Photo of Ernst Mally

Ernst Mally

First published Thu Oct 13, 2005; substantive revision Fri Jan 17, 2014

The Austrian philosopher Ernst Mally (1879–1944) is one of the most important representatives of Meinong's School. Though he is best known for his work on Meinong's theory of objects (Gegenstandstheorie) and for his development of deontic logic, he has also gained some notoriety for his German-nationalist convictions and his support of National Socialist ideology. On the one hand, Mally's contribution to Meinong's theory of objects is not a mere extension of his teacher's work, but rather a real alternative that, in turn, influenced Meinong's own conceptions. Moreover, he was the first philosopher to establish a formal system of deontic logic (see the entry on Mally's deontic logic), and though, according to most philosophers, it was seriously flawed, it was a major undertaking and only recently received the attention it was due. On the other hand, some of Mally's later writings were particularly influenced by his sympathies for National Socialism. In what follows, we will identify and outline the various strands of his thought, and also address the delicate question of whether and how his sympathies for National Socialism affected his later philosophical work.


1. Biographical Sketch

Ernst Mally was born October 11, 1879 in Krainburg, then a town of the Austro-Hungarian monarchy, and today Kranj in Slovenia. After the death of his father in 1888, the family moved to Laibach, today Ljubljana, the capital of Slovenia. There, Mally attended the Gymnasium from 1890 to 1898. At this time, Mally already formed a nationalist attitude, becoming a supporter of Georg Ritter von Schönerer, the leader of the Austrian “deutschnationale Bewegung”, a German national, anti-semitic, anti-liberal and anti-catholic group that demanded the “Anschluss” (annexation) of Austria to Germany even before the First World War. During his years in the Gymnasium, Mally developed a serious interest in philosophy, and in 1898, he started studying philosophy with Alexius Meinong at the University of Graz, Austria. There he also studied mathematics and physics, for he felt that this would enable him to achieve greater precision in his philosophical thinking and writings. During this time, Mally developed a special interest in formal logic.

Mally earned his philosophical doctorate in 1903, with the dissertation Untersuchungen zur Gegenstandstheorie des Messens (Investigations in the Object Theory of Measurement), which was published in 1904. Alexius Meinong was his supervisor. In 1906, he started teaching at a Gymnasium in Graz, yet stayed in contact with the university, especially with Meinong and the then already famous Laboratory for Experimental Psychology, which had been founded by Meinong in 1894. In 1913, Mally became Dozent with his Habilitation thesis, which was titled Gegenstandstheoretische Grundlagen der Logik und Logistik (Object-theoretic Foundations for Logics and Logistics) and published in 1912. Again, Alexius Meinong was his supervisor. During World War I, Mally served in the Austrian Army from 1915 to 1918. In this period, Mally contracted “a serious disease called rheumatoid arthritis, [resulting] in a 70% invalidity that led to a growing and painful immobility” (Wolf 1971: 3), lasting for the rest of his life. After the end of the war, he started teaching at the University of Graz, where he eventually succeeded to Meinong's Chair in 1925. He stayed there until 1942. After his retirement, he moved to Schwanberg, Styria, where he lived two more years and died rather unexpectedly March 8, 1944.

2. Ontology and Logic

2.1 Mally's Ontological and Logical Background

Mally was trained not only in philosophy but also in mathematics, and was influenced by Ernst Schröder, and later, of course, by Whitehead and Russell. He therefore learned how to apply modern logical methods to philosophical theories, and in particular to the theory of objects (Gegenstandstheorie) developed by his teacher Alexius Meinong as well as to the theory of norms in his development of deontic logic. Among the Austrian philosophers, Mally was one of the pioneers of formal methods in discussing philosophical problems. Note that Mally's disciple Hans Mokre was the first to translate the introductory chapters to Whitehead and Russell's Principia Mathematica into German, with Mally's assistance (Russell/Whitehead 1932). Mally had originally planned to translate the complete Principia himself.

Since many of the problems giving rise to the theories of objects are covered elsewhere in this encyclopedia, we restrict ourselves to a very short sketch of what led to Mally's contribution to that field. One of the main impulses for the development of theories of objects were the problems that arose in connection with intentionality. Mally's teacher Meinong followed Brentano in concluding that the distinctive and defining feature of intentional mental acts is that they are always directed towards something. That is, thinking, believing, intending, etc., all involve thinking, believing, or intending something. Meinong took this a step further by believing that we have to be ontologically generous when analyzing intentional mental acts: every such act is directed towards an object, even if sometimes that object does not or cannot exist. So, when we search for the fountain of youth or think about the round square (and conclude that the latter is impossible), Meinong required that there be such objects like the fountain of youth and the round square. According to Meinong, the former is an object (the waters of which confer everlasting life but) which doesn't exist, while the latter is an object which is round, square, and which couldn't exist. (For a more complete discussion of Meinong's theory of nonexistent objects, see the entry on nonexistent objects.)

This ontologically generous attitude commits us to the acceptance of contradictory and incomplete objects: if we accept contradictory objects then we are at least dangerously close to tolerating contradictions (unless we take appropriate precautions), and if we accept incomplete objects, we deny the intuitively plausible Law of Excluded Middle, namely, that for any property P, an object either has P or fails to have P (tertium non datur). Meinong adopted one of Mally's distinctions for solving the first of these problems, namely, the distinction between nuclear (formal/konstitutorisch) and extra-nuclear (außerformal/außerkonstitutorisch) properties (see Meinong 1915: 176; Findlay 1963: 176; as well as section 4.4.3 of the entry on Alexius Meinong). But later, Mally developed an even more profound distinction with which he was able to cope with the incompleteness problem as well.

Mally's first work on Meinong's theory of objects is the published version of his dissertation (Mally 1904). His own, mature theory of objects can be found in the published version of his Habilitation thesis (Mally 1912). (For a detailed comparison of the two theories, see Poli 1998.) Mally addressed the topic also in his later works, taking a critical point of view with respect to Meinong's as well as his own theory (Mally 1935, 1938b, 1971). Since Mally's theory of objects is one of his most interesting and most influential contributions to philosophy, we want to provide a more detailed account of the theory itself as well as of the problems it seems to be able to solve, in the following section.

2.2 Mally's Theory of Objects

Mally's most important distinction was between an object's being determined (determiniert sein) by a property and an object's satisfying (erfüllen) a property. This distinction allowed Mally to speak of objects that are neither contradictory nor incomplete (with respect to satisfaction), although they may be contradictory or incomplete with respect to determination:

Every object satisfies a complete complex of objectives and is thus “complete” with respect to its actual determinations. But there are objects that are mere formdeterminates of certain (defining) objectives (without satisfying these objectives): such an object is only incompletely determined by its defining objective (which is an incomplete complex of objectives), and thus it has to be called “incomplete” with respect to its formal determination. Nevertheless, according to the first statement, it is complete with respect to the objectives it satisfies: since it satisfies the objective to be the formdeterminate of its definition, and it also satisfies everything implied by this objective. (Mally 1912: 76; this translation, and all subsequent translations, by the authors)

It would help to reread this passage with the following interpretative suggestions in mind. First, following Zalta (1983), we want to interpret Mally's notion of objectives (Objektive) in terms of the modern notion of a property, though the notion of attribute would also be appropriate. The linguistic expressions which signify objectives are just open formulas like ‘Px’, ‘Rxy’, etc. Therefore, in what follows, we use ‘property’ instead of ‘objective’. Second, we can understand Mally's notion of satisfying an objective in terms of the modern notion of instantiating or exemplifying a property. Finally, let us replace Mally's talk of ‘formdeterminates’ by the talk of ‘conceptual objects’. In contrast to ordinary objects, the characteristic form of conceptual objects is determined by certain properties rather than by the properties it may instantiate. Although we have made these terminological substitutions for interpreting Mally, we hope that the new terminology is close to Mally's original intent. So, using our modern terminology, we would say that conceptual objects are determined by a certain group of properties and don't necessarily instantiate the properties that determine them. Moreover, the property of being a conceptual object is one which implies that the objects which instantiate it are abstract entities.

With this interpretation in mind, we can understand the above passage from Mally as follows. According to Mally, a group of properties determines a conceptual object and thereby ensures that there is such an object. E.g., the property of being triangular (alone) determines the conceptual object we might identify as the triangle. This object is conceptual because it is not the case that it is a specific triangle in the ordinary sense of the verb ‘to be’ (understood as a copula). Mally would say the triangle does not instantiate the property of being triangular. But since every object is complete with respect to instantiation, the triangle instantiates the property of being non-triangular. Indeed, this latter property is implied by the property of being a conceptual object. Or, to put it in a different way: the property of being triangular is excluded by the property of being a conceptual object—conceptual objects have no shape at all. (For the concept of inclusion (Einschließung), see Mally 1912: 4 ff.) This results in the claim that the triangle is non-triangular, which is perfectly understandable if we understand ‘is’ in the sense of ‘instantiates’. Additionally, Mally offers us an algebra of properties that ensures that for each given property F there is an property non-F, i.e., its negation, which behaves in the usual manner (see Mally 1912: 14 ff.). For example, he implicitly assumes that instantiating non-F is materially equivalent to not instantiating F:

x instantiates non-F iff x does not instantiate F.

Now, if there were objects incomplete with respect to instantiation problems would arise, since the law tertium non datur would be violated. For example, if we ask the question, is the triangle right-angled, then the Law of Excluded Middle tells us that either it is right-angled or it is not. Although the conceptual object identified above as the triangle neither is determined by being right-angled nor is it determined by being non-right-angled, it nevertheless instantiates the property of being non-right-angled. So, according to Mally, for every property F and every object x, the following holds:

x instantiates F or x instantiates non-F.

Each object, whether it is conceptual or not, either instantiates a property or its negation. The triangle instantiates the property of being abstract, but not its negation; it does not instantiate the property of being triangular, but it instantiates its negation. There is, of course, no object that instantiates both a property F and its negation non-F, since this would clearly be a contradiction.

On the other hand, there are objects, namely, conceptual ones, that are incomplete with respect to determination. So the following is a consequence of Mally's theory:

There is an x and there is an F such that x is not determined by F and x is not determined by non-F.

Note that this consequence of Mally's theory does not violate any logical principle because (a) being determined by F does not imply instantiating F, and (b) not being determined by F does not imply being determined by non-F. There are objects that are not determined by a property F, but which are also not determined by non-F; as noted above, the triangle is not determined by being right-angled, but it is also not determined by being non-right-angled; the triangle is only determined by being triangular.

There are even objects that are determined by contradictory properties; Mally would assert the following:

There is an x and there is an F such that x is determined by F and x is determined by non-F.

The non-square square may be seen as such an object. But, again, no logical principles are being violated, because being determined by non-F does not imply not being determined by F, nor does its being determined by these properties imply that it instantiates them.

As is well known, Bertrand Russell criticized Meinong's theory of objects in “On Denoting” (Russell 1905: 482–484). (See also the entry on nonexistent objects (section 4), as well as the entry on Alexius Meinong, section 4.4.) According to Russell, Meinong has to accept entities like the round square:

the round square is round, and also not round […]. But this is intolerable; and if any theory can be found to avoid this result, it is surely to be preferred. (Russell 1905: 438)

As we have already seen above, Mally's theory of objects is a theory that avoids this result. For Mally, it holds that there is an x such that x is determined by roundness and x is determined by non-roundness. But we have already shown above that this is no problem, because it does not violate any logical law.

Conceptual objects can be incomplete and even contradictory with respect to the properties that determine them, but neither of these circumstances violates a logical law. Like ordinary objects, conceptual objects are always complete and consistent with respect to instantiation, and thus the laws of logic are respected. Now, these conceptual objects serve as the content of intentionally directed acts. Mally says that there may be no object that is instantiated by the properties we posit (setzen) in our judgments, but there is always a conceptual object that is determined by these properties. Intentional acts will never be deprived of their content.

We want to stress that ordinary concrete objects are not determined by any property, they merely instantiate properties. So, the current Pope, e.g., instantiates the properties of being human, being Catholic, etc., but there is no property that determines the current Pope. On the other hand, there is the conceptual object which we could call ‘the Pope’ which is determined by being Pope. Indeed, Mally's view also allows us to talk about the Pope*, which is determined by all the properties implied by (included in) being the Pope. Understood this way, the Pope and the Pope* are neither human nor Catholic nor do they instantiate any other “ordinary” property. These conceptual objects are abstract, and are determined by being Pope, being human, being Catholic, etc. The Pope is, like the triangle, a conceptual object (Begriffsgegenstand), while the (current) Pope is concrete and a living human being. (Note that we use the verb ‘to be’ in the sense of ‘to instantiate’, because we think that this suits best the everyday intuitions about the meaning of ‘to be’, understood as a copula.) Mally says, “we grasp through the conceptual object at the object which instantiates a set of determinations” (Findlay 1963: 183). In our example, we apprehend the current Pope by way of the abstract conceptual object the Pope*, which is determined by all the properties implied by being the current Pope.

We see from the above that the existence of conceptual objects depends on which properties are accepted. If we assume with Mally that we have a full Boolean Algebra of properties then the only question left to be answered, is: what are the primitive properties? We can only make a suggestion inspired by the theory of intentionality here: the primitive properties are all the non-complex properties that can be posited by the subject(s). (For other English translations of crucial passages of Mally's work on his theory of objects, as well as a summary of Mally's theory of conceptual objects, see Zalta 1998.)

2.3 Discussing Mally's Theory

Mally's theory of objects has been acknowledged and validated in Zalta 1983 and 1988 (see also Rapaport 1978, for an informal development of something like Mally's view, though the ideas developed there are traced to Meinong, not Mally). Zalta utilizes Mally's ideas and conceptions in order to establish a full-fledged axiomatic theory of abstract objects that ensures the existence of these objects with the help of comprehension principles. Zalta also translated Mally's terminology into modern terms by formulating the distinction between an object x instantiating and being determined by a property F in terms of the distinction between x's exemplifying property F (‘Fx’) and x's encoding property F (‘xF’). Zalta calls exemplifying and encoding two (different) “modes of predication”. But there is some controversy as to whether Mally's distinction in two modes of predication can be reduced to the distinction between nuclear and extranuclear properties (recall, this is a distinction introduced by Mally but adopted by Meinong in his work). Dale Jacquette calls Mally's introduction of these two modes of predication “Mally's heresy” (see Jacquette 1989: 3). He tried to show that the distinction between nuclear and extranuclear properties is “more fundamental” than the distinction between two modes of predication in the sense that there is a reduction of the latter to the former but not vice versa (see Jacquette 1989: 5). However, Zalta showed (1992) that a reduction of two modes of predication to two kinds of property has not yet been developed. Moreover, Mally's theory (in modern guise) can cope at least with all the problems Meinong's theory can solve. Along these lines, Mally's student Findlay wrote,

[Mally's theory] removes many difficulties in Meinong's theory, without abandoning the general standpoint of the theory of objects. (Findlay 1963: 110)

Mally therefore established a real alternative to Meinong's theory of objects; his theory avoided different modes of being (such as Meinong's famous Außersein) as well as the duplication required by the distinction between nuclear and extranuclear properties. (In reconstructions of Meinong's theory, e.g., Parsons 1980, every predicate has both a nuclear and an extranuclear version, and this is avoided in Mally's theory.) Mally's theory, however, requires an ontology with a sufficient number of properties—enough to jointly determine all the conceptual objects we might use to cognize and conceptualize ordinary everyday objects. And, of course, it also presupposes a kind of comprehension principle that guarantees the (abstract) existence of these conceptual objects determined by its properties.

We have seen in detail now that even in his earlier ontological writings Mally developed viable alternatives to Meinong's theory of objects. Later he distanced himself from Meinong's philosophy. In unpublished letters to Hans Pichler, Mally writes:

I realized that the theory of objects is based on a big mistake; it can be described as a mix-up of intending and grasping. […] Meinong's fundamental error is his mistaking the (objective) meaning and content of a thought for an object (or the object) of the thought. […] Once you have realized this, you are done with the theory of objects, and with the foundations of Meinong's philosophy as well. (Mally 1934a, January 5 1934)

It may well be that you [Hans Pichler] are already caught by Meinong's thoughts like by an infection, which has to take effect in order for its antidote to develop. That is how I experienced it. (Mally 1934a, January 6 1934)

Mally's critical stance towards Meinong's philosophy paved the way to his new ontological conceptions, which we want to discuss in the next section.

2.4 Mally's Dynamic Ontological Conceptions

In his later works, Mally criticized Meinong's “static conception” of objects (Mally 1935, 1938b, 1971). Meinong and many other philosophers shared and still share the belief that the world is constituted by completely determined elements or completely determined individual things and processes which taken together make up the universe. Christian von Ehrenfels (1859–1932), a student and friend of Meinong, doubted this view by pointing to the Gestaltproblem: when we consider a definite shape or Gestalt, the parts of the shape are determined by the whole. For example, the colored parts of the shape, when considered in their environment, differ from what they appear to be when each single part is presented to a spectator in isolation. Mally was influenced by this observation and added that such colored parts, in isolation, are no longer genuine elements of the whole, no longer determined objects. Thus, whatever we can experience is—as a whole—only vaguely determined: the borderlines of things become more or less blurred; sometimes they appear sharper as in the case of tools, sometimes more hazy as in the case of clouds.

According to Mally, reality objectively tends to a separation of individual things, but this separation can or will never fully be reached, but only approximated. In other words, ours is a world without exact individual things; instead it is a world with a dynamic nature, with many tendencies or strivings (Strebungen). In Mally 1935, there are many examples from everyday life with which he wants show that subjects do not primarily apprehend rigid or static individual things, but rather tendencies of events. For example, a portrait painting does not show how a person looks at a given point of time and place, it rather expresses a certain tendency by indicating a direction to which the painting “idealizes” the given status. Or, a plane surface of a lake reminds us of the geometrical concept of a plane figure, but actually the lake is only approximately plane. In this sense, even the so-called natural laws are precise expressions of natural tendencies which are never fully realized. Mally writes,

No longer material elements, but probabilities (this is the tendency) of describable forms of happenings are the final apprehensible which can be met by researching reality. (Mally 1938b: 11; translation by the authors)

2.5 Mally's Deontic Logic

We conclude this section by noting again that Mally developed the first formal logical system of deontic logic, in Mally 1926. This system is described and analyzed in some detail in the entry Mally's deontic logic. This entry explains how Mally introduced an operator (!) to form statements of the form ‘It ought to be the case that A’ (‘!A’), and how the logical axioms of his system implied the following, problematic claim:

!AA

This scheme states that something is obligatory if and only if it is the case. In other words, in Mally's system, the obligatory and the factual collapse. This, of course, is unacceptable. The first one to show this was Karl Menger in 1939. Further discussion of Mally's deontic logic can be found in Morscher 1998, as well as in the entry cited above, i.e., Lokhorst 2013 (forthcoming). We would like to reiterate Lokhorst's claim that despite the flaw in Mally's deontic logic, his “pioneering effort deserves rehabilitation rather than contempt”.

It is to be noted, however, that a proper understanding and analysis of Mally's deontic logic can only be reached through his particular meta-ethical view. This will be sketched in section 3, and it is also touched by Mally 1940 in his paper on “objective truth”. Yet not even the most recent study of the critical work on Mally's deontic logic (Krickler 2008) seems to be aware of Mally's philosophy of values and its peculiar description of value (Wert) and ought (Sollen): “Value and ought can only be understood via emotional presentation” (Mally 1926: 74 or Mally 1971: 312). Much more about that will be explained in the following section, especially at the end of section 3.3.3 below.

3. Ethics: Norms and Values

Mally's entire philosophical oeuvre shows three tendencies that indicate the philosophical heritage of Brentano and Meinong: 1. The rehabilitation of the emotional versus the widespread intellectualism of his time, 2. the emphasis of what is objectively given versus subjectivism and 3. the philosophical re-discovery of the unity of reality and value versus all forms of dualism (Wolf 1952a: 169).

3.1 New sources and lecture notes discovered

New research on Mally's philosophy in general, ethics, and logic of norms has brought forward so far unknown material. Mally's unpublished work in the Library Archives of the University of Graz contains a number of philosophical texts and personal documents as well as private letters. Some lecture notes by Mally himself seem to be of particular relevance, partly laid down in illegible shorthand. Yet some lecture notes have been edited by his students in manuscript form, especially the lecture notes of some Vorlesungen between 1926 and 1938. It is to be expected that more research work in the years to come will shed more light onto Mally's philosophical work and development. There are new indications contained in those manuscripts that promise a deeper understanding of Mally's post-Meinongian philosophy, in particular his ethics and deontic logic.

So far, some of these texts have been studied to find a better answer to the question to what degree Mally's philosophy was influenced by National Socialism (Sagheb-Oehlinger 2008). Among the aforementioned lecture manuscripts we find the following: “Ernst Mally: Value Theory and Ethics”. This is a lecture delivered by Mally at the University of Graz, winter semester 1926/27, elaborated and typed by Hans Mokre in 1927.

3.2 Mally's background and development in ethics

It seems justified to distinguish three phases of Mally's work on value theory and ethics:

(1) The early period until 1923 is influenced and coined by Meinong's philosophy. Two years after Meinong's death, Mally edited Meinong's On the Foundation of a General Theory of Values (Meinong 1923a). In his short preface to this volume, Mally points out that he does not see any reason to change or complement Meinong's text. In other words, this ethical point of view is molded by Meinong's value objectivism: values exist independently of value experiences. Just as sensations are the basis of perceptual judgments, evaluations are the basis of value judgments. The value of an object triggers, via emotional presentation (Meinong), a certain value experience or value feeling in the subject. Mally accepted not only Meinong's distinction between object and objective but also the distinction between dignitative (object based on feeling) and desiderative (object based on willing). To the class of dignitatives, Meinong counted the classical triad of true, good and beautiful (maybe even pleasant) (Meinong 1923b, 120; see also the excellent summary of Meinong's value philosophy from a modern point of view in Reicher 2009: 114 ff.). Mally continued his investigations in value theory on this foundation of the natural law tradition in ethics (Wolf 1952b; see also below 3.3.1).

(2) Mally has then developed his own views on value theory and ethics, partly based on Meinong but also with reference to his contemporaries, ethicists like Max Scheler and Nicolai Hartmann. He offered his views in a lecture on “Value Theory and Ethics” in 1924/25 and then again in a reviewed and expanded version in 1926/27. This seems to be of central importance for Mally's work on deontic logic which he elaborated at the same time, most probably between 1924 and 1926 (Mally 1926). It was Melanie Sagheb-Oehlinger who looked through the unpublished work of Ernst Mally. She retyped and edited this lecture manuscript—originally typed by Mokre (1927)—as an Appendix to her master's thesis (Sagheb-Oehlinger 2008). It offers an extensive outline of Mally's philosophical approach to value theory and ethics, of course in the broad tradition of Franz Brentano and Alexius Meinong. What is described below is mainly based on this Appendix.

(3) In the 1930s, Mally further developed his philosophy of reality (Mally 1935). Although it seems he had some ethical consequences of this “realistic approach” in mind, he did not elaborate them beyond this book. He even mentioned explicitly in his article on truth (Mally 1940) that he has left aside questions of the normative.

3.3 Mally on value theory and ethics

The lecture notes by Hans Mokre of “Ernst Mally: Value Theory and Ethics” contain four chapters (many references below refer to the re-typed version in Sagheb-Oehlinger 2008, Appendix, which will be cited as SOM):

  • Introduction: the concept of values; several theories of value
  • Psychology of value: objects of emotions (feelings), types of emotions, value feelings and their objects, counter-feelings
  • Theory of objects of value, the relationship between objective values and value emotions
  • Ethics: morality and values; morally relevant values; ethics and the individual person.

3.3.1 Humans possess a natural evidence for values

This is the central ethical hypothesis of Mally: “Whatever has (objective) value ought to be” (SOM: 49). Moral values are not values for somebody, but are values of the act of the human person herself. It is difficult to see, he maintains, that the moral value of an act does not collapse with the intended utility value of that act. A moral value is logically prior to its utility value, because moral values cannot be willingly or consciously intended. Moral values are not assigned to objects of reality but are inherent to them (SOM: 51).

In the tradition of Brentano and Meinong, Mally asserts that moral values can be perceived emotionally. This conception roots even further in the classical tradition of the convergence of being and value from Aristotle to Leibniz (Mokre 1971: 20): esse et verum et bonum convertuntur. Mally refers to the triad of the true, the good and the beautiful two times in his lecture (SOM: 10; also 44 where he mentions “primary values” in regard to what is true, good and beautiful for which we humans seem to possess a sort of “natural evidence”). But it is questionable to him if a supreme value exists at all, like pleasure for Epicurus, lawlike duty for Kant or love for Christians. He rather suggests that the order of moral values is infinite—upwards as well as downwards. Since we grasp the objects of reality with our sense perception and then form an intellectual judgment, at the same time we experience a particular value feeling that is our emotional response to the inherent value of every object of reality. For example, when we look at a clock and judge that it is working correctly, then at the same time we experience this fact as something positive, pleasant—through our value feeling, although we don't perceive anything like “the pleasure of the clock being in time”. Mally even asserts:

If an object is valuable (wertvoll)—emotionally felt correctly by one person—then it should be valuable to all people. (SOM: 46)

3.3.2 Preconditions of moral values are internal and external utility values

Mally emphasizes again: “Every value corresponds to an (at least relative) ought” (SOM: 53). The foundation of moral values is the value of life: “All moral life is connected to the animalist ‘vital sphere’” (SOM: 56). E.g., a small amount of water is of particular utility value for the human being to preserve his life (15). Particular utility values of this kind are more important than a given quantity of value institutions like art, legal order, state, government or literature. Only through subjective acting on the individual's part can utility values be created—of course within the framework of those institutions (SOM: 55). Therefore, Mally contends, there is no such thing as a universal law of morality like Immanuel Kant's Categorical Imperative. The reason for this lies in the fact that the individual creates utility values. In the complex variety of life situations, no single rule can cover the total quantity of culture, science, religion etc. (SOM: 55).

As internal utility values, Mally lists the value of life, the value of consciousness, of conscious activity, of suffering: “To open our eyes for many and even for the highest values, suffering is unavoidably necessary” (57); the assertion that the experience of suffering is “unavoidably necessary” for the grasping of moral values has to do with Mally's own painful and handicapped living conditions (see section 1). Furthermore he lists the values of power and the value of freedom that is the basic value of all moral acting. Foreseeing is another precondition because it is necessary for our willing. Finally, we act teleologically (= directed towards a purpose) which is equally necessary in order to reach a goal.

External utility values are natural goods like air, water etc. as preconditions for our moral life. The causal order of reality enables us to purposeful planning whereas the concrete situation of each act is of particular value. Concrete situations make up the whole of moral life. Other external values are power, luck and goods like wealth, riches but also social communities like family, society, all of humankind and whatever constitutes them or keeps them together like law, language, culture, traffic, etc. (SOM: 61)

3.3.3 Kinds of moral value and the total life value

Moral values are categorized by Mally into basic values and values of virtue. The most general moral basic value is “the good”, not meaning “good for something” or “good for somebody”. “We signify as good the free intention to(wards) objective values” and “evil is the intention towards disvalues or the intention against values” (SOM: 62). Essential for the moral good is the fact that preferring the higher value is not done through intellectual weighing of alternatives but through our immediate value feeling (SOM: 62). Mally asserts a special sense for the varying degree of values (“Werthöhensinn”). This special value sense works in a person's conscience and makes us immediately feel the right and the wrong behavior. In addition he uses a metaphysical hypothesis that helps building a transition from this subjective value feeling to the objective value:

Whatever is in accordance with the innermost essence of reality is objectively valuable and at the same time the essence-related most probable. (SOM: 62)

The latter is not necessarily the empirically most probable, i.e., not what probably will be realized in the individual case but what ought to be realized (or what is worthy to be realized). Objective values are an a priori given essence relatedness in our value feeling (SOM: 63).

The values themselves are ideal forms (Gebilde) which exist timelessly and unchangeably. (SOM: 74)

Yet the value behavior of humans following them is changing, mainly because it loses the immediate emotional contact (feeling) to the values. Instead of this immediate value feeling and its ensuing insight humans accept the value tradition of society. Moreover, Mally talks about “value forms” (Wertgestalten) which can be seen as ideal types of personality (SOM: 75). One of the many value forms (depending on value perspectives and value hierarchies) corresponds to each individual human being: in her empirical character we find the ethical norm of her value form. This ethical norm occurs in that character as essence-directed tendency towards the value form. Mally adds that this assertion corresponds to the above mentioned metaphysical hypothesis “that only the objectively valuable exists in the essence of reality” (SOM: 76). The moral task of each individual consists in the fulfillment of his personal ethical norm. The way to find that norm will be shown to him by his conscience.

In other words: to Mally, the concept of a subjective value constituted by the feeling or willing of the individual is untenable. Rather, in her feeling and understanding the person corresponds to various objective values in reality. With her willing, she responds to the ought that is dwelling in the objects of reality. Karl Wolf summarizes Mally's central point:

In her feeling the human being responds adequately to various value qualities of reality; in her willing she corresponds to the ought that is contained in the ‘objects’. (Wolf 1971: 12, translation by the authors)

The problem of different value experiences by different people is explained by Mally with the hierarchy of ranks of perspectives. Each concrete situation conveys an objective value as well as a value perspective of that particular reality to the person (see the reflection of this view in Mally's deontic logic in the next paragraph). Since each situation is different depending on the temperament, the mood, the age, etc. of the beholder, as well as the zeitgeist reflected by him, each result of such a personal situation experience is genuine, i.e., indubitable. This is the reason why there cannot be a general moral norm to act in certain situations in a certain moral way (SOM: 76). Yet there is a hierarchy of experienced perspectives. Some are better because they make more distinctions, some are worse because the particular feeling experience is not adequately corresponding to the situation. The main tendency of a person's striving should be towards the total value of the life of that person (SOM: 49). Moral behavior that supports a striving towards this total value is better than the pursuit of other strivings that miss this total value (Wolf 1971: 12–13).

At this point, a short remark about the consequences of Mally's value theory in regard to his deontic logic seems to be in order. His deontic axiom III is seen at least as “problematic” by all known critics so far. This axiom states the equivalence of the factual with the obligatory. This has been judged as problematic or even absurd because in modern meta-ethical discourse the is-ought gap is accepted as logical basis for all ethical deliberations, and, moreover, the collapse would mean that our actual world is a morally “ideal” one. Mally, however, broadens this view. To him, the ought is contained in the objects of reality. With ‘objects’ he does not refer to sensually perceived entities but to the more complex essence of objects (on Meinong's object-theoretic basis). According to Meinong's view on dignitatives (an expression not used by Mally, who refers to them as “Forderungen” in Mally 1926: 12, or Mally 1971: 243), a value constitutes an object of higher order. This value is complex and can only emotionally be grasped but it cannot be defined, nor even propositionally characterized. E.g., a donation to a charitable fund can be understood or felt as a morally good deed (Marek 2008: ch. 6.2). Although this would not be a sensory perception of an object, to Mally it is the emotional impression or feeling that reveals the “essence of the object” considered. It is interesting to note that Mally must have been aware of some of the criticisms of his controversial axiom III (by Laird 1926 or Menger 1939), but it is not known if he ever defended it or at least tried to clarify his underlying value theoretical viewpoint.

3.3.4 Trends in Mally's ethics after 1926/27

Although Mally denies the possibility of a universal moral principle (Mally 1935: 75), he emphasizes the important role of our moral responsibility. Our responsibility must be exemplified through moral decisions: “Morality is always the striving after the most perfect meaning and its best exemplification” (Mally 1935: 77). There is, however, a formal moral duty, “Follow your conscience”, or more precisely, “Act in the way that you recognize as right according to the best of your knowledge and conscience” (Mally 1938a: 27).

Ultimately, morality is connected with the divine. For the religiously inspired person, morality is a matter of religion, because religion is necessarily linked to morality. For the philosophically oriented person, morality is the supreme task of her character to transcend her ego. This striving beyond one's own person is again a kind of meaning exemplification of the dynamic structure of reality. As a sort of moral behavior, it is always related to fellow humans. Doing the right thing is not only a private matter for oneself and one's neighbors. No human belongs to himself or to some other people next to him. He belongs to everyone, foremost to the community, Mally asserts, and to the reality of the world: “The world is beautiful in him, just like a tree blossoms in each of its flowers” (Mally 1935: 77). Pursuing this responsibility makes the person a microcosmos, an image of a deity (Gottheit). And:

the most original feature of a human being and her deepest personality magically shine through in the case of love, a loved person is always experienced as a miracle. (Mally 1935: 62)

Mally's dynamistic-holistic world-view with its central notion of strivings (Strebungen) has further been developed and applied to a number of moral issues by his student Karl Wolf (1947). In chapter 11 of Realistic Ethics, Wolf asserts,

Every tendency is basically good when it remains within the order of the whole, and every tendency, even the most ideal, becomes evil, when it transgresses the order. (Wolf 1947: 78)

Thus, a balance is morally required with a view to the dynamic order of the whole. Compromise as a rule of nature justifies the power of the stronger, because the stronger is more capable of guaranteeing a balance in conflicts than the weaker. This idea is also applicable to education: the stronger parent helps the weaker child, thereby creating a balance within the whole of strivings of both people involved. More detailed discussions by Wolf are elaborated in the collection of his essays (Rothbucher/Zecha 2012).

4. Philosophy and National Socialist Ideology

After the end of the Austro-Hungarian monarchy 1918, Mally became a member of the Großdeutsche Volkspartei, a German national and mostly anti-semitic party in the Austrian parliament, which agitated, like Schönerer and his followers, for Austria's annexation to Germany. In February 1938, Mally joined the Volkspolitisches Referat, an organisation with the goal to unite all Austrian nationalist movements (including the National Socialists). The same year he also entered the NS Lehrerbund (National Socialist Teachers' Association). Two months after the annexation of Austria by Germany in March 1938, Mally became a member of the NSDAP (National Socialist German Workers Party), i.e., the Nazi party. Given all this political involvement in Austria's and later Germany's national movements, the question has been legitimately raised whether and how his political attitude influenced his philosophical work. It seems to be appropriate to pursue this question and some answers to it in its historical development.

First, it is interesting how the Nazis themselves classified Mally's philosophical work with respect to their ideology. According to their judgment of the political reliability of philosophy professors in Germany (then including Austria) by the Reichssicherheitsdienst of the Reichsführer SS, there were six groups:

  1. Denominationally bound philosophers;
  2. Liberal philosophers;
  3. Indifferent philosophers;
  4. Politically positive philosophers;
  5. National Socialist philosophers;
  6. Positive junior scholars (Nachwuchskräfte).
(Korotin 2007: 8; translation by the authors)

Mally was ranked in group 2 and thus categorized as “liberal”, which here meant “neither national socialist nor system dependent” according to Korotin (2007: 8). The term ‘liberal’ was used by the Nazis for German nationalists who were not considered to be National Socialists.

Second, after World War II, no one seemed to have serious concerns about Mally's philosophical work (or even just parts of it) in view of his political attitude. In 1971, a collection of essays (including Großes Logikfragment and Grundgesetze des Sollens) was edited by Karl Wolf and Paul Weingartner, with introductory comments by the editors as well as by Hans Mokre. It was only in the 1990s when a critical and serious discussion of the question how Mally's political views influenced his philosophical work began.

Third, Sauer 1998 claimed that Mally's National Socialist views clearly shaped his philosophical writings. Sauer provides a number of quotes from, and references to, Mally's writings and private correspondence, as well as a critical evaluation. He condemns Mally's entire later philosophical work as not being worthy of any further investigation. Thus Sauer challenged the philosophical community to seriously investigate all of Mally's work, including some of his unpublished manuscripts and personal correspondence. Schönafinger 1994 comes to similar results, based on previously unpublished work by Sauer and referencing to personal documents and lecture notes in the archives of the Graz University Library. In 2008, Sagheb-Oehlinger devoted her entire master's thesis to this problem. She analyzed thoroughly all “later” philosophical writings of Mally by providing ten categories like racism, anti-semitism, cult of the Führer, anti-democratic, National Socialist education, etc. In addition she studied Mally's private correspondence with his philosophical “soulmate” and pen friend, Gertraud Laurin, which extended over a period of ten years (1934–1944). Sagheb-Oehlinger's final result can be summed up the following way: Mally cannot clearly be seen a “National Socialist philosopher”, but there is no doubt about the national socialist ideological content of his Anfangsgründe der Philosophie (1938a) (Sagheb-Oehlinger 2008: 143). This is different from what Sauer (1998) had concluded. To give just one example, in his description of Anfangsgründe der Philosophie (Mally 1938a) Sauer names the two National Socialist main values emphasized in Mally's book, the “basic value of blood” and the “duty to keep the race clean and breed it higher” (Sauer 1998: 184). He then continues:

With one brief word, the philosophical placet is granted to the whole barbaric madness of the racist legislation and racist separation, of the legislation of hereditary health and the forced sterilization in huge numbers of insane people (or what was identified as such) and social nonconformists. (Sauer 1998: 184)

Whilst it is correct that Mally (in Mally 1938a) certainly supported this ideology that led to these atrocities, Sauer's general conclusion that all of Mally's late philosophy stands in one row with the works of all the other Nazi philosophers is questionable. Also his concluding question whether there remains anything of Mally's philosophy worth to be saved finds its positive answer in the preceding sections. For more details see the following paragraphs.

Finally, considering these opposing views, we want to give our own additional assessment of Mally's philosophical writings with respect to his national socialist involvement. Though Mally was an analytic, scientifically oriented philosopher who produced original contributions in various fields of philosophy, it is a fact that National Socialist ideas and principles inspired some of his later philosophical works. He presents us with a case where, in certain parts of his work, it is not easy to separate his private political convictions from the content. Nevertheless, it is important to stress that many of Mally's works are free from any untoward political influences, and their philosophical value should in no way be diminished by his political views. But, of course, there are works that do contain National Socialist ideology. We will outline the grades of National Socialist involvement in Mally's work below, but first we present a short sketch of Mally's central Nationalist Socialist (NS) theses.

In NS ideology, the concept of das Volk (the people), especially das deutsche Volk (the German people), plays a central role. From the early 1930s on, Mally tried to provide a philosophical justification for the value judgments (1) that das Volk is more important than its individual members, and (2) that the Germans constitute the dominant people. He further stated an anti-reduction thesis, namely, that the concept of das Volk cannot be reduced to the concepts of each of its members (the individual persons). He thus wanted to

“fight against subjectivist, Jewish-positivist and related doctrines … and replace them by something healthier”.
(From Mally's curriculum vitæ, dated September 23, 1938, six months after the Anschluss; unpublished, University of Graz Library/Nachlass-Sammlung. This is, however, not a philosophical work but can rather be seen as an opportunistic self-description).

This fact also explains why Mally saw himself in opposition to the Vienna Circle and the logical positivists, who he thought of as being the prime exponents of the “individualist ideology”—an ideology which (according to Mally) tries to deprive the world of its meaning (Sinn). Mally saw das Volk as a “quasi-person”, having a body, a mind, and a soul; das Volk cannot be completely rationally comprehended, it rather has to be experienced (erlebt). He maintains that the “essential reality” of das Volk is revealed through this experience, i.e., its meaning, and thus, the meaning of its “dynamic development” is revealed. Furthermore, different Völker (peoples) have different properties, depending on their origin, their development, culture, etc. These properties allegedly yield a significantly moral difference: the German people are supposed to rank among the peoples with the highest value and have therefore to be kept “pure”. External influences have to be eliminated, so that das deutsche Volk can be “bred” to even higher states of development, and thus gradually strive towards a state where its meaning can be totally fulfilled (see Mally 1934b, 1935 and 1938a).

From any reasonable perspective today, all his NS “theses” are either barely understandable, or simply false. Obviously, his allegations reflect Nazi ideology. In any case, much of what we find in the writings just described has nothing to do with serious and solid philosophy. If we summarize the NS involvement in Mally's writings between 1904 and 1944, we may distinguish three different grades, not in chronological order. Grade 1 is “NS-ideology free”. These are purely philosophical writings such as Mally 1904, 1912, 1923, 1926, and 1938b. In grade 2, we count philosophical writings partially interpretable by, and applicable to, Nazi ideology, such as Mally 1935 and 1940. Finally, we can count as grade 3 the pure Nazi propaganda in articles or pamphlets such as Mally 1934b and 1938a.

As we have shown above, Mally's logical as well as ontological ideas, concepts and theories are still being discussed in contemporary philosophical research. His value theory and ethical philosophy, however, are largely unknown and deserve widespread attention as his views are diametrically opposed to what is generally accepted today. Moreover, this short overview should make clear that there are many parts in Mally's writings that deserve serious further philosophical investigation.

Bibliography

For a complete bibliography (including the unpublished work) of Mally's writings, see Wolf/Weingartner 1971: 325–331.

All quotations originally in German were translated by the authors of the entry.

Primary Literature: Selection of Mally's Writings

  • (1904) “Untersuchungen zur Gegenstandstheorie des Messens”, in Untersuchungen zur Gegenstandstheorie und Psychologie, vol. 3, A. Meinong (ed.), Leipzig: Barth, 121–262.
  • (1912) Gegenstandstheoretische Grundlagen der Logik und Logistik, supplement to Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik, 148.
  • (1923) “Studien zur Theorie der Möglichkeit und Ähnlichkeit. Allgemeine Theorie der Verwandschaft gegenständlicher Bestimmungen”, in Sitzungsberichte der Akademie der Wissenschaften in Wien. Philosophisch-historische Klasse. Wien-Leipzig: Hölder-Pichler-Tempsky, 1–131.
  • (1926) Grundgesetze des Sollens. Elemente der Logik des Willens, Graz: Leuschner & Lubensky. Reprinted in Ernst Mally: Logische Schriften. Großes Logikfragment—Grundgesetze des Sollens, K. Wolf, P. Weingartner (eds.), Dordrecht: Reidel, 1971, 227–324.
  • (1934a) “Briefe Ernst Mallys an Hans Pichler vom 5. Jänner 1934 und vom 6. Jänner 1934”, in: Mally's unpublished work in the Library Archives of the University of Graz.
  • (1934b) “Wesen und Dasein des Volkes”, Volksspiegel. Zeitschrift für Deutsche Soziologie und Volkswissenschaft, 2: 70–77.
  • (1935) Erlebnis und Wirklichkeit. Einleitung zur Philosophie der Natürlichen Weltauffassung, Leipzig: Julius Klinkhardt.
  • (1938a) Anfangsgründe der Philosophie. Leitfaden für den Philosophischen Einführungsunterricht an höheren Schulen, Wien-Leipzig: Hölder-Pichler-Tempsky.
  • (1938b) Wahrscheinlichkeit und Gesetz. Ein Beitrag zur wahrscheinlichkeitstheoretischen Begründung der Naturwissenschaft, Berlin: de Gruyter.
  • (1940) “Zur Frage der ‘objektiven Wahrheit’ ”, Wissenschaftliches Jahrbuch der Universität Graz, 1940, 177–197.
  • (1971) “Grosses Logikfragment”, in Wolf & Weingartner 1971, 29–187.

Secondary Literature

  • Findlay, J.N., 1963, Meinong's Theory of Objects and Values, 2nd edition, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Hieke, A. (ed.), 1998, Ernst Mally. Versuch einer Neubewertung, Sankt Augustin: Academia Verlag.
  • Jacquette, D., 1989, “Mally's heresy and the logic of Meinong's Object Theory”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 10: 1–14.
  • Korotin, I., 2007, “Deutsche Philosophen aus der Sicht des Sicherheitsdienstes des Reichsführers SS. Dossier Ernst Mally”, in Carsten Klingemann (ed.), Jahrbuch für Soziologiegeschichte, Wiesbaden: VS Verlag fü̈r Sozialwissenschafte, 167–175.
  • Krickler, B., 2008, Die fünf Grundgesetze von E. Mallys Normenlogik und deren Beurteilung durch die modernen Logiker G. Kalinowksi, E. Morscher und O. Weinberger, M.A. Thesis, University of Graz.
  • Laird, J., 1926, “Review of Mally's Grundgesetze des Sollens”, Mind (New Series), 35: 394–395.
  • Lokhorst, G.-J., 2013, “Mally's Deontic Logic”, in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2013 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), forthcoming URL = http://plato.stanford.edu/archives/win2013/entries/mally-deontic/
  • Marek, J., 2008, “Alexius Meinong”, in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, (Winter 2008 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = http://plato.stanford.edu/archives/win2008/entries/meinong/
  • Meinong, A., 1915, Über Möglichkeit und Wahrscheinlichkeit, Leipzig: Barth.
  • –––, 1923a, Zur Grundlegung der allgemeinen Werttheorie, ed. with a preface by Ernst Mally, Graz: Leuschner & Lubensky.
  • –––, 1923b, “A. Meinong”, in Schmidt 1923, 101–160.
  • Menger, K., 1939, “A Logic of the Doubtful: On Optative and Imperative Logic”, in Reports of a Mathematical Colloquium, Notre Dame, Indiana: Indiana University Press, pp. 53–64.
  • Mokre, H. (ed.), 1927, Wertlehre und Ethik. Nach Vorlesungen von Ernst Mally (1926/27), unpublished manuscript, see Sagheb-Oehlinger 2008, cited as SOM.
  • –––, 1971, “Gegenstandstheorie—Logik—Deontik”, in Wolf & Weingartner 1971, 16–20.
  • Morscher, E., 1998, “Mallys Axiomensystem für die deontische Logik—Rekonstruktion und kritische Würdigung”, in Hieke 1998: 81–165.
  • Parsons, T., 1980, Nonexistent Objects, New Haven/CT: Yale University Press.
  • Poli, R., 1998, “Understanding Mally”, in Hieke 1998: 29–49.
  • Rapaport, W., 1978, “Meinongian Theories and a Russellian Paradox”, Noûs, 12: 153–180.
  • Reicher, M.E., 2009, “Value Facts and Value Experiences in Early Phenomenology” in Centi, B. and Huemer, W. (eds.), Values and Ontology. Problems and Perspectives, Heusenstamm: Ontos, 105–135.
  • Rothbucher, M. and G. Zecha, (eds.), 2012, Karl Wolf: Biopädagogik. Aufsätze, Reden, Abhandlungen, Vienna: LIT.
  • Russell, B., 1905, “On Denoting”, in Mind, 14: 479–493.
  • Russell, B. and A.N. Whitehead, 1932, Einführung in die Mathematische Logik (Die Einleitung der “Principia Mathematica”), translation into German of Preface, Introduction, Introduction to the Second Edition (1925) by Hans Mokre, Munich: Drei Masken Verlag. (Note that Mokre changed the order of the authors' names intentionally.)
  • Sagheb-Oehlinger, M., 2008, Ernst Mally: Philosophie und Nationalsozialismus, master's thesis, University of Salzburg, with an Appendix: Mokre 1927.
  • Sauer, W., 1998, “Mally als NS-Philosoph”, in Hieke 1998: 167–191.
  • Schmidt, R. (ed.), 1923, Die Philosophie der Gegenwart in Selbstdarstellungen, Leipzig: Felix Meiner (2nd rev. edition).
  • Schönafinger, B., 1994, Das Grazer Philosophische Institut 1920–45 und seine Verstrickung in den Nationalsozialismus, master's thesis, University of Graz.
  • Wolf, K., 1947, Ethische Naturbetrachtung. Eine Philosophie des modernen Naturgefühls, Salzburg: Jgonta-Verlag.
  • –––, 1952a, “Die Entwicklung der Wertphilosophie in der Schule Meinongs”, in Radakovic, K., Tarouca, S. and Weinhandl, F. (eds.): Meinong-Gedenkschrift, 157–171.
  • –––, 1952b, “Die Spätphilosophie Ernst Mallys”, in Wissenschaft und Weltbild, 5: 145–153.
  • –––, 1971, “Ernst Mallys Lebensgang und philosophische Entwicklung”, in Wolf & Weingartner 1971, 3–15.
  • Wolf, K. and P. Weingartner (eds.), 1971, Ernst Mally: Logische Schriften. Großes Logikfragment—Grundgesetze des Sollens, Dordrecht: Reidel.
  • Zalta, E.N., 1983, Abstract Objects. An Introduction to Axiomatic Metaphysics, Dordrecht: Reidel.
  • –––, 1988, Intensional Logic and The Metaphysics of Intentionality, Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.
  • –––, 1992, “On Mally's Alleged Heresy: A Reply”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 13: 59–68.
  • –––, 1998, “Mally's Determinates and Husserl's Noemata”, in Hieke 1998: 9–28.

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