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August Wilhelm von Schlegel
A.W. Schlegel (Sept. 8, 1767, Hanover – May 12, 1845, Bonn) was a German essayist, translator and poet. Although the philosophical dimension and profundity of his writings remain underrated, he is considered to be one of the founders of the German Romantic Movement, as well as one of the most prominent disseminators of its philosophy, not only in Germany but also abroad and, most notably, in Britain.
Schlegel had an outstanding knowledge of art, history, literature, architecture, anthropology and foreign languages, which made him a decisive figure in the early development of comparative literature and modern linguistics, and with the creation of the journal Indische Bibliothek, he inaugurated the domain of Sanskrit studies in Germany. He also wrote poetry and drama; but he is mostly known for his critical writings and his brilliant translations of William Shakespeare.
- 1. Life and work
- 2. A.W. Schlegel's influence in German Romanticism
- 3. Philosophy of art
- 4. Philosophy of language
- 5. Translation theory
- 6. The role of the critic and Schlegel's Romantic nationalism
- 7. A W. Schlegel: a thinker of difference
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- Related Entries
A.W. Schlegel was son of the Lutheran pastor and hymn writer Johann Adolf Schlegel. In 1787 he began his studies at the University of Göttingen, starting in theology and later changing to classical philology and aesthetics. He worked as a private teacher in Amsterdam and returned to Jena in 1796 to work as a literary critic, where he joined important artists and philosophers such as Novalis, Ludwig Tieck and F.W.J. Schelling. In the same year, he married Caroline Michaelis, who encouraged him and also participated in his project to translate Shakespeare's plays.
In 1798, tired of the publishing difficulties they endured within the existing literary journals, A.W. Schlegel and his brother Friedrich Schlegel founded the famous periodical Athenaeum. They were both the editors and the main writers of this journal, which would offer an alternative to mainstream classicist approaches in literary criticism and which was soon to become one of the German Romantic Movement's principal voices. The Athenaeum was devoted mainly to literary criticism with a philological and historical perspective, and a large section of it featured the review of contemporary literature. It contained critical essays, fragments, letters, announcements and dialogues and appeared twice a year between 1798 and 1800.
In that same year, 1798, A.W. Schlegel was named extraordinary professor at Jena University, where he continued his translation of the works of Shakespeare (1797–1810). Schlegel was remarkably talented as a translator; he translated over 16 Shakespearean plays, five plays from the Spanish dramaturge Calderón de la Barca, and other selected pieces from Dante, Petrarch, Giovanni Boccaccio, Miguel de Cervantes, Torquato Tasso, and Luís de Camões which were published in 1804 as Blumensträusse italiänischer, spanischer, und portugiesischer Poesie, (Bouquets of Italian, Spanish, and Portuguese Poetry).
In 1801 Schlegel went to Berlin, where he lectured on literature and art. Both his Jena (1798–1799) and his Berlin lectures (1801–1804) were highly didactic while at the same time interspersed with important philosophical insights. So, as well as providing a comprehensive vision of the history of European literature, poetry and mythology, Schlegel presented a new critical and philosophical approach to art and its history. Some of these lectures were published in literary journals, until 1884 when they were posthumously collected as Vorlesungen über philosophische Kunstlehere (Lectures on Philosophical Art Education) and Vorlesungen über schöne Literatur und Kunst (Lectures on Fine Art and Literature) respectively. Four years later, Schlegel delivered in Vienna another series of lectures elaborating upon some of the ideas he had already developed in his previous work. A literal transcription of these was published between 1809 and 1811 as Vorlesungen über dramatische Kunst und Literatur (A Course of Lectures on Dramatic Art and Literature). A more extended version of his Course of Lectures… was published in an 1816 edition: by that time, they had already been translated into English, French, Dutch and Italian and had obtained a wide circulation. This success facilitated the dissemination of the fundamental ideas underlying the Romantic Movement throughout Europe, and helped to solidify Schlegel's influence and reputation as a critic.
After his divorce from Caroline Michaelis, who left him for his friend the philosopher F.W.J. Schelling, he embarked upon a relationship with Mme. de Stäel; he became tutor of her children and was her constant companion on her travels in Germany, Italy, France and Sweden until her death in 1817. In August 1818 he married Sophie Paulus in Heidelberg, but they only remained together for a few weeks. Sophie never accompanied him to Bonn.
In 1818 A.W. Schlegel became professor of literature and art history in Bonn, where he published the scholarly journal Indische Bibliothek (1820–1830) and set up a Sanskrit printing press with which he provided the first printed editions of the Bhagavadgītā (1823) and Rāmāyana (1829) in continental Europe. He died in 1845.
An anthology of some of A.W. Schlegel's critical essays, selected by the author himself, was published in Berlin in 1828. Despite his opposition to the publication of the rest of his essays, A.W. Schlegel's collected works were edited by E. Böcking and published in 16 volumes between 1846 and 1848. His complete lectures were edited by E. Behler in 1989, and his letters were edited by J. Körner and published in 1930.
Schlegel's lectures show his commitment as a professor, combining high intellectual standards with an appealing and interesting approach. His aphorisms are sagacious in both form and content, but his style seems to lose its boldness and wittiness after the Athenaeum period, gaining perhaps in depth and erudition. Critics of Schlegel's literary writings (Gedichte, 1800; Ion, 1803; Poetische Werke, 1811) tend to stress their formal perfection, but also justify his presumable lack of success as a poet. Other scholars, however, speak of the considerable achievement of his play Ion and the German poet Heinrich Heine refers to him as “the poetic genius” (Heine, 56). Overall A.W. Schlegel's writings are prolific in quantity and in a certain sense remain rather unfocused and repetitive. This could be due to the fact that many of the essays Schlegel had decided not to publish were printed after his death. As Schlegel himself had often regretted, by taking too many different topics into consideration, his work lost the intensity of its philosophical and critical insights.
Critics have also pointed out that, as a literary critic, A.W. Schlegel is more empirical and less philosophical than his brother Friedrich Schlegel (Welleck, 72–73). Contemporary scholars have even questioned his being the genuine creator of the ideas laid out in his writings and lectures. But however theoretically convincing the distinction between having created the ideas as opposed to merely having disseminated them may seem, this is in actual fact quite disputable. It was A.W. Schlegel's lectures, with their particular view of world literature as an organic whole, that were to influence many authors; amongst the most prominent of whom was S. T. Coleridge as well as the philosopher F.W.J. Schelling.
Throughout his lectures and essays, A.W. Schlegel praised the plays of Shakespeare and Calderón to the detriment of French Neoclassical theatre. Although this was part of a systematic and organic comprehension of art and art history, his harsh attack on classical rules considered sacred by French critics predisposed the latter to react hostilely (especially with the publication of the polemical Comparaison entre la Phèdre de Racine et celle d'Euripide, in 1807), whilst it favored the approval of English reviewers. In fact, the rediscovery of Shakespeare's greatness in the 19th century was due, not only to Schlegel's translations, but most importantly to his special approach to Shakespearean theatre. Instead of comparing Shakespeare to ancient Tragedy, as if it were a bad copy, Schlegel claimed it should be analyzed on the grounds of constituting a necessary historical difference. This difference – the difference between the ancients and the modern – was the cornerstone of Schlegel's critique and set the basis for his theoretical use of the concept Romantic, which became the key-concept in his comprehension and reevaluation of modernity.
In the preface to his critical essays (Kritische Schriften, Berlin, 1828) Schlegel explains how many of the ‘revolutionary’ ideas he had formerly defended in his essays and lectures had been internalized and normalized by those very critics who had once rejected them with contempt. A.W. Schlegel's response to this was modest: he said, he had just been able to foresee the coming shift of taste and evaluative parameters in the understanding and the interpretation of works of art (KS, I, vi).
It is widely accepted that the Romantic Movement in Germany emerged, on the one hand, as a reaction against the aesthetical ideals defended in Classicism and Neoclassicism, and on the other, as a deviation from the rational principles of the Enlightenment with the consequent regression to the irrational spirit of the Middle Ages. However, some scholars maintain that the Romantic Movement should be seen as a radicalization, and not a rejection, of Weimar Classicism (Behler, 1992, 43). Certainly, in some of his essays, A.W. Schlegel offered a harsh critique of Friedrich Schiller, who had been regarded, together with Goethe, as the founding father of Weimar Classicism; but this rivalry seemed to involve more than just strictly philosophical issues.
It would be impossible to ascribe the original conception of the Romantic aesthetical and philosophical precepts to one author alone. Despite the emphasis the Romantics laid on the individual artist and his/her genius and originality, the conceptualization of the Romantic Movement itself is essentially a collective work. This is most evident in what has been considered to be the organ of the Romantic Movement, the Athenaeum: there were two editors, several writers and a diversity of opinions, but one unifying principle (A, I, vi). And yet, most commentators credit A.W. Schlegel for having given the word ‘romantic’ a systematic significance from the very beginning (Furst, 84). In contrast with other literary critics who used the term in contradictory and erratic ways, Schlegel believed it was important to transmit a clear-cut understanding of the term and “to elevate it again to its true signification” (LDA, 441). Indeed his purpose was to foster a solid movement that should become the symbol of modernity and Germany.
Schlegel's philosophical analysis of art and the artist were inspired by his reading of Kant, Fichte, Goethe, Schiller and Schelling among others, but he developed his own poetology. In the presentation of his theoretical position, however, A.W. Schlegel was less speculative than other German philosophers. But as Benjamin notes, this is the result of a conscious decision to make room for a more critical approach, which renders Schlegel's position surprisingly modern (Benjamin, 118). Thus, in a mixture of pride and censure, Schlegel frequently notes how German authors are more speculative than practical (LDA, 16 and 440). Indeed, his aesthetical essays can be seen as a comment on and criticism of those more speculative Germanic approaches in which the particular work of art and the artist seem to be relegated to a secondary level.
F.W.J. Schelling (the most Romantic of the German idealist philosophers) was very much influenced by Schlegel's Jena lectures, and used them as a basis for the elaboration of his Lectures on the Philosophy of Art (1802–1804). Although subject of scholarly debate (Esterhammer, 153), Schlegel's profound influence on English Romanticism through Coleridge is widely accepted. In the end, however, Schlegel was quite pessimistic about the actual influence he had had in his time, and lamented that his efforts had fallen so far short of his desire to inspire an artistic movement and define an epoch.
Art is not a mere imitation or representation of nature; art is the product of a creative force. This principle, embodying a pivotal idea of the German Romantic aesthetics is also the core of one of A.W. Schlegel's Berlin lectures published in the Viennese journal, Prometheus (1808). Re-collected in his Kritische Schriften (1828) as “Über das Verhältniss der schönen Kunst zur Natur; Über Täuschung und Wahrscheinlichkeit; Über Manier und Stil” (On the Relationship of Art to Nature; On Illusion and Probability; On Style and Manner), the importance of this essay lies not only in this thesis (an idea that we also find in other texts of that period, such as Schelling's 1807 essay Über das Verhältniß der bildenden Künste zu der Natur (On the Relationship of Visual Arts to Nature), but also in the way Schlegel developed his argument.
In this text, Schlegel argues in favor of a modern, i.e. Romantic art theory, in opposition to the representationalist and mimetic doctrines that go back to Aristotle's Poetics and conceive the work of the artist as that of a craftsman copying the beauty of nature (Abrams, 48). But his critique of the classicist formula ‘art imitates nature’ was accompanied by a careful analysis of the different meanings the term ‘nature’ had come to assume within aesthetic discourses. This philological and historical approach is distinctive of Schlegel's writings and lends intelligibility and clarity to the texts without eroding their philosophical sharpness.
Undoubtedly, the Romantic notion of art goes hand in hand with a reevaluation of the concept of nature. Schlegel argues that, from a philosophical point of view, everything participates in an ongoing process of creation, whereas, from an empirical point of view, natural things are conceived as if they were dead, fixed and independent from the whole. This means that, in its purest and philosophical sense, nature is not perceptible in the same way the worldly objects are. However, unlike Schelling with his intellectual intuition or intellektuelle Anschauung, Schlegel did not develop an elaborate theory to give account of this different form of perception; he succinctly argued that the comprehension of nature's true essence is more like a presentiment (ahnen) or an aesthetic contemplation, than like scientific knowledge. In order to realize this Romantic notion of nature, one needs to comprehend or rather feel oneself as an organic whole. One needs to achieve self-awareness and to recognize oneself as forming part of a larger unity. Indeed, this resort to a non-theoretical or non-discursive plane as an essential constituent of human comprehension was also important in Schlegel's philosophy of language, which he already expounded in his Letters on Poetry, Meter and Language (Briefe über Poesie, Sylbemaß und Sprache) in 1795.
In any case, the philosophical or Romantic notion of nature as an unfathomable unity and creative force which cannot be seen nor touched, and which is obviously a direct response to some of the many questions raised by Kant's three Critiques, is not to be understood as a mere intellection, an empty chimera: Nature is the productive force pulsing in all living beings. For Schlegel, Nature is organic in the sense that it is an organized and organizing principle, granting intelligence to the totality of existing beings. It is a creative force that produces independent living things, the life of which does not need any external mechanism to keep its autonomy, for it only depends on its inner, natural power to live. In this point Schlegel mentions the astrological doctrines that claim that even the tiniest atom is a mirror of the universe. The idea of Nature mirroring itself in each and every living organism is characteristic both of German Idealism and German Romanticism. The difference between human beings and other animals, plants or mineral structures is that, (1) human beings are able to understand the fact that they, as an organism, mirror Nature's organic structure; and furthermore, (2) they are capable of reproducing nature's creativity through art, as well as reflecting upon this fact. This reasoning induced Schlegel to define human genius and his/her poetical creativity as a whole (i.e. art and language) as the capability of producing a world within a world (Müller-Vollmer, 317); a definition which is most tangible in dramatic literature.
Schlegel's criticism of the physicalists' conception of nature is surely the result of a very specific aesthetic perspective. But this particular viewpoint enabled him to reinterpret the old formula ‘art imitates nature’, in such a way as to grasp not only the true essence of art, but also its most fundamental principle. Indeed, once we conceive of nature as an organic whole, constantly becoming and transforming itself, then Schlegel's paradoxical determination “art should imitate nature” (SW III, 306) becomes quite coherent. The deficiency of the formula does not lie in the idea itself, but in the meaning we give to it. In a very precise sense, art imitates nature, because in his/her creativity, the genuine artist (i.e. the Romantic artist) also seeks to produce an organic whole and thereby embody an eternal truth. For Schlegel, it is only through art and through everything that art signifies, that man is capable of attaining that seemingly lost unity.
However, Schlegel was also very aware of the fact that, if art was the embodiment of an eternal truth, of absolute beauty, this indirectly meant that it was not Beauty itself. This is also why he emphasized that each work of art is the expression of a certain longing, a craving for the recreation of that very unity experienced through the “spiritual feeling (geistige Anschauung) of Nature” (SW III, 307). Indeed, the idea of longing or Sehnsucht is essential in Schlegel's account of Romanticism and must be understood in relation to the difference between ancient and modern art, which also was the structuring principle and, in a sense, constituted the real object of Schlegel's analysis in his Lectures on Dramatic Art. This opposition may be summarized as follows: whereas ancient poetry is plastic, sensual, harmonious and, overall, a poetry of enjoyment of the present; modern poetry is a poetry of desire and longing (Sehnsucht), hovering between the idealizations of a remote past and an unknown future (LDA, 9). According to Schlegel, these differences encompass every sphere of reality and every form of art, and are on the whole the result of a historical event, namely the establishment of Christianity.
Thus, as F.W.J. Schelling had done in his Lectures on the Philosophy of Art of 1803, Schlegel presents the passage from paganism to Christianity as the historical realization of an insurmountable division between the subject and the object, between consciousness and nature. Christianity, he argues, awakened the consciousness of the internal rupture or fundamental discord between the finite and the infinite which, in Schlegel's analysis, is constitutive of modernity. In other words, for Schlegel, modernity arises from the painful realization of an insurmountable fissure, and the subsequent insight that real happiness can never be attained, i.e. “that no external object can ever entirely fill our souls; and that every mortal enjoyment is but a fleeting and momentary deception” (LDA, 9). As a result, in Schlegel's view, to understand modern and especially Romantic literature means to understand art as the eternal longing for the reconciliation of this fissure between the subject and the universe, the finite and the infinite or the divine. Both the realization of the insurmountable fissure as well as the longing for its reconciliation are part of a particular way of experiencing nature, the self and the infinite.
Schlegel uses the term ‘Romantic’ to denote the very specific historical and stylistic discrepancy between German and modern art on the one hand, and ancient and classicist art on the other. Schlegel considered that German culture, which he defined as having a natural inclination to the Romantic (LDA, 439), was indebted to all the cultures which preceded it. But he specifically laid the roots of the so-called ‘Romantic spirit’ in chivalry, i.e. in the union of the heroism of the northern conquerors with the humanistic principles of Christianity. Schlegel associated chivalry and the Middle Ages in general with a certain form of purity that manifests itself (1) in a more spiritual understanding of love and female worth, to the extent that one could talk of a fusion between the metaphysical longing for the infinite (or God) and the erotic longing for a woman; and (2) in a ‘heroic’ morality, which, in a certain sense, evokes the severity of Kantian ethics. It is a morality “that never calculated consequences, but consecrated unconditionally certain principles of action” (LDA, 8). On the other hand, though, Schlegel's genealogy of the ‘Romantic’ would be incomprehensible without paying attention to his openness to and interest in other cultures and languages. Thus, the ‘Romantic spirit’ is also found in the works of Shakespeare, and sought in the spirit of romance cultures and languages, which, for Schlegel, are the result of a fusion between Latin and Teutonic, in a similar way as German Romanticism “is the fruit of the union of the peculiarities of the northern with the fragments of antiquity” (LDA, 5).
In the same way as Nature, or to be precise, the true experience of Nature cannot be reduced to its mere physical or external manifestation, a work of art and its contemplation of it are, also, more than just the simple perception or the analysis of its appearance. Therefore, in order to endure the shifting modes of time, the work of art needs to have something more profound than just a beautiful form, as a flower needs its roots and cannot survive long without them. Conversely, for Schlegel, as for Schelling or Novalis, the attempt to understand the work of art as the result of the conscious decisions of the artist alone would also be misleading, because there is always an unconscious element in every artistic creation. The work of art is a result of both conscious and unconscious forces. In other words, the artist's intention is irrelevant for the artistic product, and hence, must remain irrelevant in the evaluation of his work. In his Lectures on Dramatic Art, Schlegel defines a genius as being capable of the “almost unconscious choice of the highest degree of excellence” (LDA, 5), and in an Athenaeum fragment he claimed that “it is a distinguishable mark of poetical genius to know a great deal more than he knows he knows” (SW VIII, 15). This does not mean that any sign of an ‘unconscious’ choice in the production of art is a sign of genius; what is characteristic about the great artist is that his/her ‘unconscious’ choices seem attributable to a higher, divine and conscious force. The extent to which the artist is capable of transcending his/her more or less involuntary particularities, i.e. the extent to which his/her unconscious choices seem to derive from a higher instance (consciously choosing the highest degree of excellence) determines the difference between style and mannerism. When the work of art appears as if all its elements had been consciously chosen by a power above the artist, it has style; when the artist has not transcended his/her individuality, then s/he is categorized as a mannerist artist (SW III, 309–312).
The essence of a work of art, the principle that all real works of art have in common and which makes them be more than a mere accumulation of countable elements, is what Schlegel called the poetical. Consequently, the ability to grasp whatever is truly poetical in a specific work of art set the basis for his methodological procedure in his art criticism. For Schlegel, a criterion for evaluating a work of art is its capacity to extend itself “beyond the limits of reality into the region of a creative fancy” (LDA, 107–108). On the other hand, the poetical aspect of a work of art depends on its capacity to mirror and to present (darstellen) eternally true ideas (LDA, 18). But, as in many aesthetic texts from this period, it is not always obvious which ‘ideas’ the work of art must seek to mirror. It seems these ‘ideas’ should be understood in a Platonic sense, as they generally refer to great values or great ideals such as beauty, greatness and goodness.
However, and partly due to his reluctance to consider the artist's intentionality as being decisive in the comprehension of the work of art (which in some way prefigures the late Romantic ideal of l'art pour l'art), Schlegel did not underline a necessary moral purpose in aesthetic objects, as Schiller had done. And yet, for Schlegel, this did not imply that the contemplation and understanding of art should lose its moral aura. Quite to the contrary, for Schlegel, art has the power to elevate us above our ordinary encounters with the world, above the sorrows and daily troubles of life. This is why he argued that the purpose of art could not be a mere imitation or reduplication of the world as it is, because in this case, apart from the fact that music, dance, architecture and so many other art forms become totally inexplicable, the best works of art would be the ones which deceive the most, in the sense that the viewer would find himself prevented from contemplating the work of art as a work of art. Clearly, if the purpose of art were to replicate nature (understood as a collection of things) the aesthetic objects would have no particular interest other than ornamentation. But, for Schlegel, both the contemplation as well as the production of art should be seen as the result of a creative activity.
In accordance with these theoretical assumptions, Schlegel was very negative about the naturalistic neoclassicist tendencies in art. Schlegel praised the wholeness and the poetical unity as well as the originality in a work of art. For Schlegel, the magic of a work of art is that it brings us into a different world, with all its own internal coherence, and this is why it needs to become organic and complete unto itself. Therefore, its purpose should not be to reflect the real world with naturalism, but rather to create its own world, which could never be a question of applying a set of rules and principles to a particular matter (paintings, words, marble), such as classicist principles seemed to do. The search for naturalism and plausibility, in an attempt at producing the most true and real representation of reality, makes art lose its greatness, beauty and wonder.
Consequently, in his Lectures on Dramatic Art, Schlegel praised the use of masks in theatrical representations as well as those performers who managed to create an emotional distance between themselves, the audience and the role they were playing. Once more, art is not about deceiving or hiding, but about the production or the creation of a world within a world. This also explains Schlegel's admiration of Old Comedy, because in this case the spectator is constantly forced to remain aware of the experience in which s/he is partaking, namely the experience of the difference between reality and illusion. A similar reconsideration of Comedy was also the basis for other contemporary authors in Schlegel's circle, such as Ludwig Tieck with his version of the 17th century fairy tale Der gestiefelte Kater (Puss in Boots). Schlegel stresses that, in contrast to tragedy, the author of which needs to remain invisible lest his/her fictional world should disintegrate; in comedy, the gap between the different levels of reality and illusion, or rather, the very disintegration of the unity of the story becomes the center of the play. As Schlegel puts it, in Old Comedy: “the whole production was one entire jest within itself” (LDA, 108). In Aristophanes' plays, the chorus, which regularly interrupts the course of the play to address the audience with reference to the story, the author and the people from the audience alike (parabasis), virtually destroys all the elements and characteristics of tragedy: its seriousness as well as its harmonious unity is systematically parodied. Not only the scenes, not only the poetry, but also the tragic composition, the music, acting and dancing, were object of a hilarious distortion. However, for Schlegel, this did not make comedy dependent on tragedy; on the contrary, he affirms it to be “a species of poetry as independent and original as tragedy itself” (LDA, 108). In fact, A.W. Schlegel's characterization of the distinction between the character of Old Comedy and Greek tragedy would become a central reference in literary criticism.
Among all the different artistic manifestations, Schlegel considered dramatic poetry to be “the most entertaining of all diversions” (LDA, 12). The fundamental reason for dramatic poetry's being so engaging, as Schlegel points out, lies in the mimicry that is always involved in theatrical representations. Schlegel maintained that all works of art, and in particular, all theatrical representations, are the expression of the idiosyncrasies of the country where they are produced. And although he succinctly suggested that the existence of a theatrical tradition may be seen as a symbol of a special intellectual and political environment, he also indicated that the enjoyment of mimicry per se is somehow constitutive of human beings (Flaherty, 195). For Schlegel, children's delight in imitating their relatives is also explanatory of man's basic psychological predisposition to mimicry (LDA, 18); a disposition without which man would not be able to enter the linguistic, let alone the poetical and creative, phase of his development (SW VII, 117). Dramatic poetry, he argued, is the representation of an ‘important’ action, namely an action that has been purged of all the petty and unnecessary details of real life; it is the performance of a morally and intellectually exemplary action through dialogue. Indeed, to place dramatic poetry in the highest rank amongst the arts does not make Schlegel unique. What does render him quite distinctive, however, is the argument he gives, namely that it produces the maximum enjoyment. This certainly contrasts with Schiller's moralizing views. Schlegel was very aware of the necessity for a play to be interesting and exciting for the audience: the greatness of a play has to do with the way in which it creates a certain tension or conflict that involves the audience. But, what makes dramatic poetry different from a mere pantomime, what really elevates it above other human activities is, once again, its poetical element, i.e. its capacity to mirror an idea or eternal truth. Ultimately, this is also what determines the difference between tragedy and comedy. The tragic tone is given through a sincere melancholy, a longing for and accepting of a “destiny soaring above this earthly life”, whereas the main characteristic of comedy is its “forgetfulness of all discouraging considerations” (LDA, 24). For Schlegel, the aim of tragedy is not “to purify the passions by pity and terror” (LDA, 43), as Aristotle had said, but to elevate us “to the most dignified view of humanity” (LDA, 112). In fact, Schlegel's analysis of Greek tragedy and his sharp rejection of Aristotle's theory of tragedy were extremely influential in other authors such as Schelling and Nietzsche.
In his Lectures on Dramatic Art Schlegel was very critical towards the present state of German theatre (LDA, 438). However, apart from Shakespeare, Calderón, with their ironic way of mixing the tragic with the comic (LDA, 175), and the ancient Greeks, Schlegel also praised Lessing, Schiller and Goethe for having “redeemed the German theatre from its long continued mediocrity” (LDA, 424).
In his influential Letters on Poetry from 1795, addressed to a fictional Amalie, Schlegel discusses the possible origins of language; a theme, to which he would later return in his Jena and Berlin lectures. In his disputation, Schlegel was taking part in an old philosophical debate which had formed two opposite hypotheses (Behler, 2002, 124–128). The two basic and mutually exclusive positions maintained, on the one hand, as Schlegel portrays them, that human language must have originated as a transcription, representation or imitation of external objects; and on the other, that in its origin language must have been purely sensual, i.e. a mere form of expression of emotions through sounds. Thus, either directly or indirectly, Schlegel was referring to authors such as Condillac, Hemsterhuys, Karl Phillip Moritz, August Ferdinand Bernhardi, Fichte, Herder and Rousseau. However, in contrast to Herder (and even his own brother Friedrich) for whom the debate about the origin of language was primarily a debate about whether its origin was natural or divine, for Schlegel, the real question at stake was the extent to which the nature of language could be reduced to and explained in purely rationalistic terms. Furthermore, in these letters Schlegel implicitly questions the possibility of attaining absolute knowledge solely through theory, i.e. attending only to a scientific rationale that necessarily excludes more metaphorical and intuitive approaches, which prefer to see everything “under the mysterious light of twilight” (SW VII, 110). For Schlegel, the real problem lay in the presupposed exclusivity of both alternatives (Behler, 2000, 126).
The fact that Schlegel entered into an already existing debate and that he aimed to dissolve it by reconciling both perspectives, makes his decision to present his position in an epistolary form, mixing different styles of argumentation, much more interesting and valuable; especially if we take into consideration that Schlegel actually modified his last Letter after having received a commentary, through a missive, from Friedrich Schiller (Behler, 2002, 126). Schlegel's letters were indeed an example of what he claimed in them, namely that the only plausible theory on the origin of language had to take into account both its irrational elements (i.e. the purely emotional, imaginative, sensual and most radically communicative aspects of language) and its rational characteristic (i.e. a system of signs based on convention), while admitting that on the whole, the origin of language remains as secret and inexplicable as the origin of humanity itself (SW VII, 111). In brief: for Schlegel, as for Novalis or Schleiermacher, language could not be reduced to a mere system of signs and any account of the origin of language had to be able to integrate the two apparently opposite aspects of it.
For Schlegel, language constitutes, in its most elementary conception, the basic means of communication of immediate feelings, and therefore represents a dimension that is also present in other animals. Children learn to move their tongues, Schlegel notes, even before they learn to use their feet (SW VII, 117). But in human language, this communicative capability is also the tool that enables man to surpass a purely naturalistic or animalistic sphere. Indeed, for Schlegel, as for Herder, language is the quintessence of human beings. Language is our first and most fundamental contact with the world: (1) it is the true condition of possibility of our orientation in the world; and (2) it provides us with the unique opportunity of communicating with other people and of developing subjectivity. Moreover, for Schlegel, the world as such only makes sense through or within language. It is through language that we tear ourselves away from nature and constitute ourselves as a subject. Language is what takes us beyond ourselves; it is the “magical power” that leaves room for the incorporeal, unphysical in us (SW VII, 139).
Schlegel accepts the idea that, in its beginning, language was probably a direct expression of feelings and emotions through sounds. The origin of language, he argues, must have been very close to the cry of animals and the singing of birds, an idea which he supports with the fact that we all began to use our voices by screaming (SW VII, 115). But to this basic point, Schlegel also adds the idea of rhythm. In his letters, he suggests that the rhythmic character of language is as old as poetry, and moreover, as old as human life. The oldest or the first language, he argues, must have been indivisible from tones, rhythms, music and dance. Poetry, or rather rhythm, he affirms, is thus essential to language itself. Indeed, it would be impossible to eliminate rhythm from language (SW VII, 108). In other words, Schlegel maintains that, in its origin, language was poetry (SW VII, 104). Most important, though, is that Schlegel “does not limit the realm of sensuality and feeling to an early stage in the formation of language” (Behler, 2000, 81). For Schlegel, this more sensual aspect of language is always present: however civilized a people may be, they cannot avoid using different tones and rhythms to express themselves (SW VII, 115). Each utterance, each sentence is spoken with a certain rhythm, each word also carries the way in which it is said, the way in which it refers to the world, and all these elements constitute an aspect of language, for they help to establish the ultimate meaning of the words. This, as Schlegel points out, becomes most obvious once we realize that, in order to comprehend the emotions that are being transmitted through a particular speech, one does not need to understand the words literally (SW VII, 114).
Thus, for Schlegel, language not only was poetry in its origin, but language is essentially poetry. Or as he would later claim in his Berlin lectures: “language is an ongoing becoming and continually changing, never ending poem of human kind” (1884, I, 388). Thus, the nature of language should be understood, not as a more or less automatic response to the necessities the world imposes upon us, but as a creative, poetical ability. For Schlegel, the characterization of language as poetry is the only way a theory of language could give account of language's inherent spontaneity and creativity. In a certain way, Schlegel was reinterpreting Herder through Fichte, emphasizing Fichte's idea of man's self-possession and his relation to the world as an active and not a passive one. This also explains the importance Schlegel gave to the role of the poet (and to the literature translator) in the development of the language of a nation. For Schlegel, as for Wilhelm von Humboldt, the task of the poet and also of that of the translator is to broaden the signifying and expressive capacity of a language. The poet, Schlegel says in his 1796 text The Works of Homer by Voss, is the force that renders language alive, which nevertheless does not mean that s/he may introduce any kind of changes: language's malleability also has its grammatical and philological limits (KS, I, 75–76 and 116–117).
In his philosophical account of the fact that language is constantly changing and moving from lower to higher stages, Schlegel operates with two very different ways of approaching language, which, at the same time, reveal the co-existence of two opposite but equally constitutive forces in the development of a language: the artist's language-shaping efforts and the grammarian's judicial function (SW VII, 117). In this way, Schlegel is somehow anticipating Saussure's extremely influential differentiation between langue and parole. For Schlegel, as for Saussure or Deleuze, the tension between language as an ordered and stable whole, and language as the subject of a more or less arbitrary, free and creative development, is what makes language something alive.
In a similar way, Schlegel affirms that our encounters with the world are always poetical, in the sense that they cannot be merely receptive, but also creative. Reality exists through language, or in other words, we always relate to the world metaphorically. This also means that there cannot be an ‘absolute’ (i.e. an absolutely true) way of referring to the external world, for we do not see the world as it is, but always in relation to ourselves. Schlegel's theory of language is thus intrinsically connected to his theory of mythology. Both in his Jena and in his Berlin lectures, Schlegel stressed the fact that the experience of an existing totality has a mythological basis without which the experience itself would be impossible (Behler, 1992, 77–78). Once again, Schlegel stressed the idea that mythology is not merely a phase of human rationality but is part of our being in the world. It is a structural principle of human intellectual activity, the purest rational activity being a mythological one: be it in art, sciences or in our daily activities, we always relate to the world metaphorically.
In his letters, Schlegel maintained that language is the “most wonderful creation of human beings' poetical talent”, because it is through language that human nature is able to reflect upon itself (SW VII, 104). Thus, Schlegel's theory of language is at the same time a theory of the origin of poetry, which also explains his predilection for poetry among all the different artistic manifestations. Thanks to this comprehension of the poetical nature of language, Schlegel can explain poetry as the highest and freest of all arts, because it creates its own objects. Indeed, if language is defined as poetry, then poetry itself becomes “poetry in poetry” (Behler, 125). The only difference between language and poetry, he argued, is that the poet is aware of his/her poetical creativity: s/he consciously decides to create a dream; whereas in ordinary speech, the subject is unaware of his/her poetical and imaginative activity (1884, I, 275). In this way, Schlegel was clearly anticipating Nietzsche's On Truth and Lie in an Extra-Moral Sense.
Although Schlegel himself denied that he had developed any translation theory (IB, I, 256), many of his texts are devoted to the analysis of existing translations (such as Voss's and Bürger's translations of Homer) as well as to the commentary on his own work as translator. Schlegel was almost certainly influenced by the work of Johann Gottfried von Herder, but his decision to avoid the elaboration of a systematic translation theory can be interpreted as the result of a very precise theoretical position, namely that each text requires a different procedure for its translation. As he affirmed in the commentary to his Bhagavad-Gita translation, it all depends on the relation between the two languages (IB, I, 256). In other words, for Schlegel, a translation theory as such is uninteresting unless it involves the exposition of the actual work undertaken with the texts, i.e. with the original text as well as with all the existing translations. Consequently, Schlegel's commentary and his suggestions concerning Voss's translation of Homer are accompanied by a very detailed analysis of the Greek text together with a comparative study of Voss's and Bürger's versions. Likewise, in his Über die Bhagavad-Gita, Schlegel analyzes all the different ways in which a particular word (such as ‘yoga’ or ‘dharma’) has been translated, creating thus a history of the translation. And although his commentaries appear as a work in progress, they show a very precise and carefully conceived methodology which was mostly valuable for other translators and translation theorists.
For Schlegel, a good translation is not necessarily a literal translation; the translator must be able to translate the spirit of the text. He must follow the letter, but he must also be able to “capture some of the innumerable, indescribable marvels that do not reside in the letter, but float above it like a breath of spirit!” (SW VII, 39). Thus, in an 1838 letter to Reimen, Schlegel explains that the aim of a translator should be to “provide those who have no access to the original with as pure and uninterrupted appreciation of the work as possible” (SW VII, 287). Anticipating Humboldt's distinction between the ‘foreign’ (das Fremde) and ‘strangeness’ (die Fremdheit) – which he introduced in the preface of his translation of the Agamemnon from 1816 — Schlegel also emphasizes that all translations should avoid converting foreign texts into strange texts (Berman, 154). As he had said in his Works of Homer by Voss, in order to translate a text from a different culture, the translator needs to maintain the text's naturalness; s/he cannot convert it into something strange, there is no necessity to violate the language, to invent a new language (SW VII, 116). In fact, Schlegel's principal concern as a translator seems to be to enable the assimilation and comprehension of otherness. In this sense, Schlegel also believed that German culture and language provided much better conditions for good translations than other languages, and he criticized the way in which especially French translations tended to paraphrase passages from foreign texts in order to make them seem more French (KS, I, 75–76, see also Berman, 36). As Antoine Berman notes, what Schlegel reproached in Voss's translation of Homer is precisely “to have created a much too ‘strange’ pidgin of Greek and German” (Berman, 154).
Although many of Schlegel's remarks may seem self-evident and elementary, they did not appear so at the time. In fact they are the result of a very precise way of understanding language. Indeed Schlegel's translation theories are very much connected to his philosophy of language. Thus, it is within his explanatory observations about the difficulty of translating Sanskrit terms that we find a philosophical theory about the genealogy of abstract significance. All abstract concepts, he argues, are the result of a progressive growing apart between an original sensual denotation and its future abstract meanings (IB, II, 248–258). Therefore, the translator needs to make a decision between (a) finding a more or less neutral term in his/her own language that has a similar meaning to the original, sensual meaning (in this case s/he needs to explain the particular use of this word); and (b) using all the meanings that the original word has been attached to. The problem in the latter case is that one meaning does not relate to the other, and, what is worse, the translation loses the cohesion between all the different meanings, so the reader is not able to know in which way these different meanings are bound.
Schlegel describes the task of the translator as a voluntary and embarrassing slavery (IB, I, 254). It is never gratifying, because the more s/he tries to make the best translation, the more s/he realizes how impossible his/her task is. And yet, Schlegel's translations of Shakespeare are still read today.
The Romantic vision of the great artist as an exceptional individual, an unrepeatable genius, creator of his/her own rules, of his/her own style, leaves the figure of the philosopher and essayist in a rather difficult position. The art critic has a very different task from that of the artist. As a critic, Schlegel conceives his activity as an educational and moral one, something which he definitely does not demand from the artist. Certainly, in order to appreciate correctly the work of the artist, in order to avoid being dazed by superficial beauty, the art critic also has to have an inner feeling, a certain genius. But his task is not to create, but to comprehend and to educate the public in their taste, to enable them to value the new, modern artistic productions with a profound understanding of their significance. For, “what ennobles human nature [is] to recognize and respect whatever is beautiful and grand under those external modifications which are necessary to their existence, and which sometimes even seem to disguise them. There is no monopoly of poetry for certain ages and nations” (LDA, 2). In Schlegel's oeuvre the Romantic ideals are in fact embedded in an enlightenment project.
Thus in the 1809 preface to the publication of his Lectures on Dramatic Art, Schlegel argued that his main purpose was not so much to transmit an indifferent account of the history of dramatic poetry, but most importantly to “develop those ideas which ought to guide us in our estimate” (LDA, vii). His objective was to liberate his listeners and readers from what he calls a “despotism in taste” (LDA, 2), that is, to release them, both from their provincial prejudices towards unknown cultures and from the new tendencies developing in German literature. He wanted to prepare the German public for the (future) German Romantic theatre.
In a similar fashion, Schlegel argued that in order to appreciate art productions from past cultures and remote nations, an acquaintance not only with the actual work of art is indispensable, but also with its historical and cultural background: it is imperative to understand the peculiarities of their culture and history as a whole. The profound comprehension of History is the basis for any comprehension of art and languages, which necessarily bears a direct relationship with the historical conditions circumscribing it (KS, I, x). Schlegel consequently introduced in all of his lectures historical, social and cultural observations; because for him, the aim of the critic was, primarily, to reconcile the division between theory and experience, i.e. between a philosophical and a historical approach. Such was the balance Schlegel sought to achieve in his lectures between what would be a purely theoretical comprehension of tragedy and the consideration of the theatre as such, with all the historical, architectural and cultural characteristics that conditioned the actual performance of the play.
The critic of art and history needs to be a connoisseur in the strictest sense of the word, for he must be able to explain the actual state of humanity from its most remote past. He needs to distance himself sufficiently from his own time in order to be able to understand and judge it. The true critic must have a “universality of mind” so that he may leave aside his “personal predilections” (LDA, 5). Schlegel conceived his lectures as a true critique, and many years later, he still considered that this is what made his approach in his Lectures on Dramatic Art and Literature unique (KS, I, xiii).
In the preface to the publication of his critical writings from 1828, Schlegel explains that the difficulty of his task as an art critic lies not so much in the critique or the judgment itself, or in the laying out of the proper argument in demonstration of his views, as in finding, i.e. creating the right concepts with which to express the effect and the impressions generated by a specific work of art (KS, I, xii). The genius of the critic is that he is able to use the word ‘Romantic’ in such a way that it may express the essence of an epoch. And, although Schlegel did not believe he actually had a big influence on the German public, by 1828 he did remark that a shift of taste had taken place in Europe, a shift that showed how the Romantic ideals had in fact widely pervaded European audiences.
Schlegel's writings made Shakespeare one of the most universally known and revered authors in Germany and, to a great extent, also in England. Through his translations and essays he intended to make foreign literary traditions and literary works accessible to the German public, but he also thought that the opposite was necessary. That is, Schlegel understood that his task as an art critic was also to defend and disseminate German culture, within Germany and throughout Europe.
Indeed, Schlegel's preoccupation with the historical and cultural diversities had two different, even opposite, consequences. On the one hand it made Schlegel's approach to different cultures and their artistic production much more tolerant, because he was aware of the fact that one needs to immerse oneself in their culture in order to grasp the universal or poetical nature of the work of art and avoid a provincial attitude. In fact, Schlegel liked to think of himself as a citizen of the world. But, on the other hand, it led him to harbor a certain nationalistic sentiment, which he projected both abroad and to the German literati. So, as well as restoring German culture (many of his writings can be regarded as a manifesto of German Romanticism and German philosophy), he also encouraged his fellow countrymen, in a highly patriotic tone, to become deeply national and historical and to depict “what Germans of olden times were and what they should become again”, lest they should lose their “unity as Germans” (LDA., pp. 441). Schlegel believed that for the true potential of Romantic literature to be realized in Germany, Germans needed to regain an interest in the great events of their history and in their identity as an independent nation (Carlson, 143).
In his late essay Abriß von den Europäischen Verhältnissen der Deutschen Literatur (1825), written for an English public, he repeats an idea he had also defended in his Lectures on Dramatic Art, namely that German literature was young because of the historical evolution of the German language, and not because of its quality (LDA, 421, SW VIII, 207). Schlegel fervently defended German authors (such as Klopstock, Lessing, Winkelmann, Wieland, Goethe or Herder), as well as German philosophers, from the English accusations of being abstract and obscure (SW VIII, 212). He also claimed that Germans were the most cosmopolitan and intellectual leaders of European culture, and that Germany had reached its maturity, its autonomy, and hence its freedom (SW VIII, 214). This is why, for Schlegel, Germany had a central role in the development of European culture: in the recuperation of the Roman and Greek cultures, which were the very foundations of Europe. The evidence of this ‘superiority’ would lie in the development of natural sciences, philosophy and the critical interpretation of classical texts (SW VII, 214–217). In short, A.W. Schlegel's concern became more and more a problem of national identity (Schmelling, 35–36).
After the disastrous consequences of German nationalism during the 20th century, and the fact that “it is also a common view that ‘political Romanticism’, in its regard for organic community, was a precursor to Nazism” (Black, 32), such ‘Romantic’ nationalistic statements are not received without a certain apprehension. However, without trying to solve the ambivalent character of the Romantic political program, it is important to note how these very statements show that Schlegel was not an impartial critic. He too was in some way trapped in what he called the Romantic spirit, despite his efforts to contemplate art, history and society from a neutral perspective. In explaining the spirit of the Romantic, Schlegel himself is being very Romantic. The very division he made between the ancient and the modern, as well as his views of Shakespeare, Aristophanes or the Greeks as a people who were “conscious of no wants, and aspired at no higher perfection than that which they could actually attain by the exercise of their own faculties” (LDA, 9), were inevitably influenced by his own time.
A.W. Schlegel's writings show a great preoccupation with and interest in the perspective of the ‘other’: women, children and, above all, other cultures. He constantly reminds the reader about the necessity, in critical thought, of creating a link between theory and practical experience or historical knowledge. This enables him to defend the idea that two totally different works of art can be great and admirable, not only in spite of their differences, but because of them. In fact, although Schlegel's Lectures on Dramatic Art can be seen as a plea for what he calls modern or Romantic poetry and culture in general (“the feeling of the moderns is, upon the whole, more intense, their fancy more incorporeal, and their thoughts more contemplative”, LDA, 9), in contrast to other authors, he is always very careful not to judge modern works of art according to their similarities or dissimilarities with ancient ones. It was not by chance that Schlegel should be the first author to introduce the idea of a comparative literature.
The emphasis on the opposition between ancient and modern art, and its parallel to the antagonism between Christianity and Greek pagan mythology, are recurring assumptions in 19th century aesthetics. But Schlegel's purpose is not to conceptualize a particular canon of beauty, but much more, as a means of elevating oneself above all partial views, to find an approach that may enable the comprehension and enjoyment of the different ways in which art is manifested throughout history. Thus, Schlegel is taking to its highest point the 19th century idealist principle according to which art is the “power of creating what is beautiful and representing (darstellen) it to the human eye and ear” (LDA, 3) as well as the idea that “poetry, as the fervid expression of our whole being, must assume a new and peculiar form in different ages” (LDA, 29).
The experience of difference also becomes an important element in his critique of art. Schlegel clearly positions himself against modern critics, who consider the mixture of reality and imitation “destructive of theatrical illusion” (LDA, 34). Although not always explicit in his writings, Schlegel constantly stresses the idea that in the contemplation of a work of art, the spectator must still perceive the craftedness of the whole; i.e. the difference between reality and illusion. This is a fundamental element of his criticism of naturalism and his defense of the use of verse and masks in theatre. What is more interesting, though, is that the constant awareness of the difference between reality and illusion (for instance through irony) also shows the fundamental fragility of difference itself in a much more compelling way than a rigorous classicist work of art does. Reality is also an illusion; it also is the result of creative forces, such as language is.
In this specific sense, Schlegel could be understood as a thinker of difference in a much more radical way than other philosophers of his time. Although Schlegel's writings have not been considered as philosophical as those of other 19th century German philosophers, his approach to art and its history, and his reflections on language and cultural differences are much closer to what is sometimes called a postmodern comprehension of aesthetics than that of his contemporaries. Indeed, in his characteristically unpresumptuous style, Schlegel anticipates philosophers such as Nietzsche, Blumenberg or René Girard.
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