Notes to Object

1. There is, then, some inevitable overlap in topic here with entries in the S.E.P. whose topics are just the particular sub-categories of object, for instance, the categories of substance and of abstract object. There is however no inevitable overlap of content; here, such categories are briefly spoken to qua applications or sub-categories of the formal category, rather than as topics in their independent right.

2. The notorious Platonism embodied in Russell's remark may for present purposes be ignored.

3. And on this account, it might be given either an Aristotelian or a Kantian category-twist.

4. Or perhaps we should speak, with Boolos—to allow for more recent developments—of the values of a variable.

5. The response is to be found in Chapter Seventeen, following his well known re-presentation in that book of the Theory of Descriptions. Whether the doctrine concerns the significance of plural reference altogether generally, or perhaps only in the context of semantically irreducible plural sentences, is an issue which is not here pursued.

6. In a similar vein, Helen Cartwright declares that whether one or many, ‘Identical cats are one—one cat or one set of cats’ (Cartwright 1970).

7. Such a ‘pure compound’ is presumably to be distinguished from a couple, in the sense in which, were Siemens and Halske to be married or involved in some other intimate relationship, they would conventionally come to constitute a single couple.

8. That is, his agonized discussion of what he there calls ‘the class as many’ seems to end up by calling the whole idea into question.

9. Recent work has witnessed the coining of the term ‘singularism’ to characterise this semantic standpoint; the issue figures in more detail in Part 3.

10. The recent and fairly commonplace revival of scepticism regarding so-called ‘ordinary’ objects is not among the issues for this entry.

11. This is a point which both Quine and Strawson, in their different ways, have stressed.

12. The matter is perhaps further complicated by the nature of the concept of substance itself. For insofar as substance is conceived – along with both Aristotle and the rationalist tradition – as that which ‘exists independently’, Platonists in particular may wish to treat numbers not merely as abstract objects, but also as substances – and so, as objects in that full-blooded, substantial sense of the term perhaps more commonly reserved for concrete entities alone. On the other hand, Fregean concepts, understood as being essentially ‘incomplete’, cannot qualify for substancehood, and therefore not for objecthood in any such restricted sense.

13. The point is hardly frivolous; in light of developments in both cosmology and quantum mechanics, it can no longer be said to be obvious that either space-time, space, or time correspond to unitary, well-demarcated ontic categories.

14. In a similar vein, in his ‘The metaphysics of abstract objects’, E. J. Lowe speaks of universals as abstract entities; yet he remarks that pieces of gold ‘are soluble in aqua regia’ only in virtue of being instances of the kind, gold. Yet this would seem to attribute a physical property primarily to the kind, and only derivatively to the instances. The issue is pursued in section 2.3.

15. It is here that set theory merges into mereology. See Cartwright 1993. At the same time, their being human products—artifacts and so functionally, rather than physically defined—might well be taken to be a significant element in their sethood.

16. It cannot, for instance, be taken to be self-evident that the status of items as types or universals renders them causally inert. Arguably, and depending on the case in point, the structure (‘form’, ‘design’) of a concrete object can play a central role in its causal powers. Whether the item in question is an aircraft wing, a microchip, or a piece of code in machine language—in which syntactic structure, digitalized to a sequence of numerals, is all that matters—structure seems key; and structures are themselves pre-eminently objects of mathematics, hence the intimacy of the relationship of math to physics, and of physics to engineering in turn. The objection that such structures must here be understood as tokens or tropes, rather than as types or full-blown Platonic qualities, seems relatively weak. By their own characterization, trope-theorists tend to classify tropes themselves as abstract or ‘perfect’ particulars. Furthermore, as Armstrong and others have argued, causal relationships involve laws, which themselves involve reference to universals, general properties and the like.

17. For the parallel prototypical account, see Quine 1960, ch. 3.

18. Thus when Dale Jacquette speaks darkly of the abstract triangle—said to have only properties common to all triangles, and none peculiar to any particular triangle—no determinate size or shape—it might seem that what he has in mind can be no triangle at all, but instead a purely abstract attribute. Zalta's (1983) account of abstract objects would provide Jacquette with a more sophisticated option here, although what seems clear is that, once again, the appropriate abstract object could not possibly be a triangle. And, of course, Berkeley's characterization of Locke's ‘abstract general idea’ of a triangle in very similar terms was intended as no elucidation but rather a reductio of Locke's idea. But recent discussion indicates that whether Berkeley has fairly interpreted Locke's account or not is very much an open question

19. It would seem, e.g., that Shakespeare's character by the name of ‘Hamlet’ cannot be treated on anything like the lines of an attribute corresponding to a so-called abstract singular term (an attribute of what?).

20. ‘Consequently ontic’, since it is a characteristic feature of empiricist methodology to epistemologize ontological categories. Though this is not the place to do it, the ongoing influence of empiricism in both epistemology and metaphysics is readily documented.

21. This issue is evidently related to the contentious question of so-called ‘mass nouns’ or words for stuff, to be considered briefly in the sequel.

22. The point is explored in Laycock 2006, Ch. 5, sections 6 & 7.

23. In this lies one motivation for the reductionist treatment of his so-called ‘mass terms’ in Quine 1960, ch. 3.

24. Scepticism regarding the traditional (non-epistemic) concept of substance has, of course, by no means disappeared, and is often vigorously promoted, in association with the recent popularity of mereological styles of ontology, chiefly on grounds of vagueness. The issue is not considered in this work. However, for incisive discussion of the issue focussing on recent work by Ted Sider, see Koslicki 2003.

25. ‘In the present chapter’, he writes, ‘we shall be concerned with the in the plural: the inhabitants of London, the sons of rich men, and so on. In other words, we shall be concerned with classes’.

26. A note of caution is in order at this point, however. The boundary between monistic doctrines and Boolosian pluralism—for which some plural sentences are represented as irreducibly plural or multiple—is far from sharp. For lacking any determinate principle of unity, the idea of ‘class’ as merely ‘several objects’, or Lowe's ‘a number of things’, becomes no more than the idea of ‘many’—in short, Russell's questionably intelligible notion of ‘the class as many’.

27. An anonymous reader has suggested that there are other options to consider, noting that ‘in a Davidsonian framework, we might consider the reduction to: (∃e) (e is a surrounding & Agent(e) = dog1 & Patient(e) = fox1) & (∃e) (e is a surrounding & Agent(e) = dog2 & Patient(e) = fox1) & … Or we might go with plural quantification over the events, while still keeping all the substance talk in the singular: (∃Es) (Each e among the Es is a surrounding, each e among the Es has one and the same fox as its patient, and for each e among the Es, (∃x) (x is a dog and the agent of e)). This requires there to be a plurality of surrounding events, and requires that an individual dog can be the agent of a given surrounding event. The latter is not so problematic, in that “being a surrounding” can be an extrinsic property of the event in question. Just as a single soccer player can be the agent of an event that satisfies the extrinsic description “winning the World Cup for Spain”, so a single dog can be the agent of an event that satisfies the extrinsic description “being a surrounding”.’ The former suggestion would appear to involve reference to the individual dogs involved, a fact which is not revealed in the original remark. As to the naturalness (and metaphysics) of such paraphrases, in light of the form of the natural language sentence at issue, the reader is left to judge.

28. These are objects referred to variously, and potentially with different connotations, as ‘sets’, ‘classes’, ‘pluralities’, ‘sums’, ‘collections’, and ‘plural objects’.

29. See Boolos (1998) and McKay (2006). In the Fregean reductive style of treatment we have the pursuit of what McKay has called a singularist strategy.

30. The precise nature of the relationship between the Boolos strategy, and the non-singular Russellian approach, to be considered in the sequel, is not entirely clear.

31. At the same time, the ontic significance of such symbolism—or lack of it—needs to be explicitly stipulated, since there exists a spontaneous and naive tendency, within reflective or philosophical thought, to take any distinctive types of symbolism precisely as an index of a correspondingly distinctive types of object (or as Russell puts it, to fail to distinguish between grammatical and logical subjects).

32. As Boolos sensibly remarks, it is ‘haywire to think that when you have some Cheerios, you are eating a set—what you're doing is eating THE CHEERIOS … it doesn't follow just from the fact that there are some Cheerios in the bowl that, as some who theorise about the semantics of plurals would have it, there is also a set of them all’. The classical example of this approach is the treatment by Boolos of the so-called Geach-Kaplan sentence, ‘Some critics admire only one another’. And it is worth remarking here that Russell, contrary to Frege, struggled with the idea of collective predication as a logically distinctive phenomenon which did not involve collective units, because it could not be understood as involving single logical subjects. In effect, and very much in keeping with his incipient distinction between logical and grammatical subjects, Russell struggled against the ontologization of semantical non-singularity. The issue is of sufficiently general relevance to our overall concerns that it is considered further in the sequel. It is also addressed in the entry for plural-quantification, where it is suggested that “There may be something ad hoc about the idea that some sorts of semantic value give rise to ontological commitments while other sorts don't. On the other hand, it may count in favor of the alternative view that it does better justice to many people's strongly felt intuition that plural locutions are ontologically innocent.” But an anti-singularist reponse here might involve nothing more than insistence upon a general and principled distinction between semantical and ontic issues.

33. This issue in particular is considered in Laycock 2006a, in which the overall status of non-singular sentences is examined at some length.

34. See particularly the work of Vere Chappell (1971) and Peter Hacker (1979) for explicit statements of this view. The view itself however is advocated by most of those who have written on the topic, including Cartwright; for—as is noted in this work—once the view is couched in formal terms, it is evidently difficult to see what possible alternative there could be.

35. The idea of such a posit differs from that of an organized individual substance in just one key respect—it is the idea of a kind of object which is entirely form-indifferent—an object which might occur in any state of scatter or of aggregation whatsoever. And for this very reason, it is supposed, such things will be typically more durable than discrete individual substances— outliving those structured objects which they might sometimes constitute. Vere Chappell speaks of the bronze of which the Discobolus was made as persisting through being transformed into swords and shields; Helen Cartwright takes as an example

The gold of which my ring is made is the same gold as the gold of which Aunt Suzie's ring was made.

And asserts its equivalence to

The quantity of gold of which my ring is made = the quantity of gold of which Aunt Suzie's ring was made.

36. Nevertheless, the standard reductionist answer has one basic merit: it is, in a word, internally coherent. And not only is it, in a certain sense, coherent, but it constitutes, in effect, an attempt to rationalise an otherwise seemingly absurd state of affairs. And yet, in virtue of the possibility of seemingly limitless distinct references to matter (or ‘drawings of boundaries’), the rationalisation involves embracing the daunting excesses of a mereology with a ‘principle of unrestricted composition’. To embrace the mereology of matter-instances is to simply bite the bullet—to brave or brazen it out by insisting that there really are utterly vast (and indeed, in the absence of so-called ‘simples’, countless) numbers of arbitrary objects, the theory of which is not a physical or causal theory in any recognizable sense, but is akin to a branch of algebra or pure geometry.

Copyright © 2010 by
Henry Laycock <>

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