have to be met for something to be enforceable as right: first, right concerns only actions that have influence on other persons, directly or indirectly, meaning duties to the self are excluded, second right does not concern the wish but only the choice of others, meaning that not mere desires but only decisions which bring about actions are at stake, and third right does not concern the matter of the other’s act but only the form, meaning no particular desires or ends are assumed on the part of the agents. As an example of the latter he considers trade, which for right must have the form of being freely agreed by both parties but can have any matter or purpose the agents want. These criteria appear to be less rigid than Kant ultimately intends, for the term “influence” is vague enough that it might include far-reaching minor effects. They would also include under right actions even those imperfect duties that “influence” others by improving their lot, such as beneficent acts of charity. John Stuart Mill’s “harm principle” does not face this problem since it specifies that the influence to be subject to law is always negative. While Kant must include consideration of beneficent action as part of right, he does not conclude that beneficent actions are required by right but only that most are permitted by right and others violate right. His focus on free individual choice entails that any beneficent action that interferes with or usurps the recipient’s free choice is wrong (for example, improving the recipient’s property without permission as opposed to merely donating money to a fund made available to the recipient at the recipient’s discretion).

In addition to these three conditions for right, Kant also offers direct contrasts between right and virtue. He thinks both relate to freedom but in different ways: right concerns outer freedom and virtue concerns inner freedom (being master of one’s own passions) (6:406–07). Right concerns acts themselves independent of the motive an agent may have for performing them, virtue concerns the proper motive for dutiful actions (6:218–221). In another formulation (6:380–81) he says that right concerns universality as a formal condition of freedom while virtue concerns a necessary end beyond the mere formality of universality, thus appearing to tie the distinction to the first two formulas of the categorical imperative in the Groundwork. In yet another he says that right concerns narrow duties and virtue wide duties (6:390). In the Feyerabend lectures, Kant notes that right is the subset of morally correct actions that are also coercible (27:1327). These various alternative formulations of the distinction would exclude imperfect duties not because imperfect duties do not “influence” others (they do) but because, as imperfect, they cannot be coerced in particular instances, since imperfect duties always allow for the moderating role of an individual’s inclinations. While these various formulations of the distinction appear to be quite different, they can in general be summarized by saying that right concerns outer action corresponding to perfect duty that affects others regardless of the individual’s internal motivations or goals.

2. Freedom as the Basis of the State

“There is only one innate right,” says Kant, “Freedom (independence from being constrained by another’s choice), insofar as it can coexist with the freedom of every other in accordance with a universal law” (6:237). Kant rejects any other basis for the state, in particular arguing that the welfare of citizens cannot be the basis of state power. He argues that a state cannot legitimately impose any particular conception of happiness upon its citizens (8:290–91). To do so would be for the ruler to treat citizens as children, assuming that they are unable to understand what is truly useful or harmful to themselves.

This claim must be understood in light of Kant’s more general claim that moral law cannot be based upon happiness or any other given empirical good. In the Groundwork Kant contrasts an ethics of autonomy, in which the will (Wille, or practical reason itself) is the basis of its own law, from the ethics of heteronomy, in which something independent of the will, such as happiness, is the basis of moral law (4:440–41). In the Critique of Practical Reason he argues that happiness (the agreeableness of life when things go in accordance with one’s wishes and desires), although universally sought by human beings, is not specific enough to entail any particular universal desires in human beings. Further, even were there any universal desires among human beings, those desires would, as empirical, be merely contingent and thus unworthy of being the basis of any pure moral law (5:25–26). No particular conception of happiness can be the basis of the pure principle of the state, and the general conception of happiness is too vague to serve as the basis of a law. Hence, a “universal principle of right” cannot be based upon happiness but only on something truly universal, such as freedom. The “universal principle of right” Kant offers is thus “Any action is right if it can coexist with everyone’s freedom in accordance with a universal law, or if on its maxim the freedom of choice of each can coexist with everyone’s freedom in accordance with a universal law” (6:230).

This explains why happiness is not universal, but not why freedom is universal. By “freedom” in political philosophy, Kant is not referring to the transcendental conception of freedom usually associated with the problem of the freedom of the will amid determinism in accordance with laws of nature, a solution to which is provided in the Third Antinomy of the Critique of Pure Reason. Rather, freedom in political philosophy is defined, as in the claim above about the only innate right, as “independence from being constrained by another’s choice”. His concern in political philosophy is not with laws of nature determining a human being’s choice but by other human beings determining a human being’s choice, hence the kind of freedom Kant is concerned with in political philosophy is individual freedom of action. Still, the universality of political freedom is linked to transcendental freedom. Kant assumes that a human being’s use of choice (at least when it is properly guided by reason) is free in the transcendental sense. Since every human being does enjoy transcendental freedom by virtue of being rational, freedom of choice is a universal human attribute. And this freedom of choice is to be respected and promoted, even when this choice is not exercised in rational or virtuous activity. Presumably respecting freedom of choice involves allowing it to be effective in determining actions; this is why Kant calls political freedom, or “independence from being constrained by another’s choice”, the only innate right. One might still object that this freedom of choice is incapable of being the basis of a pure principle of right for the same reason that happiness was incapable of being its basis, namely, that it is too vague in itself and that when specified by the particular decisions individuals make with their free choice, it loses its universality. Kant holds that this problem does not arise for freedom, since freedom of choice can be understood both in terms of its content (the particular decisions individuals make) and its form (the free, unconstrained nature of choice of any possible particular end) (6:230). Freedom is universal in the proper sense because, unlike happiness, it can be understood in such a way that it is susceptible to specification without losing its universality. Right will be based on the form of free choice.

The very existence of a state might seem to some as a limitation of freedom, since a state possesses power to control the external freedom of individual citizens through force. This is the basic claim of anarchism. Kant holds in contrast that the state is not an impediment to freedom but is the means for freedom. State action that is a hindrance to freedom can, when properly directed, support and maintain freedom if the state action is aimed at hindering actions that themselves would hinder the freedom of others. Given a subject’s action that would limit the freedom of another subject, the state may hinder the first subject to defend the second by “hindering a hindrance to freedom”. Such state coercion is compatible with the maximal freedom demanded in the principle of right because it does not reduce freedom but instead provides the necessary background conditions needed to secure freedom. The amount of freedom lost by the first subject through direct state coercion is equal to the amount gained by the second subject through lifting the hindrance to actions. State action sustains the maximal amount of freedom consistent with identical freedom for all without reducing it.

Freedom is not the only basis for principles underlying the state. In “Theory and Practice” Kant makes freedom the first of three principles (8:290):

  1. The freedom of every member of the state as a human being.
  2. The equality of each with every other as a subject.
  3. The independence of every member of a commonwealth as a citizen.

Freedom as discussed in “Theory and Practice” stresses the autonomous right of all individuals to conceive of happiness in their own way. Interference with another’s freedom is understood as coercing the other to be happy as the former sees fit. The direct link to action comes when pursuing that autonomously chosen conception of happiness. Each may pursue happiness as they see fit provided that their pursuit does not infringe upon others’ similar pursuits.

Equality is not substantive but formal. Each member of the state is equal to every other member of the state before the law. Each has equal coercive right, that is, the right to invoke the power of the state to enforce the laws on one’s behalf. (Kant exempts the head of state from this equality, since the head of state cannot be coerced by anyone else). This formal equality is perfectly compatible with the inequality of members of the state in income, physical power, mental ability, possessions, etc. Further, this equality supports an equality of opportunity: every office or rank in the political structure must be open to all subjects without regard for any hereditary or similar restrictions.

Independence concerns citizens as subject to laws they give themselves, i.e. as co-legislators of the laws. While this principle appears to require universal democratic decision making for particular laws, Kant instead understands this principle on two levels, one of which is not universal and the other of which is not for particular laws. At one level, that of participation in determination of particular laws, citizenship does not extend to all. Kant excludes women and children, weakly claiming that their exclusion is natural, as well as anyone who lacks economic self-sufficiency. Hence decision making is not universal. While Kant thereby denies women and others full citizenship in the ability to take part in legislation, he stresses that he is not denying them the rights entailed by freedom and equality as “passive” members of the state. At the second level, he claims that all members of the state, as subjects of the law, must be able to will the basic law that governs them. This basic law is the “original contract” and will be discussed in the next section. The basic law is willed by each subject in the sense that the “will of all” or a “public will”, or “general will” (Kant uses Rousseau’s term) determines the basic law. Hence decision making at this level is not for particular laws. Particular laws, in contrast, are to be determined by a majority of the citizens with voting rights, as will be discussed in section 4.

3. Social Contract

Kant provides two distinct discussions of social contract. One concerns property and will be treated in more detail in section 5 below. The second discussion of social contract comes in the essay “Theory and Practice” in the context of an a priori restriction on the legitimate policies the sovereign may pursue. The sovereign must recognize the “original contract” as an idea of reason that forces the sovereign to “give his laws in such a way that they could have arisen from the united will of a whole people and to regard each subject, insofar as he wants to be a citizen, as if he has joined in voting for such a will” (8:297). This original contract, Kant stresses, is only an idea of reason and not a historical event. Any rights and duties stemming from an original contract do so not because of any particular historical provenance, but because of the rightful relations embodied in the original contract. No empirical act, as a historical act would be, could be the foundation of any rightful duties or rights. The idea of an original contract limits the sovereign as legislator. No law may be promulgated that “a whole people could not possibly give its consent to” (8:297). The consent at issue, however, is also not an empirical consent based upon any actual act. The set of actual particular desires of citizens is not the basis of determining whether they could possibly consent to a law. Rather, the kind of possibility at issue is one of rational possible unanimity based upon fair distributions of burdens and rights in abstraction from empirical facts or desires. Kant’s two examples both exemplify this consideration of possible rational unanimity. His first example is a law that would provide hereditary privileges to members of a certain class of subjects. This law would be unjust because it would be irrational for those who would not be members of this class to agree to accept fewer privileges than members of the class. One might say that no possible empirical information could cause all individuals to agree to this law. Kant’s second example concerns a war tax. If the tax is administered fairly, it would not be unjust. Kant adds that even if the actual citizens opposed the war, the war tax would be just because it is possible that the war is being waged for legitimate reasons that the state but not the citizens know about. Here possible empirical information might cause all citizens to approve the law. In both these examples, the conception of “possible consent” abstracts from actual desires individual citizens have. The possible consent is not based upon a hypothetical vote given actual preferences but is based on a rational conception of agreement given any possible empirical information.

Kant’s view is similar to the social contract theory of Hobbes in a few important respects. The social contract is not a historical document and does not involve a historical act. In fact it can be dangerous to the stability of the state to even search history for such empirical justification of state power (6:318). The current state must be understood, regardless of its origin, to embody the social contact. The social contract is a rational justification for state power, not a result of actual deal-making among individuals or between them and a government. Another link to Hobbes is that the social contract is not voluntary. Individuals may be forced into the civil condition against their consent (6:256). Social contract is not based on any actual consent such as a voluntary choice to form a civil society along with others. Since the social contract reflects reason, each human being as a rational being already contains the basis for rational agreement to the state. Are individuals then coerced to recognize their subjection to state power against their will? Since Kant defines “will” as “practical reason itself” (Groundwork, 4:412), the answer for him is “no.” If one defines “will” as arbitrary choice, then the answer is “yes.” This is the same dichotomy that arises with regard to Kant’s theory of punishment (section 7). A substantial difference between Kant and Hobbes is that Hobbes bases his argument on the individual benefit for each party to the contract, whereas Kant bases his argument on Right itself, understood as freedom for all persons in general, not just for the individual benefit that the parties to the contract obtain in their own particular freedom. To this extent Kant is influenced more by Rousseau’s idea of the General Will.

4. Republics, Enlightenment, and Democracy

Kant was a central figure in the philosophy of the Enlightenment. One of his popular essays, “An Answer to the Question: What is Enlightenment?” discusses Enlightenment in terms of the use of an individual’s own reason (8:35f). To be Enlightened is to emerge from one’s self-incurred minority (juvenile) status to a mature ability to think for oneself. In another essay, “What Does it Mean to Orient Oneself in Thought?” Kant defines Enlightenment as “the maxim of always thinking for oneself” (8:146). “What is Enlightenment” distinguishes between the public and private uses of reason. The private use of reason is, for government officials, the use of reason they must utilize in their official positions. For example, a member of the clergy (who in Kant’s Prussia were employees of the state) is required to espouse the official doctrine in sermons and teachings. The public use of reason is the use an individual makes of reason as a scholar reaching the public world of readers. For example, the same member of the clergy could, as a scholar, present perceived shortcomings in that very same doctrine. Similarly, military officers can, using public reason, question the value or appropriateness of the orders they receive, but in their functions as military officers, using private reason, they are obliged to obey the same orders. Since the sovereign might err, and individual citizens have the right to attempt to correct the error under the assumption that the sovereign does not intend to err: “a citizen must have, with the approval of the ruler himself, the authorization to make known publicly his opinions about what it is in the ruler’s arrangements that seems to him to be a wrong against the commonwealth,” writes Kant in “Theory and Practice”. This freedom of the pen is “the sole palladium” of the rights of the people, for without this means the people would have no way to make any claims to rights at all (8:304).

One might expect from this emphasis that Kant would insist that the proper political system is one that not only allows individuals to think for themselves about political issues, but also contains a mechanism such as voting to translate those well reasoned opinions into government policy. One would be wrong. Kant does not stress self-government. In his discussion in “Perpetual Peace” of the traditional division of the types of government Kant classifies governments in two dimensions (8:352). The first is the “form of sovereignty”, concerning who rules, and here Kant identifies the traditional three forms: either rule by one person, rule by a small group of people, or rule by all people. The second is the “form of government” concerning how those people rule, and here Kant offers a variation on the traditional good/bad dichotomy: either republican or despotic. By “republican,” Kant means “separation of the executive power (the government) from the legislative power”. Despotism is their unity such that the same ruler both gives and enforces laws, in essence making an individual private will into the public will. Republics require representation in order to ensure that the executive power only enforces the public will by insisting that the executive enforce only laws that representatives of the people, not the executive itself, make. But a republic is compatible with a single individual acting as legislator provided that others act as executives; for example, a monarch would issue laws in the name of the people’s will but the monarch’s ministers would enforce those laws. Kant’s claim that such a government is republican (see also 27:1384) showcases his view that a republican government need not require actual participation of the people in making the laws, even through elected representatives, as long as the laws are promulgated with the whole united will of the people in mind. Kant does, nonetheless, think that an elected representative legislator is the best form of a republic (8:353). Whether elected or unelected, the moral person who holds legislative power is representative of the people united as a whole, and is thus sovereign.

When Kant discusses voting for representatives, he adheres to many prevailing prejudices of the time (8:295). The right to vote requires “being one’s own master” and hence having property or some skill that can support one independently. The reason given for this, that those who must acquire something from another to make a living alienate what belongs to them, is so vague that Kant himself admits in a footnote “It is, I admit, somewhat difficult to determine what is required in order to be able to claim the rank of a human being who is his own master.” Kant also leaves women out of the voting populations for what he calls “natural” reasons which are left unspecified.

Kant’s state, then, does not require that actual decisions are made by the people at large, even through elected representatives. He holds that a single individual or small group can themselves adequately represent the people at large simply by adopting the point of view of the people. Insistence on a representative system (8:353) is not insistence on an elected representative system. Nonetheless it is clear that Kant holds that such an elective representative system is ideal. Republican constitutions, he claims, are prone to avoid war because, when the consent of the people is needed, they will consider the costs they must endure in a war (fighting, taxes, destruction of property, etc), whereas a non-republican ruler may be insulated from such concerns. In the “Doctrine of Right” he also notes that a republican system not only represents the people but does so “by all the citizens united and acting through their delegates” (6:342).

5. Property and Contract Right

The “Doctrine of Right” begins with a discussion of property, showing the importance of this right for the implementation of the innate right to freedom. Property is defined as that “with which I am so connected that another’s use of it without my consent would wrong me” (6:245). In one sense, if I am holding an object such as an apple, and another snatches it from my hand, I have been wronged because in taking the object from my physical possession, the other harms me (Kant does not specify whether this harm is because one’s current use of the apple is terminated or because one’s body is affected, but the latter fits the argument better). Kant calls this “physical” or “sensible” possession. It is not a sufficient sense of possession to count as rightful possession of an object. Rightful possession must be possession of an object so that another’s use of the object without my consent harms me even when I am not physically affected and not currently using the object. If someone plucks an apple from my tree, no matter where I am and no matter whether I am even aware of the loss I am prevented from using that apple. Kant calls this “intelligible possession”.

His proof that there must be this intelligible possession and not merely physical possession turns on the application of human choice (6:246). An object of choice is one that some human has the capacity to use as means for various ends or purposes. Rightful possession would be the right to make use of such an object. Suppose that for some particular object, no one has rightful possession. This would mean that a usable object would be beyond possible use. Kant grants that such a condition does not contradict the principle of right because it is compatible with everyone’s freedom in accordance with universal law. But putting an object beyond rightful use when humans have the capacity to use it would “annihilate” the object in a practical respect, treat it as nothing. Kant claims that this is problematic because in a practical respect an object is considered merely as an object of possible choice. This consideration of the mere form alone, the object simply as an object of choice, cannot contain any prohibition of use for an object, for any such prohibition would be freedom limiting itself for no reason. Thus in a practical respect an object cannot be treated as nothing, and so the object must be considered as at least potentially in rightful possession of some human being or other. So all objects within human capacity for use must be subject to rightful or intelligible possession.

Intelligible possession, then, is required by right in order for free beings to be able to realize their freedom by using objects for their freely chosen purposes. This conclusion entails the existence of private property but not any particular distribution of private property. All objects must be considered as potential property of some human being or other. Now if one human being is to have intelligible possession of a particular object, all other human beings must refrain from using that object. Such a one-sided relation would violate the universality of external right. Kant further worries that any unilateral declaration by one person that an object belongs to that person alone would infringe on the freedom of others. The only way that intelligible possession is possible without violating the principle of right is if there is an agreement that puts all under an obligation to recognize each other’s intelligible possessions. Each person must acknowledge an obligation to refrain from using objects that belong to another. Since no individual will can rightfully make and enforce such a law obligating everyone to respect others’ property, this mutual obligation is possible only in accordance with a “collective general (common) and powerful will”, in other words, only in a civil condition. The state itself obligates all citizens to respect the property of other citizens. The state functions as an objective, disinterested institution that resolves disputes about individual property and enforces compliance with those determinations. Without a state to enforce these property rights, they are impossible.

This creation of a civil condition is Kant’s first manner of discussing a social contract mentioned in section 3. Prior to a social contract the only manner in which human beings can control things is through empirical possession, actual occupation and use of land and objects. In order to gain full property rights to land and objects, individuals must all agree to respect the property rights of others in a social contract. They are in fact required, as a duty, to enter into a social condition in order to defend their own and everyone’s property rights. Only in such a society can persons exercise their freedom, that is their pursuit of ends, by legitimately using objects for their own purposes without regard for others. Hence a social contract is the rational justification of the state because state power is necessary for each individual to be guaranteed access to some property in order to realize their freedom. While the discussion in “Theory and Practice” of a social contract as an idea of reason constrains the sovereign in promulgating laws, it does not explain why the state is necessary in the first place. The discussion in “Doctrine of Right” of property as the basis of a social contract explains why individuals are in fact rationally required to enter into a social contract.

A puzzle arises here with regard to property. If individuals are not able to have any intelligible property prior to the existence of a state, yet the state’s role is to enforce property rights, where does the original assignment of property to individuals occur? John Locke had famously avoided this problem in his theory of property by making property a product of a single individual’s activity. By “mixing” one’s labor with an object in the commons, one comes to have property in the object. Kant objects to Locke’s theory of property on the grounds that it makes property a relation between a person and a thing rather than between the wills of several persons (6:268–69). Since property is a relation of wills that can occur only in a civil condition under a common sovereign power, Kant suggests that prior to this civil condition property can be acquired only in anticipation of and in conformity with a civil condition. Provisional property is initial physical appropriation of objects with the intention of making them rightful property in a state (6:264, 267).

Property is of three types for Kant (6:247–48, 260). First is the right to a thing, to corporeal objects in space. Examples of these things include land, animals, and tools. The second is the right against a person, the right to coerce that person to perform an action. This is contract right. The third is the “right to a person akin to a right to a thing”, the most controversial of Kant’s categories in which he includes spouses, children, and servants. Of these three types, the first has already been discussed in relation to acquisition. The second of these, contract right, involves the possession by one person of the “deed” of another (6:274). One person is able to control the choice of another in order to apply the other’s causal powers to some end. At first glance this contract right appears to violate the second formula of the categorical imperative which states that persons are to be treated always as ends and never merely as means. A contract appears to be a case in which an individual is used merely as a means. A homeowner, for example, hires a repair specialist specifically as a means for repairing a house. Kant turns the tables on this problem by showing that a contract is “the united choice of two persons” and thus treats both parties to the contract as ends. For example, he notes that the repair specialist who is contracted to work on a house has agreed to the exchange in order to obtain a personal end, namely, money (27:1319). Each party to the contract is both means for the other and an end.

The third category, the right to a person akin to a thing, is Kant’s own addition to the traditional understanding of property and contract. Kant argues that some contracts or rightful obligations such as the parent-child relation allow one party to the contract to control not only the choice of the other, but also to possess some power over the body of the other, such as the power to insist that the other remain in the household. His discussion of marriage, which focuses on this legal relation in abstraction from empirical considerations such as love, treats marriage as reciprocal access to the other’s sexual organs. While each partner in the marriage is using the other as a means for enjoyment and thus as a thing, the marriage contract’s reciprocity “restores” their personality as ends in themselves (6:278). Kant describes this legal relation as equal in these powers of possession and in the communal property. Both men and women must have reciprocal relations of this kind; for example, a wife may utilize state power to insist that a runaway husband perform his family duties of child support; likewise, a man’s use of a prostitute as a thing violates her dignity as an end in herself (only the latter is Kant’s example). Despite this equality at the level of a priori right, Kant holds that men have a natural superiority in their capacity to promote the couple’s common interest, and that laws codifying husbands’s rule over wives are not unjust. Certainly Kant’s personal sexism plays a part in his views on marriage, as it did in his exclusion of women from voting. Some of Kant’s own contemporaries objected to his views on women, and an early review of the “Doctrine of Right” rejecting Kant’s novel category of property to persons akin to things prompted him to respond in an Appendix to the book’s second edition.

6. Rebellion and Revolution

The very idea of a right to rebel against the government is incoherent, Kant argued, because the embodiment of all right is the actually existing state. By this he did not mean that any actually existing state is always completely just, or that merely by virtue of having power, the state could determine what justice is. He meant that a rightful condition, the opposite of the state of nature, is possible only when there is some means for individuals to be governed by the “general legislative will” (6:320). Any state embodies the general legislative will better than no state. While such reasoning seems pragmatic, it is not. It is instead based upon the claims above that a rightful condition requires the centralizing of coercive power in a state as the only means of bringing about reciprocal coercion and obligation. Kant also argues that a right to rebel would require that a people be authorized to resist the state. This kind of authorization for action, however, is an exercise of sovereign power, and to any people who claimed such a right would be claiming it (the people) rather than the state embodies sovereign power. It would thus “make the people, as subject, by one and the same judgment sovereign over him to whom it is subject” (6:320). This is a contradiction. The nature of sovereignty is such that sovereign power cannot be shared. Were it shared between the state and the people, then when a dispute arose between them, who would judge whether the state or the people are correct? There being no higher sovereign power to make such a judgment, all other means for resolving the dispute fall outside of rightful relations. This role of judgment relates to the judgment that Kant discusses with regard to the social contract. Under the idea of a social contract, the sovereign legislator may not make a law that the people could not make for itself because it possesses irrational, non-universal form. The state, not the people, is the judge of when a law is rational (8:297). People who argue for a right to revolution, Kant claims, misunderstand the nature of a social contract. They claim that the social contract must have been an actual historical occurrence from which the people could withdraw (8:301–02). But since the social contact is only an idea of reason which sets moral limits to the sovereign’s legislative acts, and the sovereign’s judgment alone determines how these limits are to be interpreted, there is no independent contractual agreement to which the people could refer in its complaints. Citizens are still allowed to voice their grievances through their use of public reason, but they can do nothing more than attempt to persuade the sovereign to adopt or repeal decisions.

While the people cannot rebel against the state, Kant does not insist that citizens always obey the state. He allows at least for passive civil disobedience. This comes in two forms: in a republican representative system such as England’s, there can be “a negative resistance, that is, a refusal of the people (in parliament) to accede to every demand the government puts forth as necessary for administering the state” (6:322). In the context of this discussion it is clear that Kant is referring to the use of the power of the legislature to refuse funding, and therefore approval, of actions of the executive. He clarifies that the legislature is not allowed to dictate any positive action to the executive, its legitimate resistance is only negative. A second form of acceptable resistance applies to individuals. Kant mentions that citizens are obligated to obey the sovereign “in whatever does not conflict with inner morality” (6:371). He does not elaborate on the term “inner morality”.

Nor does Kant always reject the actions of revolutionaries. If a revolution is successful, citizens have as much obligation to obey the new regime as they had to obey the old one (6:323). Since the new regime is in fact a state authority, it now possesses the right to rule. Further, in his theory of history, Kant argues that progress in the long run will come about in part through violent and unjust actions such as wars. Kant even takes it as a sign of progress that spectators of the French Revolution had greeted it with “a wishful participation that borders closely on enthusiasm” (7:85). Kant is not pointing to the revolution itself as a sign of progress but to the reaction of people such as himself to news of the revolution. The spectators endorse the revolution not because it is legitimate but because it is aimed at the creation of a civil constitution. Revolution, then, is wrong but still contributes to progress.

In fact, Kant did believe that the French Revolution was legitimate, and a look at his argument illuminates some of his complex terminology. The French king possessed sovereignty until he convened the Estates General as representative of the people, at which time sovereignty “passed to the people” even though the king had intended for the assembly to resolve specific problems and then return the reins of power to him (6:341–2). Further, the king could not have any power to restrain the actions of the assembly as a condition for it being given the sovereign power, for there can be no restrictions on this sovereign power. This understanding of sovereignty shows the difference between a rebellion against authority and peaceful transfer of sovereign power such as an election. In an election, sovereignty is passed back to the people, so there is nothing wrong with the people replacing the entire government. Without an election (or similar method of designating the return of sovereignty to the people), any action aimed at replacing the government is wrong.

7. Punishment

Kant was long considered to be an exemplar of the retributivist theory of punishment. While he does claim that the only proper justification of punishment is guilt for a crime, he does not limit the usefulness of punishment to retributivist matters. Punishment can have as its justification only the guilt of the criminal. All other uses of punishment, such as rehabilitation (the alleged good of the criminal) or deterrence (alleged good to society) uses the criminal merely as a means (6:331). Once this guilt is determined, however, Kant does not deny that something useful can be drawn from the punishment. In the Feyerabend lectures on Natural Right, Kant is clear that the sovereign “must punish in order to obtain security”, and even while using the law of retribution, “in such a way the best security is obtained” (27:1390–91). The state is authorized to use its coercive force to defend freedom against limitations to freedom; more particularly, since right does not entail that citizens must limit their own freedom but only that “freedom is limited” by conditions of right, it is right for another, i.e. the state, to actively limit citizens’ freedom in accord with right (6:231). The state is authorized to use force to defend property rights (6:256). Kant’s view, then, is that punishment of a particular individual may serve deterrent functions even when the punishment may not be based solely on deterrence as its justification.

Retributivist theory holds not only that criminal guilt is required for punishment, but that the appropriate type and amount of punishment is also determined by the crime itself. Traditionally this is the heart of the ancient injunction “an eye for an eye”. Kant supports this measurement for punishment because all other measurements bring into consideration elements besides strict justice (6:332), such as the psychological states of others that would measure the effectiveness of various possible punishments on deterrence. As a principle, retribution grounds but does not specify the exact punishment. Kant recognizes that “like for like” is not always possible to the letter, but believes that justice requires that it be used as the principle for specific judgments of punishment.

The retributivist theory of punishment leads to Kant’s insistence on capital punishment. He argues that the only punishment possibly equivalent to death, the amount of inflicted harm, is death. Death is qualitatively different from any kind of life, so no substitute could be found that would equal death. Kant rejects the argument against capital punishment offered earlier in his century by the Italian reformer, the Marchese Cesare Beccaria, who argued that in a social contract no one would willingly give to the state power over one’s own life, for the preservation of that life is the fundamental reason one enters a social contract at all. Kant objects to Beccaria’s claim by distinguishing between the source of a social contract in “pure reason in me” as opposed to the source of the crime, myself as capable of criminal acts. The latter person wills the crime but not the punishments, but the former person wills in the abstract that anyone who is convicted of a capital crime will be punished by death. Hence one and the same individual both commits the crime and endorses the punishment of death. This solution mirrors the claim that individuals can be coerced to join a civil condition: reason dictates that entering the civil condition is mandatory even if one’s particular arbitrary choice might be to remain outside it (see section 3).

8. International Relations and History

In the “Doctrine of Right” Kant complains that the German word used to describe international right, “Völkerrecht”, is misleading, for it means literally the right of nations or peoples. He distinguishes this kind of relation among groups of individuals, which he discusses as Cosmopolitan Right and will be covered in Section 9, from the relations among the political entities, which would better be called “Staatenrecht”, the right of states. Nonetheless Kant still uses the phrase “right of nations” and also discusses a “league of nations”, although it is clear that he is referring not to nations as peoples but to states as organizations. Kant is also inconsisistent in his use of other terms, such as “federation”. For the sake of clarity, this entry will maintain consistent termininology for the discussion of concepts in international right, even where that requires departures from Kant’s own usage.

Given the lack of international institutions, Kant says, states must be considered to be in a state of nature relative to one another. Like individuals in the state of nature, then, they must be considered to be in a state of war with each other. Like individuals, the states are obligated to leave this state of nature to form some type of union under a social contract. Before the creation of some such union (see next paragraph), states do have a right to go to war against other states if another state threatens it or actively aggresses against it (6:346). But any declaration of war ought to be confirmed by the people “as colegislating members of a state” (6:345). Rulers who wage war without such consent are using their subjects as property, as mere means, rather than treating them as ends in themselves. This claim is one of Kant’s strongest statements that actual voting by citizens is required: citizens “must therefore give their free assent, through their representatives, not only to waging war in general but also to each particular declaration of war” (6:345–46). Once war has been declared, states are obligated to conduct the war under principles that leave open the possibility of an eventual league of states. Actions that undermine future trust between states, such as the use of assassination, are prohibited.

States are obligated to leave this state of nature among states and enter into a union of states. He considers several models of this worldwide political institution. The first is a single universal state in which the entirety of humanity is ruled directly by the single state or is subject to a single monarch. He rejects this model for failing to fulfill the function of the international institution by in effect dissolving the separateness of states rather than providing a means for peaceful relations among states. The second model is a league of states in which states voluntarily submit themselves to an organization for resolving international disputes. The league would not have coercive power to enforce its decisions, and states would be free to leave the league if they chose. He sometimes refers to this model as a “federation”, although he notes that it cannot be an indissoluble union based upon a constitution, as in the federalist structure of the United States (6:351), so it is best to refer to this model as a “league”. The third model is a state of states or a world republic of states in which each state joins a federation of states with coercive power. In this model, a state’s relation to the international federation is closely analogous to an individual person’s relation to a state. Only these second and third models receive Kant’s approval. He offers different reasons for supporting each of the two models.

Kant holds out the third model as the ideal form for the correct international institution. He calls the world republic an “idea” (8:357), a term that Kant uses for concepts created by the faculty of reason that cannot be met in experience but that can serve as models or goals for actual human behavior. The ideal international union is a federation of states that has coercive power over member states but whose decisions arise from debate and discussion among those member states. Kant is unclear regarding whether that coercive force is to be realized by joint action of member states, sanctioned by the federation, against a non-compliant member or by a distinct international force controlled by the federation itself. The precise status of states’ membership is also not clearly stated: he generally says that states have a right to withdraw from the federation, although he often states that the federation is indissoluble and even indicates in the “Doctrine of Right” that states may go to war to “establish a condition more closely approaching a rightful condition” (6:344), implying that states can be coerced into membership. Kant recognizes that actual states will balk at this international federation since rulers will object to such a surrender of their sovereign power. Kant thus argues that the second model, a league of states in which each state opts to negotiate with other nations instead of waging war, must be adopted as a “negative surrogate” (8:357). In a league of states, individual nations are allowed to leave at will and the league itself has no coercive powers over members. States voluntarily agree to settle disputes in a way that avoids war and encourages further peaceful relations. Leagues of states need not extend worldwide but should expand over time in order to approximate a worldwide union of all states.

In the essay “Toward Perpetual Peace”, Kant offers a set of six “preliminary articles” which aim to reduce the likelihood of war, but cannot by themselves establish permanent peace (8:343–47). These are a ban on making temporary peace treaties while still planning for future wars, the prohibition of annexation of one state by another, the abolition of standing armies, the refusal to take on national debts for external affairs, a ban on interference by one state in the internal affairs of another, and a set of limits on the conduct of war that disallows acts that would breed mistrust and make peace impossible. These six articles are negative laws that prohibit states from engaging in certain kinds of conduct. They are not sufficient by themselves to prevent states from lapsing back into their old habits of warring on one another. To institute an international order that can genuinely bring about perpetual peace, Kant offers three “definitive articles”. The first of these is that every state shall have a republican civil constitution (8:348, discussed in section 4 above). In a republican constitution, the people who decide whether there will be a war are the same people who would pay the price for the war, both in monetary terms (taxes and other financial burdens) and in flesh and blood. Republican states will therefore be very hesitant to go to war and will readily accept negotiations rather than resort to war. This consideration is Kant’s most important contribution to the debate about securing peace. He believes that when states are ruled in accordance with the wishes of the people, their self-interest will provide a consistent basis for pacific relations among states. The second definitive article is that each state shall participate in a union of states (8:354, discussed in the previous paragraph). The third definitive article advocates a cosmopolitan right of universal hospitality (8:357, discussed in section 9 below).

Kant’s view of historical progress is tied to his view of international relations. He actually presents several versions of his argument for the progress of humanity toward the ideal condition in which states, each governed by a republican civil constitution and thus each providing maximal consistent freedom for its citizens, all cooperate in a republican federation of states. In his essay “Idea for a Universal History from a Cosmopolitan Point of View” (8:15–31), he takes the basis of his claims for historical progress to be the culmination of the human ability to reason, which, as a natural property of human beings, must be worked out to perfection in the species. He argues that incessant wars will eventually lead rulers to recognize the benefits of peaceful negotiation. They will gradually increase the freedoms of their citizens, because freer citizens are economically more productive and hence make the state stronger in its international dealings. Importantly he claims that the creation of civil constitutions in particular states is dependent upon the creation of an international union of states, although he does not elaborate on this reasoning. In “Toward Perpetual Peace” Kant reverses that order, claiming that some particular state may, through “good fortune”, become a republic and then act as a focal point for other states to join in peaceful relations, and that gradually such cooperation can spread to all states (8:356). These positions certainly reveal that Kant considered world peace impossible without both individual republican states and an international federation among them.

9. Cosmopolitan Right

Relations among the states of the world, covered above, are not the same as relations among the peoples (nations, Volk) of the world. Individuals can relate to states of which they are not members and to other individuals who are members of other states. In this they are considered “citizens of a universal state of human beings” with corresponding “rights of citizens of the world” (8:349, footnote). Despite these lofty sounding pronouncements, Kant’s particular discussion of cosmopolitan right is restricted to the right of hospitality. Since all peoples share a limited amount of living space due to the spherical shape of the earth, the totality of which they must be understood to have originally shared in common, they must be understood to have a right to possible interaction with one another. This cosmopolitan right is limited to a right to offer to engage in commerce, not a right to actual commerce itself, which must always be voluntary trade. A citizen of one state may try to establish links with other peoples; no state is allowed to deny foreign citizens a right to travel in its land.

Colonial rule and settlement is another matter entirely. In his published writings in the 1790s, Kant is strongly critical of the European colonization of other lands already inhabited by other peoples. Settlement in these cases is allowed only by uncoerced informed contract. Even land that appears empty might be used by shepherds or hunters and cannot be appropriated without their consent (6:354). These positions represent a change in Kant’s thought, for he had previously indicated acceptance if not endorsement of the European colonial practices of his time and the racial hierarchy behind them. Kant himself produced a theory of human racial classifications and origins and thought that non-Europeans were inferior in various ways. Kant thought that the course of world progress involved the spread of European culture and law throughout the world to what he considered to be less advanced cultures and inferior races. By the mid-1790s, however, Kant appears to have given up beliefs about racial inferiority and no longer discusses it in his lectures. He publicly criticized European colonial practices as violations of the rights of indigenous peoples who are capable of governing themselves (8:358–60).

Cosmopolitan right is an important component of perpetual peace. Interaction among the peoples of the world, Kant notes, has increased in recent times. Now “a violation of right on one place of the earth is felt in all” as peoples depend upon one another and know about one another more and more (8:360). Violations of cosmopolitan right would make more difficult the trust and cooperation necessary for perpetual peace among states.

10. Social Philosophy

“Social philosophy,” can be taken to mean the relationship of persons to institutions, and to each other via these institutions, that are not part of the state. Family is a clear example of a social institution that transcends the individual but has at least some elements that are not controlled by the state. Other examples would be economic institutions such as businesses and markets, religious institutions, social clubs and private associations created to advance interests or for mere enjoyment, educational and university institutions, social systems and classifications such as race and gender, and endemic social problems like poverty. It is worth noting a few particulars, if only as examples of the range of this topic. Kant advocated the duty of citizens to support those in society who could not support themselves, and even gave the state the power to arrange for this help (6:326). He offered a biological explanation of race in several essays and also, certainly into his “Critical” period, held that other races were inferior to Europeans. He supported a reform movement in education based on the principles presented by Rousseau in “Emile”. I will not provide detailed treatement of Kant’s views on these particular matters (some of which are scant) but only focus on the nature of social philosophy for Kant.

Kant had no comprehensive social philosophy. One might be tempted to claim that, in line with natural law theorists, Kant discusses natural rights related to some social institutions. One might read the first half of the “Doctrine of Right” as a social philosophy, since this half on “Private Right” discusses the rights of individuals relative to one another, in contrast to the second half on “Public Right” that discusses the rights of individuals relative to the state. Kant even offers an explanation of this difference by claiming that the opposite of state of nature is not a social but the civil condition, that is, a state (6:306). The state of nature can include voluntary societies (Kant mentions domestic relations in general) where there is no a priori obligation for individuals to enter them. This claim of Kant’s, however, is subject to some doubt, since he explicitly links all forms of property to the obligation to enter the civil condition (see section 5 above), and his discussion of marriage and family comes in the form of property relations akin to contract relations. It is thus not obvious how there can be any social institutions that can exist outside the civil condition, to the extent that social institutions presuppose property relations.

Another approach to the issue of social philosophy in Kant is to view it in terms of moral philosophy properly speaking, that is, the obligations human beings have to act under the proper maxims, as discussed in the “Doctrine of Virtue” (see section 1 above). In the “Doctrine of Virtue” Kant talks about the obligation to develop friendships and to participate in social intercourse (6:469–74). In the Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason Kant discusses the development of an “ethical commonwealth” in which human beings strengthen one another’s moral resolve through their participation in the moral community of a church. He also holds that educational institutions, the subject of his book On Pedagogy, should be designed to provide for the development of morality in human beings, who lack a natural disposition for the moral good. In these cases Kant’s social philosophy is treated as an arm of his theory of virtue, not as a freestanding topic in its own right.

A third approach to social philosophy comes through Kant’s Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View. Kant had envisioned anthropology as an empirical application of ethics, akin to empirical physics as a application of pure metaphysical principles of nature. Knowledge of the general characteristics of human being as well as particular characteristics of genders, races, nationalities, etc, can aid in determining one’s precise duties toward particular individuals. Further, this knowledge can aid moral agents in their own task of motivating themselves to morality. These promises of anthropology in its practical application are unfulfilled, however, in the details of Kant’s text. He does little critical assessment of social prejudices or practices to screen out stereotypes detrimental to moral development. His own personal views, considered sexist and racist universally today and even out of step with some of his more progressive colleagues, pervade his direct discussions of these social institutions.


Primary Sources

Kant’s original German and Latin writings are collected in Kants gesammelte Schriften, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1900-. Most translations provide the pagination to this edition in the margins, often using volume and page number. All citations in this article use this method.

English translations of Kant’s primary works are numerous. The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant in English includes critical translations of all of Kant’s published works and large selections of his correspondence, lectures, and literary remains. The following volumes of that series contain relevant material, some of which is also issued separately:

  • Practical Philosophy, translated by Mary Gregor, 1996. Relevant contents: “An Answer to the Question: What is Enlightenment?,” Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, “On the Common Saying: That May Be Correct in Theory, But it is of No Use in Practice,” “Toward Perpetual Peace”, and the Metaphysics of Morals.
  • Lectures and Drafts on Political Philosophy, translated by Frederick Rauscher and Kenneth Westphal (2016). Relevant contents: “Naturrecht Feyerabend” course lecture, fragments on political philosophy, and drafts of works in political philosophy.
  • Religion and Rational Theology, translated by Allen Wood and George di Giovanni, 1996. Relevant Content: Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, “Conflict of the Faculties”
  • Anthropology, History, and Education, translated by Robert Louden and Guenther Zoeller (2007). Relevant contents: “Idea for a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Aim,” Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View, and “Lectures on Pedagogy”

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