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The topic of scientific revolutions has become philosophically important, especially since Thomas Kuhn's account in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962, 1970). It is controversial whether there have been any revolutions in the strictly Kuhnian sense. It is also controversial what exactly a Kuhnian revolution is, or would be. Many analysts agree that there have been revolutionary scientific developments of various kinds, whether Kuhnian or not, but there is considerable disagreement about their import. For the existence and nature of scientific revolutions is a topic that raises a host of fundamental questions about the sciences and how to interpret them, a topic that intersects most of the major issues that have concerned philosophers of science and their colleagues in neighboring science studies disciplines such as history of science and sociology of science. Even if the so-called Scientific Revolution from Copernicus to Newton fits the attractive, Enlightenment picture of the transition from feudalism to modernity (a claim that is also contested), the putative revolutions in mature sciences (e.g., the relativity and quantum mechanical revolutions) challenge precisely this Enlightenment vision of rational, objective sciences and technologies leading society steadily along the path of progress toward the truth about the world. Although many philosophers and philosophically or historically reflective scientists had commented on the dramatic developments in twentieth-century physics, it was not until Kuhn that such developments seemed so epistemologically and ontologically damaging as to seriously challenge traditional conceptions of science—and hence our understanding of knowledge acquisition in general. Why it was Kuhn's work and its timing that made the major difference are themselves interesting questions for investigation, especially given that others (e.g., Wittgenstein, Fleck, Polanyi, Toulmin, and Hanson) had already broached important “Kuhnian” themes.
Was there a Scientific Revolution that replaced pre-scientific thinking about nature and society and thus marked the transition to modernity? Which later developments, if any, are truly revolutionary? Are attributions of revolution usually a sign of insufficient historiographic understanding? In any case, how are such episodes to be explained historically and epistemologically? Are they historical accidents, perhaps avoidable; or are they somehow necessary—and, if so, why, and necessary for what? Is there an overall pattern of scientific development? If so, is it basically one of creative displacement, as Kuhn originally claimed? Do all revolutions have the same structure and function, or are there diverse forms of rupture, discontinuity, or rapid change in science? Do they represent great leaps forward or, on the contrary, does their existence undercut the claim that science progresses? Does the existence of revolutions in mature sciences support a postmodern or “post-critical” (Polanyi) rather than a modern, neo-Enlightenment conception of science in relation to other human enterprises? Does their existence support a strongly constructivist versus a realist conception of scientific knowledge claims? Are they rational or irrational? Do they invite epistemological relativism? What are the implications of revolution for science policy?
- 1. The Problems of Revolution and Innovative Change
- 2. History of the Concept of Scientific Revolution
- 3. Kuhn's Account of Scientific Revolutions
- 4. Responses to Kuhn's Account
- 5. Larger Formations and Historical A Prioris: The Germanic and French Traditions
- 6. Alternative Conceptions of Scientific Change
- 7. Revolution or Evolution?
- 8. Conclusion
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
The difficulties in identifying and conceptualizing scientific revolutions involve many of the hardest issues in epistemology, methodology, ontology, philosophy of language, and even value theory. Since revolution obviously involves significant change, we right away confront the problem of deep, possibly noncumulative, conceptual change, now in modern science itself, a locus that Enlightenment thinkers would have found surprising. And since revolution is typically driven by new results, sometimes completely unanticipated, we also confront the hard problem of understanding creative innovation. Third, major revolutions supposedly alter the normative landscape of research by altering the goals and methodological standards of the enterprise, so we face also the difficult problem of relating descriptive claims to normative claims and practices, and changes in the former to changes in the latter.
Comparing the world of business and economic theory provides a perspective on the difficulty of these problems, for both the sciences and business technologies change rapidly and sometimes deeply, thanks to what might be termed “innovation pressure”—both the pressure to innovate and the pressure to accommodate innovation (e.g., Christensen 1997; Christensen and Raynor, 2003; Nickles 2008a). In a market economy, as in science, there is a premium on change driven by innovation. Yet most economists have treated innovation as an exogenous factor—as a sort of accidental, economically contingent event that comes in from outside the economic system to work its effects. It is surprising that innovation has not been a central topic of economic theorists, especially theorists of capitalism, which, according to the Austrian-American economist Joseph Schumpeter, follows a pattern of “creative destruction.” Schumpeter himself did identify economic innovation as
the process of industrial mutation—if I may use that biological term—that incessantly revolutionizes the economic structure from within, incessantly destroying the old one, incessantly creating a new one. This process of Creative Destruction is the essential fact about capitalism. [1942, chap. VII; Schumpeter's emphasis]
Unfortunately, subsequent economic theorists (with a few exceptions such as Robert Solow, Brian Arthur, and Paul Romer) did not develop Schumpeter's insight. The result is an inability of major economic theories to explain economic change. The parallel observation holds for philosophy of science. Here, too, the leading philosophers of science until the 1960s—the logical empiricists and the Popperians—neglected, nay shunned, innovation as a legitimate topic, even though it is the primary intellectual driver of scientific change. They distinguished “context of discovery” (the context in which new ideas and practices are developed) from “context of justification” (the logical structure of testing and confirmation of claims already available), or, more broadly, the process of ongoing scientific work from the logical structure of its final products. (For recent discussion of this distinction, see Schickore and Steinle 2006.) By contrast, Thomas Kuhn attempted to explain the tempo and mode of what he took to be the creative-destructive pattern of scientific change precisely by internalizing innovative processes into his philosophy of science (see §3 below). He rejected standard accounts of both discovery and justification.
What are the root conceptions of revolution? At bottom there would seem to be three, sometimes overlapping tropes, all involving rapid change from one stage or phase or structured system to another: (1) revolution as simply turning, e.g. revolving; (2) revolution as overturning; and (3) revolution as a great leap forward into new, previously uncharted territory. We may subdivide each in various ways, principally these. (1) The turning may be either revolution as in a turning wheel or a turning away from one path or direction to another. And the turning away may be either slight (doing something new that was previously imaginable, in which case it is hardly revolutionary) or sharp (doing something previously quite unexpected, even inconceivable). The history of both science and philosophy is full of such turns. (2) The overturning can be either with or without replacement. In the former case, the replacement can be either a turn away from the past toward an imagined future or a return to a (supposed) past, overlapping trope (1). If there is no replacement, the field is presumably left in disarray. (3) The leap forward can be either a rapid but continuous, “evolutionary” development or so momentous as to constitute a sharp break with the past but nevertheless progressive, that is, a kind of extension of an existing enterprise into new intellectual or practical terrain. In either case such a development can be transformative, opening up—or creating—a whole new domain of possibilities. In the case of the sciences and technologies and other problem-solving endeavors, this can involve the introduction of novel kinds of entities, processes, problems to investigate, and tools of investigation. In each of the above cases, we can also distinguish revolutions that are highly theoretical from those that significantly alter practice without requiring huge revisions of theory. Depending on which metaphors are highlighted, revolutions can be regarded as conservative or radical—and in some cases perhaps both.
Another approach to characterizing scientific revolutions is to ask whether they are primarily the assimilation a large quantity of new material or, instead, primarily a rearrangement of materials already present. Perhaps there are two types of revolution: revolutions in content and revolutions in form, structure, or organization. As will appear below, Kuhn (problematically) conceived revolutions as a major reorganization of largely familiar materials.
It is clear that a discontinuity in the history of a science does not automatically constitute a revolution, for scientific work can be temporally interrupted for many reasons, “external” (Lysenkoism's disruption of biological research in the Soviet Union and the interruptions caused by World War II) and “internal” (as when the central problems of a field are declared solved—or unsolvable—and it ceases being an active research site).
There are entire academic industries devoted to various aspects of the topic of scientific revolutions—rationality, objectivity, progress, incommensurability, realism, and so on. Accordingly, this entry can barely skim the surface of selected debates.
What history lies behind the terms ‘revolution’ and ‘scientific revolution’? The answer is an intriguing mix of accounts of physical phenomena, political fortunes, and conceptions of chance, fate, and history. Originally a term applying to rotating wheels and including the revolution of the celestial bodies (as in Copernicus' title: De Revolutionibus Orbium Coelestium) and, more metaphorically, the wheel of fortune, ‘revolution’ was eventually transferred to the political realm. The term later returned to science at the metalevel, to describe developments within science itself (e.g., “the Copernican Revolution”). Christopher Hill, historian of seventeenth-century Britain and of the so-called English Revolution in particular, writes:
Conventional wisdom has it that the word ‘revolution’ acquired its modern political meaning only after 1688. Previously it had been an astronomical and astrological term limited to the revolution of the heavens, or to any complete circular motion. [Hill 1990, 82]
Hill himself dates the shift to the governmental realm somewhat earlier, pointing out that the notion of overturning was also present in groups of reformers who aspired to return human society to an earlier, ideal state: overturning as returning. This conception of revolution as overturning was compatible with a cyclical view of history as a continuous process. This process could be either natural and smooth or highly contingent, as the fortune of a city-state changed and bad times replaced good, or good bad.
It was in the socio-political sphere that talk of revolution as a successful uprising and overturning became common. In this sense a revolution is a successful revolt, ‘revolution’ being an achievement or product term whereas ‘revolt’ is a process term. The fully modern conception of revolution as involving a break from the past—an abrupt, humanly-made overturning rather than a natural overturning—depended on the linear, progressive conception of history that originated in the Italian Renaissance or at least the Protestant Reformation, gained strength during the two seventeenth-century English revolutions, and became practically dogma among the champions of the scientific Enlightenment. The violent English Revolution of the 1640s gave political revolution a bad name, whereas the Glorious Revolution of 1688, a bloodless, negotiated compromise, reversed this reputation. Ironically, as Hill points out, the latter revolution removed England from a revolutionary history, whereas the American and French revolutions, not to mention the Bolshevik, were yet to come. It was a revolution that ended revolution.
When did the term ‘revolution’ become a descriptor of specifically scientific developments? In the most thorough treatment of the history of the concept of scientific revolution, I. B. Cohen (1985) notes that the French word revolution was being used, somewhat vaguely, to mark significant developments already in early eighteenth-century France. By mid-century it was pretty clear that Clairaut, D'Alembert, Diderot and others sometimes applied the term to scientific developments, including Newton's achievement but also Descartes' rejection of Aristotelian philosophy. However, the definition of revolution in the Encyclopédie of the French philosophes was still political. Toward the end of the century, Condorcet could speak of Lavoisier as having brought about a revolution in chemistry; and, indeed, Lavoisier and his associates also applied the term to their work, as did Cuvier to his. Meanwhile, of course, Kant in The Critic of Pure Reason (first edition 1781) spoke of his “Copernican Revolution” in philosophy.
It was during the twentieth century that talk of scientific revolutions gained currency, albeit rather slowly. The idea of radical breaks was foreign to such historians of science as Pierre Duhem and George Sarton, but Alexandre Koyré, in Études Galiléennes (1939), rejected inductivist history, interpreting the work of Galileo as a sort of Platonic intellectual transformation. In The Origins of Modern Science: 1300-1800 (1949 and later editions), Herbert Butterfield, a political historian, wrote a comprehensive summary of what we now term the Scientific Revolution, one that emphasized the importance of conceptual transformation with key phrases such as that so-and-so “picked up the other end of the stick.” The anti-whiggism that he had advocated in his The Whig Interpretation of History (1931), after being imported from political history, became a major constraint on the new historiography of science, especially in the Anglophone world. In Origins Butterfield applied the revolution label not only to the Scientific Revolution and to several of its components but also to “The Postponed Revolution in Chemistry” (a chapter title), as if it were a delayed component of the Scientific Revolution. His history ended there. However, Butterfield's book suggested to many readers that there had been several scientific revolutions, not just one big one. Subsequently A. Rupert Hall, a full-fledged historian of science who worked from primary sources, published his The Scientific Revolution: 1500-1800 (Hall 1954). Soon many other scholars spoke of the Scientific Revolution, the achievements of the period from Copernicus to Newton, including such luminaries as Kepler, Galileo, Bacon, Descartes, Huygens, Boyle, and Leibniz.
Then Thomas Kuhn and Paul Feyerabend challenged received views of science and made talk of revolution and incommensurability central to history and philosophy of science. They asserted that major conceptual changes lay in the future of the various sciences as well as in their past. The new historiography of science had led these historically sensitive thinkers to deny that our own position in history was inherently privileged—a view with obvious epistemological implications. (Meanwhile, Popper had been preaching a modest version of the same theme: see below.)
Kuhn published The Copernican Revolution in 1957 and The Structure of Scientific Revolutions in 1962, adding the important “Postscript—1969” to the second edition of 1970. (Later editions remained essentially unchanged.) Feyerabend simultaneously introduced the term ‘incommensurable’ in his (1962). According to Kuhn, there have been many scientific revolutions, large and small, some occurring in specialty areas with as few as twenty-five members, achievements that looked like normal, cumulative advances to outsiders. This was a consequence of his views that large paradigms such as classical mechanics contain many smaller paradigms within their various specialty and subspecialty fields (paradigms within paradigms), that eventual paradigm change in an active field is inevitable, and that paradigm change is revolutionary. Critics complain that Kuhn multiplied revolutions without necessity. On the other hand, for Kuhn a given field could normally sustain only one paradigm at a time; indeed, it was defined by that paradigm. There could be an overlap of competing paradigms only during rare interregnum periods of extraordinary science. Feyerabend disliked this rigid, hierarchical conception of science and the dogmatism that it implied, arguing instead for a proliferation of alternative theories. Kuhn rejected Feyerabend's idea as not only impractical, given the immense difficulty of developing successful theory frameworks, but also destructive of the constitution of modern science. Although they were colleagues at the University of California, Berkeley, during these crucial years, Kuhn's primary intellectual soulmate was philosopher of art Stanley Cavell rather than Feyerabend. But our focus in this section is on history and historiography of science.
The field of historiography of science came to maturity primarily with work on the so-called Scientific Revolution. Butterfield's and Kuhn's popularizations of the idea that even the mature sciences undergo deep conceptual change stimulated enormous interest in the history of science during the 1960s and 1970s. The revolution frame was a boon to historical narrative. (For detail see Cohen 1985 and Nickles 2006a.) And by challenging the received, quasi-foundational, Enlightenment conception of science, history of science and related philosophies of science gained great cultural significance for a time.
In recent decades, however, many historians have challenged even the claim that there was a single, coherent development appropriately called “the Scientific Revolution.” Steven Shapin (1996, 1) captures the unease in his opening sentence: “There was no such thing as the Scientific Revolution, and this is a book about it.” Everyone agrees that a series of rapid developments of various kinds took place during the period in question, but the operative word here is ‘various’. One difficulty is that no one has succeeded in reducing a 150-year (or more) period of work to an insightful, widely accepted characterization that embraces the important changes in theory, method, practices, instrumentation, social organization, and social status ranging over such a wide variety of projects. Older styles of historical writing, exemplified by Dijksterhuis (1961; original, Dutch edition, 1950) and Gillispie (1960), were characterized by grand narratives such as the mechanization of the world picture or the passage from subjective superstition to objectivity and mathematical precision. Philosophically oriented writers attempted to find unity and progress in terms of the discovery of a new, special scientific method. However, today even most philosophers of science dismiss the claim that there exists a powerful, general, scientific method the discovery of which explains the Scientific Revolution and the success of modern science.
Continuity theorists such as Pierre Duhem (1906), J. H. Randall (1940), A. C. Crombie (1959, 1994), and more recent historians such as Peter Dear (2001) have pointed out a second major difficulty in speaking of “the Scientific Revolution.” It is difficult to locate the alleged sharp break from medieval and Renaissance practices that discontinuity historians from Koyré to Kuhn have celebrated. When examined closely in their own cultural context, all the supposed revolutionaries are found to have had one foot in the old traditions and to have relied heavily on the work of predecessors. As J. M. Keynes remarked, Newton was the last of the magicians, not the first of the moderns. Still, most historians and philosophers would agree that the rate of change of scientific development increased notably during this period. Hence, Shapin, despite his professional reservations, could still write an instructive, synthetic book about the Scientific Revolution. The most thorough appraisal of historiographical treatments of the Scientific Revolution is H. Floris Cohen's (1994).
The Scientific Revolution supposedly encompassed all of science or natural philosophy, as it then existed, as opposed to more recent talk of revolutions within particular fields. Have there been other comprehensive revolutions? Some have claimed the existence of a “second scientific revolution” in the institutional structure of the sciences in the decades around 1800, others (including Kuhn) a multidisciplinary revolution in the “Baconian sciences” (chemistry, electricity, magnetism, heat, etc.) during roughly the same time period. Still others have claimed that there was a general revolution in the sciences in the decades around 1900. (See Cohen 1985, chap. 6, for discussion of these claims.)
For many historians, ‘the Scientific Revolution’ now describes a topic area rather than a clearly demarcated event. They find it safer to divide the Scientific Revolution into several more discipline-specific revolutions (now employing the more recent sense of ‘revolution’), beginning with Copernicus. However, in their unusually comprehensive history of science textbook, Peter Bowler and Iwan Morus (2005) query of practically every major development they discuss whether or not it was a genuine revolution at all, at least by Kuhnian standards.
Clearly, then, commitment to the existence of deep conceptual change does not entail, for all experts, a commitment to the existence of scientific revolutions as highly distinctive developments. Another prominent example is the philosopher Stephen Toulmin (1953, 1961, 1972), who wrote of “ideals of natural order,” principles so basic that they are normally taken for granted during an epoch but that are subject to eventual historical change. Such was the change from the Aristotelian to the Newtonian conception of inertia. Yet Toulmin remained a critic of revolution talk. Although the three influential texts that he co-authored with June Goodfield recounted the major changes that resulted in the development of several modern sciences (Toulmin and Goodfield 1961, 1962, 1965), these authors could write, already about the so-called Copernican Revolution:
We must now look past the half-truths of this caricature, to what Copernicus attempted and what he in fact achieved. For in science, as in politics, the term ‘revolution’—with its implication that a whole elaborate structure is torn down and reconstructed overnight—can be extremely misleading. In the development of science, as we shall see, thorough-going revolutions are just about out of the question. [1961, 164]
The Toulmin and Goodfield quotation raises the question, When did talk of scientific revolutions enter philosophy of science in a significant way? Given the prominence of the topic today, it is surprising that we do not find it (for example) in Philipp Frank's account of the positivistic discussion group in Vienna in the early twentieth century. Frank (1957) does speak of their perception of a crisis in modern physics caused by special relativity's and quantum mechanics' undermining of classical mechanism, and it was common to speak of this or that worldview or world picture (Weltbild), e.g., the electromagnetic vs. the Einsteinian vs. the mechanical picture. Nor do we find talk of scientific revolutions in the later Vienna Circle even after the diaspora following the rise of Hitler. It is not in Karl Popper's Logik der Forschung (1934), nor his 1959 English expansion of that work, as The Logic of Scientific Discovery. It is not in Ernest Nagel's The Structure of Science (1961). Hans Reichenbach (1951) speaks rather casually of the revolutions in physics. And so on. It is worth noting that Stephen Pepper published his widely read World Hypotheses already in 1942 and was the chair of the Philosophy Department when Kuhn was hired (in that department as well as History) at the University of California in Berkeley over a decade later. In Patterns in Discovery (1958), N. R. Hanson helped prepare the ground with his talk of the theory-ladenness of observation and perceptual Gestalt switches; and, as noted above, Toulmin and Goodfield were certainly sensitive to deep historical change. However, there is little mention of scientific revolutions as a philosophical topic in Anglo-American and logical empiricist work until Kuhn.
In his autobiographical lecture at Cambridge in 1953, Popper did refer to the dramatic political and intellectual events of his youth as revolutionary:
the air was full of revolutionary slogans and ideas, and new and often wild theories. Among the theories which interested me Einstein's theory of relativity was no doubt by far the most important. The others were Marx's theory of history, Freud's psycho-analysis, and Alfred Adler's so-called ‘individual psychology’. [Popper 1957]
During the 1960s and 1970s, Popper indicated that, according to his “critical approach” to science and philosophy, all science should be revolutionary—revolution in permanence, a view that Kuhn considered self-undermining. It certainly tamed the idea of revolution, as did Popper's two logical criteria for scientific progress: (a) a progressive new theory must logically conflict with its predecessor and overthrow it; and (b) “a new theory, however revolutionary, must always be able to explain fully the success of its predecessor” (Popper 1975, 82f). As we shall see, Kuhn's model of revolution rejects both constraints as well as the idea of progress toward truth. Kuhn also vehemently rejected Popper's doctrine of falsification, which implied that a theory, even a theory framework, could be rejected in isolation, without anything to replace it. At any time there may be several competing theories being proposed and subsequently refuted by failed empirical tests—rather like a scattering of balloons being launched and popped! Popper's view thus faces the difficulty, among others, of explaining the long-term coherence that historians find in scientific research.
Beginning in the 1960s, several philosophers and historians addressed this difficulty by proposing the existence of larger units (than theories) of and for analysis. These stable formations correspondingly raised the eventual prospect of larger-scale instabilities, for an abrupt change in such a formation would surely be more dramatic, more revolutionary, than a Popperian theory change. Kuhn's paradigms, Imre Lakatos's research programmes, Larry Laudan's research traditions (Lakatos 1970, Laudan 1979), and the widespread use of terms such as ‘conceptual scheme’, ‘conceptual framework’, ‘worldview’, and Weltanschauung (Suppe 1974) instanced this felt need for larger-sized units among Anglo-American writers, as had Toulmin's old concept of ideals of natural order. Meanwhile, Michel Foucault 1966, 1969), working in a French tradition, was positing the existence of “discursive formations” or epistemes, sets of deep-structural cultural rules that define the limits of discourse during a period. Section 5 returns to this theme.
I. B. Cohen (1985, chap. 2) lays down four historical tests, four necessary conditions, for the correct attribution of a revolution. First, the scientists involved in the development must perceive themselves as revolutionaries, and relevant contemporaries must agree that a revolution is underway. Second, documentary histories must count it as a revolution. Third, later historians and philosophers must agree with this attribution and, fourth, so must later scientists working in that field or its successors. By including both historical contemporary reports and later historiographic judgments, Cohen excludes people who claimed in their day to be revolutionaries but who had insufficient impact on the field to sustain the judgment of history. He also guards against whiggish, post hoc attributions of revolution to people who had no idea that they were revolutionaries.
Cohen sets the bar high. Ironically, given Copernicus' own conservatism and the fact that few people paid attention to his work for half a century, the Copernican Revolution either was not a revolution at all or only became one decades after Copernicus' death. But in that case, if personal attribution is a must, should not the revolution be attributed to Kepler, Galileo, and Descartes? This thought further problematizes the notion of revolution, for science studies experts as well as scientists themselves know that scientific and technological innovation can be extremely nonlinear in the sense that a seemingly small, rather ordinary development may eventually open up an entire new domain of research problems or a powerful new approach. Consider Planck's semi-classical derivation of the empirical blackbody radiation law in 1900, which, under successively deeper theoretical derivations by others over the next two and a half decades became a pillar of the revolutionary quantum theory. As Kuhn (1978) shows, despite the flood of later attributions to Planck, it is surprisingly difficult on historical and philosophical grounds to justify the claim that he either was, or saw himself as, a revolutionary in 1900 and for many years thereafter. (Kuhn 2000b offers a short summary.) Robert Olby (1985) defended a similar claim about Mendel's alleged discovery of Mendelian inheritance.
These examples suggest that Cohen's account of revolution places too much weight on the intentions of the generators. In the last analysis, many would agree, revolution, like speciation in biology, is a retrospective judgment, a judgment of eventual consequences (Nickles (2006a, 2008a), not something that is always directly observable as such in its initial phases. On the other hand, a counterintuitive implication of this consequentialist view of revolutions is that there can be revolution without revolt (assuming that revolt is a deliberate course of action). At least the generators of the revolutionary line of research need not regard themselves as revolutionaries.
A related point is that insofar as revolutions are highly nonlinear, it is difficult to ascribe to them any particular reason or cause, for the triggering events represent quite ordinary work that, by good fortune, opens up new vistas for exploration. A small cause may have an enormous effect. To be sure, the state of the relevant scientific system must be such that the events do function as triggers, but we need not expect that such a system always be readily identifiable as one in crisis in Kuhn's sense. Rather, the highly nonlinear revolutionary developments can be regarded as statistical fluctuations out of a “noisy” background of ordinary work. On this view it is a mistake to think that explaining revolutions requires locating a momentous breakthrough.
Having tiptoed around and through Kuhn's early conception of scientific revolutions, it is time that we confront it squarely. A full Kuhnian revolution, as expounded in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (Structure, hereafter), requires a simultaneous discontinuity at four distinct levels: (1) the most basic perceptual experience or “sense data” of the scientific practitioners involved, (2) factual claims about the world, both theoretical and experimental-observational; (3) values and standards for good research; and (4) the goals of that branch of science. Underlying all of these is a basic linguistic discontinuity (and, in a sense, a prelinguistic discontinuity), and their product is a socio-cultural discontinuity. A revolution is holistic and noncumulative: it cannot be achieved piecemeal (Kuhn 2000b, 28). The overall result of Kuhn's account of both revolutionary and normal science is not only a rejection of key tenets of the positivist conception of knowledge and inquiry but also the most thoroughgoing attack on the Cartesian approach to philosophy since Wittgenstein and Ryle.
It was, of course, Kuhn's work that popularized the terms ‘scientific revolution’, ‘incommensurability’, ‘normal science’ under a ‘paradigm’ and revolutionary science as ‘paradigm change’, or ‘paradigm shift’, terms that now pervade business and political rhetoric as well as academic discourse. His most radical account of scientific revolutions occurs in the original edition of Structure. Most commentators agree that, in response to criticism, Kuhn soon backtracked toward a somewhat more conventional view of scientific progress, beginning with the “Postscript” to the second edition. In his later years, he reformulated his case for incommensurable paradigm change in linguistic rather than historical or evaluative terms (Horwich 1993, Kuhn 2000a). James Conant and John Haugeland are editing for publication Kuhn's incomplete final book draft. Although some authors regard this late work as a significant contribution to cognitive science as well as to philosophy of science (see especially Andersen 2001, Nersessian 2003, 2008; Barker, Chen, and Andersen 2003; and Andersen, Barker, and Chen 2006), it is Structure that has made by far the greatest impact. The late work provides a distinctly less revolutionary account of revolutions. Accordingly, this article will focus on Kuhn's early work and deal only briefly with later work on incommensurability. It is also important to keep in mind that Kuhn himself was attempting to foment a revolution at the metalevel, that is, at the level of history and philosophy of science and of epistemology generally. This intent is signaled by the famous opening sentence of Structure: “History, if viewed as a repository for more than anecdote or chronology, could provide a decisive transformation in the image of science by which we are now possessed.”
Kuhn's first book, The Copernican Revolution (1957), demonstrated his early interest in revolutions. This work and a prior, personal experience provided models for his further work on revolutions, although historian Robert Westman (1994) notes how tame is the revolution idea in The Copernican Revolution. The personal experience, often retold by Kuhn, is this. While teaching early history of science at Harvard, he struggled to make sense of Aristotle's treatment of natural phenomena. One hot summer's day, he experienced an epiphany in which everything came together, with the once strange claims now making sense and the initially sensible passages now meaning something different than before. The materials had reorganized themselves into a more fully intelligible and coherent form but one more distant from modern conceptions of motion and other forms of change. The hermeneutic lesson Kuhn drew from this experience was, when dealing with distant texts and practices, the need to focus on the strange rather than the seemingly familiar. Hence his habit, in dealing with scientific change, to emphasize differences, to draw sharp contrasts—to the point of exaggeration, his critics say. Significantly, this experience also led Kuhn to conclude that scientific practitioners from Aristotle forward had, in effect, to bridge this widened conceptual gulf—to accomplish in the forward direction what he, as a competent historian, had succeeded in doing in reverse, but “with no text but nature to guide them” (2000b, 15). This insight into the nature of deep conceptual change served Kuhn well, but he carried over characteristics of his psychological experience to his account of scientific revolutions as something sudden, affecting many practitioners in the manner of a Gestalt switch or a religious conversion. He later abandoned this overly episodic and perceptual account of revolutions. Kuhn (1983) already acknowledged that things look more revolutionary to the historian jumping across the centuries (as he had done, from Aristotle to Galileo and Newton) than to a natural scientist or philosopher such as Galileo, working in smaller conceptual and practical increments, in this case from late impetus theory to his own mature conception of motion. This remark raises the question whether all attributions of revolution result from telescoping the detailed developments.
Although Kuhn's account of revolutions has attracted the lion's share of the attention, Kuhn himself would have us apply the above-mentioned hermeneutic strategy to normal science as he describes it—by far the greater part of scientific work but, remarkably, a part that had gone largely unrecognized in previous philosophical accounts. The idea is that, once we understand normal science, revolution will take on new meaning (2000b). Besides, against the background of Popper's “method of conjectures and refutations” and other versions of the hypothetico-deductive method, it is stasis, the long-term periods of stability, that most need explaining (Nickles 2003b). This article therefore devotes attention to normal science as well as to revolution.
According to Kuhn the overall pattern of scientific inquiry, at least in the mature natural sciences, is this. A loosely characterized field of inquiry becomes a mature science when it achieves a paradigm that defines what it is to do “normal science.” Normal science under a paradigm is the normal state of a science and of the community of researchers who constitute it. Normal science is convergent rather than divergent: it actively discourages revolutionary initiatives and essentially novel discoveries. Normal research is so detailed and focused that it is bound to turn up anomalous experimental and theoretical results, some of which will long resist the best attempts to resolve them. As practitioners lose confidence in the paradigm as a secure guide to research, crisis sets in. Relative to normal science, crisis periods are pathological. Scientists can now propose significant alternatives to the reigning paradigm. Should one of these abnormal, previously illegal, even crazy-looking approaches convince enough community leaders that it is the way of the future, a paradigm battle breaks out. Should the revolutionaries win, they will have achieved a paradigm change and accomplished a scientific revolution. While normal scientific work is highly cumulative, acquiring a new paradigm is a noncumulative scientific change, a rupture, a break from the past. This is true both for the first acquisition of a paradigm by a maturing field and for paradigm change within an already mature field.
Physicist Stephen Weinberg (2001) observes that Kuhn's overall model is still, in a sense, cyclic: normal science under a paradigm, then crisis, then revolution, then a new paradigm—and back to normal science. At this abstract level of description it is indeed cyclic, but of course the new paradigm heads the science in question in a new direction rather than by returning it to a previous state. Kuhn did not think his model cyclic: he insisted that it was progressive relative to previous work although not toward any final truth about the universe. Others have regarded Kuhn's mechanism as dialectical (as in the succession of revolutions in the theory of light from a Newtonian particle theory to a wave theory to a new kind of Einsteinian particle theory).
In chapters II and III of Structure, Kuhn characterized paradigms in two different ways. In the first place they are concrete, problem-formulating and solving achievements, sufficiently impressive to attract an enduring group of adherents away from competing modes of scientific investigation yet sufficiently open-ended to define further problems or puzzles for the reorganized group of practitioners to resolve. Second is a still more sociological characterization of paradigms. They provide a “shared framework” that accounts for “the ease, fulness [sic], and directness of communication within a scientific community” and “the unanimity of professional agreement” within that community. Yet, as he often stated, this is not the same as a consensus set of beliefs about the meaning of the postulated laws or theories. In his final extensive interview (Baltas et al. 2000), he discussed “paradigms as models” as replacements for consensus and went so far as to say, “a paradigm is what you use when the theory isn't there” (2000d). Kuhn held a similar view in the 1960s, on the basis of historical evidence of scientists’ disagreement about such matters but also on the basis of W. V. Quine's rejection of the analytic-synthetic distinction. One scientist's law of nature may be another's definition.
In “Postscript” Kuhn recognized that he had been using the term ‘paradigm’ in several distinct ways. There he distinguished two senses of ‘paradigm’. In the large sense a paradigm is a “disciplinary matrix” that both defines the bounds of intelligibility of the enterprise and provides specific guidance by virtue of including (a) key symbolic or word generalizations such as Newton's F = ma, (b) metaphysical commitments expressed in terms of preferred analogies or models for parsing or taxonomizing the domain of reality being studied, (c) the methodological values that characterize the ethos of that particular scientific community, and (d) exemplars. Exemplars are the aforementioned concrete individual problem solutions that become the models for future work. They are paradigms in the small sense, which Kuhn identifies as the primary meaning of ‘paradigm’. Exemplars are the positive core, the particularly instructive achievements, upon which future science builds.
Kuhn's account of science abandons traditional confirmation theory, which focuses on the past, the predictive track record of theories. What are more important to working scientists are future prospects, the expected fertility of the paradigm (Nickles 203b, 206b). The promise that a paradigm holds for the scientists working within it is that the set of exemplars, in various combinations (potentially a sort of “basis set,” as we might think of them), is sufficient to both define and solve the remaining puzzles of that domain. Just as people are confident that crossword puzzles have a solution that can be found using familiar resources already available, so the Kuhnian normal scientist trusts the paradigm. The power of exemplars for working scientists is not merely their own reputed correctness as problem solutions but their power to guide future research. A once fruitful but now sterile exemplar is no help.
Normal science consists of puzzle solving, a highly regimented, cumulative enterprise in which the discipline arises not from external enforcement of methodological rules or even consensual agreement on the intellectual meaning of substantive theoretical principles but instead from tacit expertise deriving from a socially acquired cognitive “similarity relation” learned over years of practice in modeling problem solutions on those taken by the community to be exemplary. These shared understandings enable normal scientists to focus on the most esoteric “puzzles” at the frontier of research and to worry about even tiny quantitative discrepancies from anticipated results. There is a constitutive relationship between puzzles and paradigms. Normal research puzzles in Kuhn's sense do not exist except within the framework or culture of a paradigm. Puzzles are not context-free problems.
Kuhn conceived normal science as a craft, the purpose of which is to articulate the paradigm. Normal scientists work under only one paradigm: there is no competition. Normal scientists belong to closed, conservative communities of practitioners that resemble medieval guilds more than relatively undisciplined, democratic, Enlightened, Popperian open societies. Whereas Popper and the logical empiricists, like most Anglo-American philosophers, are children of Descartes' method of doubt, a Kuhnian research community is so deeply committed to the rectitude of its dogmas and practices that it can be said to follow something like the medieval way of belief. A third difference from Popper's learning theory—the view that “we learn from our mistakes”—is that, for Kuhn, we learn from our successes, namely, by learning how to apply the lessons of exemplary problem solutions to new research puzzles. Contrary to Popper, the defining assumptions of the normal scientific enterprise are so deeply taken for granted that they are not submitted to empirical test. Far from empirical testing being the mark of the rational, scientific spirit, said Kuhn, putting the paradigm framework to the test would threaten the entire enterprise: “to turn Sir Karl's [Popper's] view on its head, it is precisely the abandonment of critical discourse that marks the transition to a science” (Kuhn 1970b, 6).
Normal science under a paradigm was Kuhn's attempt to solve the problem of social order within mature scientific communities (Barnes 1982, 2003). Popperian critical communities, such as are found in many branches of the social and behavioral sciences as well as in philosophy, lack this solidarity. This is what struck Kuhn while he spent a fellowship year at the Center for Advanced Study in the Behavioral Sciences at Stanford. Kuhn found it a startling contrast with the physics communities in which he had been educated that even the world's best social scientists disagreed fundamentally with one another. He set out to discover what it was that the mature sciences possessed that social scientists and philosophers lacked. Rather than assume, with Popper, that non-revolutionary science was simply a period in which the practitioners ran out of bold new ideas, Kuhn said it was during revolutionary periods in which scientific work broke down.
Although in one sense science puts a premium on innovation, essential innovation of the Popperian kind has no place in normal science, according to Kuhn.
Perhaps the most striking feature of … normal research problems … is how little they aim to produce major novelties, conceptual or phenomenal. Sometimes, as in a wave-length measurement, everything but the most esoteric detail of the result is known in advance, and the typical latitude of expectation is only somewhat wider. [Kuhn 1970a, 35]
Unexpected discoveries such as Wilhelm Roentgen's discovery of X-rays in 1895 are disruptive because they undermine confidence that the paradigm provides the correct take on the world. They threaten the solidarity of the community. Such discoveries provoke at least mini-crises. One might therefore think that their resolution, even within the terms of the reigning paradigm, are like mini-revolutions in that they at least change the perspective or expectations for that paradigm. However, Kuhn only hints at these ideas without pursuing them.
So is major innovation, including unexpected discovery, endogenous or exogenous to the functioning of Kuhnian normal science? It depends on one's point of view. From the point of view of the normal scientist, it is an exogenous factor—an unintended consequence of purposive normal scientific work. But from Kuhn's own (and his readers') point of view, observing the entire process from above, or outside, major innovations are precisely what we should expect normal scientific practice eventually to generate. For all paradigms, owing to their conditions of origin and maintenance, can be expected to contain an element of arbitrariness, an element of historical and personal contingency. It is extraordinarily improbable that such a framework will hold up permanently under the stringency of normal research. Precisely because normal science is so focused on esoteric details, it is bound to turn up the unexpected, a path that eventually will lead to the exceedingly rapid change of crisis and revolution. Just as the fastest way to Carnegie Hall is slow practice, in the musicians' joke, it turns out that painstakingly detailed normal science is the fastest route to revolutionary innovation.
The accumulation of anomalous results that even the best practitioners cannot resolve eventually undermines confidence in the paradigm and leads to crisis. The unresolved research puzzles become problems whose structure is uncertain. Now a wider sort of random trial and error, somewhat closer to the Popperian model, becomes possible, even necessary, in the minds of bolder scientists. For Kuhn's “essential tension” between tradition and innovation has shifted away from tradition in the direction of innovation (Kuhn 1977, chap. 9). Occasionally, scientists find a resolution within the old paradigm. If no way out is found, either old or new, the problem may be set aside as intractable, at least for the time being, as happened with efforts to find a classical mechanism for Newtonian gravitation. The third possibility is that a radical new approach handles the problem and promises much more. It succeeds in attracting a group of followers who amplify these early successes into a new paradigm that competes for allegiance with the old one. Paradigm change is noncumulative. Advocates of the new approach now consider some previous experimental and theoretical practices out of date or even pointless, and some former problem solutions are lost (commonly called “Kuhn loss”). Presumably, something is also gained by the abrupt change in direction, but it has been more difficult for Kuhn and his sympathizers to say exactly what that is.
Both Kuhn and Feyerabend pointed out serious difficulties in the traditional view that later theories within a field reduce (or reduce to) earlier ones in a smooth enough manner to regard science as a cumulative enterprise, namely by direct logical or mathematical derivation. They highlighted two fatal difficulties. One became known as “the meaning change objection.” Although Einstein's special theory of relativity goes over, syntactically, to classical mechanics in the limit of low velocities, Kuhn argued (1962, 101), the meaning and/or reference of crucial terms such as ‘mass’ has now changed. The ontology of the two paradigms is quite different. For example, Newtonian mass is an absolute quantity, whereas relativistic mass is a function of velocity. To claim a logical derivation is to commit a fallacy of equivocation. Second, while the scope of the later theory is typically greater than that of the earlier, rarely does the later theory completely overlap the former. Usually, some puzzles previously solved become unsolved in the new dispensation, the aforementioned Kuhn loss. Other writers soon demonstrated that the relations between theories are typically far more complex than Nagel's standard account of reduction allowed (Nagel 1961, chap.11; Batterman 2001).
Kuhn himself made a somewhat related criticism of deductivist or derivationist accounts of scientific work in “Postscript.” There his point was that particular puzzle solutions in mechanics, say the equations describing the behavior of coupled pendula, cannot be simply deduced from Newton's laws, which provide only schemata. Physical content enters from the bottom, by modeling on exemplars at the same level, Kuhn said. It is not already wholly contained in the highest principles, from which it can trickle down to phenomenal laws and applications, as the deductive models of theories and explanation maintain. (This sort of viewpoint would later be thoroughly developed by Nancy Cartwright (1983 and later works) and Ronald Giere (1988 and after), to name two of the most prominent.)
For Kuhn, incommensurability was the key indicator of revolutionary breaks, a view he maintained to the end even as he attenuated the normal-revolutionary distinction. Why are Kuhnian revolutions so intellectually violent? Because they simultaneously disrupt all four (or six) levels of scientific investigation listed at the beginning of §3. There is lack of a common measure regarding observation, theoretical understanding, standards, and goals. First, observation is so theory laden that people working in competing paradigms can disagree even about the basic observational data—a direct challenge to the neutral observation language of logical empiricism. Second, the terms of one theory cannot even be translated into those of the other, which, for the early Kuhn, entailed (and explained) communication failure. The two sides cannot even understand one another, let alone competently evaluate each other's work. Even worse, the two sides disagree on the very goals of the enterprise and on standards of success and of good research, including which problems are most important or even genuine (cf. Doppelt 1978). This point signals Kuhn's strong rejection of the traditional idea that method or practical technique is independent of substantive content. The upshot is that the two sides simply talk past one another and justification becomes so internal to their respective paradigms as to become circular with respect to the disagreements in question. The only way for a practitioner to pass from one paradigm to another is through a kind of intellectual and emotional transformation brought on by powerful rhetorical persuasion. “Like the choice between political institutions, that between competing paradigms proves to be a choice between incompatible modes of community life” (1970, 94).
In his original account, Kuhn made the sensational claims that scientific revolution resembles political revolution and that paradigm change possesses some features of religious conversion. Scientists converted to the new paradigm have such a different cognitive take on the world of their specialty areas that those on different sides of a paradigm debate, in some sense that he could not fully articulate, “live in different worlds” (1970, chap. X and “Postscript”). That is Kuhn's most radical claim. Paradigms are not only constitutive of science; in a sense, “they are constitutive of nature as well” (1970, 110). To the end Kuhn insisted, in a kind of McLuhanesque manner, that our basic vocabulary, our lexicon, taxonomizes the world in such a way that we cannot sharply separate a language (as a supposedly neutral medium) from what can be said and thought in the language. Scientific language is “double-faced” (2000b, 31). To some degree, the medium is the message.
Although Kuhn shunned traditional talk of methodological rules (Structure, chap. V), the slack is more than taken up by his strong emphasis on practices and (particularly) on the mutual understandings and expectations that Polanyi called “tacit knowledge” (Polanyi 1958). In this broadened sense, the knowing-how or methodological culture is more important than ever. A Kuhnian paradigm change is more profound than the failure of a successor theory to reduce (to) its predecessor. Kuhn's central idea is that a revolutionary replacement of one disciplinary matrix (a paradigm in the large sense) by another changes the constitutive basis of a science, the defining matrix. Subjectively, this amounts to a cognitive restructuring, a transformation in the learned, cognitive “similarity relations” by which scientists parse their domains of problems and natural processes. In the key section of Personal Knowledge on “The Tacit Component,” specially, the chapter on “intellectual passions,” Polanyi already spoke of the kind of passionate commitment to scientific world views that Kuhn would later feature—and of the “logical gaps” between such views and the need for rhetorical persuasion with heuristic power to bridge them.
Such an acceptance is a heuristic process, a self-modifying act, and to this extent a conversion. It produces disciples forming a school, the members of which are separated for the time being by a logical gap from those outside it. They think differently, speak a different language, live in a different world, and at least one of the two schools is excluded to this extent for the time being (whether rightly or wrongly) from the community of science…. Demonstration must be supplemented, therefore, by forms of persuasion which can induce a conversion. The refusal to enter on the opponent's way of arguing must be justified by making it appear altogether unreasonable. [1958, 151]
Kuhn is also indebted to Wittgenstein, early (“The limits of my language are the limits of my world,” 1922, 148) and late (on language games and forms of life). (See Harris's introduction to his (2005) for Kuhn in relation to Wittgenstein, Polanyi, Feyerabend, and others.)
In Structure and the articles that followed, Kuhn emphasized that scientific data plus logic do not determine major theory choice. Given the several dimensions of Kuhnian incommensurability, his claim more deeply challenged traditional ideas of scientific objectivity and rationality than did standard treatments of the problem of underdetermination of theory by fact, treatments based on versions of the problem of induction and the Duhem-Quine problem (Quine 1951).
Change at the level of exemplars also provides a valuable insight into the nature of revolutions. Changes in the set of exemplars (paradigms in the small sense), in the working basis set of solved problems, imply changes in goals and standards as well as in factual claims. Exemplars are more than “factual” problem solutions: as models or ideals they have powerful normative and directive force. They declare, in effect, “This is the way science should be done in this field!” The change in exemplars draws attention away from some old domains of problems and practices and toward new ones. Accordingly, Kuhn claimed, the two paradigms cannot be rationally evaluated in the traditional way by comparison against the same set of standards. Practitioners modeling their work on conflicting sets of exemplars will disagree fundamentally about the future direction of research. Again, there is no common measure. We shall return to incommensurability below.
The final chapters of Structure can be summarized briefly. Kuhn argued that occasional revolutions are inevitable, necessary. This view ran directly counter to that of traditional empiricism. Here is the experimental physicist and Nobel laureate Percy Bridgman, a founder of operationism, insisting that scientific revolutions are not necessary:
We should now make it our business to understand so thoroughly the character of our permanent mental relations to nature that another change in our attitude, such as that due to Einstein, shall be forever impossible. It was perhaps excusable that a revolution in mental attitude should occur once, because after all physics is a young science, and physicists have been very busy, but it would certainly be a reproach if such a revolution should ever prove necessary again. [1927, 2]
Bridgman deplored the fact that the method of operational definition was not employed properly to define simultaneity at the very beginning of Newtonian physics!
If there have been so many revolutions, then why has the world had to wait for Kuhn to see them? Because, he said, they are largely invisible. After a revolution, the winners rewrite the history of science to make it look as if the present paradigm is the brilliant but rational sequel to previous work. The implication is that only someone of Kuhn's historical sensitivity could be expected to notice this. Indeed, in his large book on the history of the early quantum theory, as noted above, Kuhn moved the origin of the quantum theory revolution from Planck in 1900 five years forward to Einstein and Ehrenfest (Kuhn 1978). Revisionist historiography, he claimed, had smoothed out the actual history by crediting Planck with a solution that he actually rejected at the time to a problem that he did not then have—and by diminishing the truly radical contribution of Einstein. Working in a new framework and problem context that included what Ehrenfest called “the ultraviolet catastrophe,” Einstein postulated the existence of free quanta for the first time. In fact it was Einstein and Ehrenfest's bold move that most of the physics community rejected for several years.
While Kuhn does make an important historical point, he seems to assume, with Cohen, that revolutions can only be started by self-conscious revolutionaries doing extraordinarily bold things—that revolutions are linear in the sense that big effects require big causes. Nickles (1998, 2008a and b) argues that revolutions can be highly nonlinear, with normal work turning out, inadvertently, to lead to revolutions by mechanisms other than Kuhn's account of anomalies leading to self-conscious crises.
Kuhn's chapter XIII, “Progress through Revolutions,” is controversial, since Kuhn seemed to many readers to have removed all the usual bases for evaluating progress. Kuhn proposed an evolutionary analogy (discussed below) in which a revolution corresponds to something like biological macroevolution. Like Darwin, he rejected the idea that this evolution was drawn toward an overall terminus or telos such as the truth about the world.
As noted, the failure of the standard model of theory reduction already challenged the supposed temporal unity, or continuity, of science. However, these failures fell short of the radical discontinuity claims of Kuhn and (to a lesser extent) Feyerabend. Kuhn challenged the common supposition that the mature sciences are getting closer to a correct account of reality. Once we recognize that our own position in history is not absolutely privileged, anymore than Aristotle's or Newton's was, we confront the prospect—no, the likelihood— that future revolutions will once again disclose that we live in a world quite different from what today's best science tells us. There is no reason, given the prospect of endless future revolutions, to believe that scientific claims are converging on the truth about reality.
The scope of Kuhn's account has always been somewhat unclear. He sometimes appeared to be making a claim about all mature scientific revolutions: “the successive transition from one paradigm to another via revolution is the usual developmental pattern of mature science” (1970, 12). But then (just three pages later) he excludes from his account sciences “like biochemistry, that arose from division and recombination of specialties already matured” (1970, 15). §§5 and 6 return to the question of scope.
Wholly apart from the question of whether it is right or wrong, there is considerable disagreement about how to interpret Kuhn's own account of scientific revolution (Shapere 1964, 1984; Lakatos and Musgrave 1970; Toulmin 1972, Hoyningen-Huene 1993; Bird 2000; Fuller 2000; Andersen 2001; Sharrock and Read 2002). For one thing, his account was part of a broader and deeper and better-motivated attack on the Cartesian tradition in epistemology than most commentators realized. For another, his original use of ‘paradigm’ was notoriously problematic as Kuhn agreed already in his “Postscript” to the second edition. Most commentators agree that his account in the original, 1962 edition of Structure was more radical than the softened version that appeared in “Postscript” and in other articles in which Kuhn responded to the initial wave of philosophical criticisms, some of which are mentioned below. The consensus is that Kuhn retreated substantially from the most radical passages of Structure. Again, Kuhn himself acknowledged some degree of retreat in the 1983 PSA symposium with Philip Kitcher and Mary Hesse (Kuhn 1983) and in later work and interviews.
Many have treated paradigms as large theoretical units—super-theories cum research programs—whereas others have noted that Kuhn was one of the first philosophers to emphasize the importance of scientific practices, most of which proceed on the basis of acquired expertise rather than explicit methodological rules. Although much of Kuhn's discourse is theory-centered, Joseph Rouse (2002, 2003) shows that there is a consistent interpretation of both normal science and revolutions in terms of scientific practices. A strong hint of this is found in Kuhn's frequent choice of the phrase ‘scientific practitioner’.
Other construals of what Kuhn was after are glossed below.
The philosophical reaction to The Structure of Scientific Revolutions has gone through three major phases. First was a wave of angry criticism by the very philosophers whom Kuhn hoped to convince. Philosophy was always his first love. Second was a quieter period of accommodating some of Kuhn's insights—or ignoring them. Third is a (still ongoing) revival of interest in Kuhn's work, sometimes from unexpected quarters. On the one hand, however, general, one-track models of science and big “stage” theories of scientific change have fallen out of favor. On the other hand, nowadays the field is more open to the social, naturalistic, pragmatic, non-representational and other non-Cartesian conceptions of inquiry that Kuhn's early work invited.
Meanwhile, historians of science showed no special interest in Kuhn's philosophical theses. Kuhn himself frequently said that he kept his historical work and his philosophical work separate (Kuhn 1977). Already during the 1960s, history of science was beginning to turn away from the internalist sort of intellectual history that Kuhn did, by attempting, as he said, to “get inside the heads” of leading investigators. (However, Kuhn had done as much as anyone to bring together internalist and externalist considerations). Many social scientists flocked to Kuhn's work during the early years, hoping that it would show them how to achieve mature scientific status under a paradigm. To Kuhn's chagrin, even the business and political communities soon expropriated talk of paradigms and paradigm-shifts. Many humanists found Kuhn's views attractive, for Kuhn's work humanized even the hard sciences and promised to narrow the gap between C. P. Snow's “two cultures”. (However, as Robert Westman (1994) points out, Kuhn's emphasis on discontinuity even within the scientific community reinstated the cultures distinction with a vengeance.) Postmodernists relished his attack on Enlightenment ideals of rationality, objectivity, foundationism, and scientism. Neo-pragmatist Richard Rorty credited Kuhn with establishing that interpretation was just as important in the natural sciences as in literary contexts and also with developing an attractive non-representational account of the sciences, one that did not pretend that the sciences are converging on the unique truth about the universe as expressed in nature's own language (Rorty 1979, 1982, 2000). To that widely-read observer of, and contributor to, the passing philosophical scene, Kuhn had indeed achieved his life's goal of working a philosophical revolution! And that revolution, too, was intended to be transformational rather than a change in content. For as Kuhn had remarked in the Preface to Structure, “Since my most fundamental objective is to urge a change in the perception and evaluation of familiar data, the schematic character of this first presentation need be no drawback.”
What was the nature of the initial philosophical resistance to Structure? In the early, important collection of Lakatos and Musgrave (1970) deriving from a London conference some years before, Popper admitted the existence of normal science but deplored it and later attacked “the myth of the framework” (Popper 1995). In the same volume Lakatos described Kuhn's account of the resolution of paradigm debates in revolutionary science as irrational “mob psychology” and launched his own “methodology of scientific research programmes.” Meanwhile, Dudley Shapere (1964, 1984) had criticized Kuhn on paradigms, holistic philosophy of language, revolutions, and relativism; and Israel Scheffler (1967) had contended that Kuhn's account reduced science to a thoroughly subjective, irrationalist, relativist, and anti-realist enterprise. Toulmin (1972) countered Kuhn's stage theory of scientific development, with its alternating, sharply delimited normal and revolutionary phases, with a gradualist, evolutionary model of scientific development, arguing that it was Kuhn's tacit commitment to a positivist conception of rationality as logicality, that is, to rigid consistency and derivability within a fixed logical system, that forced him to introduce revolutions as the only way to break free of said system.
Nearly everyone rejected Kuhnian claims for incommensurability. There was, of course, the outrage about its implications for rationality, objectivity, and progress toward truth. A more specific criticism was that Kuhn's own, illuminating historical accounts of Aristotle, Ptolemy, and so on, undermined his claims for incommensurability. Ironically, the better he explained the conceptual differences, the more convincingly he showed that communication across revolutionary divides was possible. His success as a historian undermined his own philosophical account! Another common objection was that if two paradigms were incommensurable, they could not be logically incompatible and hence could not even be considered competitors (as if logical incompatibility were a necessary condition for epistemic competition). Many critics attacked Kuhn's holistic theory of meaning and/or reference, some contending that he had retained the meaning holism of some of the logical empiricists. Donald Davidson (1974) argued that the very idea of a conceptual scheme (scheme versus content) is incoherent, and talk of alternative conceptual schemes more so.
Dismayed by the criticism, Kuhn replied that he was no relativist, subjectivist, irrationalist, or anti-progressivist; that, on the contrary, his point was precisely that the historical and logical evidence showed that new conceptions of objectivity and rationality and progress are needed—and that he was attempting to provide them. He intended for his own account of science to demonstrate the virtue of importing interpretive resources beyond simple logical relations and a rather simple empiricist epistemology.
Despite the rough reception of Structure, in the longer run Kuhn's work arguably did more than anyone's to encourage empirically responsible, naturalistic approaches to epistemology and to diminish the influence of both the logical empiricists and Popper while (more locally) helping Lakatos supplant Popper as the leading light of the London School of Economics. Lakatos's “methodology of scientific research programmes” was a kind of compromise between Popper and Kuhn, although deriving also from his long interest in research programs in mathematics.
The upshot of the first phase of the reception of Kuhn's book was that it, more than anything else, sparked the exciting Battle of the Big Systems, that is, the competition among several general theories of scientific change, as contending methodologists of science attempted to come to terms with history of science, with deep conceptual change, and with the limitations of symbolic logic as a canonical language for philosophy of science. An institutional consequence of these developments was the emergence of several university departments of history and philosophy of science.
The second phase (roughly, the early 1970s through the 1980s) took seriously into account Kuhn's “Postscript” and articles in which he clarified and somewhat retreated from some of the boldest passages in Structure while further developing his epistemological position. By now several leading thinkers were accommodating some of Kuhn's insights while rejecting other Kuhnian moves. Larry Laudan's Progress and Its Problems (1979) sharply disagreed with Kuhn while incorporating an idea of “research traditions” inspired by Kuhnian paradigms and Lakatosian research programs as larger historical units of and for analysis. Laudan (1984) further articulated a pragmatic, problem-solving approach to understanding scientific work and agreed that there could be sharp changes in factual claims, methodology, and goals; but he denied Kuhn's claim that these ever happened simultaneously. Meanwhile, Harold Brown (1977) promoted Kuhn's epistemological ideas. And it was Kuhn's work as much as anything that suggested to the new-wave sociologists of science how to develop a sociology of science that was internalist (taking account of the technical content of science) as well as externalist, and eventually to blur or eliminate the internal/external distinction. It was these science studies disciplines (mainly history and sociology of science) that filled the “process of discovery gap” left by traditional philosophical accounts. Traditional philosophers of science had been happy to leave the so-called discovery process to historians, psychologists, and sociologists (who seemed to them not to be doing epistemology at all). But the science studies movement can be viewed as a low-end disruption of the epistemological marketplace of ideas (§6 and Nickles 2008a), a development that is by now high-end. Institutionally, some of the relatively new history and philosophy of science departments and programs (including Kuhn's own at Princeton) mutated into history and sociology of science programs, and new departments and programs in science, technology, and society emerged at many universities in the United Kingdom, on the Continent, and in America.
During this second phase, Kuhn's book was a major factor in the emergence of the new social studies of science in the form of the Edinburgh Strong Program, the Bath relativist school's study of controversies that are still open, and laboratory life studies of detailed normal scientific practice, to mention the three most influential early approaches. They saw his work as opening the door precisely to social constructivist factors internal to the technical development of the sciences. And the goal of some of them was to supersede philosophical accounts of science and of epistemology more generally, on the grounds that the philosophers talked the talk of empiricism but paid surprisingly little attention to what scientists actually do. (Publications representative of the early Edinburgh Strong Programme, Harry Collins' relativist programme at Bath, and laboratory life studies, respectively, are Bloor (1976), the special issue of Social Studies of Science (11, No. 1, 1981) edited by Collins and featuring studies of still-open controversies, Latour and Woolgar (1979), and Knorr-Cetina (1981).) These developments provoked a conservative philosophical reaction against the radical claims of the sociologists, Kuhn himself being among their detractors. (The strong focus on philosophers on problems of scientific realism was a central feature of this reaction.) The new social constructivism, feminist critiques of science, ongoing criticism of Kuhn's views, their sloppy application by outsiders, and the wider cultural unease caused by the Vietnam War helped to ignite the so-called Science Wars that pitted neo-Enlightenment epistemological realists against the social constructivists and other postmodernists, who often contended, in a relativist or constructivist debunking mode, that the sciences had no more cultural authority than any other human endeavor.
We can conveniently date the third phase of Kuhn's reception from Paul Hoyningen-Huene's thorough, authorized explication of Structure, published in 1993, Paul Horwich's Kuhn Festschrift of the same year, and Kuhn's death in 1996, followed by a collection of his last essays (Kuhn 2000). This period to the present has experienced a general rise in Kuhn's philosophical reputation and a quieting of the Science Wars on the intellectual if not always on the American political front. During this period, many philosophers have gravitated toward more flexible pragmatic and naturalistic positions, while, at the same time, the new science studies disciplines have become academically established and less radical. The emergence of philosophy of biology and philosophy of cognitive science during the latter two phases has made more apparent than ever the diversity of the sciences and has dampened enthusiasm for the big, general methodologies of the Big Systems era. During this time the fields of history of science and philosophy of science have drifted apart into a kind of disciplinary incommensurability. Surprisingly, in his later years Kuhn himself denied that history was key to his position (cf. Kindi 1995). In a sense he now emphasized the a priori side of his neo-neo-Kantianism rather than relying heavily upon historical facts. After his move to MIT he came to prefer linguistic analysis.
Many insightful books and articles dealing with Kuhn's work have appeared since 1993, including Sankey (1994, 1997), Friedman (2001), Bird (2001), Andersen (2001), Sharrock and Read (2002), Nickles (2003a), Harris (2005), and Preston (2008). Although specific Kuhnian claims and arguments remain controversial (and Fuller 2000 is a decidedly negative appraisal of Kuhn's career), he is now widely regarded as the most significant philosopher of science at least since World War II. Richard Rorty (2000) pronounced him the most important philosopher (full stop) during that period.
Michael Friedman (2001, 2003) makes one of the most important contributions to the ongoing paradigm debate, in locating Kuhn within a tradition that goes back to Kant but that, surprisingly, includes Moritz Schlick, Hans Reichenbach, and Rudolf Carnap, three founders of modern logical empiricism. (Although it is widely thought that it was Kuhn who killed logical empiricism (rather than Popper, who eagerly confessed to the crime), George Reisch (1991) called attention to the letter in which Carnap, as editor of the logical empiricist book series in which Structure was published, accepted Kuhn's proposal with enthusiasm, as fitting into his own view of science.) Friedman shows how Kuhn's treatment of normal science under a paradigm can be interpreted as a further development of Reichenbach's neo-Kantian idea of a relativized yet constitutive a priori.
Contrary to the blurring action of Toulmin, Laudan, and other critics, Friedman restores the profound distinction between normal and revolutionary science and defends Kuhn's emphasis on tight conceptual systems—socio-cognitive and mathematical systems that it takes a revolution to alter significantly. ‘Revolution’ regains its status as a contrast term to ‘normal science’. Writes Friedman, “A constitutive framework thus defines the space of empirical possibilities (statements that can be empirically true or false)” (p. 84). Such frameworks answer the Kantian “how possibly” questions of the type: How is it possible to do gravitational theory in terms of non-Euclidean mathematics? Friedman's work also exemplifies the current effort, in various quarters, to provide defensible, non-relativist accounts of scientific rationality, objectivity, and progress of roughly the kind that Kuhn sought. The early attacks on Kuhn's account of science have largely given way to such attempts to find new, trans-revolutionary conceptions of rationality and progress.
Friedman agrees that Kuhnian revolutions exist, his two most prominent examples being special and general relativity (which fall into one of Frieman's own specialty areas). As Friedman characterizes them, such revolutions involve changes of norms, standards, and the symbolic frameworks (crucially including the mathematics)—the very frameworks that are constitutive of intelligibility and rationality. Such frameworks define the enterprises in question and thus do far more than guide research practice: they make it possible in the first place. A revolution amounts to a “incommensurable or untranslatable” break from the previous framework, a transition to a radically different language and cultural tradition. Nonetheless, in Friedman's view, scientific revolutions are conservative, unlike political and religious revolutions that claim to wipe the slate clean. In his own partial return to Kant, Friedman employs Kuhn to defend the need for a relativized (and hence empirically contingent in the long run) but constitutive a priori against the pragmatic naturalism of W. V. Quine (1951). The switch from one constitutive framework to another marks the difference between a genuine revolution and mere empirical undermining of the Duhem-Quine variety. Pragmatic naturalism, Friedman says, must fail to capture the depth of scientific revolutions. If Friedman is right, there is something of a tension in Kuhn's work, for as Bird (2008) and others have emphasized, Kuhn's original appeal to history, psychology, and sociology and socio-cognitive modeling in place of methodological rules represented a strong strain of pragmatic naturalism at a time when philosophy of science and epistemology generally were thoroughly anti-naturalistic disciplines.
Discussion of incommensurability has become a minor industry in philosophy of science and related disciplines. (See, e.g., Hoyningen-Huene 1993; Kitcher 1993; Sankey 1994 and 1997; Favretti et al. 1999; Friedman 2001 and 2003; Barker et al. 2003; Harris (2005); and Soler et al. 2008, e.g., Teller. Khalidi (2000) is a nice summary of changes in Kuhn's view, with a discussion of his differences from Paul Feyerabend's simultaneous introduction of the term ‘incommensurable’ in his (1962).) Kuhn soon backtracked from the multidimensional conception of incommensurability in Structure, which (in some key passages, although perhaps not others) equated commensurability with translatability and, in turn, with communicability. Kuhn may have intended to break this linkage already in “Postscript,” where he still, confusingly, retained the language of translation. Kuhn (1983) definitely broke the connection by distinguishing translation from interpretation and hence from communication. He now narrowed incommensurability to literal untranslatability between paradigmatic theory complexes of key sets of terms, often just a few interrelated terms; hence, he termed it local incommensurability. Kuhn from then on dropped the other dimensions of incommensurability as exaggerated extensions of linguistic incommensurability. And he added that communication remains possible in the absence of direct translation, for people can provide interpretations of what each other means, most fully by acquiring the other's mode of speaking as a second language. (However, this would seem to conflict with Kuhn's early, ratchet view of deep conceptual change, that scientists cannot make the transition back from the new paradigm to the old.) Quine's radical translator is actually an interpreter, Kuhn said, not really a translator. Kuhn (1983) still believed that the sort of untranslatability that concerned him amounts to a break in both reference and meaning, contrary to his respondents, Mary Hesse and Philip Kitcher, who attempted to maintain continuity of reference through meaning change. And he there softened the distinction between normal science and revolutionary science.
Kitcher (1983), in the same symposium, pressed Kuhn further, arguing that Kuhnian incommensurability, in Kuhn's new sense, occurs even within normal science. If so, then Kuhn can no longer use the appearance of incommensurability to demarcate revolutionary changes. Like many other critics, Kitcher held (and continues to hold) that Kuhn's normal/revolutionary distinction is greatly exaggerated and that objective comparison of theories with their putative successors is possible. In particular, a successor theory complex typically retains some key referring capacities from its predecessor. Kitcher rejects both Fregean semantics (the distinction of sense and reference) and the causal theory of Kripke and Putnam while retaining elements of both. The central idea of his “reference potential” is that, in successful cases, scientists learn new ways of referring to natural kinds as inquiry proceeds, on the basis of new descriptions that are not synonymous with old ones. From the point of the view of the old theory, some tokenings (of “dephlogisticated air,” say) will be non-referring, whereas, in context, others will be seen as obviously referring to what we today term ‘oxygen’. Kitcher develops this view in far more detail in his The Advancement of Science (1993), where he rejects key components of the pre-Kuhnian conception of science while retaining an account of scientific objectivity, realism, and truth.
The thesis that I shall defend … is that the conceptual shifts in science that have caused most attention (and that are supposed to be troublesome) can be understood, and understood as progressive, by recognizing them as involving improvements in the reference potentials of key terms. [1993, 96]
It is worth noting that Kuhn's own later views on reference are not totally dissimilar (see, e.g., Kuhn 2000c). In his book Kitcher defends a sophisticated version of representational theoretical realism via work on Alfred Tarski's theory of truth by Hartry Field (1972) showing that, basically, truth reduces to reference, which we can hope to analyze naturalistically.
Of course, all of these issues remain controversial. For example, Shanahan (1997) develops Kuhn's 1983 claim that Kitcher's compromise ultimately fails to make sense of scientific practice when the latter is examined in the detail that historians but not many philosophers appreciate. And Stanford (2006) drives this and related points home. The toughest problem for the theoretical realist to handle, Stanford argues, is the negative historical induction confirmed by the very success of scientists in coming up, repeatedly, with conceptions and practices that could not even have been conceived at earlier times. The best scientists today have scant idea what alternatives their successors a hundred years from now will have available for consideration.
Incommensurability remains a topic of lively discussion today. (See, e.g., the thoroughgoing discussion by Sankey (1994 and 1997), by Andersen et al. (2006), and by the various authors in Soler et al. (2008)). As noted, Kuhn himself steadily retreated into lexical issues of incommensurability, and he denied in his later work that history of science was any longer particularly relevant to his project. It seems safe to say that, by itself, his later work would not have provoked the wide interest—and controversy—of his earlier work.
Kuhnian paradigms are not only larger units than theories as discussed by his predecessors such as Popper and the logical empiricists, they are also cognitively deeper. Kuhn could agree with Popper (for example) that the theories we hold can bias our perceptions, but a Popperian falsificationist can take measures to overcome this cognitive bias, whereas a Kuhnian paradigm is supposed to affect normal scientists' perception on a deeper level. In the controversial chapter X of Structure (“Revolutions as Changes in World View”), “Postscript,” and related papers, Kuhn rejected the traditional view that perceptual observation in science and daily life can be analyzed into sense data plus interpretation. Kuhn asserted that, when observing a swinging pendulum, Aristotle and Galileo did not see the same thing. It was not that they merely interpreted the phenomenon differently: their most basic visual experience was different. Kuhn felt constrained to say (problematically) that the physical stimuli are the same for both men, while insisting that the conscious sense data could be different. It was on the basis of this distinction between stimuli and data that Kuhn wanted to say that scientists on different sides of a paradigm debate live in the same physical world but nonetheless live in different worlds of experience. Here Kuhn faced a difficulty parallel to Kant's appeal to a human-independent noumenal world to which we have no articulate access. For what epistemological role could such a postulation have? Kuhn refers to physical stimuli, but, insofar as we attempt to characterize them, stimuli-as-conceived surely belong to the world of human theory and experiment, i.e., to one paradigm or another. In his late work Kuhn recasts the multiple worlds idea in terms of the evolution of science, with sciences splitting into distinct specialties, each inhabiting it own, partially socially-constructed niche (Kuhn 2000c). By now, a large science such a physics or biology or chemistry harbors many distinct subworlds. Such a view correspondingly encounters the problem of understanding how normal, cross-disciplinary research is possible (Kellert 2008).
Other philosophers and scientists have gone even further than Kuhn in positing the existence of cognitive formations that are both broad and deep. One prominent line of thought here is the neo-Kantian one up through Reichenbach and Carnap, discussed by Friedman. Another, not entirely distinct idea is that of a thought style or discursive formation found variously in such writers as Ludwik Fleck (1935), Alistair Crombie (1994), Michel Foucault (1969), and Ian Hacking (1990, 2002). Especially in the accounts of Foucault and Hacking, new logical spaces open up and become structured quite rapidly. Once structured, they come to seem such obvious ways of speaking that we cannot imagine things being otherwise. The referents of their concepts and categories appear to be given as part of the natural structure of things. Not only our perceptions but even (at least some) propositions that we take to be self-evidently true are in fact a product of the cultural conditioning of our cognitive systems. We project our deeply ingrained cultural categories not only onto our world as we encounter it but also onto all possible worlds that we can imagine. In both types of case, the change in question seems revolutionary—in a manner that is (at least in some cases) both broader and cognitively deeper than the transition to a new paradigm within a particular scientific specialty. Once again, the magnitude of the change is practically invisible to all but the most sensitive historical archeologist.
Kuhn several times described himself as “a Kantian with moveable categories.” Hoyningen-Huene (1993) provides a broadly Kantian interpretation of Kuhn, as does Friedman (2001). Given the deeply historical approach of Structure, other commentators have likened Kuhn to Hegel instead of Kant. Both Kant and Hegel rejected naïve empiricism, according to which all human knowledge arises, somehow, from the accumulative aggregation of individual sensations or perceptions. As Kant emphasized, we need transcendent structures or rules to organize sensory input into something coherent and intelligible. As is well known, Kant argued that our sense experience is ordered by forms of intuition (in space and time) and by a set of categories (substance, causality, etc.) that represent the human mind's contribution to knowledge. (Kant was a founder of cognitive psychology.) Thus there is a substantial a priori form to our experience of the world. This is where the Kantian version of idealism enters the picture: the world of human experience is not the world of ultimate reality (Kant's unknowable, noumenal world); rather, it is a world shaped by our own cognitive structures.
Hegel, one of the founders of the new, deep conception of historical change characteristic of nineteenth-century German scholarship, proceeded to historicize Kant's innovation: the categories are not permanent and universal; on the contrary, they are historically acquired and differ from one historical epoch to another. People living in different epochs experience the world differently. In effect, Kuhn then further relativized Hegel—to specific scientific paradigms. Moreover, Kuhn's model provides endogenous, dynamic mechanisms of (inadvertent) scientific innovations that sow the seeds of the paradigm's eventual destruction in a vaguely Hegelian sort of dialectical process. It thus becomes possible to experience a change in categorical scheme within one's own lifetime—the small-scale scientific counterpart of Hegel watching Napoleon march in victory through the streets of Jena! Thus it is tempting to regard Kuhnian revolutions as Hegelian revolutions writ small.
There is a long historical gap between Kant/Hegel and Kuhn, however, and this space is not empty. Many other thinkers, especially those in the various nineteenth-century idealist traditions were Kantian or Hegelian or neo-Hegelian or neo-Kantian opponents of empiricist positions they considered naïve, such as that of John Stuart Mill. The neo-Kantian label applies even to prominent logical positivists or logical empiricists, who have too often been caricatured as naïve, cumulative empiricists. As Friedman and others have shown, the logical empiricists extended the neo-Kantian attack on simple empiricism. The basic idea here is that, just as Kant regarded any account of perception and knowledge as naively empiricist insofar as it left no room for underlying cognitive organizing principles, so any account of the sciences that provided no analogous underlying social-cognitive framework was a continuation of naive empiricism.
Carnap had been influenced by the neo-Kantian Marburg school, e.g., the work of Ernst Cassirer, whose central theme was the fundamental epistemological implications of the replacement of Aristotle's subject-predicate logic and substance ontology by the new relational logic of the modern, mathematical-functional approach to nature. This could not be a priori in Kant's original sense, since the emergence of non-Euclidean geometry had shown that there are alternative organizing principles. But the very fact that we still needed organizing structures that are constitutive or definitory of the cognitive enterprise in question meant that Kant was still basically correct. Like Moritz Schlick, the first leader of the Vienna Circle, Hans Reichenbach of the Berlin school parlayed his engagement with relativity theory and non-Euclidean geometries into a conception of the “relativized a priori.” All of this by around 1920, with the younger Carnap's views developing during the 1920s and ‘30s. In the USA, meanwhile, C. I. Lewis (1929) was defending his “pragmatic a priori.”
In his famous paper of 1950, “Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology,” Carnap made his two-tiered view of inquiry quite explicit. Starting from the problem of the existence of abstract entities, Carnap distinguished internal questions, that is, questions that can arise and be answered within a particular logico-linguistic framework, from external questions, that is, meta-level questions about which framework to prefer. External questions cannot be answered in the same, disciplined manner as internal, for choice of framework is ultimately a pragmatic decision based on the expected fertility of using one framework rather than another. About the same time, Quine defended his own, more holistic version of pragmatic decisions as to whether or not to withhold from falsification central tenets of the single web of belief. Quine (1951) abandoned two-tiered, neo-Kantian accounts that attempt to factor out the human contribution to cognition from nature's. Kuhn sometimes cited Quine in his behalf, failing to note that his own view was closer to Carnap's in this particular respect.
Although both defended two-tiered conceptions of inquiry, there are important differences between Kuhn and Carnap (as Friedman observes). For Carnap, as for Reichenbach, the choice of framework or coordinating definitions was conventional, a matter of convenience or heuristic fertility, whereas for committed Kuhnian normal scientists the foundational tenets of their paradigm are deep, quasi-a priori truths about the world, principle not subject to empirical test. In Carnap's frameworks these were explicit systems of logical rules, whereas Kuhn's account of normal science largely jettisoned rule-based knowledge in favor of a kind of case-based tacit knowledge, the cases being the concrete exemplars. Third, Kuhn himself emphasized that his approach was historical whereas Carnap's was not (Friedman 2003). Although a Carnapian change from one logical framework to another could, in principle, be quite revolutionary, Carnap himself never emphasized this point, suggested nothing of Kuhn's incommensurability, and was simply not interested in the history of science. So in this sense we could say that Kuhn played Hegel to Carnap's Kant.
Meanwhile, important French thinkers had already taken a historical approach, one that explicitly characterized science as a series of breaks or coupures. One genealogy includes Léon Brunschvicg, Gaston Bachelard, his student, Georges Canguilhem, and the latter's student, Michel Foucault. Neither Kuhn's historicism nor his talk of revolutionary breaks was news to the French (Gutting, 2001, 2003). The French tradition of science study, going back to Comte and including later figures such as Pierre Duhem and Henri Poincaré, possessed a historical dimension that positivism lost after Ernst Mach, as it became logical positivism. However, the French tradition and Germanic traditions have some roots in common. As Gutting points out, Brunschwicg, like Emile Meyerson, was a science-oriented idealist. For him the mind is not a passive wax tablet; rather, it actively forges internal links among ideas, yet it is also often surprised by the resistant exteriority of the natural world. Against traditional metaphysics, philosophy of science should limit itself to what the science of the time allows—but not dogmatically so. For dogmatic attempts to extract timeless principles and limitations (such as Kant's denial of the possibility of non-Euclidean geometry) may soon be embarrassed by further scientific advances. Einstein's general theory of relativity exemplifies the revolutionary nature of the most impressive developments.
Bachelard, French physicist and philosopher-historian of science, also believed that only by studying history of science can we gain an adequate understanding of human reason. He stressed the importance of epistemological breaks or discontinuities (coupures épistémologiques). In Le Nouvel Esprit Scientifique (1934), Bachelard argued that the worldview of classical physics, valuable in its own time, eventually became an obstacle to future progress in physics. Hence a break was needed. Like Brunschwicg, he held that a defensible, realist philosophy had to be based on the science of its day. Hence, scientific revolutions have (and ought to have) brought about epistemological revolutions. The reality we posit, he said, ought to be that of the best science but with the realization that our concepts are active constructs of our own minds and not nature's own language, as it were. Future mental activity as well as future empirical findings are likely to require another rupture. As Gutting points out, Bachelard's account of discontinuity was not as radical as Kuhn's. Bachelard was willing to speak of progress toward the truth. He made much of the fact that successor frameworks, such as non-Euclidean geometry or quantum physics, retain key predecessor results as special cases and, in effect, contextualize them.
Canguilhem was more interested in the biological and health sciences than Bachelard and gave great attention to the distinction between the normal and the pathological, a distinction that does not arise in physical science. For this and other reasons, in his view, we can expect no reduction of biology to physics. Canguilhem provided a more nuanced conception of obstacles and ruptures, noting, for example, that an approach such as vitalism, which constitutes an obstacle in one domain of research, could simultaneously play a positive role elsewhere, as in helping biological scientists to resist reductive thinking.
Bachelard and Canguilhem also had less disruptive conceptions of scientific objectivity and scientific closure than Kuhn. Canguilhem criticized Kuhn's (alleged) view that rational closure could not amount to more than group consensus. Both Frenchmen emphasized the importance of norms and denied that disciplinary agreement was as weak as Kuhnian consensus. Kuhn replied to this sort of objection (in “Postscript” and elsewhere) that his scientific communities do possess shared values, that their agreement is not something arbitrary, say, as whipped up by political ideologues.
Foucault's archaeology of knowledge (Foucault 1966, 1969) posits a distinction between a superstructure of deliberately made observations, claims, and arguments and a deep structure, most elements of which we are probably unconscious. Once again we meet a two-level account. Writes Hacking:
Foucault used the French world connaissance to stand for such items of surface knowledge while savoir meant more than science; it was a frame, postulated by Foucault, within which surface hypotheses got their sense. Savoir is not knowledge in the sense of a bunch of solid propositions. This “depth” knowledge is more like a postulated set of rules that determine what kinds of sentences are going to count as true or false in some domain. The kinds of things to be said about the brain in 1780 are not the kinds of things to be said a quarter-century later. That is not because we have different beliefs about brains, but because “brain” denotes a new kind of object in the later discourse, and occurs in different sorts of sentences. [2002, 77]
To what extent was Kuhn indebted to these thinkers? Unfortunately, Kuhn was not generous in acknowledging the work of others. We do know that he took Kant but not Hegel very seriously. He was largely self-taught in philosophy. Among his contemporaries, he was familiar with Popper but ignorant of the details of logical empiricism, in particular the positions of Carnap and Reichenbach. Apparently, Kuhn was only slightly acquainted with the work of Bachelard while writing Structure, and they never engaged in a fruitful interchange (Baltas et al. 2000, 284f). Kuhn did acknowledge, in print and in his classes, the crucial influence on his historical and philosophical thinking of the two Russian émigrés, Emile Meyerson, author of Identité et Realité (1908) and Alexandre Koyré, especially his Etudes Galiléenes (1939), and Annaliese Maier, a German historian of medieval and early modern science. Again, we also know that he had read Ludwik Fleck's Genesis and Development of a Scientific Fact (originally published in German in 1935) and Michael Polanyi's Personal Knowledge (1958), and that he had had discussions with Polanyi (Baltas et al. 2000, 296).
Kuhn more than anyone in the Anglo-American world pointed out the need for larger-sized units than individual theories in making sense of modern science. Nonetheless, as we have seen, others in the Teutonic and Francophone worlds had previously postulated even larger socio-intellectual units and correspondingly deeper changes even than Kuhn's, but on somewhat different scales of intellectual space and time. If we think of authors such as historian Fernand Braudel with his distinct time-scales, we recognize that the attribution of transformative change clearly depends heavily on the choice of time-scale and on how fine- or course-grained is our approach. Hacking (2002, 76) makes this point with reference to the French context:
There are two extremes in French historiography. The Annales school went in for long-term continuities or slow transitions—“the great silent motionless bases that traditional history has covered with a thick layer of events” (to quote from the first page of Foucault's 1969 Archeology of Knowledge). Foucault takes the opposite tack, inherited from Gaston Bachelard, Georges Canguilhem, and Louis Althusser. He posits sharp discontinuities in the history of knowledge.
Although Kuhn, following Polanyi, emphasized the importance of tacit knowledge in skilled scientific practice, his paradigms remained closer to the articulate surface of scientific culture than Foucault's discursive formations, which are better located in the unconscious than in the Kuhnian subconscious. Foucault does not speak of revolution. Foucault's discursive formations are also, obviously, still larger and more multidisciplinary than Kuhn's paradigms.
Hacking (1975, 1990) has studied in depth the emergence of probability and (later) of statistical thinking as key examples of what he terms “historical ontology.” He acknowledges inspiration from both Foucault's discursive formations and Crombie's styles of thinking (Crombie 1994). Like Kuhn (and Friedman), Hacking returns to Kant's “how possible?” question, the answer to which sets out the necessary conditions for a logical space of reasons in which practitioners can make true or false claims about objects and pose research questions about them. And Hacking also historicizes the Kantian conception. He likes the term ‘historical a priori’, which Canguilhem once applied to the work of his erstwhile student, Foucault.
The historical a priori points at conditions whose dominion is as inexorable, there and then, as Kant's synthetic a priori. Yet they are at the same time conditioned and formed in history, and can be uprooted by later, radical, historical transformations. T. S. Kuhn's paradigms have some of the character of a historical a priori. [Hacking 2002, 5].
Hacking describes changes in historical a prioris as “significant singularities during which the coordinates of ‘scientific objectivity’ are rearranged” (2002, 6).
Hacking recognizes that Kuhnian problems of relativism (rather than subjectivism) lurk in such positions. “Just as statistical reasons had no force for the Greeks, so one imagines a people for whom none of our reasons for belief have force” (2002, 163). Hacking acknowledges a kind of incommensurability between successive styles of reasoning, but one that is closer to Feyerabend's extreme cases (as in the ancient Greek astronomers versus their Homeric predecessors) than to Kuhn's “no common measure” (2002, chap. 11). Kuhn had in mind the direct succession of one paradigm by another within the same field, whereas both Feyerabend and Hacking are concerned with even deeper and subtler changes in which one mode of practice is almost completely unintelligible to the other. This sort of unintelligibility runs deeper than a Kuhnian translation failure. It is not a question of determining which old style statements match presumed new style truths; rather, it is a question of the conditions for an utterance to make a claim that is either true or false at all. Writes Hacking, “Many of the recent but already classical philosophical discussions of such topics as incommensurability, indeterminacy of translation, and conceptual schemes seem to discuss truth where they ought to be considering truth-or-falsehood” (2002, 160). In “Postscript” Kuhn thought W. V. Quine's World and Object, with its discussion of indeterminacy of translation, illuminated the cross-paradigm communication problem (Kuhn 1970, 202n). But, as Hacking notes (and also Alexander Bird in his SEP article, “Thomas Kuhn”), the two ideas are incompatible. Quine concludes that there are many equally good translations, whereas Kuhn concludes that there are none that are adequate; and Kuhn's views on both meaning and reference differ from Quine's.
Oliver Wendell Holmes, Jr. (1861) once remarked, “Revolutions never follow precedents nor furnish them.” Given the unpredictability, the nonlinearity, the seeming uniqueness of revolutions, whether political or scientific, it is therefore surprising to find Thomas Kuhn attempting to provide a General Theory of Scientific Revolutions. On the other hand, recent work in nonlinear dynamics, self-organizing systems, and complex adaptive systems has discovered regularities in seemingly chaotic phenomena. Has Kuhn found such a regularity, or has he imposed his own philosophical structure on the vagaries and vicissitudes of history?
Numerous philosophers, scientists, and other commentators have made claims about scientific change that differ from Kuhn's. Some, as we have seen, are skeptical of revolution talk altogether, others of Kuhn's in particular. Still others accept that some revolutions are Kuhnian but deny that all of them are. One common criticism is that not all revolutionary advances are preceded by an acute crisis, that is, by major failures of preceding research. Another is that revolutionary changes need not involve discontinuities in all of Kuhn's levels at once. Yet another is that in some cases there is no logical or linguistic discontinuity or loss at all: the revolution adds a new body of knowledge rather than displacing something already there. On this view revolution need not be a zero-sum game, a game of creative destruction. Yet again, a rapid, seemingly transformative change in research practices may involve no logical or semantic disconnection with previous science but only marked gains in data accessibility or accuracy or computational processing ability. Only a few examples can be considered here. A related question, taken up in the next section, is whether scientific change is better considered evolutionary than revolutionary—and whether the choice is really so dichotomous as the question suggests.
Does the emergence to prominence of “chaos theory” (nonlinear dynamics) itself constitute a scientific revolution and, if so, is it a distinctly Kuhnian revolution, as several authors have claimed? In recent years several writers, including both scientists and science writers have attempted to link Kuhn's idea of revolutionary paradigm shifts to the emergence of chaos theory, complexity theory, and network theory (e.g., Gleick 1987, chap. 2, on the chaos theory revolution; Hayles 1990, 169ff, on the Prigogine research program; Ruelle 1991, chap. 11; Jen in Cowan et al. 1999, 622f, on complexity theory; and Buchanan 2002, 47, on network theory). Interestingly, some authors reapply these ideas to Kuhn's account itself, theoretically construing revolutionary paradigm shifts as phase changes or as nonlinear jumps from one strange attractor or one sort of network structure to another.
Steven Kellert (1993) considers and rejects the claim that chaos theory represents a Kuhnian revolution. Although it does provide a new set of research problems and standards and, to some degree, transforms our worldview, it does not overturn and replace an entrenched theory. Kellert argues that chaos theory does not even constitute the emergence of a new, mature science rather than an extension of standard mechanics, although it may constitute a new style of reasoning.
Kellert's position hangs partly on how we construe theories. If a theory is just a toolbox of models, something like an integrated collection of Kuhnian exemplars (Giere 1988, Teller 2008), then the claim for a revolutionary theory development of some kind becomes more plausible. For nonlinear dynamics highlights a new set of models and the strange attractors that characterize their behaviors. Kuhn wrote that one way in which normal science articulates its paradigm is by “permitting the solution of problems to which it had previously only drawn attention.” But had not classical dynamics suppressed rather than drawn attention to the problems of chaos theory and the various sorts of complexity theory and network theory that are much studied today? Still, it is easy to agree with Kellert that this case does not fit Kuhn's account neatly. To some readers it suggests that a more pluralistic conception of scientific revolutions than Kuhn's account allows is warranted.
Kellert also questions whether traditional dynamics was really in a special state of crisis prior to the recent emphasis on nonlinear dynamics, for difficulties in dealing with nonlinear phenomena have been apparent almost from the beginning. Since Kuhn himself emphasizes, against Popper, that all theories face anomalies at all times, it is unfortunately all too easy, after an apparently revolutionary development, to point back and claim crisis.
Kuhn's original account of the dynamics of science ill fit the rapid splitting and recombining of fields in the post-World War II era of Big Science. In Structure, as noted earlier, he expressly excluded from his account the division and recombination of already mature fields such as happened with biochemistry. In his later work he did devote careful attention to the division of fields into specialties and subspecialties, a phenomenon that he considered a product of revolution and as analogous to biological speciation into distinct, incommensurable niches (see below). However, it is arguable that he gave too little attention to the more-or-less reverse process of new fields coming into existence by combinations of previously distinct fields, e.g., biochemistry as well as to cross-disciplinary research, in which a variety of different specialists somehow succeed in working together (Kellert 2008).
And what can we make, on Kuhn's account, of the explosion of work in molecular biology following the Watson-Crick discovery, in 1953, of the chemical structure of DNA and the development of better laboratory equipment and techniques? Molecular genetics quickly grew into the very general field of molecular biology. Less than two decades after Watson and Crick, Gunther Stent could already write in his 1971 textbook:
How times have changed! Molecular genetics has … grown from the esoteric specialty of a small, tightly knit vanguard into an elephantine academic discipline whose basic doctrines today form part of the primary school science curriculum. [Stent 1971, ix]
There is something paradigmatic about molecular biology and also something revolutionary about its rapid progress and expansion. It is not clear how to characterize this and similar developments. Was this a Kuhnian revolution? Is molecular biology more like a style of thought-and-practice than a paradigm? Was its rapid emergence simply a combination of two already mature fields? A more plausible Kuhnian story might be that molecular biology was a new paradigm that united pre-paradigmatic work into a new specialty field within the umbrella of the Darwinian paradigm. After all, Kuhn allowed smaller paradigms to govern specialty fields within a larger paradigm. But this story strains Kuhn's larger account in three ways. First, Watson-Crick was one of the most spectacular discoveries in the history of science, yet it did not disrupt the reigning, Darwinian paradigm. Quite the contrary. Second, such an explosive development as molecular biology hardly fits Kuhn's description of steady, normal scientific articulation of the large paradigm by puzzle solving. Third, in the case of molecular biology, the field specificity of Kuhnian paradigms is lost. At a minimum, it seems better to regard molecular biology as a large toolkit of methods or techniques applicable to several specialty fields rather than as an integrative theory-framework within one field (Nickles 2008a). This last option abandons the traditional conception of theories as deductive systems, even in physics, and substitutes informal collections of models of various, exemplary kinds, along with a toolbox of expert practices for constructing and applying them (Cartwright 1983, Giere 1988, Teller 2008). To be fair, there is a basis for this interpretation already in Kuhn's emphasis on the priority of modeling in Structure and especially in “Postscript.”
Should we then focus on practices rather than on integrative theories in our interpretation of Kuhnian paradigms? The trouble with this move is that practices can also change so rapidly that it is tempting to speak of revolutionary transformations of scientific work even though there is little change in the overarching theoretical framework (e.g., evolutionary theory). Moreover, the rapid replacement of old practices by new is often a product of efficiency rather than incompatibility. Why continue to do gene sequencing by hand when automated processing in now available? Replacement can also be a product of change in research style, given that, as Kuhn already recognized, scientific communities are cultural communities.
Similar points can be made about the rise of statistical physics, discussed above in relation to Hacking's work. (See also Brush 1983 and Porter 1986.) This was an explosion of work within the classical mechanical paradigm rather than a puzzle-by-puzzle articulation of precisely that paradigm. The kinetic theory of gases quickly grew into statistical mechanics, which leapt the boundaries of its initial specialty field. New genres as well as new styles of mathematical-physical thinking quickly replaced old—and displaced the old generation of practitioners. Modern mathematical physics came into being.
The biological and chemical sciences do not readily invite a Kuhnian analysis, given the usual, theory-centered interpretation of Kuhn. For biological fields rarely produce lawful theories of the kind supposedly found in physics. Indeed, it is controversial whether there exist distinctly biological laws at all. And yet, over the past century the biological sciences have advanced so rapidly that their development cries out for the label ‘revolutionary’.
What of the emerging field of evolutionary-developmental biology (evo-devo)? It is too soon to know whether future work in this accelerating field will merely complete evolutionary biology rather than challenging it. It does seem unlikely that it will amount to a complete, revolutionary overturning of the Darwinian paradigm. (But Kuhn might reply that the discovery of homeobox genes overturned a smaller paradigm based on the expectation that biological homologies would not correspond to near identities at the gene coding level.) And if it complements the Darwinian paradigm, then evo-devo is surely too big and too rapidly advancing to be considered a mere, piecemeal, puzzle-solving articulation of that paradigm. Based on work to date, evo-devo biologist Sean Carroll holds precisely the complementing view—complementary yet revolutionary:
Evo Devo constitutes the third major act in a continuing evolutionary synthesis. Evo Devo has not just provided a critical missing piece of the Modern Synthesis—embryology—and integrated it with molecular genetics and traditional elements such as paleontology. The wholly unexpected nature of some of its key discoveries and the unprecedented quality and depth of evidence it has provided toward settling previously unresolved questions bestow it with a revolutionary character. [2005, 283]
Do revolutions consist, according to Kuhn, of major new materials (experimental facts, theories, models, instruments, techniques) entering a scientific domain or, instead, a major restructuring or rearrangement of materials already present? Kuhn states that the relativity revolution might serve as
a prototype for revolutionary reorientation in the sciences. Just because it did not involve the introduction of additional objects or concepts, the transition from Newtonian to Einsteinian mechanics illustrates with particular clarity the scientific revolution as a displacement of the conceptual network through which scientists view the world. [1970, 102]
Unfortunately, in the just-preceding paragraphs Kuhn himself had emphasized the ontological and conceptual changes of precisely this revolution, e.g., the radical change in the concept of mass! Yet he surely does have a point worth saving here in that relativity theory still deals with most of the same kinds of phenomena as classical mechanics and employs immediate successors to the classical concepts. That reorganization dominates Kuhn's conception of revolutions is apparent from his Aristotelian epiphany and his early emphasis on Gestalt switches together with his characterization the Copernican, Daltonian, Einsteinian and other revolutions. But then that leaves his one-track account unable to handle extraordinary spurts in substantive content.
In his book Conceptual Revolutions, Paul Thagard (1993) retains something of Kuhn's idea of conceptual transformation and the more specific idea of taxonomic transformation. He distinguishes two kinds of reclassification, in language taken over from tree structures in computer science: branch jumping and tree switching. Branch jumping reclassifies or relocates something to another branch of the same tree, e.g., reclassifying the whale as a mammal rather than a fish, the earth as a planet, or Brownian motion as a physical rather than a biological phenomenon. New branches can appear and old branches eliminated. Meanwhile, tree switching replaces an entire classification tree by a different tree structure based on different principles of classification, as when Darwin replaced the static classification tree of Linnaeus by one based on evolutionary genealogy and Mendeleev replaced alternative classification systems of the chemical elements by his own. Taking a computational approach to philosophy of science, Thagard employs his computer program ECHO to reconstruct and evaluate several historical cases of alleged conceptual revolution.
In The Cognitive Structure of Scientific Revolutions, Andersen et al. (2006) also devote a good deal of attention to cognition and categorization issues, in a defense of Kuhn's latest thought. The work of cognitive psychologist Lawrence Barsalou and philosopher-historian Nancy Nersessian (the founder the “cognitive historical” approach to science) plays a significant role in their account. Nersessian (2003, 2008) emphasizes model-based reasoning. These are no long static cases or exemplars as they have an internal dynamic.
Howard Margolis (1993) distinguishes two kinds of revolutions, depending on what kinds of problems they solve. Those revolutions that bridge gaps, he contends, differ, from those that surmount or penetrate or somehow evade barriers. He develops his account in terms of the broadly Kuhnian idea of “habits of mind.” Margolis is struck by the apparent fact that all the materials for Copernicus' re-orientation of the solar system had been available, in scattered form, for centuries. No new gap-crossing developments were needed. He concludes that, rather than a gap to be bridged, the problem was a cognitive barrier that needed to be removed, a barrier that blocked expert mathematical astronomers from bringing together, as mutually relevant, what turned out to be the crucial premises, and then linking them in the tight way that Copernicus did. If Margolis' account of the Copernican Revolution is correct, it provides another example of the nonlinearity of revolutions; for the developments that lead to a barrier's removal can be minor and, as in the case of Copernicus, even quite peripheral to the primary subject matter that they ultimately help to transform.
Margolis notes the importance of the phenomenon of “contagion,” in which new ideas or practices suddenly reach a kind of tipping point and spread rapidly. Contagion is, of course, necessary for a revolt to succeed as a revolution. Today, contagion is a topic being studied carefully by network theorists and popularized by Malcolm Gladwell's The Tipping Point (2000). Steven Strogatz is among the new breed of network theorists who are developing technical accounts of “phase changes” resulting from the growth and reorganization of networks, including social networks of science—a topic dear to the early Kuhn's heart as he struggled with the themes of Structure. (See Strogatz, 2003, chap. 10; also Watts 1999; Newman 2001; Barabási 2002; Buchanan 2002.)
One intriguing suggestion of this work is that scientific changes, like earthquakes and many other phenomena, may follow a power law distribution in which there are exponentially fewer changes of a given magnitude than the number of changes in the next lower category. For example, depending upon the exponent, there might be only one magnitude 5 change for every ten magnitude 4 changes (on average over time), as in the Gutenberg-Richter scale for earthquakes. Working out such a scale would be difficult and controversial, as would be the ranking of particular episodes, but Nicholas Rescher (1978) has begun the task in terms of ranking scientific discoveries and studying their distribution over time. Derek Price (1963) had previously introduced quantitative historical considerations into history of science, pointing out, among many other things, the exponential increase in the number of scientists and quantity of their publications since the Scientific Revolution. Among philosophers, Rescher was probably the first to analyze aggregate data concerning scientific innovation, arguing that, as research progresses, discoveries of a given magnitude become more difficult. Given the plateau in the number of scientists since the 1960s, Rescher concludes that we must expect a decrease in the rate of discovery of a given magnitude and hence, presumably, a similar decrease in the rate of scientific revolutions. Although he does not mention Schumpeter in this work, Rescher expresses a similar view:
Scientific progress in large measure annihilates rather than enlarges what has gone before—it builds the new on the foundations of the ruins of the old. Scientific theorizing generally moves ahead not by addition and enlargement but by demolition and replacement. [1978, p. 82, Rescher's emphasis]
Philosophers, including Kuhn, have largely overlooked another source of revolutionary developments, namely, material culture, specifically the development of new instruments. There is, however, a growing literature in history and sociology of science and technology. A good example is Andy Pickering's discussion of the conception and construction of the large cloud chamber at Lawrence Berkeley Laboratory (Pickering 1995). Pickering's Constructing Quarks (1984), Peter Galison's How Experiments End (1987) and Image and Logic (1997), and Sharon Traweek's Beamtimes and Lifetimes (1988) describe the cultures that grew up around the big machines of high-energy physics in the U.S., Europe, and Japan. As he himself recognized, Kuhn's model of rapid change runs into increasing difficulty with the Big Science of the World War II era and beyond. (See also Kellert 2008 for difficulties of interdisciplinary research.)
Kuhn made the topic of revolution central to science studies, not only by introducing massive amounts of history of science but also by broadening his perspective to include comparison with rapid social change, especially political and religious change. In addition, Structure included a brief comparison with biological evolution. One way in which to critically appraise Kuhn's model is to look at revolutionary developments in neighboring sectors, such as technology and business innovation, then to ask whether anything similar occurs in the sciences. Nickles (2008a and b) suggests that we include technological and economic innovation and advances in complexity theory as sources of insight into scientific change.
What kinds of revolutionary transformation occur in technological and business life? Exploration of this topic is beyond the scope of this entry, but consider briefly the invention (or re-invention and application) of the transistor in the late 1940s. Its history is nonlinear in the following sense. Even if its introduction constituted a revolution in its small, technical field as that existed at the time, the later development has exploded far beyond what anyone could have then imagined, so that today billions of transistor-like elements can be included in a single silicon chip. Nonlinearities of this sort are characteristic of revolutions, as opposed to normal science and technology, yet their very expansiveness ill fits Kuhn's model of relatively enclosed specialty disciplines.
Harvard business economist Clayton Christensen (1997, 2003) identifies two types of business failure and success that suggest possible types of transformative scientific displacement poorly captured by Kuhn's model. Both involve forms of nonlinearity. Christensen distinguishes “sustaining technologies” from “disruptive technologies”. The former can include major, even quasi-revolutionary, innovations, as when automatic transmissions were introduced to automobiles and jet engines to aircraft. A sustaining technology aims to keep its customer base happy by improving popular product lines—just what a successful company seemingly should do. Christensen was originally led to his investigation by asking the question why such successful and well-managed companies sometimes fail—and fail precisely because they pursued the “obviously successful” strategy. This phenomenon is vaguely reminiscent of Kuhn's claim that successful normal science leads to revolution, but here the similarity ends. On Christensen's view, technical breakthroughs are neither sufficient nor necessary for major discontinuities in business life. The main threat comes from developments perhaps long underway outside the core of the business paradigm.
A disruptive technology begins away from the center and initially poses little threat. It may be the pursuit of hobbyists and tinkerers, as was the personal computer; but, as it grows, it threatens established technologies and products (mainframe computer centers and even mini-computers) eventually to displace them. A crucial point is that these technologies need involve no major technical breakthroughs, no revolutionary theoretical developments in order to get underway, e.g., the Sony Walkman. Christensen (2003, chap. 2) then distinguishes two kinds of disruptive technologies, which can occur separately or in combination. “New market disruptions” appeal to a previously non-existing market (both the above examples). “Low-market” or “low-end disruptions are those that attack the least-profitable and most overserved customers at the low end of the original value network,” those who need only basic products, e.g., low-grade steel bars for reinforced concrete (p. 45).
Neither of these two kinds of technology-based business displacement involves anything like logical incompatibility of the predecessor and successor technologies. One displaces the other on account of greater efficiency, better pricing, or better marketing. This is a familiar phenomenon of economic life (e.g., the victory of VHS format videotape players over Betamax), but something like this phenomenon also occurs in science. Many eminent scientists report that some of their work would have caught on had they packaged it better.
Insofar as this is correct, there can be major scientific change based not on overturning major results but on a change in methodological preferences or what we might call “scientific fashion” or “scientific style” (had not Crombie and Hacking already used this term for bigger intellectual formations). In short, a change in goals and standards alone is sufficient to change the direction of science to a marked degree.
The upshot is that there would seem to be other forms of displacement (destructive replacement) than the logical and epistemological forms recognized by philosophers of science. There is the familiar economic phenomenon of obsolescence—and its parallels in science, technology, and the rest of culture. The displacement of biological species by others is an instance from another quarter. In these cases there need be no logical relation of incompatibility between the new and the old, for the old practices may still work quite consistently with the new—only not as well or as fashionably. This is especially obvious with experimental practices and modeling techniques. From this point of view, even Kuhn and Feyerabend are still too much stuck in trying to analyze scientific change in terms of simple logical and epistemological relations between theory systems—incompatibility, deductive derivability, falsifiability, and the like. Although Kuhn rejects Popper's logic of testing (attempting to falsify the most basic assumptions), Kuhn's account of paradigm change retains a whiff of logical falsification at the level of disciplinary matrices.
In On the Origin of Species Darwin argued that evolutionary change is inevitable in a reasonably constant environment with selection pressures, given the slow and steady processes of variation and selection plus inheritance that he had outlined. Schumpeter made a similar claim about market economies.
The essential point to grasp is that in dealing with capitalism we are dealing with an evolutionary process… . Capitalism, then, is by nature a form or method of economic change and not only never is but never can be stationary. [1942, chap. VII]
Kuhn in turn made a like claim for modern science. Yet, somewhat surprisingly, given his dramatic account of scientific revolutions, in the final pages of Structure Kuhn drew a parallel between his account of progress through revolution and Darwin's account of evolution. His central claim there was that scientific development is not teleological (anymore than biological evolution supposedly was for Darwin, but see Richards 2003); it moves toward no particular goal such as correspondence with reality:
The process described in Section XII as the resolution of revolutions is the selection by conflict within the scientific community of the fittest way to practice future science. The net result of a sequence of such revolutionary selections, separated by periods of normal research, is the wonderfully adapted set of instruments we call modern scientific knowledge. Successive stages in that developmental process are marked by an increase in articulation and specialization. And the entire process may have occurred, as we now suppose biological evolution did, without benefit of a set goal… . [1970, 172f]
It is striking that Kuhn emphasized that revolutionary transitions rather than normal scientific developments are evolutionary. It seems clear that Kuhn did not consider revolution and evolution to be mutually incompatible (although he may already have been moderating his earlier, radical claims for revolution). Normal science represents periods of relative stasis, whereas revolutions are short, highly creative periods that more closely resemble exploration by random trial and error (1970, 87). Examined on a minute time scale, however, normal science also involves a more constrained variation and selection process, as scientific practitioners search for ways to articulate the paradigm. The important point here is that, in Kuhn's view, apparently, revolution and evolution are compatible when considered on the correct time scales. Examined from afar, revolutions are simply the more noteworthy episodes in the evolution of the sciences. Examined up close, they (like discoveries in general for Kuhn) have a detailed structure that is evolutionary, even something as revolutionary as the quantum theory (Kuhn 1978).
But how, then, the reader is entitled to ask, can Kuhn accommodate the sharp discontinuities that he advertised in chapter X of the book? Nor can we equate revolutions simply with speciation in Darwin's own sense, given that Darwin's favorite mechanism of speciation was anagenesis, not cladogenesis—just the long-term adaptive evolution within a single line rather than the splitting of lines. Interestingly, the later Kuhn opted for cladogenesis. When work within a specialty becomes sufficiently incongruous with the paradigmatic models, a group breaks off and forms a new specialty. The incommensurability then functions to keep distinct scientific specialties or cultures separate (nonbreeding). Unfortunately, this model exacerbates the aforementioned difficulty of handling interdisciplinary work that Kuhn already faces and to which Westman called attention. In “The Road Since Structure,” Kuhn articulated this evolutionary theme—still in connection with revolution. He explicitly likened scientific revolution to biological speciation.
[R]evolutions, which produce new divisions between fields in scientific development, are much like episodes of speciation in biological evolution. The biological parallel to revolutionary change is not mutation, as I thought for many years, but speciation… . [Scientific specialties are analogous to reproductively isolated biological populations in being a] community of intercommunicating specialists, a unit whose members share a lexicon that provides the basis for both the conduct and the evaluation of their research and which simultaneously, by barring full communication with those outside the group, maintains their isolation from practitioners of other specialties. [Kuhn 2000c, 98]
As noted above, each specialist group, according to Kuhn, inhabits the scientific niche-world that it has socially constructed.
Stephen Weinberg (2001) disagrees strongly with Kuhn's evolutionary tree metaphor, on two accounts. First, Weinberg defends a more Peircean view of science as asymptotically approaching the objective truth about the world. Kuhn's evolutionary tree is about right, he says—if we read it as the evolution running backward. The individual branches of science join together into larger and larger unified approaches until, one day, we shall end up with the final theory of reality. Elsewhere, however, Weinberg criticizes the evolutionary tree model on the ground that the structure of modern physics is a multiply connected web, an image earlier promoted (in a different context) by Richard Feynman (1965, 46f) and now, increasingly, by biological taxonomists themselves.
As many commentators have pointed out, the theory of punctuated equilibrium of Niles Eldredge and Stephen Jay Gould (1972) raises the question of evolution versus revolution, now precisely in the biological context. (Gould and Eldredge were themselves influenced by Kuhn, whom Gould once described as “a dear friend,” but they denied that they had deliberately fashioned themselves as Kuhnian revolutionaries; Gould 1997.) And here, too, those who resist Gould's attempt to sound so revolutionary as to be contrary to Darwin's phyletic gradualism note that it is only on a geological time scale that such developments as the Cambrian explosion appear to be episodic. When examined on the time scale of the biological generations of the life forms in question, the development is evolutionary—more rapid evolution than during other periods, to be sure, but still evolutionary. Gould and Eldredge (1993) themselves end their review article on punctuated equilibrium by remarking:
[C]ontemporary science has massively substituted notions of indeterminacy, historical contingency, chaos and punctuation for previous convictions about gradual, progressive, predictable determinism. These transitions have occurred in field after field; Kuhn's celebrated notion of scientific revolutions is, for example, a punctuation theory for the history of scientific ideas. [1993, 227]
Stuart Kauffman (1993) and Brian Goodwin (1994) defend reorganization in the form of self-organization as the primary macro-biological mechanism, with evolutionary adaptation adding only the finishing touches. Gould and Richard Lewontin had raised this possibility in their famous paper of 1979, “The Spandrels of San Marco and the Panglossian Paradigm.” Applied to the development of science, this view implies that revolutions determine the overall shape, while ordinary scientific work applies the adaptive microevolution.
Michael Ruse (1989) defends the view that the Darwinian paradigm (with its emphasis on function and adaptation) and the punctuated equilibrium paradigm (with its emphasis on Germanic ideas of form and internal constraints) are complementary.
David Hull ends his book, Science as a Process (1988), with the remark that the book can be regarded as an attempt to fulfill both Kuhn's and Toulmin's ambitions to provide a evolutionary account of scientific development. Hull's is the most thoroughgoing attempt to date to provide an evolutionary account of scientific practice. However, nothing like Kuhnian revolutions or paradigms or Kuhnian normal science is found in his book. Whereas Kuhn originally said that paradigms correspond one-to-one with scientific communities, Hull rejects Kuhn's idea of a scientific community as too loose. A scientific community does not consist of people who merely happen to agree on certain things (anymore than the members of a species are individuals who happen to share a set of traits). Mere consensus is not enough. Rather, communities are tightly causally linked in the right sorts of ways, just as species are. There is no community of biologists or even of evolutionary biologists but only a patchwork of cliques. It is here, locally, that the seeds of innovation are sown, most of which are weeded out in a selective process by the larger group of specialists. Hull's is a story of the socio-cultural evolution of science without revolution.
It was initially a shock to realize that the term ‘revolution’ in the modern sense of deep conceptual change appropriately describes certain developments even in mature scientific fields and not only the passage from pre-science to modern science. The new history of science directly challenged formalist accounts of science according to which the progress of mature science can be characterized as a process of logical refinement, including cumulative addition. During the 1960s, methodologists of science increasingly judged the received philosophical accounts, most recently those of the logical empiricists and Popperians, incompatible with the incoming historical descriptions of scientific work. Roughly speaking, the logicians had focused on syntactical structure and thereby had missed the subtle but momentous semantic and pragmatic shifts (including rhetorical shifts) that the historians claimed to find.
Thomas Kuhn's The Structure of Scientific Revolutions made scientific revolutions, and historical development and concrete scientific practices more generally, central topics in science studies and established the best known account of both revolutionary and non-revolutionary (normal) science—so well known that his account has largely pre-empted the term ‘scientific revolution’. However, even those philosophers, historians, and sociologists sympathetic to Kuhn balk at his single-track account of scientific development. The many sciences are far too diverse (they contend) to be captured by a single model. Accordingly, many science studies scholars would prefer a less committal vocabulary, such as “transformative change.” This is the term used, for example, in the U.S. National Research Council report on theory in biology (2008). Since the 1960s, many philosophers have employed the term ‘conceptual change’ to denote significant theoretical change, but this term is not well suited to the biological and neuro-cognitive sciences or to experimental research in general, all of which now receive a large share of philosophical attention.
This article has dealt mainly with Kuhn's early work (roughly, the twenty years from 1960 to 1980), which has had far more philosophical and cultural impact than his later work. Naturally, Kuhn was then responding most directly to the issues of that day—an agenda set primarily by the Popperians and logical empiricists, views that are now dated—“fossils” as Godfrey-Smith (2003, 19) dubs them. Nonetheless, by forcing philosophical thinkers to confront squarely for the first time the (alleged) fact of deep historical change, Kuhn (and others of that day such as Feyerabend, Lakatos, and Toulmin) raised problems of enduring interest and gave a sense of historical concreteness and epistemological urgency to the long familiar but abstract logical and probabilistic problems of underdetermination of theory by observation. By, in effect, playing neo-Hegel to the logical empiricists' neo-Kant, Kuhn deeply challenged the easy, representational realism that the remarkable success of modern science invites. For once we realize that we, too, are historical agents with a specific location in historical time and place, just as were Aristotle, Paracelsus, Newton, Lamarck, and Durkheim (to pick four names more or less at random), the worry arises that our best future theories and models may be beyond our present horizons of imagination (Stanford 2006). We may well lack the vocabulary even to conceive them. This problem of deep change arises whether or not those changes are evolutionary or revolutionary.
Those philosophical thinkers who have adopted the deep history perspective (e.g., Kuhn, Feyerabend, L. Laudan, Hacking, Rorty) have modestly refused to project our current scientific lines of inquiry far into the future; for, in their view, that would be to engage in an unwarranted sort of futurology. But they also realize that the human experience fails to be cumulative in another sense—that past cultures and foreign cultures recede from us. Our best scholars find it difficult to make parts of Aristotle and Paracelsus intelligible. As the human community moves through time, our horizons of imagination and conceivability contract as well as expand. There is destruction as well as creation. Thus, although we are historically privileged, relative to the ancients (as Francis Bacon already recognized), even that privilege is limited. That is something of the insight that Kuhn tried to historically compress and transfer to paradigm change when he spoke so radically of scientists living in different worlds. Historians routinely encounter a similar phenomenon on the personal level when questioning scientists about their own past work.
There are accounts of scientific change even broader and deeper than Kuhn's—and hence more potentially revolutionary and even more morally and epistemologically unsettling—. Philosophers of science initially attempted to tame the creative destruction found in the sciences with their accounts of reduction of theories, but Kuhn and Feyerabend largely scuttled that effort. Kuhnian and other accounts of scientific change recognize a greater degree of destruction. Foucault, Crombie, and Hacking, not to mention Hegel and Marx, introduce cognitive formations even larger than Kuhnian paradigms and hence describe still broader and deeper kinds of transformative change.
Unlike postmodernists (many of whom make use of his work), Kuhn accepted the traditional view that the sciences have been remarkably successful since the scientific revolution, if not before. On the science policy front, he intended his work to help preserve the integrity of this successful enterprise (and it is on the science policy issue that Fuller 2000 is most critical of Kuhn). The problem presented by Kuhn's critique of traditional philosophy of science is that, although the various sciences have been successful, we do not understand how they have accomplished this. Enlightenment-style explanations have failed. For example, Kuhn and Feyerabend were among the first philosophers to expose the bankruptcy of the claim that it was the discovery of a special scientific method that explains that success.
That conclusion (one that cheered postmodernists) left Kuhn with the problem of how science really does work. To explain how and why it had been so successful became an urgent problem for him—a problem largely rejected as bogus by later social studies of science, the disciplines seemingly in the best position to answer the question.
Although he was never attracted to Hegel's writings, Kuhn's theory of scientific change can be termed broadly Hegelian, given his view that scientific reason is manifested more clearly in historical processes than in symbolic logical structures, in his internalist account of normal scientific research as sowing the seeds of its own destruction through unintended innovation, and hence in his quasi-dialectical, conflicting-stage narrative of paradigm change. However, there is no Hegelian secret lurking within Kuhn's model, no Spirit, no permanent logic of science as for Lakatos (Bird 2008, Worrall 2008). (Here Feyerabend also sided against Lakatos.) Kuhn, following Polanyi, emphasized disciplined expertise and tacit knowledge, but for philosophers who hold that rationality requires making everything explicit, this leaves largely intact the mystery of how science works.
Schumpeter's theme of creative destruction, when generalized, implies that any highly innovative enterprise with limited intellectual and material-financial “shelf space” must be subject to a form of creative destruction as new developments push out the old. That is, of course, why these enterprises are so competitive. Accordingly, we expect a conflict theory of deep change, one that is either evolution, revolutionary, or both. So far, Kuhn's theory is an instance. But the next question to ask is what are the various forms that conflict might take—better, what forms scientific conflicts have actually taken historically. Although Kuhn, in his talk of incommensurability and modeling, loosened the logical bonds of preceding views, he felt constrained to retain talk of logical incompatibility as well.
Critics of Kuhn have faulted his model of scientific development on just these grounds, arguing that there is no reason to think that transformative displacement must always take the form of a logical breakout from the old conceptual framework. Why, some critics ask, must a revolution either follow upon, or cause, massive epistemological failure? And some revolutionary developments do appear to be cumulative, avoiding serious conflict. Moreover, broadening the creative destruction theme to include economic and biological innovation points to forms of conflict other than logical incompatibility of competing frameworks and thus, at least in part, avoids Kuhn's difficulty in speaking simultaneously of logical conflict and incommensurability. The old ways may be not wrong but simply obsolete, inefficient, out of fashion— destroyed by a process that requires more resources than simple logical relations to understand it. There can be massive displacement by non-logical means. Kuhn himself sometimes recognized this, as when he spoke of incompatible modes of community life.
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Carnap, Rudolf | choice, dynamic | empiricism: logical | Feyerabend, Paul | Foucault, Michel | incommensurability: of scientific theories | Kuhn, Thomas | physics: intertheory relations in | Popper, Karl | Reichenbach, Hans | science: unity of | scientific progress | value: incommensurable