Friedrich Schlegel (1772–1829) is of undisputed importance as a literary critic, but interest in his work among philosophers has until recently tended to be confined to a rather limited circle. However, as scholars have come to reassess in the last several years the philosophical importance of early German Romanticism—both as something of a counter-movement to German Idealism and as a contributing factor within idealism's development—so interest in Schlegel's distinctive philosophical contribution to his era has increased. The article below will consider the philosophical aspects of Schlegel's development and their relation to his contributions to literary theory and practice.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. The Romantic Turn
- 3. Poetics and Aesthetics
- 4. Philosophical Apprenticeship: Schlegel on Idealism and Transcendental Philosophy
- 5. Ethical, Social and Political Philosophy
- 6. Later Philosophy of Life, History and Religion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
The youngest of five sons, Schlegel was born in Hanover into a distinguished and culturally prominent literary family. His father, Johann Adolf Schlegel, was both a clergyman and literary figure; his uncle, Johann Elias, was a dramatist and aesthetic theorist; and his elder brother by five years, August Wilhelm, was to become the great German translator of Shakespeare and one of the most prominent literary critics of the time.
Schlegel attended the universities of Göttingen and Leipzig, originally to study law, but his intellectual interests began to widen, centering especially on classical literature, and he turned after 1793 to a life of literary freelancing. In the succeeding couple of years, he wrote several early essays on Greek literature amid plans for a history of classical poetry. Only one volume of the intended larger study was published, in 1798, as Geschichte der Poesie der Griechen und Römer, but the essay “On the Study of Greek Poetry” (Über das Studium der griechischen Poesie, finished 1795, but not published until January 1797), with its sharp distinction between ancient and modern modes of literature, is taken to be representative of this early, “classicist” phase of Schlegel's intellectual life.
An important influence on the young Schlegel was Caroline Böhmer, future wife of his brother (and ultimately of F. W. J. Schelling). Schlegel met her initially in 1794 in Dresden, and her life experience—the daughter of a famous Göttingen professor, she had become pregnant by a French officer in occupied Mainz and been imprisoned as a revolutionary—had a particular effect on the awakening of his interest in political and social issues. In the summer of 1796, Schlegel moved to join his brother and new wife in Jena, the city which, since Fichte's momentous arrival two years prior, had become perhaps the liveliest intellectual scene in all of Germany. Schlegel remained in Jena for almost a year, but then moved to Berlin, where he became a regular visitor to the salons of Henriette Herz and Rahel Levin and established contact with several important figures of the Romantic movement. Among them were Friedrich Schleiermacher, who became Schlegel's roommate and collaborator on a number of intended projects, including the translation of Plato's dialogues (a project that in the end only Schleiermacher would actually carry out); the writers Ludwig Tieck and Wilhelm Heinrich Wackenroder; and the poet Friedrich von Hardenberg (Novalis), who had been a fellow student with Schlegel in Leipzig and who was partly responsible for opening up the philosophical problems of Fichtean idealism to the young Schlegel.
Among the works most famously associated with Schlegel's name from this period is the project of the journal Athenaeum, which published in the years 1798–1800 a set of fragments written by both Schlegel brothers, Novalis and Schleiermacher. During his time in Berlin, Schlegel also began a relationship with Dorothea Veit, daughter of Moses Mendelssohn, who had left her banker husband Simon Veit in 1798. The publication in 1799 of Schlegel's novel Lucinde, with its frank (though by today's standards hardly risqué) portrayal of a sexual liaison widely thought to be autobiographical became for Schlegel a major scandal.
In September 1799, Schlegel left Berlin to join his brother and Caroline again in Jena. He gave lectures on transcendental philosophy at the University of Jena from October 1800 to March 1801, although these were apparently not well-received. (Among those in the audience for some of those lectures was probably Hegel, newly arrived in Jena, but there is considerable dispute about what Hegel—a bitter rival of Schlegel's for the remainder of his life—may or may not have gained from hearing them.)
Schlegel remained in Jena until December 1801, and his departure on this occasion came at a time which marks a significant turning point in the history of Romanticism: the end of the “Jena circle” and its collaborations. Novalis had died in March, and Schlegel had become somewhat distanced from his brother and Caroline. After a time in both Berlin and Dresden, Schlegel moved to Paris in June 1802, where he founded another new journal, Europa, and turned significant attention to the figurative arts. Among other things, Schlegel wrote accounts of the paintings in the Louvre and began, at the behest of the notable art collectors Sulpiz and Melchior Boisserée, a series of lectures on art and art history.
Schlegel and Dorothea moved to Cologne in 1804, where Schlegel studied German Gothic architecture, gave lectures on the development of philosophy (Die Entwicklung der Philosophie) and turned, with some hopes of finally establishing himself in an academic position, to a new intellectual interest: the study of Sanskrit and Hindu religious writings. Schlegel's work on the grammatical connections between Sanskrit and the Indo-European languages, published as On the Language and Wisdom of the Indians (Über die Sprache und Weisheit der Indier, 1808), represents an important moment in the development of the study of comparative grammar (a term which Schlegel himself coined in the text).
The study of Hindu thought marked an important shift in the development of Schlegel's religious thought, as did a second and important event of the Cologne period: his conversion, together with Dorothea, to Catholicism, in April 1808. The shift in Schlegel's religious stance corresponded with an apparently new political one as well.
In March of 1809 he was appointed to a position in the Austrian civil service and moved to Vienna, where he was to live for the rest of his life.
During these Austrian years, Schlegel was, among other things, the editor of an anti-Napoleonic newspaper, founder of two other prominent journal projects (the Deutsches Museum and Concordia) and an apparently popular public lecturer on a wide range of topics. Metternich asked him in 1813 to draw up proposals for a future German constitution, and Schlegel served (until he was recalled) as first secretary of the Austrian legation to the Diet of Frankfurt. He died in Vienna in January 1829.
Schlegel's intellectual biography begins in what is usually interpreted as a “classicist” phase. In his early Studium essay, Schlegel claimed that Greek poetry was “beautiful” while modern poetry was only “interesting” (interessant): ancient poetry strove for an ideal and was “objective,” while modern poetry was “characteristic” and strove for an originality that was “individual” or “mannered.” (A similar distinction, as many critics have noted, can be found in Schiller's contemporaneous work On Naive and Sentimental Poetry. Schlegel apparently arrived at his distinction independently, although when he did encounter Schiller's essay, it prompted him to reconsider his approach to more contemporary literature: see Eichner 1970, chapter 2, and Schlegel's later preface to the Studium essay.)
In the years following the Studium essay, Schlegel moved not only to a distinction between the classical and the romantic, as opposed to that between the ancient and modern, but moreover began distinctly to privilege the romantic. What Schlegel meant by the term “romantic” (romantisch) and its apparent cognate Roman (usually translated as “novel,” but having among the Romantics a much wider sense) has long been disputed. Perhaps under the influence of Herder (see Eichner 1956), Schlegel saw the historical origins of “the romantic” in the wide mixture of forms and genres that characterized medieval literature and took it as the point of departure for a genre-transcending notion that allows even Shakespeare's plays or Dante's Commedia to be classified as Romane. Seen from this historical perspective, the Roman becomes the central dividing line between ancient literature and the literature of the current age: Greek poetry, he claimed in 1800, “began with and finally again converged in epic; our poetry began with and finally again will converge in the Roman.”
The shift between Schlegel's classicist and romantic phases presents an interpretive challenge that is frequently discussed in the literature. On the one hand, scholars have stressed that what Schlegel now commends in romantic poetry are the very same facets he had previously condemned (for example, Eichner 1970, 49, who lists here the tendency toward the purely imaginative; the mixing of genres; the trend toward didacticism, irony and parody; the fusion of poetry and philosophy). On the other hand, many have noticed that there are seeds in the Studium essay of the later view—Schlegel's praise of poets like Dante, Goethe and Shakespeare often seems at odds with the essay's valorization of ancient poetry.
One of the most important expressions of Schlegel's claims for the romantic can be found in the much-discussed Athenaeumsfragment 116: Romantic poetry is said there to be a “progressive, universal poetry, … the only kind of poetry that is more than a kind, that is, as it were, poetry itself: for in a certain sense all poetry is or should be romantic.” The task of such poetry, he claims in this fragment, should be to “fuse poetry and prose, inspiration and criticism, the poetry of art and the poetry of nature; and make poetry lively and sociable, and life and society poetical; poeticize wit and fill and saturate the forms of art with every kind of good, solid matter for instruction, and animate them with the pulsations of humor.” In a similar vein, he raises the stakes for what should be achieved by the genre that is not merely a genre—the novel: a “genuine theory of poetry would be a theory of the novel,” he claims.
Schlegel does seem to acknowledge at times that his claims for the romantic border on the overly expansive (or, some would prefer, on the inherently incomplete or uncompletable). In a 1793 letter to his brother, he said: “I cannot send you my explanation of the word ‘romantic’ because it would be 125 sheets long” (cited in Beiser, 1992, 410, n 67). Schlegel's bold envisioning of the romantic and the Roman are, however, part of a larger project in poetics and aesthetics concerned with finding a standard of judgment appropriate to the individuality of artistic and literary works.
The aesthetic standard that Schlegel develops—perhaps best expressed in his claim that “criticism is not to judge works by a general ideal, but is to search out the individual ideal of every work” (Literary Notebooks, 1733)—owes debts both to Herder's notions of the historical and cultural uniqueness of individuals (Eichner, 1970, 42) and to Kant's stress in the Critique of Judgment on the impossibility of judging beauty according to some external rule (see Eichner, 1970, 35–36, for an account of Schlegel's successive readings of the third Critique). Schlegel worked out his new criterion of the “individual ideal of every work” in three important early (1796) critical essays reviewing the work of Jacobi, Georg Forster and Lessing that give a reader a sense of his distinctive approach as stylist and literary theorist (Wilhelm von Humboldt called Schlegel's method in the Jacobi essay one of “reviewing the whole man”—i.e., the man visible precisely in his work). Likewise, Schlegel applies his approach to critical judgment in a famous review of Goethe's Wilhelm Meister, where he insists that the novel “not only judges itself but describes itself.”
Given the importance Schlegel attaches within his romantic poetics to the novel and to the novel which gives itself its own criterion, critics have often examined Schlegel's own novelistic efforts in light of his theoretical stance. The scandalous and unfinished Lucinde, subtitled “Confessions of a Blunderer,” was, according to Schlegel, an attempt at “shaped, artistic chaos,” a work that was meant to be “chaotic and yet systematic.” Part of the achievement of its “shaped chaos” is that Lucinde presents, within the form of a novelistic work itself , a romantic ‘contest’ of competing novelistic possibilities (see, for example, the interpretation of the famous chapter on the “Allegory of Impudence” in Behler 1993).
The notion of the individual work as giving itself its own criterion—a notion that appears later in the hermeneutic tradition and in Benjamin's famous essay on the concept of criticism—is one of a number of distinctive new facets of romantic poetics and aesthetics. Stylistically, Schlegel and the Romantics also made much of the notions of the literary fragment, the concept of irony, and of wit and allegory, as well as a revised notion of the literary genres.
The fragment is among the most characteristic figures of the Romantic movement. Although it has predecessors in writers like Chamfort (and earlier in the aphoristic styles of moralists like Pascal and La Rochefoucauld), the fragment as employed by Schlegel and the Romantics is distinctive in both its form (as a collection of pieces by several different authors) and its purpose. For Schlegel, a fragment as a particular has a certain unity (“[a] fragment, like a small work of art, has to be entirely isolated from the surrounding world and be complete in itself like a hedgehog,” Athenaeumsfragment 206), but remains nonetheless fragmentary in the perspective it opens up and in its opposition to other fragments. Its “unity” thus reflects Schlegel's view of the whole of things not as a totality but rather as a “chaotic universality” of infinite opposing stances.
If a literary form like the fragment opens up the question of the relation between finite and infinite, so do the literary modes of allegory, wit and irony—allegory as a finite opening toward the infinite (“every allegory means God”), wit as the “fragmentary geniality” or “selective flashing” in which a unity can momentarily be seen, and irony as their synthesis (see Frank 2004, 216). Although impressed with the Socratic notion of irony (playful and serious, frank and deeply hidden, it is the freest of all licenses, since through it one rises above one's own self, Schlegel says in Lyceumfragment 108), Schlegel nonetheless employs it in a way perhaps more reminiscent of the oscillations of Fichtean selfhood. Irony is at once, as he says in Lyceumfragment 37, self-creation, self-limitation and self-destruction.
“Philosophy is the true home of irony, which might be defined as logical beauty,” Schlegel writes in Lyceumfragment 42: “for wherever men are philosophizing in spoken or written dialogues, and provided they are not entirely systematic, irony ought to be produced and postulated.” The task of a literary work with respect to irony is, while presenting an inherently limited perspective, nonetheless to open up the possibility of the infinity of other perspectives: “Irony is, as it were, the demonstration [epideixis] of infinity, of universality, of the feeling for the universe” (KA 18.128); irony is the “clear consciousness of eternal agility, of an infinitely teeming chaos” (Ideas 69). A literary work can do this, much as Schlegel's Lucinde had, by presenting within its scope a range of possible alternate plots or by mimicking the parabasis in which the comic playwright interposed himself within the drama itself or the role of the Italian buffo or clown (Lyceumfragment 42) who disrupts the spectator's narrative illusion. (Some of the more striking examples of such moments of ironic interposition in the works of Schlegel's literary contemporaries can be found in the comedies of Tieck—where, as Szondi (1986) argues, it is not merely the actor or playwright who “steps out” of his usual role, but in some sense the very role itself.)
Along with his somewhat idiosyncratic appropriation of literary modes, Schlegel offers a theory of the literary genres which undergoes considerable revision as he attempts to take account both of the historical development of forms and particularly of the rise of the modern novel. Moving from the pragmatic classifications of the Enlightenment to a philosophically oriented theory of the genres, Schlegel shifts from a view on which the drama (as “objective-subjective”) develops out of (“objective”) epic and (“subjective”) lyric to one on which the epic in fact unites the other two classical modes (Szondi 1986, 85–86). The new stress on the epic genre corresponds with his sense of the Roman or novel as the “modern epic” which transcends the traditional genres and with a fluid sense of genre classification itself: “One can just as well say that there exist inifintely many [genres] as that there exists only one progressive poetical genre.”
Like many other members of the generation which came intellectually of age in the 1790's—a group which includes not only the idealist philosophers Schelling and Hegel but also the poets Novalis and Hölderlin—Schlegel's philosophical interests were framed around a concern for somehow uniting Fichtean freedom of the subject with Spinozistic holism. It is likely that Schlegel attended Fichte's Wissenschaftslehre (Theory of Scientific Knowledge) “nova methodo” lectures in Jena starting in October 1796, and he was guided at least in part in his study of the new idealistic philosophy by Novalis, whose own Fichte Studies represent a fascinating window onto the effect that Fichte had on this generation. Novalis and Schlegel had a famous conversation about idealism in the summer of 1796, and both attempted to articulate an opposition to the reliance on a single first principle which they thought characterized the philosophical efforts of Reinhold and Fichte to set Kantian philosophy on a systematic basis. (This Romantic contribution to the anti-foundationalist Grundsatzkritik of the 1790's has long been a neglected aspect of research on the development of German Idealism, as has the work of those philosophers—such as Immanuel Niethammer, Carl Immanuel Diez, Johann Benjamin Erhard and Friedrich Karl Forberg—who pursued a similar line of thought against Reinhold and Fichte.)
Philosophers interested in Schlegel's early engagement with the problems of German Idealism have, in addition to his published works, two rich but tantalizingly incomplete textual resources to draw upon: a set of fragments, the so-called “Philosophical Apprenticeship” (Philosophische Lehrjahre), which date from 1796 and reveal Schlegel's study not only of Fichte and Spinoza but also of Winckelmann, Herder and Kant (this collection remained unpublished until the critical Schlegel edition of 1963), and notes from Schlegel's Lectures on Transcendental Philosophy at Jena in 1800–01.
Schlegel's critique of first-principle philosophy is rooted (like Novalis') in a sense of the ungraspability of the absolute or unconditioned. (As Novalis puts it in the first of his “Pollen” fragments: “Everywhere we seek the unconditioned [das Unbedingte], but find only things [Dinge].”) More specifically, Schlegel holds, against Reinhold and Fichte, that “there are no first principles that are universally suitable [zweckmässig] companions and guides to truth” (KA XVIII.518, #13): even “self-evident” propositions can be doubted and so require demonstration (thus opening up an infinite regress), and any proposition can be proved in an “infinite” number of ways. For Schlegel “every proof is infinitely perfectible” (KA XVIII.518, #9), and the task of philosophy is not one of searching to find an unconditioned first principle but rather one of engaging in an (essentially coherentist) process of infinite progression and approximation.
Philosophy on Schlegel's view must thus begin with skepticism and tend toward the absolute; the idealists have found no way to the latter that avoids the difficulties of the former. Against Fichte's attempts at system-building, Schlegel proposes a notion of what he calls an alternating proof (Wechselerweis): “In my system the ultimate principle [der letzte Grund] is actually a reciprocal proof [Wechselerweis]. In Fichte's [it is] a postulate and a conditional proposition” (KA XVIII, 521).
The Schlegelian philosophy that results from this engagement with idealism is non-foundationalist, holistic and historical (see Beiser 2003, 123–26). Schlegel himself describes his philosophical approach as resembling both a circle and epic poetry because it must forever “begin in the middle”: “Philosophy must have at its basis not only an alternating proof [Wechselbeweis] but also an alternating concept [Wechselbegriff]. In the case of every concept, as in the case of every proof, one can in turn ask for a concept and a proof of the same. For this reason, philosophy, like an epic poem, must start in the middle, and it is impossible to pursue philosophy piece by piece starting from a first piece which is grounded and explained completely in and through itself. It is a whole, and thus the path to recognizing it is no straight line but a circle” (KA XVIII, 518).
For the young Schlegel, consideration of ethical and political matters was never far removed from consideration of the aesthetic. Like Schleiermacher and the young Hegel, Schlegel puts a strong emphasis in his early ethical writings on the notion of love. In his essay “On the Limits of the Beautiful” (Über die Grenzen des Schönen, 1794), he argues that love is the highest form of aesthetic enjoyment and can only be realized between free and equal beings (Beiser 1992, 248). Part of Schlegel's larger political animus lay always (in early as well as late phases of his career) in a refashioning of the relationship between the sexes. In his early phase, Schlegel shared with other Romantics a sense of the political and social importance of the revolutionary period. In his “Essay on the Concept of Republicanism occasioned by the Kantian Tract Perpetual Peace” (Versuch über den Begriff des Republikanismus, 1797), a commentary on sections of Kant's Perpetual Peace, Schlegel moves to a far more democratic view of politics than Kant defended: Schlegel advocates not only the “necessarily democratic” nature of republicanism and the “majesty” of the people as expressed in a majority, as well as the “political imperative” of making all nations republican, but—especially decisive against Kant's restrictions on political activism—argued that insurrection was legitimate in certain cases. Schlegel's political radicalism in this period comes much closer to Fichte than Kant and, in fact, rivals the claims for universal extension of suffrage advocated by Herder and Georg Forster.
It is all the more striking, of course, that the politics of the later Schlegel, as he takes up a position in the Austrian court, turn decisively more conservative. His late essay “Signature of the Age” (Signatur des Zeitalters, 1820) attacks the twin evils of idealism and British-American parliamentary government. As opposed to the machine-like state, Schlegel advocates as his ideal an “organic” Christian state consisting of “corporations” that form a living whole around the monarch (church, school, family, guild—a series of social institutions similar to that visible in the corporatist philosophy espoused in Hegel's philosophy of right during the same time period).
In the final twenty years of his life in Vienna, Schlegel followed on the success of his brother's famous Lectures on Dramatic Art and Literature, given in that city in 1808,with several lecture series of his own. He lectured on modern European history (1810), ancient and modern literature (1811), the philosophy of life (1827), the philosophy of history (1828) and the philosophy of language (1828–1829, a lecture series that was never completed because of Schlegel's death).
Given Schlegel's conversion and the more conservative tendency of his later political thought, commentators have often raised questions about the continuity between the earlier romantic phase and Schlegel's later work. Blanchot puts this line of questioning most sharply:
[A]s a young man he is an atheist, a radical, and an individualist… Some years pass: the same Schlegel, converted to Catholicism, a diplomat and journalist in the service of Metternich, surrounded by monks and pious men of society, is no longer anything but a fat philistine of unctuous speech, lazy, empty, his mind on food, and incapable of remembering the young man who had written: ‘A single absolute law: the free spirit always triumphs over nature.’ Which is the real one? Is the later Schlegel the truth of the first? Does the struggle against a bourgeois who is banal engender no more than a bourgeois who is exalted, then weary, and finally only contribute to an exaltation of the bourgeoisie? Where is romanticism? In Jena or Vienna? [Blanchot 1993, 352]
There is, to be sure, a rather different style and tone evident in many of Schlegel's later writings and lectures. In some of the lecture series, there is a good deal of repetition and argumentative flaccidity of a sort the young Schlegel would no doubt have sharply criticized. But it is far from clear that Vienna represented simply a phase of ossification in Schlegel's intellectual life or even a turn away from the most important philosophical and literary concerns of the young romantic. The literary lectures reveal interesting shifts in his treatment of the literary genres (Eichner 1970, 117–23), the philosophy of life pleads not unconvincingly for a “modest” conception of philosophizing that avoids the excesses of merely abstract or empirical points of departure (Schlegel 1847), and the philosophy of language insists upon the essentially dialogical character of human thought and expression (Schlegel 1847).
1958–2002, Kritische Friedrich-Schlegel-Ausgabe, E. Behler et al. (eds.), 35 vols., Munich: F. Schöningh. (The standard critical edition of Schlegel's works.)
Schlegel's writings available in English translation
|1847||The Philosophy of Life and Philosophy of Language in a Course of Lectures, A. Morrison (trans.), London: H. G. Bohn.|
|1849a||“Lectures on Christian Art,” “An Essay on Gothic Architecture,” “Remarks on the Romance-Poetry of the Middle Ages and on Shakespeare,” “On the Limits of the Beautiful,” “On the Language and Wisdom of the Indians,” in The Aesthetic and Miscellaneous Works of Friedrich von Schlegel, E. Millington (trans.), London: H. G. Bohn.|
|1849b||A Course of Lectures on Modern History, L. Purcell and R. H. Whitelock (trans.), London: H. G. Bohn.|
|1859a||Lectures on the History of Literature, Ancient and Modern, H. G. Bohn et al. (trans.), London: H. G. Bohn.|
|1859b||The Philosophy of History, J. B. Robertson (trans.), London: H. G. Bohn.|
|1957||Literary Notebooks 1797–1801, H. Eichner (ed.), London: Athlone, 1957.|
|1968||Dialogue on Poetry and Literary Aphorisms, E. Behler and R. Struc (trans.), University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press.|
|1971||Lucinde and the Fragments, P. Firchow (trans.), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.|
|1991||“Critical Fragments,” “Athenaeum Fragments,” “From Blütenstaub,” in Philosophical Fragments, P. Firchow (trans.), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.|
|1996||“Essay on the Concept of Republicanism occasioned by the Kantian tract ‘Perpetual Peace,’” “Athenaeum Fragments,” “Ideas,” “Philosophical Lectures: Transcendental Philosophy,” and “Philosophical Fragments from the Philosophical Apprenticeship,” in The Early Political Writings of the German Romantics (ed., F. Beiser), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.|
|1997||“Fichte's Basic Characteristics of the Present Age,” “On Incomprehensibility,” “Dialogue on Poesy,” “Introduction to Transcendental Philosophy,” “Critical Fragments,” “Athenaeum Fragments,” “Ideas,” “Fragments on Literature and Poesy,” “Philosophical Fragments,” “Philological Fragments,” “Theory of Femininity,” “On Diotima,” “On Philosophy, to Dorothea,” in Theory as Practice: A Critical Anthology of Early German Romantic Writings, J. Schulte-Sasse et al. (trans., ed.), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.|
|2001||On the Study of Greek Poetry, S. Barnett (trans.), Albany: State University of New York Press.|
|2003||excerpts from “Critical Fragments,” “Athenaeum Fragments,” “Ideas,” and “On Goethe's Meister,” “Letter about the Novel,” and “On Incomprehensibility,” in Classic and Romantic German Aesthetics, J. Bernstein (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.|
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