The Coherence Theory of Truth

First published Tue Sep 3, 1996; substantive revision Wed Mar 27, 2013

A coherence theory of truth states that the truth of any (true) proposition consists in its coherence with some specified set of propositions. The coherence theory differs from its principal competitor, the correspondence theory of truth, in two essential respects. The competing theories give conflicting accounts of the relation that propositions bear to their truth conditions. (In this article, ‘proposition’ is not used in any technical sense. It simply refers to the bearers of truth values, whatever they may be.) According to one, the relation is coherence, according to the other, it is correspondence. The two theories also give conflicting accounts of truth conditions. According to the coherence theory, the truth conditions of propositions consist in other propositions. The correspondence theory, in contrast, states that the truth conditions of propositions are not (in general) propositions, but rather objective features of the world. (Even the correspondence theorist holds that propositions about propositions have propositions as their truth conditions.) Although the coherence and correspondence theories are fundamentally opposed in this way, they both present (in contrast to deflationary theories of truth) a substantive conception of truth. That is, unlike deflationary theories, the coherence and correspondence theories both hold that truth is a property of propositions that can be analysed in terms of the sorts of truth-conditions propositions have, and the relations propositions stand in to these conditions.


1. Versions of the Coherence Theory of Truth

The coherence theory of truth has several versions. These versions differ on two major issues. Different versions of the theory give different accounts of the coherence relation. Different varieties of the theory also give various accounts of the set (or sets) of propositions with which true propositions cohere. (Such a set will be called a specified set.)

According to some early versions of the coherence theory, the coherence relation is simply consistency. On this view, to say that a proposition coheres with a specified set of propositions is to say that the proposition is consistent with the set. This account of coherence is unsatisfactory for the following reason. Consider two propositions which do not belong to a specified set. These propositions could both be consistent with a specified set and yet be inconsistent with each other. If coherence is consistency, the coherence theorist would have to claim that both propositions are true, but this is impossible.

A more plausible version of the coherence theory states that the coherence relation is some form of entailment. Entailment can be understood here as strict logical entailment, or entailment in some looser sense. According to this version, a proposition coheres with a set of propositions if and only if it is entailed by members of the set. Another more plausible version of the theory, held for example in (Bradley 1914), is that coherence is mutual explanatory support between propositions.

The second point on which coherence theorists (coherentists, for short) differ is the constitution of the specified set of propositions. Coherentists generally agree that the specified set consists of propositions believed or held to be true. They differ on the questions of who believes the propositions and when. At one extreme, coherence theorists can hold that the specified set of propositions is the largest consistent set of propositions currently believed by actual people. For such a version of the theory, see Young (1995). According to a moderate position, the specified set consists of those propositions which will be believed when people like us (with finite cognitive capacities) have reached some limit of inquiry. For such a coherence theory, see Putnam (1981). At the other extreme, coherence theorists can maintain that the specified set contains the propositions which would be believed by an omniscient being. Some idealists seem to accept this account of the specified set.

If the specified set is a set actually believed, or even a set which would be believed by people like us at some limit of inquiry, coherentism involves the rejection of realism about truth. Realism about truth involves acceptance of the principle of bivalence (according to which every proposition is either true or false) and the principle of transcendence (which says that a proposition may be true even though it cannot be known to be true). Coherentists who do not believe that the specified set is the set of propositions believed by an omniscient being are committed to rejection of the principle of bivalence since it is not the case that for every proposition either it or a contrary proposition coheres with the specified set. They reject the principle of transcendence since, if a proposition coheres with a set of beliefs, it can be known to cohere with the set.

2. Arguments for Coherence Theories of Truth

Two principal lines of argument have led philosophers to adopt a coherence theory of truth. Early advocates of coherence theories were persuaded by reflection on metaphysical questions. More recently, epistemological and semantic considerations have been the basis for coherence theories.

2.1 The Metaphysical Route to Coherentism

Early versions of the coherence theory were associated with idealism. Walker (1989) attributes coherentism to Spinoza, Kant, Fichte and Hegel. Certainly a coherence theory was adopted by a number of British Idealists in the last years of the nineteenth century and the first decades of the twentieth. See, for example, F.H. Bradley (1914).

Idealists are led to a coherence theory of truth by their metaphysical position. Advocates of the correspondence theory believe that a belief is (at least most of the time) ontologically distinct from the objective conditions which make the belief true. Idealists do not believe that there is an ontological distinction between beliefs and what makes beliefs true. From the idealists' perspective, reality is something like a collection of beliefs. Consequently, a belief cannot be true because it corresponds to something which is not a belief. Instead, the truth of a belief can only consist in its coherence with other beliefs. A coherence theory of truth which results from idealism usually leads to the view that truth comes in degrees. A belief is true to the degree that it coheres with other beliefs.

Since idealists do not recognize an ontological distinction between beliefs and what makes them true, distinguishing between versions of the coherence theory of truth adopted by idealists and an identity theory of truth can be difficult. The article on Bradley in this Encyclopedia (Candlish 2006) argues that Bradley had an identity theory, not a coherence theory.

In recent years metaphysical arguments for coherentism have found few advocates. This is due to the fact that idealism is not widely held.

2.2 Epistemological Routes to Coherentism

Blanshard (1939, ch. XXVI) argues that a coherence theory of justification leads to a coherence theory of truth. His argument runs as follows. Someone might hold that coherence with a set of beliefs is the test of truth but that truth consists in correspondence to objective facts. If, however, truth consists in correspondence to objective facts, coherence with a set of beliefs will not be a test of truth. This is the case since there is no guarantee that a perfectly coherent set of beliefs matches objective reality. Since coherence with a set of beliefs is a test of truth, truth cannot consist in correspondence.

Blanshard's argument has been criticised by, for example, Rescher (1973). Blanshard's argument depends on the claim that coherence with a set of beliefs is the test of truth. Understood in one sense, this claim is plausible enough. Blanshard, however, has to understand this claim in a very strong sense: coherence with a set of beliefs is an infallible test of truth. If coherence with a set of beliefs is simply a good but fallible test of truth, as Rescher suggests, the argument fails. The "falling apart" of truth and justification to which Blanshard refers is to be expected if truth is only a fallible test of truth.

Another epistemological argument for coherentism is based on the view that we cannot "get outside" our set of beliefs and compare propositions to objective facts. A version of this argument was advanced by some logical positivists including Hempel (1935) and Neurath (1983). This argument, like Blanshard's, depends on a coherence theory of justification. The argument infers from such a theory that we can only know that a proposition coheres with a set of beliefs. We can never know that a proposition corresponds to reality.

This argument is subject to at least two criticisms. For a start, it depends on a coherence theory of justification, and is vulnerable to any objections to this theory. More importantly, a coherence theory of truth does not follow from the premisses. We cannot infer from the fact that a proposition cannot be known to correspond to reality that it does not correspond to reality. Even if correspondence theorists admit that we can only know which propositions cohere with our beliefs, they can still hold that truth consists in correspondence. If correspondence theorists adopt this position, they accept that there may be truths which cannot be known. Alternatively, they can argue, as does Davidson (1986), that the coherence of a proposition with a set of beliefs is a good indication that the proposition corresponds to objective facts and that we can know that propositions correspond.

Coherence theorists need to argue that propositions cannot correspond to objective facts, not merely that they cannot be known to correspond. In order to do this, the foregoing argument for coherentism must be supplemented. One way to supplement the argument would be to argue as follows. As noted above, the correspondence and coherence theories have differing views about the nature of truth conditions. One way to decide which account of truth conditions is correct is to pay attention to the process by which propositions are assigned truth conditions. Coherence theorists can argue that the truth conditions of a proposition are the conditions under which speakers make a practice of asserting it. Coherentists can then maintain that speakers can only make a practice of asserting a proposition under conditions the speakers are able to recognise as justifying the proposition. Now the (supposed) inability of speakers to "get outside" of their beliefs is significant. Coherentists can argue that the only conditions speakers can recognise as justifying a proposition are the conditions under which it coheres with their beliefs. When the speakers make a practice of asserting the proposition under these conditions, they become the proposition's truth conditions. For an argument of this sort see Young (1995).

3. Criticisms of Coherence Theories of Truth

Any coherence theory of truth faces two principal challenges. The first may be called the specification objection. The second is the transcendence objection.

3.1 The Specification Objection

According to the specification objection, coherence theorists have no way to identify the specified set of propositions without contradicting their position. This objection originates in Russell (1907). Opponents of the coherence theory can argue as follows. The proposition (1) ‘Jane Austen was hanged for murder’ coheres with some set of propositions. (2) ‘Jane Austen died in her bed’ coheres with another set of propositions. No one supposes that the first of these propositions is true, in spite of the fact that it coheres with a set of propositions. The specification objection charges that coherence theorists have no grounds for saying that (1) is false and (2) true.

Some responses to the specification problem are unsuccessful. One could say that we have grounds for saying that (1) is false and (2) is true because the latter coheres with propositions which correspond to the facts. Coherentists cannot, however, adopt this response without contradicting their position. Sometimes coherence theorists maintain that the specified system is the most comprehensive system, but this is not the basis of a successful response to the specification problem. Coherentists can only, unless they are to compromise their position, define comprehensiveness in terms of the size of a system. Coherentists cannot, for example, talk about the most comprehensive system composed of propositions which correspond to reality. There is no reason, however, why two or more systems cannot be equally large. Other criteria of the specified system, to which coherentists frequently appeal, are similarly unable to solve the specification problem. These criteria include simplicity, empirical adequacy and others. Again, there seems to be no reason why two or more systems cannot equally meet these criteria.

Although some responses to the Russell's version of the specification objection are unsuccessful, it is unable to refute the coherence theory. Coherentists do not believe that the truth of a proposition consists in coherence with any arbitrarily chosen set of propositions. Rather, they hold that truth consists in coherence with a set of beliefs, or with a set of propositions held to be true. No one actually believes the set of propositions with which (1) coheres. Coherence theorists conclude that they can hold that (1) is false without contradicting themselves.

A more sophisticated version of the specification objection has been advanced by Walker (1989); for a discussion, see Wright (1995). Walker argues as follows. In responding to Russell's version of the specification objection, coherentists claim that some set of propositions, call it S, is believed. They are committed to the truth of (3) ‘S is believed.’ The question of what it is for (3) to be true then arises. Coherence theorists might answer this question by saying that "‘S is believed’ is believed" is true. If they give this answer, they are apparently off on an infinite regress, and they will never say what it is for a proposition to be true. Their plight is worsened by the fact that arbitrarily chosen sets of propositions can include propositions about what is believed. So, for example, there will be a set which contains "Jane Austen was hanged for murder," "‘Jane Austen was hanged for murder’ is believed," and so on. The only way to stop the regress seems to be to say that the truth conditions of (3) consist in the objective fact S is believed. If, however, coherence theorists adopt this position, they seem to contradict their own position by accepting that the truth conditions of some proposition consist in facts, not in propositions in a set of beliefs.

There is some doubt about whether Walker's version of the specification objection succeeds. Coherence theorists can reply to Walker by saying that nothing in their position is inconsistent with the view that there is a set of propositions which is believed. Even though this objective fact obtains, the truth conditions of propositions, including propositions about which sets of propositions are believed, are the conditions under which they cohere with a set of propositions. For a defence of the coherence theory against Walker's version of the specification objection, see Young (2001).

A coherence theory of truth gives rise to a regress, but it is not a vicious regress and the correspondence theory faces a similar regress. If we say that p is true if and only if it coheres with a specified set of propositions, we may be asked about the truth conditions of ‘p coheres with a specified set.’ Plainly, this is the start of a regress, but not one to worry about. It is just what one would expect, given that the coherence theory states that it gives an account of the truth conditions of all propositions. The correspondence theory faces a similar benign regress. The correspondence theory states that a proposition is true if and only if it corresponds to certain objective conditions. The proposition ‘p corresponds to certain objective conditions’ is also true if and only if it corresponds to certain objective conditions, and so on.

3.2 The Transcendence Objection

The transcendence objection charges that a coherence theory of truth is unable to account for the fact that some propositions are true which cohere with no set of beliefs. According to this objection, truth transcends any set of beliefs. Someone might argue, for example, that the proposition ‘Jane Austen wrote ten sentences on November 17th, 1807’ is either true or false. If it is false, some other proposition about how many sentences Austen wrote that day is true. No proposition, however, about precisely how many sentences Austen wrote coheres with any set of beliefs and we may safely assume that none will ever cohere with a set of beliefs. Opponents of the coherence theory will conclude that there is at least one true proposition which does not cohere with any set of beliefs.

Some versions of the coherence theory are immune to the transcendence objection. A version which holds that truth is coherence with the beliefs of an omniscient being is proof against the objection. Every truth coheres with the set of beliefs of an omniscient being. All other versions of the theory, however, have to cope with the objection, including the view that truth is coherence with a set of propositions believed at the limit of inquiry. Even at the limit of inquiry, finite creatures will not be able to decide every question, and truth may transcend what coheres with their beliefs.

Coherence theorists can defend their position against the transcendence objection by maintaining that the objection begs the question. Those who present the objection assume, generally without argument, that it is possible that some proposition be true even though it does not cohere with any set of beliefs. This is precisely what coherence theorists deny. Coherence theorists have arguments for believing that truth cannot transcend what coheres with some set of beliefs. Their opponents need to take issue with these arguments rather than simply assert that truth can transcend what coheres with a specified system.

4. New Objections to Coherentism

Paul Thagard is the author of the first of two recent new arguments against the coherence theory. Thagard states his argument as follows:

if there is a world independent of representations of it, as historical evidence suggests, then the aim of representation should be to describe the world, not just to relate to other representations. My argument does not refute the coherence theory, but shows that it implausibly gives minds too large a place in constituting truth. (Thagard 2007: 29-30)

Thagard's argument seems to be that if there is a mind-independent world, then our representations are representations of the world. (He says representations “should be” of the world, but the argument is invalid with the addition of the auxiliary verb.) The world existed before humans and our representations, including our propositional representations. (So history and, Thagard would likely say, our best science tells us.) Therefore, representations, including propositional representations, are representations of a mind-independent world. The second sentence of the passage just quoted suggests that the only way that coherentists can reject this argument is to adopt some sort of idealism. That is, they can only reject the minor premiss of the argument as reconstructed. Otherwise they are committed to saying that propositions represent the world and, Thagard seems to suggest, this is to say that propositions have the sort of truth-conditions posited by a correspondence theory. So the coherence theory is false.

In reply to this argument, coherentists can deny that propositions are representations of a mind-independent world. To say that a proposition is true is to say that it is supported by a specified system of propositions. So, the coherentist can say, propositions are representations of systems of beliefs, not representations of a mind-independent world. To assert a proposition is to assert that it is entailed by a system of beliefs. The coherentist holds that even if there is a mind-independent world, it does not follow that the “the point” of representations is to represent this world. If coherentists have been led to their position by an epistemological route, they believe that we cannot “get outside” our system of beliefs. If we cannot get outside of our system of beliefs, then it is hard to see how we can be said to represent a mind-independent reality.

Colin McGinn has proposed the other new objection to coherentism. He argues (McGinn 2002: 195) that coherence theorists are committed to idealism. Like Thagard, he takes idealism to be obviously false, so the argument is a reductio. McGinn's argument runs as follows. Coherentists are committed to the view that, for example, ‘Snow falls from the sky’ is true iff the belief that snow falls from the sky coheres with other beliefs. Now it follows from this and the redundancy biconditional (p is true iff p) that snow falls from the sky iff the belief that snow falls from the sky coheres with other beliefs. It appears then that the coherence theorist is committed to the view that snow could not fall from the sky unless the belief that snow falls from the sky coheres with other beliefs. From this it follows that how things are depends on what is believed about them. This seems strange to McGinn since he thinks, reasonably, that snow could fall from the sky even if there were no beliefs about snow, or anything else. The linking of how things are and how they are believed to be leads McGinn to say that coherentists are committed to idealism, this being the view that how things are mind-dependent.

Coherentists have a response to this objection. McGinn's argument works because he takes it that the redundancy biconditional means something like “p is true because p”. Only if redundancy biconditionals are understood in this way does McGinn's argument go through. McGinn needs to be talking about what makes ‘Snow falls from the sky’ true for his reductio to work. Otherwise, coherentists who reject his argument cannot be charged with idealism. He assumes, in a way that a coherent theorist can regard as question-begging, that the truth-maker of the sentence in question is an objective way the world is. Coherentists deny that any sentences are made true by objective conditions. In particular, they hold that the falling of snow from the sky does not make ‘Snow falls from the sky’ true. Coherentists hold that it, like any other sentence, is true because it coheres with a system of beliefs. So coherentists appear to have a plausible defence against McGinn's objection.

Bibliography

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idealism: British | knowledge: analysis of | logical positivism | realism: challenges to metaphysical | Russell, Bertrand | truth: correspondence theory of | truth: deflationary theory of | truth: identity theory of | truth: revision theory of

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