Object

First published Tue Oct 1, 2002; substantive revision Wed Aug 4, 2010

It is standard practice to introduce the entries in a work of reference with a definition of the topic. However, the concept of object—that concept of object which is of fundamental interest within philosophy—is among the most general concepts (or categories) which we possess. It seems very doubtful that it can be defined in more general terms; the best that seems possible is to trace relationships with other highly general concepts. Ernst Tugendhat (1982, 21–23) compares what he calls “a concept of modern philosophy, that of an object”, with the Aristotelian concept of being (which is, as he puts it, a “term of art”). Tugendhat then proceeds to ask:

Now what is meant by the word ‘object’? This word too, in the comprehensive sense in which it is used in philosophy, is a term of art. In ordinary language we are inclined to call only material objects… objects, and not e.g. events or numbers… What is meant by ‘objects’ in philosophy has its basis in … what we mean by the word ‘something’… There is a class of linguistic expressions which are used to stand for an object; and here we can only say: to stand for something. These are the expressions which can function as the sentence-subject in so-called singular predicative statements and which in logic have also been called singular terms

In this entry, some of the various conceptions of object are documented and explored; and as with Tugendhat, their roles in logic, ontology and the philosophy of language are examined. While the focus is chiefly on contemporary philosophical writings, the philosophies of the past (and their continued influence) have an important role to play. Relationships between the very highest-level concepts of logic and semantics, and the more concrete applications of these concepts in metaphysics and ontology, are among the topics for review. Tugendhat tells us that “The fundamental question of ontology is: what is being as being?”, and he reformulates this question as the question of “what it means to speak of an object”. Recent work suggests that Tugendhat's reformulation of the ‘question of ontology’ may be, at any rate, contestable.


1. A formal sense of ‘object’

Natural-language uses of ‘object’ are (unsurprisingly) diverse. The modest American College Dictionary, for example, contains some twelve entries for the term, among which appear the following: “something that may be perceived by the senses, especially by sight or touch”, and again, “anything that may be presented to the mind: objects of thought.” The former use seems closer to the vernacular—corresponding, roughly and approximately, to the familiar everyday notion of body, or material object. But whatever its precise significance, the latter is plainly the more general use, and from a traditional logico-metaphysical standpoint, it is also the more fundamental of the two—perhaps the most fundamental of any. It will, accordingly, play the role of basic organizing concept for the following remarks. Some metaphysically significant qualifications or applications of this basic concept, such as that of substance—applications which themselves embody or exemplify formal or logical categories—are then considered briefly in the sequel.[1] What, then, is the content of this very general notion of an object, as in ‘object of thought’?

1.1 Statements in the literature

Russell, in a well-known passage, singles out just this notion in the Principles of Mathematics:

Whatever may be an object of thought, or may occur in any true or false proposition, or can be counted as one, I call a term. This, then, is the widest word in the philosophical vocabulary. (1937: 43)

And by way of elucidation of his notion of a ‘term’, Russell writes that

I shall use as synonymous with it the words unit, individual and entity. The first two emphasize the fact that every term is one, while the third is derived from the fact that every term has being, i.e. is in some sense. A man, a moment, a number, a class, a relation, a chimera, or anything else that can be mentioned, is sure to be a term (1937: 43)

Essentially cognate assertions are not uncommon in the literature. E. J. Lowe, for instance, notes that

‘Thing’, in its most general sense, is interchangeable with ‘entity’ or ‘being’ and is applicable to any item whose existence is acknowledged by a system of ontology, whether that item be particular, universal, abstract, or concrete. In this sense, not only material bodies but also properties, relations, events, numbers, sets, and propositions are—if they are acknowledged as existing—to be accounted ‘things’. (2005: 915)

Or again, as Peter Strawson writes,

Anything whatever can be introduced into discussion by means of a singular, definitely identifying substantival expression…. Anything whatever can be identifyingly referred to; anything whatever can appear as a logical subject, an ‘individual’. (1959: 137, 227)

And lastly, in the Tractatus, Wittgenstein writes

the variable name ‘x’ is the proper sign of the pseudo-concept object. Wherever the word ‘object’ (‘thing’, ‘entity’, etc.) is rightly used, it is expressed in logical symbolism by the variable name. For example in the proposition ‘there are two objects which…’ by ‘(∃;x, y)…’. Whenever it is used otherwise, i.e., as a proper concept word, there arise senseless pseudo-propositions. So one cannot, e.g., say ‘There are objects’ as one says ‘There are books’ … The same holds of the words ‘Complex’, ‘Fact’, ‘Function’, ‘Number’, etc. They all signify formal concepts and are presented in logical symbolism by variables. (1922: 4.1272)

Superficial differences of terminology notwithstanding, all these remarks, it seems fair to say, focus on one and the same underlying concept—a concept which, in fact, is very widely recognized within philosophy. The concept is at one and the same time both highly abstract (or as Wittgenstein puts it, formal), and quite fundamental. It would seem to be fundamental in the sense that any more narrowly defined, more constrained conception of an object (e.g. “a thing that may be perceived by the senses…”) must conform at least to the criteria for objecthood or objects in this extremely general, formal sense. And yet its widespread recognition or acknowledgement notwithstanding, there would seem to be no generally agreed-upon unique or standard designation for the concept in question—this at any rate seems clear from the already quoted comments. In what follows, the concept is referred to as neutrally as possible— employing the relatively common terminology of ‘objects’, albeit in the singular—as the pure concept, object (or PCO, for short).

Not only, however, does this concept have no truly standard designation: more significantly, it is rarely subject to any sustained examination or analysis. It seems entirely possible that the general feeling on this point is well summed up by Frege who, in response to the question of ‘what we are here calling an object’, famously avers that he regards “a regular definition as impossible, since we have here something too simple to admit of logical analysis” (1960: 32). And—given a sufficiently strict conception of ‘logical analysis’, at least—Frege's remark may well be unimpeachable. But there are in fact several key semantical / categorial relationships between the PCO and cognate notions—relationships which promise to cast a degree of light upon the formal concept itself. Some at least of these relationships have been recently examined by logicians and semanticists, and most notably, perhaps, by the late George Boolos. They are duly noted in the sequel: briefly in Part 1, (1.3); but chiefly in Part 3.

1.2 The pure concept and the thesis of its universal applicability

Wittgenstein tells us that the PCO is a purely formal concept or ‘category’; and to say this is to say, among other things, that it has no more empirical content than does any concept of logic or arithmetic, involving thereby reference to no actual or possible kinds of things. Furthermore, qua formal concept, the PCO figures typically as part of a broader set of elements—a set which includes the idea of the logical form of assertions or beliefs quite generally. Indeed, it seems plain that the proposals quoted above involve not only the articulation of a maximally general concept or category of object (entity, unit, thing, etc.), but also suggest a thesis asserting its universal applicability. That is, claims are advanced to the effect that the content of these various expressions, ‘entity’, ‘thing’, ‘unit’, and so forth, with their common, formal emphasis on oneness or unity, is such as to be adequate to comprehend the sum-total of existence, to apply to or to include whatever there may be. Or—limiting the thesis explicitly, a la Kant, to the categories of (human) thought and talk—the formal concept at issue, it is suggested, enters into virtually everything which may be thought or said. As Locke somewhat equivocally puts the point,

amongst all the ideas we have… there is none more simple, than that of unity, or one… every idea in our understanding, every thought in our minds, brings this idea along with it… For number applies itself to… everything that either does exist or can be imagined (1924, 121–2).

Whether as unrestricted doctrines concerning (Aristotelian) categories of being, or as restricted to the categories of thought, such views would seem, in fact, to be historically commonplace; they are reflected, for instance, in Aquinas' remark, “Being and one are convertible terms”, as again in that of Leibniz: “I do not conceive of any reality at all as without genuine unity”. In actual practise, the ambiguity or equivocation makes little if any difference; we may speak simply of a thesis of the universal applicability of the pure concept—whether ‘for us’, or not, as the case may be. And this thesis itself surely also deserves to be given a name. Here, it is dubbed simply as the ‘universal applicability’ thesis, or UAT.

Though the UAT is not a thesis whose precise character and basis can be said to be entirely clear, it appears standardly to be conceived as a kind of a priori or conceptual truth. Naturally enough; for if the PCO is no empirical concept, the UAT is likewise no empirical thesis—in no respect akin to positing such things as quarks, bacteria or ghosts. It is not, in short, a view concerning ‘what there is’ in anything akin to the ways in which biologists and physicists and just plain folk, are interested in what there is. Rather, as the remarks of Wittgenstein and Strawson in particular suggest, it is an austerely semantic (or logico-semantic) thesis, concerning the essential content of the categories involved in any reference or predication.[3]

The thesis can then be expressed in either of two ways—on the one hand, as a thesis concerning the categories which general terms or predicates embody or instantiate; or on the other hand, as a thesis on the semantics of reference itself. Couched à la Wittgenstein in terms of variables, the UAT declares that all general natural-language sentences may be represented in a formal system on the quantifier/variable model—that (with Quine) we speak of nothing which cannot figure as the value of a variable;[4] or more precisely, that if not restricted to first-order versions, the system of the predicate calculus is ontologically complete. Barring the truth of nominalism, properties, properties of properties, and so forth, must be allowed to count as objects too. But casting matters in this mode does not advance our understanding, either of the PCO or the UAT; for—as Wittgenstein's remarks themselves imply—it is the variable name ‘x’ which is to be explicated by reference to the formal object-concept, rather than vice-versa. At this level of abstraction, talk of variables and the like does no more than reformulate the issues in symbolic mode, whereas the UAT is primarily a thesis concerning the applicability of a certain formal category to natural-language pre-philosophical thought or discourse.

1.3 A radically inclusive understanding of the core idea

As Strawson's remark in particular makes clear, the formal concept at issue corresponds to the notion of a logical subject—a value of a Wittgensteinian ‘variable name’—where a ‘logical subject’ is itself understood as the correlate of a semantically singular reference. The point is expressed not only in Strawson's comment but also, in one way or another, in the remarks of Russell, Wittgenstein, and Locke. The key to the character of both the PCO and the UAT evidently rests in the notions of unity and singularity— and thereby perhaps, more generally, in the concepts of number and countability. The question of the bottom-line constraints upon the PCO, if any, seems to be identical with the question of constraints upon the abstract general notion of a unit, the notion of that which is countable ‘as one’. There are, it will emerge, two incompatible modes of understanding this abstract notion; here, they are referred to as the ‘unrestricted’ and ‘restricted’ modes; and correspondingly, there are two versions of the UAT. Furthermore, recent arguments appear to suggest that of the two conceptions of the PCO, the restricted mode is closer to the truth. Ironically, however, precisely those considerations which count in favour of the restricted mode may also be taken to suggest that at the end of the day—and for the very simplest of reasons—the UAT itself is false.

Now on this key logico-semantic question, the question of constraints upon the abstract general notion of a unit, the Russell / Frege tradition leans towards a strikingly liberal, unrestricted or inclusive view. Thus in his Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy (IMP), having just examined what he calls “the in the singular” in the well-know chapter 16 on ‘descriptions’, Russell writes that in

the present chapter we shall be concerned with the in the plural: the inhabitants of London, the sons of rich men, and so on. In other words, we shall be concerned with classes. (Russell 1919, 181)[5]

What Russell appears to here propose is a view which, from a naive, extra-philosophical standpoint, might well seem surprising, if not counterintuitive. The view, evidently, is that grammatically plural reference too is to be understood as having a kind of collective albeit semantically singular denotation—as corresponding to a special category of collective units.[6] In much the same vein, Frege sees semantically plural predication (that is, collective, or non-distributive predication) precisely as a warrant for the posit of a matching ontic category of collective units. In reference to the sentence ‘Siemens and Halske have built the first major telegraph network’, Frege asserts that “‘Siemens and Halske’ designates a compound object about which a statement is being made, and the word ‘and’ is used to help form the sign for this object”. (Frege 1914, 227–8). The nub of this suggestion, as it appears in the work of both Frege and Russell alike, is then that there exists some highly general and coherent formal concept of a unit, the scope of which extends beyond that of reference which is, in any straightforward sense, semantically singular. According to this view—and Russell and Frege are far from being alone on the matter—there is a coherent formal concept of ‘unit’ available to us, ranging over modes of reference which are not, in the semantically conventional sense, forms of singular reference at all, but which might well extend to include reference altogether generally and as such.

Given such an account, plainly, the thesis of the universal applicability of the object-concept, in its most comprehensive, all-inclusive form, follows as an immediate consequence. At the same time, however, the status of the apparently simple concept of a unit turns out to be less clear than it might initially have seemed. Many objects also come to count as one, as identical with a single ‘many’—and the status of the PCO then appears somewhat obscure. Objects are acknowledged, such as the ‘pure compound’ of Siemens and Halske, which the plain, extra-philosophical individual seems unlikely to recognize or readily embrace).[7] The very contrast between one and many seems to have evaporated. At the same time, such a highly liberal generalization or reconstrual of the notion of a unit is not an obviously satisfactory construal. The idea is not only contentious; most strikingly, it is one concerning which Russell himself, in the course of the argument of The Principles of Mathematics (PoM), expresses serious doubts.[8] And the reservations are not confined to to the PoM. In the IMP account itself, Russell qualifies his doctrine with the following proviso:

The theory of classes is less complete than the theory of descriptions, and there are reasons… for regarding the definition of classes that will be suggested as not finally satisfactory. Some further subtlety appears to be required… The first thing is to realize why classes cannot be regarded as part of the ultimate furniture of the world. (1919, 182)

What lies behind this vague but cautionary remark appears to be closely related to a set of issues already remarked, issues which are developed in the contemporary work of prominent logicians and semanticists. In an influential series of writings, Boolos in particular has shown how the traditional ‘class-reduction’ of essentially non-singular sentences to singular form can and should be avoided; and Tom McKay has coined the term ‘singularism’ to denote this exclusive preoccupation with singular reference and distributive predication which is a hallmark of the standard first-order predicate calculus. Particularly in view of its potential metaphysical ramifications, the matter would seem to deserve significantly more attention than it has thus far received. It is further rehearsed, albeit in a preliminary and tentative manner, in Part 3.[9]

2. Some applied object-concepts

2.1 Objects and substances: a distinction

The most commonplace philosophical use of the term ‘object’ is not that which signifies the pure concept itself, but rather, that which is intended to signify the more restricted concept of substance, understood (following Aristotle) as whatever is supposed to ‘exist independently’—however this phrase itself is to be understood.[10] Plainly, this is a far narrower notion than that associated with the UAT in any form. And most typically (though by no means necessarily, given the varieties of Platonism), such an ‘independent’ object is conceived of as a material object or body—that is, very roughly, as a substance in the full and traditional Aristotelian sense. Sponsors of the Aristotelian concept tend to conceive of substances as the central sub-category of material objects—that is, of objects consisting of matter—on account of their relatively high degree of structure (‘form’). Furthermore, in drawing a contrast of this sort, between the PCO as such, and a certain much less broad though historically and philosophically crucial concept, we are in effect making a distinction between the pure concept in itself, and one of a number of restrictions on, or specifications or applications of, the core formal category— some of which find expression in natural languages, and some of which also loom large within philosophy. It is just these which constitute the subject-matter of the present intermediate Part. And among those which merit particular consideration (other than the category of so-called ‘ordinary’ objects or Aristotelian substances) are the dual and putatively exhaustive categories of abstract and concrete objects, along with those of universals and particulars. And in all these contexts, the pure concept in itself, embodying a entirely formal, logico-semantic category, cannot but continue to occupy the foundational role as base concept, upon which any and every more specific concept cannot fail to be constructed.

The precise nature of the relationship between the narrow Aristotelian idea of a concrete organized object, and the absolutely general idea of an individual object or unit, has been examined and re-examined from the time of Aristotle's Categories up to the contemporary period; Strawson's Individuals is itself one such major relatively recent work. And, to the extent that there is a received view on the matter, it is that this relationship is grounded in (if not identical with) the contrast between the general idea of an object of reference or subject of predication, and the particular notion of a fundamental subject of predication. Aristotle's influential and powerful conception of such a fundamental subject is, of course, that of a subject which is incapable of also figuring as a predicate—or as he himself puts it, rather more precisely, it is that which is ‘neither said of nor present in a subject’. In short, while the concept of an object in general corresponds to that of a logical subject as such (abstract or concrete, the subject of any predication whatsoever), the concept of an object in the narrower sense corresponds to that of the basic or fundamental type of logical subject—the denotation of a fundamental (i.e., concrete) singular reference. It is then references of this latter type which are held, by the sponsors of accounts of this genre, to constitute the sole basis on which references to other categories of objects—such things as classes, attributes, distances, weights, states of consciousness, and so forth, whatever items could be Russellian ‘objects of thought’—may themselves be made. A thorough and complete review of the issue is to be found elsewhere in the S.E.P. (see especially the main entries under ‘Substance’ and ‘Contintental Rationalism’).

There is however a certain terminological / conceptual thorn in the philosophical flesh—an issue associated precisely with this use of the pure concept of an object, in relation to the notion of an Aristotelian substance—which merits attention in the present context. The point is brilliantly observed by J. S. Mill in his Logic. There, Mill draws attention to an implicature seemingly involved in speaking of all ‘non-substances’— attributes, for instance—as objects. His observation, in effect, is that to refer to some such thing as a virtue—kindness or generosity, say—as an object or thing, seems to involve a certain inevitable reification (platonisation, substantialisation) of what is after all a (‘mere’) attribute. In consequence, he notes, a tendency emerges to seek some alternative term (‘entity’, perhaps?) which might lighten the perceived ontic burden, or carry rather less obvious metaphysical weight. Thus Mill writes that

we must take notice of an unfortunate ambiguity in all the concrete names which correspond to the most general of all abstract terms, the word Existence. When we shall have occasion for a name which shall be capable of denoting whatever exists… there is hardly a word applicable to the purpose which is not also, and even more familiarly, taken in a sense in which it denotes only substances. But substances are not all that exists; attributes, if such things are to be spoken of, must be said to exist… Yet when we speak of an object, or of a thing, we are almost always supposed to mean a substance. There seems a kind of contradiction in using such an expression as that one Thing is merely an attribute of another thing… If, rejecting the word Thing, we endeavour to find another of more general import, a word denoting all that exists…. no word might be presumed fitter … than Being … . But this word … is still more completely spoiled for the purpose … . Being is, by custom, exactly synonymous with substance … Attributes are never called Beings … . In consequence of this perversion of the word Being, philosophers … laid their hands upon the word Entity … . Yet if you call virtue an entity, you are … suspected of believing it to be a substance … . Every word which was originally intended to connote mere existence, seems, after a time, to enlarge its connotation to separate existence (Mill, 1900: 30–1).

In speaking of a “a kind of contradiction” here, Mill acknowledges a thought which might seem to echo Frege's, concerning the essentially ‘unsaturated’ (dependent, non-substantial) character of concepts. There is an omnipresent overshadowing of the pure, abstract concept of objecthood, via its entirely legitimate association with the notion of substantiality—an overshadowing associated with the semantic and epistemic role played, in our overall talk of objects, by the ordinary concrete objects or Aristotelian substances.[11] It is an overshadowing which might seem, in effect, to call the PCO into a kind of disrepute, by way of latent innuendo.

But powerful though the association of objecthood and substantiality would seem to be, it provides sponsors of the PCO with no compelling reason to call into question the austere sense of object within a purely formal discourse. They surely remain free to stipulate that for certain purposes, any such implicature of substantiality be simply detached—that in logico-semantic contexts, ‘object’ (or other equivalent term) expresses only the PCO, meaning nothing more than ‘something, anything, to which one may refer which may be counted as one’—whether it be an Australian shiraz, a particular virtue, a number, the shape of a teardrop, or a hand grenade.[12]If, on the other hand, a principled contrast or distinction is called for between ‘property’ and ‘object’, then pace Mill, then this can indeed be nothing other than a contrast between properties and those objects deemed to be ‘basic’ or substantial objects—objects, that is, which presuppose no other categories of items as conditions of their being or instantiation.

2.2 Objects, substances and stuff

This phenomenon—this fact of a pervasive duality of meanings for ‘object’—carries with it a significant potential for still other confusions or conflations over potentially distinct high-level logico-semantic categories. Consider the case of concrete non-count nouns or words for stuff (addressed further in Part 3). Removing a fly from a bowl of soup inevitably involves removing some soup as well; but it seems grammatically inappropriate to say that in such a case, there is another thing which is removed, alongside the fly.

And the question then arises, of exactly why such a remark seems inappropriate. Given the duality in question, there is one particular answer which may seem (and has in fact seemed) intuitively attractive: the soup which was removed does not intuitively count as a thing, precisely because it does not count as an ‘ordinary’ thing or Aristotelian substance—because it is, in effect, entirely ‘form-indifferent’, structureless or seemingly mereological in its character. Or again (what comes to much the same thing), the spatio-temporal isolation of any such soup will be arbitrary or adventitious. The concept of soup evidently fails, unlike that of an individual substance, to carve nature at the joints; that, in essence, is why soup must be served in discrete bowls. And that, it may be said, is surely why it seems grammatically inappropriate to call some soup a thing. However (so this answer continues) some soup really is, in terms of the more general pure object-concept, an individual object or thing; it is just not an enformed or structured Aristotelian substance, just not an ordinary thing. Rather, it is a so-called ‘quantity’, ‘parcel’, ‘portion’, ‘sum’ or ‘mass’ of soup, belonging to a special category of extra-ordinary mereological objects having just those properties described by Quine—whereby ‘soup’ behaves like ‘water’, such that “any sum of parts which are water”, as he writes, “is water” (1960: 91).

However, exactly the opposite conclusion is no less possible. It is entirely possible that this common response just puts the cart before the horse – no less possible that we are reluctant to call some soup a material thing, precisely because we are reluctant, for good but as yet unarticulated semantic reasons, to call it a thing, an object, period. Does it seem intuitively wrong to speak of a ‘thing’ in this context, purely and simply in virtue of our supposed attachment to the idea of an Aristotelian thing or substance? That cannot be said to be self-evident. It is noteworthy that the various individuative terms which are used to plug the grammatical gap, such terms as ‘parcel’, ‘portion’, and so forth, are being used as terms of art, technical terms which no longer play the kind of role they play in natural-language contexts. Indeed if, as can be argued, the semantics of non-count nouns like ‘soup’ are themelves irreducibly non-singular—and thereby not denoting single objects, individuals or things—then the ‘easy’ explanation of this phenomenon will need to be called into serious question (and on this, see the comments of McKay in 3.4). Indeed the possibility cannot be discounted, that the UAT itself is called into question by the semantics of such nouns—an issue which is also rehearsed provisionally in the sequel.

2.3 Abstract and concrete, universal and particular: preliminary issues

Putting now relationships between the general concepts of object and individual substance to one side, there are two very general pairs of dichotomies which are plausibly seen as being directly subordinate to the highest level concept or category of objects as such. The dichotomies in question—those of concrete and abstract, on the one hand, and of universal and particular, on the other—are commonly presented as being dichotomies of mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive categories of objects. Of the two, the dichotomy of concrete and abstract would seem to be especially contentious, and some potential worries concerning it are highlighted before all else. Those worries seem however to be circumventable, just in case the line of approach advocated in Mill's Logic, elucidated in section 2.4 below, is given due regard.

The dichotomy of concrete and abstract objects seems particularly difficult. On the one hand, the use of the term ‘object’ in this context strongly suggests a contrast between two general ontic categories. On the other hand, though, the adjective ‘abstract’ is closely cognate with the noun ‘abstraction’, which might suggest ‘a product of the mind’, or perhaps even ‘unreal’ or ‘non-existent’— suggestions reinforced by the not uncommon, quasi-Aristotelian view that to be, for the case of concepts of this type, just is for the concepts to be instantiated. Alex Oliver in particular suggests that the dichotomy of concrete and abstract is simply ‘too naive to be of theoretical use’—a suggestion supported by his observation that there are ‘many different ways, themselves vague, to mark the distinction’. Consider in this connection the entry for ‘abstract entity’ in the Cambridge Dictionary of Philosophy. The Dictionary offers a not atypical definition, or partial definition, as “object lacking spatio-temporal properties”. (Although this particular entry does not mention it, a requirement of causal inertness is also sometimes added to accounts of the genre). The definition is, of course, no clearer than the concepts of space and time themselves.[13] But the dictionary then proceeds to list as examples “mathematical objects, such as numbers, sets and geometrical figures, propositions, properties and relations” (Jacquette, 1999: 3). And given this, the basic character of such an account is bound to seem less than fully perspicuous. Trivially, reference to geometrical figures, for example, includes reference to triangles, spheres and the like—objects which, even as Platonically ‘ideal’, are nonetheless defined in terms of spatial properties (shapes, areas, volumes and the like); and the question of how to square this fact with a conception of such things as non-spatial (unless this means merely ‘non-existent’) is just not immediately obvious.[14] What is described as the abstract triangle, so the dictionary entry continues,

has only the properties common to all triangles, and none peculiar to any particular triangles; it has no definite colour, size or specific type, such as isosceles or scalene.

Evidently, the remark directly echoes Locke, who speaks of the “abstract general idea” of a triangle which is “neither Oblique nor Rectangle, neither Equilateral, Equicrural nor Scalenon; but all and none of these at once”, (Essay IV.vii.9). Locke's conception of an abstract general idea—as traditionally understood, as formed from concrete ideas by the removal of all distinguishing detail—is of course rejected by both Berkeley and Hume. Indeed taken literally, the dictionary account of ‘the abstract triangle’ might seem to invite precisely Berkeley's acid criticism of Locke's abstract general ideas in the Principles—bluntly put, there can be no such object. (Such scepticism might perhaps invite the reply that qua ideal objects, such things as triangles and spheres are not conceived as spatio-temporally particularized or instantiated; and so, as ‘lacking concrete details’; but the reply can hardly be said to address the objection). One concept which evidently can pass muster in this context is that of (the attribute of) triangularity, as against that of some elusive object which is the (abstract) triangle—since the attribute itself, unlike any triangle, no matter how abstract, does not have vertices or sides. Nevertheless, it is clear from accounts such as that of Zalta (1983), that attributes are not the only possible entities to play the relevant role. At the same time, it should be said, Zalta's own account introduces a class of abstract objects which, via the use of a concept of encoding, in contrast with that of exemplification, thereby presuppose the category of attributes.

In similar fashion, the dictionary classification of sets as abstract objects is by no means atypical, yet the rationale for this too is by no means self-evident. It is difficult to see why—on pain of begging the question—ordinary everyday objects which are naturally characterised as sets—chess sets, bedroom sets, sets of tools, weights, cutlery, and so forth, should not be included in the realm of bona fide sets (as naive set theories would typically, in fact, suppose; and arguably, all appear to satisfy the axiom of extensionality). But possessing as they plainly do such properties as weight or mass is a sufficient condition of counting them as concrete; and there are in fact those who are perfectly happy to consider sets of concrete objects as themselves concrete.[15] Yet again, it is not at all unusual to classify fictional characters, musical compositions and the like as abstract, even though these are indisputably historical creations of the human mind, productions dated within human history, and so are hardly atemporal after the manner of Platonic ‘ideal’ objects. Another somewhat obscure, but again very different use of the term ‘abstract’, is that of David Lewis, who speaks for instance of ‘the particular pain of a given person at a particular time’ as an “abstract entity which… we might identify with a pair of a universal and a single concrete particular instance thereof” (Lewis 1966). On this conception, whatever it amounts to, abstract entities may be directly experienced and have (at least phenomenal) spatio-temporal location. However—and especially in light of the issues which are rehearsed in 2.4 below—it is possible that ‘abstract’ in such cases is very misleading, and is really tantamount to ‘(particularized) attribute as opposed to substance’, or in other words, that it corresponds to the notion of a spatio-temporally located trope.

In at least some of the cases of putative ‘abstract objects’, the key thought may just be that the items in question are either types or universals, rather than tokens or particulars, and are to be counted as abstract in some sense which is derivative from this. This conjecture—which seems to have a degree of plausibility—is canvassed further in the sequel. But yet, the abstract / concrete, universal / particular and type / token distinctions are all prima facie different distinctions, and to thus conflate them can only be an invitation to further confusion.[16] Hence, if Oliver's remarks might seem unduly strong, the foregoing observations nevertheless give some degree of credence to his view. Such cautionary remarks are be construed not as canvassing rejection of any possible abstract / concrete dichotomy, but rather, with Oliver, as highlighting the desirability of greater focus on the coherent understanding of ‘abstract’, and perhaps also, thereby, on the better understanding of its rationale. It may be that progress in clarifying the tangle of issues here at stake calls for revaluation of this particular way of taking the abstract / concrete dichotomy. And in this connection, the following section reviews a contrasting account of the dichotomy which may be found in Mill, and which appears in a distinctly more positive light.

2.4 Objects and attributes: Mill's contribution

Arguably, the status of both the abstract / concrete and the universal / particular dichotomies are best approached by first addressing the nature of the relationship between the two of them, within the framework of the concept of an object. And this, in fact, is the route which is here pursued. It is a fact of central significance that the concrete / abstract dichotomy has at least two prominent but widely divergent interpretations. , On the one hand, there is an ontic interpretation (such as that observed above); and there is a purely semantic or non-objectual interpretation, on the other.

Construed as ontic, the concrete / abstract dichotomy is commonly taken to simply coincide with that of universal and particular. Hence, Quine speaks of “the term ‘abstract’, or ‘universal’, and its opposite, ‘concrete’ or ‘particular’” (Quine, 1960: 233). And to thus construe the concrete / abstract dichotomy is thereby, trivially, to ontologize it—to construe it precisely as a contrast between concrete and abstract objects. Potentially, however, the basis is then laid for major confusions or distortions of the relevant conceptual terrain. The issue is acutely remarked once again by Mill, in an undeservedly neglected passage from his Logic; and it is precisely views of the Quinean genre which are the focus of Mill's complaint. Fixing primarily on the use of ‘abstract’, Mill begins by taking the abstract / concrete dichotomy in a semantic sense, as concerning what he calls names. He writes:

The second general division of names is into concrete and abstract. A concrete name is a name which stands for a thing; an abstract name is a name which stands for an attribute of a thing. Thus, John, the sea, this table, are names of things. White, also, is a name of a thing, or rather of things. Whiteness, again, is the name of a quality or attribute of those things. Man is a name of many things; humanity is a name of an attribute of those things. Old is a name of things; old age is a name of one of their attributes.

I have used the words concrete and abstract in the sense annexed to them by the schoolmen, who, notwithstanding the imperfections of their philosophy, were unrivalled in the construction of technical language, and whose definitions, in logic at least, though they never went more than a little way into the subject, have seldom, I think, been altered but to be spoiled. A practice, however, has grown up in more modern times, which, if not introduced by Locke, has gained currency chiefly from his example, of applying the expression ‘abstract name’ to all names which are the result of abstraction or generalization, and consequently to all general names, instead of confining it to the names of attributes. The metaphysicians of the Condillac school,--whose admiration of Locke, passing over the profoundest speculations of that truly original genius, usually fastens with peculiar eagerness upon his weakest points,--have gone on imitating him in this abuse of language, until there is now some difficulty in restoring the word to its original signification. A more wanton alteration in the meaning of a word is rarely to be met with; for the expression general name, the exact equivalent of which exists in all languages I am acquainted with, was already available for the purpose to which abstract has been misappropriated, while the misappropriation leaves that important class of words, the names of attributes, without any compact distinctive appellation. The old acceptation, however, has not gone so completely out of use, as to deprive those who still adhere to it of all chance of being understood. By abstract, then, I shall always mean the opposite of concrete: by an abstract name, the name of an attribute; by a concrete name, the name of an object. (1900, 17-18)

How, then, does the lesson of the Millian narrative bear on Quine's equation of the concrete / abstract and universal / particular dichotomies? On the Millian account, Quine's equation, due ultimately to Locke, involves a familiar albeit profoundly inappropriate categorization of the universal as such as ‘abstract’. In contemporary (and specifically Quinean) terminology, the Millian narrative unfolds roughly, but intuitively, as follows.[17]

Each concrete general term or predicate in adjectival form gives rise to a corresponding nominal subject-expression, commonly described as an abstract singular term . Thus, ‘wise’ gives rise to ‘wisdom’, ‘dense’ to ‘density’, ‘happy’ to ‘happiness’, ‘viscous’ to ‘viscosity’, ‘red’ to ‘redness’, and so on. Commonly and in fact typically, these abstract singular terms are naturally construed as the putative names of attributes—of one prominent sub-category, that is, of universals. And thus conceived as universals, attributes display two key, potentially complementary features. First, they are traditionally and entirely plausibly treated as abstractions, or as abstracted, in the quite specific and narrow sense of lacking independent (substantial) existence. And furthermore, in lacking independent existence, they presuppose something else—something belonging to a distinct category, something which does have an independent existence and in which they need to be instantiated.

Here, there seems to be a significantly clearer and relatively well-defined manner of drawing a distinction between the abstract and the concrete. From this standpoint, the vexed issue of geometrical figures appears in an entirely different light. In the specific case of triangles themselves, the relevant attribute—that of triangularity, corresponding to the concrete adjective ‘triangular’—contrasts radically with triangles as such, which (even qua ideal) cannot but have have some distinctive spatial properties, determinate kinds of shapes and so forth. The attribute of triangularity, on the other hand, is given by a purely abstract definition or formula, specifying what all such figures have in common, and is itself utterly incapable of independent instantation as such.[18] Consistently with these remarks, furthermore, it is fair to say that commonly and perhaps even typically, what are referred to as abstract singular terms are construed exclusively as the (putative) names of attributes.

The spirit of the Millian approach is carried one step further in the cognate group of doctrines constituted by conceptualism, nominalism and trope theory regarding attributes. With some degree of plausibility, it may be urged that abstract singular terms denote mere abstractions—that strictly speaking, there is no such object as, say, refinement or viscosity as such, as opposed to Peter's refinement, Paul's refinement, the viscosity of this or that particular substance, the triangularity of a certain piece of wood; and so forth. On such an account, there is a (‘mere’) concept of refinement, abstracting away the idiosyncratic features of Peter's individual refinement, Paul's individual refinement, and so on. In Aristotelian terms, essentially this point is put by urging that the existence of such an attribute consists only in that of its ‘instances’. We may speak of the existence of refinement, only to the extent that we encounter the particular refinement of Peter, Paul or Mary. And thus far, it may be said, the existence of attributes consists in that of tropes. Plainly, such an approach must yield a very different account of the extension of the class of abstract objects from a directly metaphysical approach.[19]

2.5 Non-attributive universals after Mill

Among non-particulars objects, the emphatic focus on properties or attributes, along with a corresponding neglect or downgrading of kinds, has a history going back to Hume—and before Hume, indeed, to Locke's ‘simple qualities’. It is the natural strategy of empiricism, still very much alive and well, to place properties as the ultimate basis—epistemic and consequently ontic—for talk both of individual concrete objects or substances and of general kinds or types.[20] But of course empiricism is not the only influential theory of knowledge (let alone as a standpoint for ontology). And by the same token, attributes are not the only widely recognized sub-category of universals.

Though their status is no less contentious than that of attributes, both species such as the tiger (Panthera tigris, ‘a large Asian carnivorous mammal’), and chemical substances such as gold (‘the yellow malleable ductile metallic element that occurs chiefly free or in a few minerals’) are also eligible for membership. Kinds too, in short, whether kinds of things or kinds of stuff, are also widely recognized as belonging to the category of objects which count as universals. Yet neither the tiger, nor the element gold, can plausibly be said to be abstractions in the manner of attributes. Intuitively, the existence neither of gold nor of the tiger presupposes that of something else in which these things ‘inhere’. And it seems fair to say that Aristotelians and essentialists tend to regard the category of kinds as a ‘deeper’ category than that of attributes.

There appears to be an intuitive and plausible sense in which one might wish to say that such things as liquids and metals, elements and compounds, are concrete. Thus, gold may be (truly) said to be yellow, heavy, malleable, dense, and so forth. And the names of liquids, metals, etc., are strikingly unlike abstract nouns. It seems then implausible to categorize these subject-expressions as abstract singular terms, on a par with ‘justice’, ‘mercy’ and ‘refinement’; they are most naturally described as generic expressions, and are happily so-called by linguists. In semantic terminology, the singular term denoting the metallic element is correlated, not with a general term in adjectival form, but with a concrete noun or substantive: there is gold in the hills, much as there are tigers in the woods. The recent critical work on Crawford Elder on modal conventionalism, which addresses natural kinds for both individuals and stuffs, contains helpful kindred insights on this issue (Elder, 2007). Arguably, then, the ontologies of attributes and kinds diverge significantly, and the (‘non-particular’ or ‘second-order’) singular terms which purport to designate objects in these categories call for substantially distinctive semantic analyses.[21]

Viewed from a metaphysical standpoint, there is a venerable sense of the term ‘universal’ in which among universals are included just those objects which are capable of ‘multiple realization’ or instantiation. Many separate things may, for example, be said to exemplify one and the same colour. And the names of substances in the ordinary or chemist's sense (the names of metals, liquids, acids, gases, and so on) seem plainly to denote universals in this venerable sense. Thus the significance of the term ‘liquid’, for example, in its nominal use, is such that there is no natural-language sense of the noun for which, if there is acetic acid in distinct containers, the liquid in one of the containers could be said to be a different liquid from the liquid in another.[22] The acetic acid in my glass cannot be said to be the same acetic acid as that in yours. However, the liquid in my glass—that is, the type of stuff which the acetic acid in my glass ‘exemplifies’, ‘embodies’, or ‘instantiates’—must be said to be identical with that in yours. And in just this sense, the concept of a liquid appears to be that of an immanent universal. In just this sense, it is a striking and undeniable feature of our ‘folk ontology’ that the very same liquid (metal, organic compound, etc.) may be said to be present in any number of places at the same time. Though the concept of a liquid just is the concept of a distinctive kind or type, and so a universal in one good sense of the term, it is not obviously coherent to maintain that (although there may be vinegar here and there, and though vinegar is indeed liquid) there are nevertheless no liquids, and in particular there is no such liquid as vinegar. Similarly, for what it is worth, it seems to be both meaningful and true to say that there is a certain precious metal, such that one and the same precious metal, namely gold, is mined in both Russia and South Africa.[23]

2.6 Substances versus bundles: a note

The use of the term ‘bundle’, in connection with the metaphysical constitution of objects, goes back at least to Hume's empiricist account of the self as a (mere) ‘bundle of perceptions’, each linked to others by various contingent associations or ‘contiguities’. Neither a persisting substance, manifest or underlying, nor a containing ‘theatre’ of any sort is then required, so Hume maintains, to do justice to the phenomenal character of subjective continuity through time. However, the doctrine is applicable (and has since been applied) to particular objects of all sorts, mental and material alike. And again, in surveying the evolution of doctrine in the empiricist tradition through Locke and Bishop Berkeley to Hume, the bundle notion seems clearly to be motivated by the requirement that epistemically respectable concepts be explicated by reference to actual and possible experiences. Arguably, then, the origins of the so-called ‘bundle theory’ of spatio-temporal objects lie in a contentious and epistemically driven metaphysics, whereby the very concept of an (Aristotelian) substance comes to appear problematic or ill-defined, a condition which evidently persists for many to the present day. For Locke, of course, our “idea of substance” is “the something, we know not what”, which we supposedly feel we must postulate, in order to bind together and (as he puts it) “support” the seemingly diverse causes of “our simple ideas of qualities”. As Tugendhat observes,

In the early modern period the Aristotelian insight was no longer understood; substance appeared as a substrate that, itself not perceptible, underlies a bundle of perceptible qualities (Locke) and could therefore be rejected (Hume). The conception that results from this, that objects are spatio-temporally instantiated bundles of properties which could be referred to with the word ‘this’, persisted in British Empiricism until Russell. (1982, 425 n.4)

It would seem to be chiefly this epistemologized conception of the significance of the non-epistemic, or metaphysical substance-concept, which constitutes the motivating force behind the very introduction of the bundle theory.[24]

For bundle theories of most varieties, concrete individual things are somehow ‘nothing but’ collections of universals—they are not, that is, instantiations of universals in the sense of tropes; rather, they are immanent universals capable of being manifested (or ‘instantiated’) in different places all at once. Although different versions of the bundle theory diverge on the issue of how particular objects are constituted out of properties, all versions of theory would seem to agree that the fundamental ingredients of concrete objects are indeed properties; neither Lockean ‘substrata’ nor so-called ‘bare particulars’ figure in bundle stories. One of the more accessible accounts of the diverse bundle theories is that of James van Cleve (1985). Van Cleve suggests that there are three basic forms of bundle theory. In the first, an individual object is a set of properties united by some relationship of ‘co-instantiation’, itself perhaps defined in terms of spatio-temporal co-ordinates. Indeed such (‘impure’) properties would seem to be a precondition for the possibility of more than one object's consisting of identical intrinsic attributes. On such an account, it is difficult to see how an object could undergo any change of attributes; but some sponsors of the theory might find this consequence acceptable nevertheless —so much he worse, it may be said with Hume, for ‘ordinary’ persisting objects. In the second version, van Cleve suggests, an object may be identified with a temporal sequence of sets of attributes, thereby circumventing the potential difficulty regarding change. In this case, however, the properties which constitute an object at any stage become essential to its identity; and a third version circumvents this objection by construing references to individual things as, in effect, ‘logical constructions’ out of references to properties, somewhat along the lines of the linguistic phenomenalism once advocated by A. J. Ayer. John Hawthorne and Ted Sider have however recently proposed a considerably less restricted conception of what bundle theory is about, according to which they propose for certain purposes to

understand the bundle theory more neutrally, as saying that the fundamental facts about qualities involve only universals, and make no reference to particulars. This leaves open whether particulars are to be eliminated from ontology or constructed out of universals, perhaps as sets or fusions of properties and relations. (2002, 54)

But, as they rightly go on to acknowledge in this same passage, Bundle theory is “a somewhat misleading name for the position we will be exploring, as our bundle theorist need not put forth bundles as entities”.

3. Singularism and objecthood

3.1 The pure concept and the universal applicability thesis reviewed

We may return now to the understanding of the fundamental object-concept which served to introduce the organizing topic of this piece. And here, Strawson's thesis noted in Part 1—whereby the claim is made that anything whatever can figure as an ‘individual’ or ‘logical subject’—provides a suitable point for addressing the fundamental question of the object-concept and its scope. The concept, it will be recalled, is glossed by Strawson (as also, representatively, by Tugendhat) as the correlate of “a singular, definitely identifying substantival expression”. But now the fact is that, when put in just these terms of ‘singular substantival expressions’, there appears to be the very simplest and most obvious objection to the claim—an objection echoing Russell's rejoinder to the Leibniz maxim that “Whatever is, is one”. Russell's response is simply that “Whatever are, are many”.

Thus take, for example, the many fish presently in Georgian Bay. On the one hand, it would seem counterintuitive (if not simply question-begging) to insist that they cannot be included under ‘anything whatever’. And on the other hand, it is plain that they are ‘introduced into discussion’ by way of a plural substantival expression, e.g. by the definite description ‘the fish in Georgian Bay’, or by a demonstrative such as ‘those fish’. In any natural-language sense of ‘singular’, these phrases do not introduce something into discussion by means of ‘a singular, definitely identifying substantival expression’, simply because the referring expressions in such cases are not singular but plural. The fish in Georgian Bay, it might be said, are manifestly many things and not just one. And this fact, taken at face value, is surely consistent with a certain ‘naive’ but entirely harmless understanding of the PCO—an understanding whereby this concept too may have both singular and plural representations or forms.

Nevertheless, the view that non-singular constructions—and particularly those involving collective predication—are best conceived as semantically singular, denoting such collective entities as classes, sums, or sets, is strikingly commonplace. Ironically, as noted earlier, just such a thesis occurs in Russell's Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy, where Russell speaks—albeit with manifestly serious reservations—of plural definite descriptions as designating classes.[25] Max Black would likewise seem to endorse the principle, in maintaining that we may build

the idealised set talk of mathematicians upon the rough but serviceable uses in ordinary language of plural referring expressions… to get the abstract notion of a set as… several things referred to at once. (1971, 633-4)

And E. J. Lowe declares that he “treats a plural noun phrase like ‘the planets’ as denoting a set… construed… as being, quite simply, a number of things” (1995: 522–3). On this type of approach, neither the concept of the many, nor the use of plural expressions, calls for modification to the doctrine that whatever is, is one. The many also count as one; what a plural referring expression designates is indeed just one—one set or equally one class. On such accounts, syntactically plural reference is semantically singular; there is a sense of ‘singular’ in which ‘singular’ and ‘reference’ are simply co-extensive, and ‘object’ is correlative with both.[26]

At the same time, of course, sentences containing plural nouns are often quite straightforwardly reducible to sentences which are (straightforwardly) singular: ‘Russell and Frege were logicians’, ‘My dogs are poodles’, and the like, can readily be cast as sentences concerning only single individuals—sentences which, if formalised, contain only singular variables, quantifiers, predicates and constants. And in such cases, it is difficult to see any good reason for introducing talk of sets. On the other hand, it sometimes happens that plural sentences are not reducible to singular form. It is self-evident, for example, that in virtue of its collective predication, the sentence

Some dogs have surrounded a fox.

cannot, while retaining the collective predication, be transformed into singular sentences about each of a number of individual dogs.[27] And it is in just such cases that the standard strategy has been to treat a sentence as designating a set or collection of objects, and so—either in reality, or perhaps just pragmatically or instrumentally treatable as such—as semantically singular. In this way, the issue of directly addressing collective predication is in effect circumvented—albeit at the cost of ontic proliferation, the introduction of a further ontic category for the values of the (singular) variables, in the form of distinctive collective entities.[28] McKay's terminology of ‘singularism’ is introduced to designate just this essentially reductive view; and thanks to the work of Boolos, along with that of McKay and others, it has become clear that sentences which are irreducibly plural may be represented in an ontically less contentious light.[29]

Boolos—perhaps the most influential author advocating such an approach—has drawn attention to a variety of syntactically simple sentences, e.g. ‘The rocks rained down’, which (chiefly on account of the non-distributive character of the predicates) are both essentially plural, and can be understood and formally represented without any singularist reduction. It is in that connection that he plausibly remarks

it would appear hopeless to try to say anything more about the meaning of a sentence of the form ‘The Ks M’ other than that it means that there are some things such that they are the Ks and they M. (1998, 168)

Indeed, Boolos urges us to

Abandon the idea that the use of plural forms must be understood to commit one to the existence of sets (‘classes’, etc.)… Entities are not to be multiplied beyond necessity… It is not as though there were two sorts of things in the world, individuals and collections… There are, rather, two different ways of referring to the same ‘things’. (1984, 442)

Boolos thus maintains that “neither the use of plurals nor the employment of second order logic commits us to the existence of extra items beyond those to which we are already committed.”

Semantically, the plural is not the singular writ large, and rather than taking the reductive route called for by the singularist canon of standard logic, the predicate calculus can itself be expanded to deal with such essentially plural sentences, qua plural.[30] What is called for here is nothing more than a further semantical category of variables (as opposed, that is, to values). By way of the deployment of plural variables, each one of which can takes any number of objects (or in other words, some objects) as its values, such a logic can be expanded to provide a plausible and intuitive semantics for the irreducibly plural sentences. We are then in a position to admit irreducibly collective expressions without any correspondingly collective objects; semantically distinctive types of symbolism are deployed which are lacking in distinctive ontological commitment.[31]We have, in short, an expanded semantics without a corresponding expansion of ontology. As McKay puts it,

plural and singular ultimately rely on the same ontology… If we take the singular as basic, adding plurals will add no new things to the ontology… the semantics of plural language does not automatically require sets or mereological sums. (2008, 302)[32]

The view involves no denial of the utility of the concept of a set or class; it insists only that the proper introduction of set-theoretical concepts calls for resources and motivation which go beyond the semantics of plural reference.

In conclusion, the fundamental spirit of the UAT in no sense demands the endorsement of an unrestricted conception of the PCO, or of singularism. Rather, it involves affirming simply that our talk is indeed talk exclusively of objects—that we may speak of objects in the plural as well as in the singular, and that plural talk of objects is talk of the very same category of items as is talk of objects in the singular. Most properly and plausibly—less ‘liberally’—conceived, the UAT involves no requirement that philosophically respectable reference be always somehow singular. Formally, there is need for no such single object as the object of a plural reference, no such unit as ‘the many’. On the approach of Boolos and those who follow him in rejecting ‘singularism’, a restricted conception of the PCO is simply a more plausible conception. Recognition of plural sentences as an additional and distinct semantic category requires no extra ontic category. From this standpoint, the unrestricted, singularist approach—in effect, a species of monism—involves ontologising what is in fact a merely semantic contrast. In direct opposition to singularism, then, Boolosian-style pluralism may then be said to be the view that the abstract general concept of an object or a unit corresponds only to reference which is semantically singular, and cannot also absorb or cover plural reference, which is straightforardly non-singular. On this view, while there is a significant semantical distinction here, the content of the maxim that ‘Whatever is, is one’ is simply not contradicted by that of the maxim that ‘Whatever are, are many’. Ontologically, these two maxims are precisely on a par, and there is no good reason to privilege the singular.

3.2 The Russellian struggle with singularism

This formal break from singuralism, while by no means universally accepted, is clearly anticipated or foreshadowed in the early work of Russell. Among other things, The Principles of Mathematics contains a hesitant defense of pluralism, against the unrestricted singularist / monistic thesis—a defense which, though incompletely developed, seems of sufficient importance to briefly here rehearse. Russell focusses on what are prima facie essentially plural sentences such as

(a) Brown and Jones are two of Miss Smith's suitors.

He notes that “it is Brown and Jones who are two, and this is not true of either separately.” Now on this basis, it seems not obviously implausible to conclude that ‘two’ is true of both collectively—that ‘Brown and Jones’, in short, denotes a unified collective subject for the collective predication (or in other words, a set or class). And yet, Russell insists that

it is Brown and Jones who are two… nevertheless it is not the whole composed of Brown and Jones which is two, for this is only one (57).

Russell's point would seem to be that, supposing Brown and Jones to constitute a set, the fact remains that it is the members of the set who are two—the predication of ‘are two’ attaches to the members, rather than to any set itself. And he insists, furthermore, that a class

in one sense at least, is distinct from the whole composed of its terms, for the latter is only and essentially one, while the former, where it has many terms, is… the very kind of object of which many is to be asserted… (69).

It is here that Russell introduces his notorious if suggestive terminology of ‘the class as many’, insisting that there must be “an ultimate distinction between a class as many and a class as one… the many are only many, and are not also one”. Or as he also writes, in

such a proposition as ‘A and B are two’, there is no logical subject: the assertion is not about A, nor about B, nor about the whole composed of both, but strictly and only about A and B (77).

Again, and with something of an air of paradox, he insists that a “plurality of terms is not the logical subject when a number is asserted of it; such propositions have not one subject, but many subjects (69, fn.).” Conceiving the notion of ‘the many’ as some one to be just plain incoherent, Russell heroically attempts to give theoretical articulation to some formal notion of the absolute diversity of the many. He attempts to promote the idea—akin, in fact, to the clearer and more developed views of Boolos and McKay—that there is simply no such object as ‘the many’—no such thing as the logical subject of a semantically plural sentence, the possibly collective nature of the predication notwithstanding. There can, Russell is obviously inclined to think, be no single subject for a collective (and in this case, a specifically numerical) predication; “there is not a single term at all which is the collection of the many terms…” (514). And in this sober judgment, he is supported among others by Peter Geach, for whom the idea of a class as many “is radically incoherent” (1972: 225). The pluralistic version of the UAT is then, because restricted, both semantically richer, and by the very same token ontologically more economical, than its monistic / singularist version. Nevertheless, it must be said, the singularist version dies hard. Furthermore, the work of Russell, Boolos and McKay certainly suggests that pluralism is also the more plausible account.

But, as an account of the basic logico-semantic categories of reference, just how plausible, at the end of the day, is this account? There are some well-known comments in the work of Frege, which have a bearing on this question concerning the predicative formulation of the UAT. And ironically, this very simple step, of the recognition and acknowledgement of semantically plural sentences, leads in a direction which threatens to undermine the UAT in its most plausible, because restricted, version. It does so, by opening up the semantic space of non-singularity, as a space which is not obviously occupied by plural sentences alone.

3.3 Frege, countability, and ‘mass nouns’ or non-count nouns

As a thesis concerning the meaning of general terms, the UAT may be expressed as the requirement that all substantival predicate-expressions (concepts, kinds) satisfy the object-concept, whether in its singular or plural forms—that, in effect, they are always constrained by an integral numerical constituent. And it is perfectly clear that, for example, the singular substantives ‘rabbit’, ‘tree’ and ‘planet’ do satisfy the object-concept; for insofar as such (a singular occurrence of) a general term as ‘rabbit’, ‘tree’ or ‘planet’ is true of anything, it is true, in virtue of its meaning, of just one item at a time.

Now the qualification ‘substantival predicate-expressions’ above is suggested by an issue famously remarked by Frege, who writes that

Only a concept which isolates what falls under it in a definite manner, and which does not permit any arbitrary division into parts, can be a unit relative to a finite number… Not all concepts posses this quality. We can, for example, divide up something falling under the concept ‘red’ into parts in a variety of ways, without the parts thereby ceasing to fall under the same concept ‘red’. (1984, 66)

In somewhat more recent (Quinean) terms, Frege's point could be put by saying that while terms like ‘rabbit’ and ‘planet’ are terms of ‘divided reference’, or come with built-in principles for counting that to which they are applied, adjectival terms like ‘red’ do not. To say that something or other (e.g. blood) is red, does not directly involve its being countable as one, in the way that to say that something is a planet, or (equally) is round, plainly does. Further argument would clearly be required, to establish that concepts such as ‘red’ must, indirectly, satisfy the object-concept, though what that argument would be is hardly obvious.

This is by no means, however, the end of the matter, precisely because it does not address the issue of such substantival terms as ‘blood’ and ‘gold’ themselves. It is no exaggeration to say that the entire status of the PCO and the UAT can seem to be called into question by the (closely related) so-called “problem of mass terms”, as Davidson (1967) puts it. Thus mass nouns (or better, non-count nouns—a more inclusive and also more precisely defined category), no more appear to satisfy a singularist version of the UAT than do plural nouns. Indeed many non-count nouns just are, in a certain limited sense, semantically plural—‘clothing’ is roughly equivalent to ‘clothes’, ‘traffic’ to ‘moving vehicles’, ‘furniture’ to ‘pieces of furniture’; and so on.

However, there are many such nouns which are not thus semantically plural, and corresponding quantified sentences which therefore cannot in any circumstances be singularised—e.g. ‘All water contains impurities’ as against ‘All apples contain pesticides’ or ‘All cattle have tails’. These then are sentences for which the UAT may, even in its most liberal form, be difficult to sustain. At any rate, if one accepts some version of semantic pluralism akin to the positions of Boolos and McKay, whereby plural references are sometimes irreducibly plural, then there is no obvious reason to stop at just this point – no obvious reason, that is, to limit non-singularity to plural forms exclusively; and the semantics of non-count reference may well emerge as neither singular nor plural, or as designating neither one nor many things.[33]

3.4 ‘Stuff and things’: the ontic issue over objects

In ontic terms, the issue may be dramatized by posing the question of just what it is for a material—a kind of stuff or substance, some such stuff as snow or beer, iron, gold, or water—to exist. The standard, traditional answer is, of course, that the existence of these various kinds of stuff consists precisely in that of particular instances—in the case of the metallic element gold, of this gold here and that gold there; in the case of the compound water, of the water in my glass and the water in yours; and likewise, for any other kind of stuff.[34] Quite generally, so this answer goes, the existence of metals, liquids, elements, compounds and the like, consists in that of discrete objects, entities or units of a special type, not uncommonly characterized as ‘quantities’ or ‘parcels’ of stuff or matter.[35]

Nonetheless, as McKay for one has noted, there would seem to be an obvious semantic problem with this view; related sceptical discussion may also be found in the recent work of Elder (2008, section 2). Words for stuff or ‘mass nouns’ clearly belong to the semantic category of non-count nouns—as contrasted with the category of words for things, or count nouns, words like ‘planet’, ‘dog’ and ‘tree’. Count nouns are themselves semantically either singular or plural; as semantical sub-categories, singularity and plurality virtually exhaust the category of count nouns. It appears then to follow that non-count nouns can be neither singular nor plural—a point which would seem indeed to be as fundamental as any, and from which two subsidiary points follow directly.

It follows in the first place that non-count nouns share with plural nouns the distinction of being semantically non-singular. And, since it is a feature of the meaning of ‘semantically singular’ that semantically singular nouns denote or correspond to single units, semantically non-singular nouns, whether plural or non-count, must somehow not denote or correspond to single units. As McKay succinctly observes, while non-count nouns are indeed on a par with plural nouns in respect of their non-singularity,

plural discourse has natural semantic units that are the same as those of singular discourse, but stuff discourse has no natural semantic units, and reference and predication seem to proceed on a different model than that of an individual and a property. (McKay 2008, 316-7)

The implication is that non-count nouns cannot denote or correspond to individual ‘quantities’ or ‘parcels’ of stuff; since there is supposedly no more to the concept of such an object than the idea of what such a noun denotes—on the crucial proviso that the mode of designation is singular, or that what is denoted is some kind of unit. The upshot, as he concludes, is that in the case of words like ‘water’,

we should not expect a successful reduction to singular reference and singular predication, something that the application of traditional first-order logic would require… when we say that water surrounds our island… our discourse is not singular discourse (about an individual) and is not plural discourse (about some individuals); we have no single individual or any identified individuals that we refer to when we use ‘water’… (2008, 310-11)

And at this point, the ontic question seems to be a pressing one. If we do not refer to any “single individual or any identified individuals” when we use ‘water’, to what, then, do we refer? Just this is the force of McKay's question when he asks ‘what the subject of fundamental non-count noun predication is’—the question

of what satisfies ‘x is water’, especially if we understand quantifier phrases on anything like a standard model… We must either understand what values x can take, or provide some other analysis of quantifier phrases… (emphasis mine). (2008, 305)

His answer is that we must

be talking about some stuff, not a thing or some things, and in that way, mass reference and predication are ontologically more significant than plural reference and predication. We seem to be in new territory ontologically, not just grammatically. (2008, 311)

Given that ‘the many’ and ‘the much’ are equally non-singular, then whereas ‘the many’ are merely many ones, ‘the much’, qua neither one nor many, can be nothing other than – the much. The idea so clearly advanced by Tugendhat, that there is just one exhaustive and maximally general ontic category, that of objects, individuals or things—a category which excludes absolutely nothing which may be spoken of, and is in that sense empty—is directly challenged by the thought that there are two, mutually exclusive top-level ontic categories or concepts. In much the way that ‘an individual or object of some kind’ naturally serves as an indefinite generic expression for the ontic category of any possible kind of individual or object, so in McKay's view, ‘some stuff of some kind’ is appropriate to serve as an indefinite expression for this ‘novel’ ontic category of (any kind of) stuff.

But now to take this route in cases unlike that of ‘clothing’, where ‘the much’ is not a stand-in for ‘the many’—to acknowledge ‘the much’ as an ontic category, even though it is agreed that we are not here dealing with a ‘unit’—might appear to risk embracing paradox. As McKay quite frankly acknowledges,

if we are not to reduce mass talk to thing talk by introducing a realm of entities, then it seems that we must somehow provide for talk about non-entities. (2008, 316)

Yet is there not a prima facie logical absurdity in the notion of a range of non-units, ‘each’ of which is just some stuff? If there is something, of which there can be several distinct occurrences, then in the minimalist sense of ‘entities’ (as meaning items each of which is countable as one), these ‘somethings’ can hardly fail to count as distinct entities. To say that there can be no ranges of non-entities seems like an outright truism. The route to resolution of this problem is far from being obvious. Assume, however, a successful resolution of such difficulties, along with the corresponding availability of a suitable algorithm. Still, the necessary departures from the sheer elegance of standard forms of predicate calculus, with all the significant associated complexities, might seem to count against opting for any such departure in the first place, and instead perhaps adopting some species of reductionism. Evidently, such a strategy might recommend itself forcefully on grounds of sheer convenience; but an option for convenience is one thing, and objective resolution of the formal difficulties quite another.[36]

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Aristotle | Aristotle, General Topics: categories | continuity and infinitesimals | mereology | nominalism: in metaphysics | plural quantification | properties | substance | temporal parts | tropes | types and tokens

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