Scientific Progress

First published Tue Oct 1, 2002; substantive revision Tue May 10, 2011

Science is often distinguished from other domains of human culture by its progressive nature: in contrast to art, religion, philosophy, morality, and politics, there exist clear standards or normative criteria for identifying improvements and advances in science. For example, the historian of science George Sarton argued that “the acquisition and systematization of positive knowledge are the only human activities which are truly cumulative and progressive,” and “progress has no definite and unquestionable meaning in other fields than the field of science” (Sarton 1936). However, the traditional cumulative view of scientific knowledge was effectively challenged by many philosophers of science in the 1960s and the 1970s, and thereby the notion of progress was also questioned in the field of science. Debates on the normative concept of progress are at the same time concerned with axiological questions about the aims and goals of science. The task of philosophical analysis is to consider alternative answers to the question: What is meant by progress in science? This conceptual question can then be complemented by the methodological question: How can we recognize progressive developments in science? Relative to a definition of progress and an account of its best indicators, one may then study the factual question: To what extent, and in which respects, is science progressive?

1. The Study of Scientific Change

The idea that science is a collective enterprise of researchers in successive generations is characteristic of the Modern Age (Nisbet 1980). Classical empiricists (Francis Bacon) and rationalists (René Descartes) of the seventeenth century urged that the use of proper methods of inquiry guarantees the discovery and justification of new truths. This cumulative view of scientific progress was an important ingredient in the optimism of the eighteenth century Enlightenment, and it was incorporated in the 1830s in Auguste Comte's program of positivism: by accumulating empirically certified truths science also promotes progress in society. Other influential trends in the nineteenth century were the Romantic vision of organic growth in culture, Hegel's dynamic account of historical change, and the theory of evolution. They all inspired epistemological views (e.g., among Marxists and pragmatists) which regarded human knowledge as a process. Philosopher-scientists with an interest in the history of science (William Whewell, Charles Peirce, Ernst Mach, Pierre Duhem) gave interesting analyses of some aspects of scientific change.

In the early twentieth century, analytic philosophers of science started to apply modern logic to the study of science. Their main focus was the structure of scientific theories and patterns of inference (Suppe 1977). This “synchronic” investigation of the “finished products” of scientific activities was questioned by philosophers who wished to pay serious attention to the “diachronic” study of scientific change. Among these contributions one can mention N.R. Hanson's Patterns of Discovery (1958), Karl Popper's The Logic of Scientific Discovery (1959) and Conjectures and Refutations (1963), Thomas Kuhn's The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962), Paul Feyerabend's incommensurability thesis (Feyerabend 1962), Imre Lakatos' methodology of scientific research programmes (Lakatos and Musgrave 1970), and Larry Laudan's Progress and Its Problems (1977). Darwinist models of evolutionary epistemology were advocated by Popper's Objective Knowledge: An Evolutionary Approach (1972) and Stephen Toulmin's Human Understanding (1972). These works challenged the received view about the development of scientific knowledge and rationality. Popper's falsificationism, Kuhn's account of scientific revolutions, and Feyerabend's thesis of meaning variance shared the view that science does not grow simply by accumulating new established truths upon old ones. Except perhaps during periods of Kuhnian normal science, theory change is not cumulative or continuous: the earlier results of science will be rejected, replaced, and reinterpreted by new theories and conceptual frameworks. Popper and Kuhn differed, however, in their definitions of progress: the former appealed to the idea that successive theories may approach towards the truth, while the latter characterized progress in terms of the problem-solving capacity of theories.

Since the mid-1970s, a great number of philosophical works have been published on the topics of change, development, and progress in science (Harré 1975; Stegmüller 1976; Howson 1976; Rescher 1978; Radnitzky and Andersson 1978, 1979; Niiniluoto and Tuomela 1979; Dilworth 1981; Smith 1981; Hacking 1981; Schäfer 1983; Niiniluoto 1984; Laudan 1984a; Rescher 1984; Pitt 1985; Radnitzky and Bartley 1987; Callebaut and Pinxten 1987; Balzer et al. 1987; Hull 1988; Gavroglu et al. 1989; Kitcher 1993; Pera 1994). These studies have also led to many important novelties being added to the toolbox of philosophers of science. One of them is the systematic study of inter-theory relations, such as reduction (Balzer et al. 1984; Pearce 1987; Balzer 2000; Jonkisz 2000), correspondence (Krajewski 1977; Nowak 1980; Pearce and Rantala 1984; Niiniluoto 1999; Nowakowa and Nowak 2000; Rantala 2002), and belief revision (Gärdenfors, 1988; Aliseda, 2006). Another was the recognition that, besides individual statements and theories, there is also a need to consider temporally developing units of scientific activity and achievement: Kuhn's paradigm-directed normal science, Lakatos' research programme, Laudan's research tradition, Wolfgang Stegmüller's (1976) dynamic theory evolution, Philip Kitcher's (1993) consensus practice. A new tool that is employed in many defenses of realist views of scientific progress (Niiniluoto 1980, 1984, 1999; Aronson, Harré, and Way 1994; Kuipers 2000) is the notion of truthlikeness or verisimilitude (Popper 1963, 1970; Niiniluoto 1987).

New interest about the development of science promoted close co-operation between historians and philosophers of science. For example, case studies of historical examples (e.g., the replacement of Newton's classical mechanics by quantum theory and theory of relativity) have inspired many philosophical treatments of scientific revolutions. Further interesting material for philosophical discussions about scientific progress is provided by quantitative approaches in the study of the growth of scientific publications (de Solla Price 1963; Rescher 1978) and science indicators (Elkana et al. 1978). Sociologists of science have studied the dynamic interaction between the scientific community and other social institutions. One of their favorite topics has been the emergence of new scientific specialties (Mulkay 1975; Niiniluoto 1995b). Sociologists are also concerned with the pragmatic problem of progress: what is the best way of organizing research activities in order to promote scientific advance. In this way, models of scientific change turn out to be relevant to issues of science policy (Böhme 1977; Schäfer 1983; Niiniluoto 1984).

2. The Concept of Progress

2.1 Aspects of Scientific Progress

Science is a multi-layered complex system involving a community of scientists engaged in research using scientific methods in order to produce new knowledge. Thus, the notion of science may refer to a social institution, the researchers, the research process, the method of inquiry, and scientific knowledge. The concept of progress can be defined relative to each of these aspects of science. Hence, different types of progress can be distinguished relative to science: economical (the increased funding of scientific research), professional (the rising status of the scientists and their academic institutions in the society), educational (the increased skill and expertise of the scientists), methodical (the invention of new methods of research, the refinement of scientific instruments), and cognitive (increase or advancement of scientific knowledge). These types of progress have to be conceptually distinguished from advances in other human activities, even though it may turn out that scientific progress has at least some factual connections with technological progress (increased effectiveness of tools and techniques) and social progress (economic prosperity, quality of life, justice in society).

All of these aspects of scientific progress may involve different considerations, so that there is no single concept that would cover all of them. For our purposes, it is appropriate here to concentrate only on cognitive progress, i.e., to give an account of advances of science in terms of its success in knowledge-seeking.

2.2 Progress vs. Development

“Progress” is an axiological or a normative concept, which should be distinguished from such neutral descriptive terms as “change” and “development” (Niiniluoto 1995a). In general, to say that a step from stage A to stage B constitutes progress means that B is an improvement over A in some respect, i.e., B is better than A relative to some standards or criteria. In science, it is a normative demand that all contributions to research should yield some cognitive profit, and their success in this respect can be assessed before publication by referees (peer review) and after publication by colleagues. Hence, the theory of scientific progress is not merely a descriptive account of the patterns of developments that science has in fact followed. Rather, it should give a specification of the values or aims that can be used as the constitutive criteria for “good science.”

The “naturalist” program in science studies suggests that normative questions in the philosophy of science can be reduced to historical and sociological investigations of the actual practice of science. In this spirit, Laudan has defended the project of testing philosophical models of scientific change by the history of science: such models, which are “often couched in normative language,” can be recast “into declarative statements about how science does behave” (Laudan et al. 1986; Donovan et al. 1988). It may be the case that most scientific work, at least the best science of each age, is also good science. But it is also evident that scientists often have different opinions about the criteria of good science, and rival researchers and schools make different choices in their preference of theories and research programs. Therefore, it can be argued against the naturalists that progress should not be defined by the actual developments of science: the definition of progress should give us a normative standard for appraising the choices that the scientific communities have made, could have made, are just now making, and will make in the future. The task of finding and defending such standards is a genuinely philosophical one which can be enlightened by history and sociology but which cannot be reduced to empirical studies of science.

2.3 Progress, Quality, Impact

For many goal-directed activities it is important to distinguish between quality and progress. Quality is primarily an activity-oriented concept, concerning the skill and competence in the performance of some task. Progress is a result-oriented concept, concerning the success of a product relative to some goal. All acceptable work in science has to fulfill certain standards of quality. But it seems that there are no necessary connections between quality and progress in science. Sometimes very well-qualified research projects fail to produce important new results, while less competent but more lucky works lead to success. Nevertheless, the skillful use of the methods of science will make progress highly probable. Hence, the best practical strategy in promoting scientific progress is to support high-quality research.

Following the pioneering work of Derek de Solla Price (1963) in “scientometrics,” quantitative science indicators have been proposed as measures of scientific activity (Elkana et al. 1978). For example, output measures like publication counts are measures of scholarly achievement, but it is problematic whether such a crude measure is sufficient to indicate quality (cf. Chotkowski La Follette 1982). The number of articles in refereed journals is an indicator of the quality of their author, but it is clear that this indicator cannot yet define what progress means, since publications may contribute different amounts to the advance of scientific knowledge. “Rousseau's Law” proposed by Nicholas Rescher (1978) marks off a certain part of the total number of publications as “important” or “first-rate,” but this is merely an alleged statistical regularity.

Another example of a science indicator, citation index, is an indicator for the “impact” of a publication and for the “visibility” of its author within the scientific community. Martin and Irvine (1983) suggest that the concept of scientific progress should be linked to the notion of impact, i.e., the actual influence of research to the surrounding scientific activities at a given time. It is no doubt correct that one cannot advance scientific knowledge without influencing the epistemic state of the scientific community. But the impact of a publication as such only shows that it has successfully “moved” the scientific community in some direction. If science is goal-directed, then we must acknowledge that movement in the wrong direction does not constitute progress (Niiniluoto 1984).

The failure of science indicators to function as definitions of scientific progress is due to the fact that they do not take into account the semantic content of scientific publications. To determine whether a work W gives a contribution to scientific progress, we have to specify what W says (alternatively: what problems W solves) and then relate this content of W to the knowledge situation of the scientific community at the time of the publication of W. For the same reason, research assessment exercises may use science indicators as tools, but ultimately they have to rely on the judgment of peers who have substantial knowledge in the field.

2.4 Progress and Goals

Progress is a goal-relative concept. But even when we consider science as a knowledge-seeking cognitive enterprise, there is no reason to assume that the goal of science is one-dimensional. In contrast, as Isaac Levi's classic Gambling With Truth (1967) argued, the cognitive aim of scientific inquiry has to be defined as a weighted combination of several different, and even conflicting, epistemic utilities. As we shall see in Section 3, alternative theories of scientific progress can be understood as specifications of such epistemic utilities. For example, they might include truth and information (Levi 1967; see also Popper 1959, 1963) or explanatory and predictive power (Hempel 1965). Kuhn's (1977) list of the values of science includes accuracy, consistency, scope, simplicity, and fruitfulness.

A goal may be accessible in the sense that it can be reached in a finite number of steps in a finite time. A goal is utopian if it cannot be reached or even approached. Thus, utopian goals cannot be rationally pursued, since no progress can be made in an attempt to reach them. Walking to the moon is a utopian task in this sense. However, not all inaccessible goals are utopian: an unreachable goal, such as being morally perfect, can function as a regulative principle in Kant's sense, if it guides our behavior so that we are able to make progress towards it.

The classical sceptic argument against science, repeated by Laudan (1984a), is that knowing the truth is a utopian task. Kant's answer to this argument was to regard truth as a regulative principle for science. Charles S. Peirce, the founder of American pragmatism, argued that the access to the truth as the ideal limit of scientific inquiry is “destined” or guaranteed in an “indefinite” community of investigators (cf. Niiniluoto 1980, 1984). Almeder's (1983) interpretation of Peirce's view of scientific progress is that there is only a finite number of scientific problems and they will all be solved in a finite time. However, there does not seem to be any reason to think that truth is generally accessible in this strong sense. Therefore, the crucial question is whether it is possible to make rational appraisals that we have made progress in the direction of the truth (see Section 3.4).

A goal is effectively recognizable if there are routine or mechanical tests for showing that the goal has been reached or approached. If the defining criteria of progress are not recognizable in this strong sense, we have to distinguish true or real progress from our perceptions or estimations of progress. In other words, claims of the form ‘The step from stage A to stage B is progressive’ have to be distinguished from our appraisals of the form ‘The step from stage A to stage B seems progressive on the available evidence’. The latter appraisals, as our own judgments, are recognizable, but the former claims may be correct without our knowing it. Characteristics and measures that help us to make such appraisals are then indicators of progress.

Laudan requires that a rational goal for science should be accessible and effectively recognizable (Laudan 1977, 1984a). This requirement, which he uses to rule out truth as a goal of science, is very strong. The demands of rationality cannot dictate that a goal has to be given up, if there are reasonable indicators of progress towards it.

A goal may be backward-looking or forward-looking: it may refer to the starting point or to the destination point of an activity. If my aim is to travel as far from home as possible, my success is measured by my distance from Helsinki. If I wish to become ever better and better piano player, my improvement can be assessed relative to my earlier stages, not to any ideal Perfect Pianist. But if I want to travel to San Francisco, my progress is a function of my distance from the destination. Only in the special case, where there is only one way from A to B, the backward-looking and the forward-looking criteria (i.e., distance from A and distance to B) determine each other.

Kuhn and Stegmüller were advocating backward-looking criteria of progress. In arguing against the view that “the proper measure of scientific achievement is the extent to which it brings us closer to” the ultimate goal of “one full, objective true account of nature,” Kuhn suggested that we should “learn to substitute evolution-from-what-we-know for evolution-toward-what-we-wish-to-know” (Kuhn 1970, p. 171). In the same spirit, Stegmüller (1976) argued that we should reject all variants of “a teleological metaphysics” defining progress in terms of “coming closer and closer to the truth.”

A compromise between forward-looking and backward-looking criteria can be proposed in the following way. If science is viewed as a knowledge-seeking activity, it is natural to define real progress in forward-looking terms: the cognitive aim of science is to know something that is still unknown, and our real progress depends on our distance from this destination. But, as this goal is unknown to us, our estimates or perceptions of progress have to be based on backward-looking evidential considerations. This kind of view of the aims of science does not presuppose the existence of one unique ultimate goal. To use Levi's words, our goals may be “myopic” rather than “messianic” (Levi 1985): the particular target that we wish to hit in the course of our inquiry has to be redefined “locally,” relative to each cognitive problem situation. Furthermore, in addition to the multiplicity of the possible targets, there may be several roads that lead to the same destination. The forward-looking character of the goals of inquiry does not exclude what Stegmüller calls “progress branching.” This is analogous to the simple fact that we may approach San Francisco from New York along two different ways—via Chicago or St Louis.

2.5 Progress and Rationality

Some philosophers use the concepts of progress and rationality as synonyms: progressive steps in science are precisely those that are based upon the scientists' rational choices. One possible objection is that scientific discoveries are progressive when they introduce novel ideas, even though they cannot be fully explained in rational terms (Popper 1959; cf. Hanson 1958; Kleiner 1993). However, another problem is more relevant here: By whose lights should such steps be evaluated? This question is urgent especially if we acknowledge that standards of good science have changed in history (Laudan 1984a).

As we shall see, the main rival philosophical theories of progress propose absolute criteria, such as problem-solving capacity or increasing truthlikeness, that are applicable to all developments of science throughout its history. On the other hand, rationality is a methodological concept which is historically relative: in assessing the rationality of the choices made by the past scientists, we have to study the aims, standards, methods, alternative theories and available evidence accepted within the scientific community at that time (cf. Doppelt, 1983, Laudan, 1987; Niiniluoto 1999). If the scientific community SC at a given point of time t accepted the standards V, then the preference of SC for theory T over T′ on evidence e was rational just in case the epistemic utility of T relative to V was higher than that of T′. But in a new situation, where the standards were different from V, a different preference might have been rational.

3. Theories of Scientific Progress

3.1 Realism and Instrumentalism

A major controversy among philosophers of science is between instrumentalist and realist views of scientific theories (Leplin 1984; Psillos 1999; Niiniluoto 1999). The instrumentalists follow Duhem in thinking that theories are merely conceptual tools for classifying, systematizing and predicting observational statements, so that the genuine content of science is not to be found on the level of theories (Duhem 1954). Scientific realists, by contrast, regard theories as attempts to describe reality even beyond the realm of observable things and regularities, so that theories can be regarded as statements having a truth value. Excluding naive realists, most scientists are fallibilists in Peirce's sense: scientific theories are hypothetical and always corrigible in principle. They may happen to be true, but we cannot know this for certain in any particular case. But even when theories are false, they can be cognitively valuable if they are closer to the truth than their rivals (Popper 1963). Theories should be testable by observational evidence, and success in empirical tests gives inductive confirmation (Hintikka 1968; Niiniluoto and Tuomela 1973; Kuipers 2000) or non-inductive corroboration to the theory (Popper 1959).

It might seem natural to expect that the main rival accounts of scientific progress would be based upon the positions of instrumentalism and realism. But this is only partly true. To be sure, naive realists as a rule hold the accumulation-of-truths view of progress, and many philosophers combine the realist view of theories with the axiological thesis that truth is an important goal of scientific inquiry. A non-cumulative version of the realist view of progress can be formulated by using the notion of truthlikeness. But there are also philosophers who accept the possibility of a realist treatment of theories, but still deny that truth is a relevant value of science which could have a function in the characterization of scientific progress. Bas van Fraassen's (1980) constructive empiricism takes the desideratum of science to be empirical adequacy: what a theory says about the observable should be true. The acceptance of a theory involves only the claim that it is empirically adequate, not its truth on the theoretical level. Van Fraassen has not developed an account of scientific progress in terms of his constructive empiricism, but presumably such an account would be close to empiricist notions of reduction and Laudan's account of problem-solving ability (see Section 3.2).

An instrumentalist who denies that theories have truth values usually defines scientific progress by referring to other virtues theories may have, such as their increasing empirical success. In 1908 Duhem expressed this idea by a simile: scientific progress is like a mounting tide, where waves rise and withdraw, but under this to-and-fro motion there is a slow and constant progress. However, he gave a realist twist to his view by assuming that theories classify experimental laws, and progress means that the proposed classifications approach a “natural classification” (Duhem 1954).

Evolutionary epistemology is open to instrumentalist (Toulmin) and realist (Popper) interpretations. A biological approach to human knowledge naturally gives emphasis to the pragmatist view that theories function as instruments of survival. Darwinist evolution in biology is not goal-directed with a fixed forward-looking goal; rather, species adapt themselves to an ever changing environment. In applying this account to the problem of knowledge-seeking, the fitness of a theory can be taken to mean that the theory is accepted by members of the scientific community. But a realist can reinterpret the evolutionary model by taking fitness to mean the truth or truthlikeness of a theory.

3.2 Empirical Success and Problem-Solving

For a constructive empiricist, it would be natural to think that among empirically adequate theories one theory T2 is better than another theory T1 if T2 entails more true observational statements than T1. Such a comparison makes sense at least if the observation statements entailed by T1 are a proper subset of those entailed by T2. Kemeny and Oppenheim (1956) gave a similar condition in their definition of reduction: T1 is reducible to T2 if and only if T2 is at least as well systematized as T1 and T2 is observationally stronger than T1, i.e., all observational statements explained by T1 are also consequences of T2. Variants of such an empirical reduction relation has been given by the structuralist school in terms of set-theoretical structures (Stegmüller 1976; Scheibe 1986; Balzer et al. 1987; Moulines 2000). A similar idea, but applied to cases where the first theory T1 has been falsified by some observational evidence, was used by Lakatos in his definition of empirically progressive research programmes: the new superseding theory T2 should have corroborated excess content relative to T1 and T2 should contain all the unrefuted content of T1 (Lakatos and Musgrave 1970). The definition of Kuipers (2000) allows that even the new theory T2 is empirically refuted: T2 should have (in the sense of set-theoretical inclusion) more empirical successes, but fewer empirical counter-examples than T1.

Against these cumulative definitions it has been argued that definitions of empirical progress have to take into account an important complication. A new theory often corrects the empirical consequences of the previous one, i.e., T2 entails observational statements e2 which are in some sense close to the corresponding consequences e1 of T1. Various models of approximate explanation and approximate reduction have been introduced to handle these situations. An important special case is the limiting correspondence relation: theory T2 approaches theory T1 (or the observational consequences of T2 approach those of T1) when some parameter in its laws approaches a limit value (e.g., theory of relativity approaches classical mechanics when the velocity of light c grows without limit). Here T2 is said to be a concretization of the idealized theory T1 (Nowak 1980; Nowakowa and Nowak 2000). However, these models do not automatically guarantee that the step from an old theory to a new one is progressive. For example, classical mechanics can be related by the correspondence condition to an infinite number of alternative and mutually incompatible theories, and some additional criteria are needed to pick out the best among them.

Kuhn's (1962) strategy was to avoid the notion of truth and to understand science as a problem-solving activity. Paradigm-based normal science is cumulative in terms of the problems solved, and even paradigm-changes or revolutions are progressive in the sense that “a relatively large part” of the problem-solving capacity of the old theory is preserved in the new paradigm. But, as Kuhn argued, it may happen that some problems solved by the old theory are no longer relevant or meaningful for the new theory. These cases are called “Kuhn-losses.” A more systematic account of these ideas is given by Laudan (1977): the problem-solving effectiveness of a theory is defined by the number and importance of solved empirical problems minus the number and importance of the anomalies and conceptual problems that the theory generates. Here the concept of anomaly refers to a problem that a theory fails to solve, but is solved by some of its rivals. For Laudan the solution of a problem by a theory T means that the “statement of the problem” is deduced from T. A good theory is thus empirically adequate, strong in its empirical content, and—Laudan adds—avoids conceptual problems.

One difficulty for the problem-solving account is to find a proper framework for identifying and counting problems (Rescher 1984; Kleiner 1993). When Newton's mechanics is applied to determine the orbit of the planet Mars, this can be counted as one problem. But, given an initial position of Mars, the same theory entails a solution to an infinite number of questions concerning the position of Mars at time t. Perhaps the most important philosophical issue is whether one may consistently hold that the notion of problem-solving may be entirely divorced from truth and falsity: the realist may admit that science is a problem-solving activity, if this means the attempt to find true solutions to predictive and explanatory questions (Niiniluoto 1984).

A different view of problem-solving is involved in those theories which discuss problems of decision and action. A radical pragmatist view treats science as a systematic method of solving such decision problems relative to various kinds of practical utilities. According to the view called behavioralism by the statistician LJ. Savage, science does not produce knowledge, but rather recommendations for actions: to accept a hypothesis is always a decision to act as if that hypothesis were true. Progress in science can then be measured by the achievement of the practical utilities of the decision maker. An alternative methodological version of pragmatism is defended by Rescher (1977) who accepts the realist view of theories with some qualifications, but argues that the progress of science has to be understood as “the increasing success of applications in problem-solving and control.” In this view, the notion of scientific progress is in effect reduced to science-based technological progress.

3.3 Explanatory Power, Unification, and Simplicity

Already the ancient philosophers regarded explanation as an important function of science. The status of explanatory theories was interpreted either in an instrumentalist or realist way: Plato's school started the tradition of “saving the appearances” in astronomy, while Aristotle took theories to be necessary truths. Both parties can take explanatory power to be a criterion of a good theory, as shown by van Fraassen's (1980) constructive empiricism and Wilfrid Sellars' scientific realism (Pitt 1981; Tuomela 1984). When it is added that a good theory should also yield true empirical predictions, the notions of explanatory and predictive power can be combined within the notion of systematic power (Hempel 1965). If the demand of systematic power simply means that a theory has many true deductive consequences in the observational language, this concept is essentially equivalent to the notion of empirical success and empirical problem-solving ability discussed in Section 3.2, but normally explanation is taken to include additional conditions besides mere deduction. Inductive systematization should also be taken into account (Hempel 1965; Niiniluoto and Tuomela 1973).

One important idea regarding systematization is that a good theory should unify empirical data and laws from different domains (Kitcher 1993). For Whewell, the paradigm case of such “consilience” was the successful unification of Kepler's laws and Galileo's laws by means of Newton's theory.

If theories are underdetermined by observational data, then one is often advised to choose the simplest theory compatible with the evidence (Foster and Martin 1966). Simplicity may be an aesthetic criterion of theory choice, but it may also have a cognitive function in helping us in our attempt to understand the world in an “economical” way. Ernst Mach's notion of the economy of thought is related to the demand of manageability, which is important especially in the engineering sciences and other applied sciences: for example, a mathematical equation can be made “simpler” by suitable approximations, so that it can be solved by a computer. Simplicity has also been related to the notion of systematic or unifying power. This is clear in Eino Kaila's concept of relative simplicity, defined as the ratio between the explanatory power and the structural complexity of a theory (cf. Niiniluoto 1980, 1999). According to this conception, progress can be achieved by finding structurally simpler explanations of the same data, or by increasing the scope of explanations without making them more complex. Laudan's formula of solved empirical problems minus generated conceptual problems is a variation of the same idea.

3.4 Truth and Information

Realist theories of scientific progress take truth to be an important goal of inquiry. This view is built into the classical definition of knowledge as justified true belief: if science is a knowledge-seeking activity, then it is also a truth-seeking activity. However, truth cannot be the only relevant epistemic utility of inquiry. This is shown in a clear way by the cognitive decision theory (Levi 1967; Niiniluoto 1987).

Let us denote by B = {h1, …, hn} a set of mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive hypotheses. Here the hypotheses in B may be the most informative descriptions of alternative states of affairs or possible worlds within a conceptual framework L. For example, they may be complete theories expressible in a finite first-order language. If L is interpreted on a domain U, so that each sentence of L has a truth value (true or false), it follows that there is one and only one true hypothesis (say h*) in B. Our cognitive problem is to identify the target h* in B. The elements hi of B are the (potential) complete answers to the problem. The set D(B) of partial answers consists of all non-empty disjunctions of complete answers. The trivial partial answer in D(B), corresponding to ‘I don't know’, is represented by a tautology, i.e., the disjunction of all complete answers.

For any g in D(B), we let u(g, hj) be the epistemic utility of accepting g if hj is true. We also assume that a rational probability measure P is associated with language L, so that each hj can be assigned with its epistemic probability P(hj/e) given evidence e. Then the best hypothesis in D(B) is the one g which maximizes the expected epistemic utility

(1) U(g/e) = n

i=1
P(hj/e)u(g, hj)

For comparative purposes, we may say that one hypothesis is better than another if it has a higher expected utility than the other by formula (1).

If truth is the only relevant epistemic utility, all true answers are equally good and all false answers are equally bad. Then we may take u(g, hj) simply to be the truth value of g relative to hj:

u(g, hj) = 1 if hj is in g
  = 0 otherwise.

Hence, u(g, h*) is the real truth value tv(g) of g relative to the domain U. It follows from (1) that the expected utility U(g/e) equals the posterior probability P(g/e) of g on e. In this sense, we may say that posterior probability equals expected truth value. The rule of maximizing expected utility leads now to an extremely conservative policy: the best hypotheses g on e are those that satisfy P(g/e) = 1, i.e., are completely certain on e (e.g. e itself and tautologies). On this account, if we are not certain of the truth, then it is always progressive to change an uncertain answer to a logically weaker one.

The argument against using high probability as a criterion of theory choice was made already by Popper in 1934 (see Popper 1959). He proposed that good theories should be bold or improbable. This idea has been made precise in the theory of semantic information.

Levi (1967) measures the information content I(g) of a partial answer g in D(B) by the number of complete answers it excludes. With a suitable normalization, I(g) = 1 if and only if g is one of the complete answers hj in B, and I(g) = 0 for a tautology. If we now choose u(g, hj) = I(g), then U(g/e) = I(g), so that all the complete answers in B have the same maximal expected utility 1. This measure favors strong hypotheses, but it is unable to discriminate between the strongest ones. For example, the step from a false complete answer to the true one does not count as progress. Therefore, information cannot be the only relevant epistemic utility.

Another measure of information content is cont(g) = 1 − P(g) (Hintikka 1968). If we choose u(g, hj) = cont(g), then the expected utility U(g/e) = 1 − P(g) is maximized by a contradiction, as the probability of a contradictory sentence is zero. Any false theory can be improved by adding new falsities to it. Again we see that information content alone does not give a good definition of scientific progress. The same remark can be made about explanatory and systematic power.

Levi's (1967) proposal for epistemic utility is the weighted combination of the truth value tv(g) of g and the information content I(g) of g:

(2) aI(g) + (1 − a)tv(g),

where 0 < a < 1/2 is an “index of boldness,” indicating how much the scientist is willing to risk error, or to “gamble with truth,” in his attempt to be relieved from agnosticism. The expected epistemic utility of g is then

(3) aI(g) + (1 − a)P(g/e).

A comparative notion of progress ‘g1 is better than g2’ could be defined by requiring that both I(g1) > I(g2) and P(g1/e) > P(g2/e), but most hypotheses would be incomparable by this requirement. By using the weight a, formula (3) expresses a balance between two mutually conflicting goals of inquiry. It has the virtue that all partial answers g in D(B) are comparable with each other: g is better than g′ if and only if the value of (3) is larger for g than for g′.

If epistemic utility is defined by information content cont(g) in a truth-dependent way, so that

U(g, e) = cont(g) if g is true
  = − contg) if g is false,

(i,e., in accepting hypothesis g, we gain the content of g if g is true, but we lose the content of the true hypothesis ¬g if g is false), then the expected utility U(g/e) is equal to

(4) P(g/e) − P(g)

This measure combines the criteria of boldness (small prior probability P(g)) and high posterior probability P(g/e). Similar results can be obtained if cont(g) is replaced by Hempel's (1965) measure of systematic power syst(g, e) = Pge).

For Levi, the best hypothesis in D(B) is the complete true answer. But his utility assignment also makes assumptions that may seem problematic: all false hypotheses (even those that make a very small error) are worse than all truths (even the uninformative tautology); all false complete answers have the same utility (see, however, the modified definition in Levi, 1980); among false hypotheses utility covaries with logical strength. These features are motivated by Levi's project of using epistemic utility as a basis of acceptance rules. But if such utilities are used for ordering rival theories, then the theory of truthlikeness suggests other kinds of principles.

3.5 Truthlikeness

Popper's notion of truthlikeness is also a combination of truth and information (Popper 1963, 1972). For him, verisimilitude represents the idea of “approaching comprehensive truth.” Popper's explication used the cumulative idea that the more truthlike theory should have (in the sense of set-theoretical inclusion) more true consequences and less false consequences, but it turned that this comparison is not applicable to pairs of false theories. An alternative method of defining verisimilitude, initiated in 1974 by Pavel Tichy and Risto Hilpinen, relies essentially on the concept of similarity (Oddie 1986; Niiniluoto 1987).

In the similarity approach, as developed in Niiniluoto (1987), closeness to the truth is explicated “locally” by means of the distances of partial answers g in D(B) to the target h* in a cognitive problem B. For this purpose, we need a function d which expresses the distance d(hi, hj) = dij between two arbitrary elements of B. By normalization, we may choose 0 ≤ dij ≤ 1. The choice of d depends on the cognitive problem B, and makes use of the metric structure of B (e.g., if B is a subspace of the real numbers ℜ) or the syntactic similarity between the statements in B. Then, for a partial answer g, we let Dmin(hi, g) be the minimum distance of the disjuncts in g from hi, and Dsum(hi, g) the normalized sum of the distances of the disjuncts of g from hi. Then Dmin(hi, g) tells how close to hi hypothesis g is, so that the degree of approximate truth of g (relative to the target h*) is 1 − Dmin(h*, g). On the other hand, Dsum(hi, g) includes a penalty for all the mistakes that g allows relative to hi. The min-sum measure

(5) Dms(hi, g) = aDmin(hi, g) + bDsum(hi, g),

where a > 0 and b > 0, combines these two aspects. Then the degree of truthlikeness of g is

(6) Tr(g, h*) = 1 − Dms(h*, g).

Thus, parameter a indicates our cognitive interest in hitting close to the truth, and parameter b indicates our interest in excluding falsities that are distant from the truth. In many applications, choosing a to be equal to 2b gives intuitively reasonable results.

If the distance function d on B is trivial, i.e., dij = 1 if and only if i = j, and otherwise 0, then Tr(g, h*) reduces to the variant (2) of Levi's definition of epistemic utility.

Obviously Tr(g, h*) takes its maximum value 1 if and only if g is equivalent to h*. If g is a tautology, i.e., the disjunction of all elements hi of B, then Tr(g, h*) = 1 − b. If Tr(g, h*) < 1 − b, g is misleading in the strong sense that its cognitive value is smaller than that of complete ignorance.

When h* is unknown, the degree of truthlikeness (6) cannot be calculated. But the expected degree of verisimilitude of a partial answer g given evidence e is given by

(7) ver(g/e) = n

i=1
P(hi/e)Tr(g, hi)

If evidence e entails some hj in B, or makes hj completely certain (i.e., P(hj/e) = 1), then ver(g/e) reduces to Tr(g, hj). If all the complete answers hi in B are equally probable on e, then ver(hi/e) is also constant for all hi.

The truthlikeness function Tr allows us to define an absolute concept of real progress:

(RP) Step from g to g′ is progressive if and only if Tr(g, h*) < Tr(g′, h*),

and the expected truthlikeness function ver gives the relative concept of estimated progress:

(EP) Step from g to g′ seems progressive on evidence e if and only if ver(g/e) < ver(g′/e).

(Cf. Niiniluoto 1980.) According to definition RP, it is meaningful to say that one theory g′ satisfies better the cognitive goal of answering problem B than another theory g. This is an absolute standard of scientific progress in the sense of Section 2.5. Definition EP shows how claims of progress can be fallibly evaluated on the basis of evidence: if ver(g/e) < ver(g′/e), it is rational to claim on evidence e that the step from g to g′ in fact is progressive. This claim may of course be mistaken, since estimation of progress is relative to two factors: the available evidence e and the probability measure P employed in the definition of ver. Both evidence e and the epistemic probabilities P(hi/e) may mislead us. In this sense, the problem of estimating verisimilitude is as difficult as the problem of induction.

The measure of expected truthlikeness can be used for retrospective comparisons of past theories g, if evidence e is taken to include our currently accepted theory T, i.e., the truthlikeness of g is estimated by ver(g/e&T) (Niiniluoto, 1984, 171). In the same spirit, Barrett (2008) has proposed that—assuming that science makes progress toward the truth through the elimination of descriptive error—the “probable approximate truth” of Newtonian gravitation can be warranted by its “nesting relations” to the general theory of relativity.

Bird (2007) has defended the “epistemic” definition of progress (accumulation of knowledge) against the “semantic” conception (accumulation of true beliefs or succession of theories with increasing verisimilitude). According to Bird, an accidentally true or truthlike belief without any justification does not constitute progress. This kind of thought experiment may seem artificial, since there is always some sort of justification for any hypothetical theory which is accepted or at least seriously considered by the scientific community. But Bird's argument raises the important question whether justification is merely instrumental for progress (Rowbottom, 2008) or necessary for progress (Bird, 2008). The truthlikeness approach replies to this question by distinguishing real progress RP and estimated progress EP: justification is not constitutive of progress in the sense of RP, but claims of real progress can be justified by appealing to expected verisimilitude. On the other hand, the notion of progress explicated by EP (or by the combination of RP and EP) is relative to evidence and justification but at the same time non-cumulative.

In his attempt to rehabilitate the cumulative knowledge model of scientific progress, Bird admits that there are historical sequences of theories none of which are “fully true” (e.g. Ptolemy—Copernicus—Kepler or Galileo—Newton—Einstein). As knowledge entails truth, Bird tries to save his epistemic account by reformulating past false theories as true ones. He proposes that if g is approximately true, then the proposition “approximately g” is true, so that “the improving precision of approximations can be an object of knowledge”. One problem with this treatment is that scientists typically formulate their theories as exact statements, and at the time of their proposal it is not known how large margins of errors would be needed to transform them into true theories (Niiniluoto, 1999, 84). Further, many past theories were not approximately true or truthlike. Ptolemy's geocentric theory was rejected in the Copernican revolution, not retained in the form “approximately Ptolemy”. Indeed, the progressive steps from Ptolemy to Copernicus or from Newton to Einstein are not only matters of improved precision but involve changes in theoretical postulates and laws.

The definition of progress by RP can be contrasted with the model of belief revision (Gärdenfors, 1988). The simplest case of revision is expansion: a theory T is conjoined by an input statement A, so that the new theory is T & A. According to the definition given in Niiniluoto (1987), if T and A are true, then the expansion T & A is at least as truthlike as T. But if T is false and A is true, then T & A may be less truthlike than T. For example, let the false theory T state that the number of planets is 9 or 20, and let A be the true sentence that this number is 8 or 20. Then T & A states that the number of planets is 20, but this is clearly less truthlike than T itself. Similar examples show that the AGM revision of a false theory by true input need not increase truthlikeness (Niiniluoto 2010).

4. Is Science Progressive?

In Section 3.5., we made a distinction between real and estimated progress in terms of the truthlikeness measures. A similar distinction can be made in connection with measures of empirical success. For example, one may distinguish two notions of the problem-solving ability of a theory: the number of problems solved so far, and the number of solvable problems. Real progress could be defined by the latter, while the former gives us an estimate of progress.

The scientific realist may continue this line of thought by arguing that all measures of empirical success in fact are at best indicators of real cognitive progress, measured in terms of truth or truthlikeness. For example, if T explains e, then it can be shown that e also confirms T, or increases the probability of T. A similar reasoning can be employed to give the so-called “ultimate argument” for scientific realism: theoretical realism is the only assumption that does not make the empirical success of science a miracle (Putnam, 1978; Psillos 1999; Niiniluoto 1999; cf. criticism in Laudan 1984b). This means that the best explanation of the empirical progress of science is the hypothesis that science is also progressive on the level of theories.

The thesis that science is progressive is an overall claim about scientific activities. It does not imply that each particular step in science has in fact been progressive: individual scientists make mistakes, and even the scientific community is fallible in its collective judgments. For this reason, we should not propose such a definition that the thesis about the progressive nature of science becomes a tautology or an analytic truth. This undesirable consequence follows if we define truth as the limit of scientific inquiry (this is sometimes called the consensus theory of truth), as then it is a mere tautology that the limit of scientific research is the truth (Laudan 1984a). But this “trivialization of the self-corrective thesis” cannot be attributed to Peirce who realized that truth and the limit of inquiry coincide at best with probability one (Niiniluoto 1980). The notion of truthlikeness allows us to make sense of the claim that science converges towards the truth. But the characterization of progress as increasing truthlikeness, given in Section 3.5, does not presuppose “teleological metaphysics” (Stegmüller 1976), “convergent realism” (Laudan 1984), or “scientific eschatology” (Moulines 2000), as it does not rely on any assumption about the future behavior of science.

The claim about scientific progress can still be questioned by the theses that observations and ontologies are relative to theories. If this is true, the comparison of rival theories appears to be impossible on cognitive or rational grounds. Kuhn (1962) compared paradigm-changes to Gestalt switches (Dilworth 1981). Feyerabend (1984) concluded from his methodological anarchism that the development of science and art resemble each other.

Hanson, Popper, Kuhn, and Feyerabend agreed that all observation is theory-laden, so that there is no theory-neutral observational language. Accounts of reduction and progress, which take for granted the preservation of some observational statements within theory-change, thus run into troubles. Even though Laudan's account of progress allows Kuhn-losses, it can be argued that the comparison of the problem-solving capacity of two rival theories presupposes some kind of correlation or translation between the statements of these theories (Pearce 1987). Various replies have been proposed to this issue. One is the movement from language to structures (Stegmüller 1976; Moulines 2000), but it turns out that a reduction on the level structures already guarantees commensurability, since it induces a translation between conceptual frameworks (Pearce 1987). Another has been the point that an evidence statement e may happen to be neutral with respect to rival theories T1 and T2, even though it is laden with some other theories. The realist may also point that the theory-ladenness of observations concerns at most the estimation of progress (EP), but the definition of real progress (RP) as increasing truthlikeness does not mention the notion of observation at all.

Even though Popper accepted the theory-ladenness of observations, he rejected the more general thesis about incommensurability as “the myth of the framework” (Lakatos and Musgrave 1970). Popper insisted that the growth of knowledge is always revolutionary in the sense that the new theory contradicts the old one by correcting it, but there is still continuity in theory-change, as the new theory should explain why the old theory was successful to some extent. Feyerabend tried to claim that successive theories are both inconsistent and incommensurable with each other, but this combination makes little sense. Kuhn argued against the possibility of finding complete translations between the languages of rival theories, but in his later work he admitted the possibility that a scientist may learn different theoretical languages (Hoyningen-Huene 1993). Kuhn kept insisting that there is “no theory-independent way to reconstruct phrases like ‘really there’,” i.e., each theory has its own ontology. Convergence to the truth seems to be impossible, if ontologies change with theories. The same idea has been formulated by Putnam (1978) and Laudan (1984a) in the so-called “pessimistic meta-induction”: as many past theories in science have turned out to be non-referring, there is all reason to expect that even the future theories fail to refer—and thus also fail to be approximately true or truthlike.

The difficulties for realism seem to be reinforced by the observation that measures of truthlikeness are relative to languages. The choice of conceptual frameworks cannot be decided by means of the notion of truthlikeness, but needs additional criteria. In defense of the truthlikeness approach, one may point to the fact that the comparison of two theories is relevant only in those cases where they are considered (perhaps via a suitable translation) as rival answers to the same cognitive problem. It is interesting to compare Newton's and Einstein's theories for their truthlikeness, but not Newton's and Darwin's theories.

Another line is to appeal to theories of reference in order to show that rival theories can after all be regarded as speaking about the same entities (Psillos 1999). For example, Thompson, Bohr, and later physicists are talking about the same electrons, even though their theories of the electron differ from each other. This is not possible on the standard descriptive theory of reference: a theory T can only refer to entities about which it gives a true description. Kuhn's and Feyerabend's meaning holism, with devastating consequences for realism, presupposes this account of reference. A similar argument is used by Moulines (2000), who denies that progress could be understood as “knowing more about the same,” but his own structuralist reconstruction of progress with “partial incommensurability” assumes that rival theories share some intended applications. Causal theories of reference allow that reference is preserved even within changes of theories (Kitcher 1993). The same result is obtained if the descriptive account is modified by introducing a Principle of Charity (Putnam 1975; Smith 1981; Niiniluoto 1999): a theory refers to those entities about which it gives the most truthlike description. This makes it possible that even false theories are referring. Moreover, there can be reference invariance between two successive theories, even though both of them are false; progress means then that the latter theory gives a more truthlike description about their common domain than the old theory.

Does this mean that, by choosing to be charitable, we can simply decide that some theory sequences are progressive? The answer is negative, since charitable reference fixing is not arbitrary: the relevant degrees of truthlikeness depend on the relations between theories and reality.

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