First published Wed Nov 25, 2015

The sense of touch is one of the central forms of perceptual experience. Thought to be the first sense to develop, touch occurs across the whole body using a variety of receptors in the skin. It often combines these signals with rich information made available by stretch receptors in the muscles and tendons as we actively move and explore the world. Because of these unique features, touch raises many interesting philosophical issues. Its complex yet fundamental nature makes it a central topic of discussion in debates about the multisensory nature of perception, the relation between perception and action, and the connection between touch and bodily awareness.

1. Background and Terminology

Touch is a fundamental form of non–visual perception, one that plays a crucial role in nearly all of our sensory experiences (a feature noted by Gibson 1966). It is, unlike many of the other senses, more plausibly taken to be inherently multisensory, given the diversity of its constituent systems and forms of experience. In addition, it seems to have unique and philosophically interesting connections to exploratory action and bodily awareness.

Before turning to these issues, it will be helpful to provide some background on the terminology typically used to talk about touch. These are standard terms used in both philosophy and cognitive science, and they are (for the most part) neutral ways of talking about the diverse constituents involved in typical touch experiences.

What we typically refer to as “the sense of touch” is what we will call “active” or “haptic” touch. This refers to touch that involves some movement. This movement can be voluntary, exploratory movements of the hands and other sensory surfaces involved in touch, or it can also refer to experiences generated by objects moving against a stationary body. In most cases, haptic touch will involve the engagement of kinesthesis (awareness of movement) and proprioception (awareness of bodily position). Some apply the term “haptic” for any touch that involves the activation of (the physiologically and functionally distinct) kinesthetic or proprioceptive systems (e.g., Loomis and Lederman 1986). Touch mediated entirely through the skin will be referred to as “cutaneous touch”. The term “tactual” will be used as a broad term to refer to any form of touch experience (so it’s used in the same way that “auditory” and “olfactory” are used for hearing and smell ). For the features and objects made available through touch the term “tangible” will be used (again, in the same way as “visible” is used for for features and objects made available by vision).

2. Is Touch Multisensory?

Touch is often classified as one of the traditional five senses, along with sight, hearing, smell, and taste. Touch is, in several ways, seemingly different from these other senses, however. For one thing, touch does not seem to have a single sense organ. The skin, of course, is the most plausible candidate sensory organ, but the skin itself is not sensory. Instead, the skin contains many different sensory systems. Many of them, like those that code for pain and itch, do not seem to be tied directly to the sense of touch. For instance, we don’t, at least in most contexts, seem to treat cutaneous pains as part of the sense of touch proper. The same seems true for itch, tingles, and twinges, though perhaps these seem more closely tied with touch. At any rate, they are not paradigm instances of tactual perception, and if they seem more closely tied to touch, then this is something in need of explanation.

Even if we focus only on those systems usually associated with touch, we find a number of distinct sensory channels. Some of these have proven incredibly difficult to isolate and study (see e.g., the historical discussion in Gallace and Spence 2014). Indeed, we are just now starting to understand the role and function of the most basic receptor types involved in touch. Another methodological challenge, to which we’ll return, concerns the deep connection between touch and exploratory action (nicely summarized in Jones and Lederman 2006). For touch, many of the historically important empirical investigations have focused on cutaneous touch, especially on mapping the two–point threshold over the extent of the body. This threshold is the minimal distance at which a subject can discriminate two distinct stimuli. Its study requires subjects to remain completely still, while very small probes (like horse hair) are used to generate stimuli. It is much more difficult to measure touch in ecologically salient contexts where there are unconstrained movements using the whole body.

This raises some interesting questions about what counts as the sense of touch. There have been various attempts to define touch. One attempt concludes that the typical means of unifying the systems involved in touch fail to give anything like a coherent account. The conclusion is that:

[T]his leaves us with something so heterogeneous that no criteria can unite its various characteristics and at the same time exclude characteristics of other senses. (Ratcliffe 2012: 3)

These discussions reveal the depth and difficulty of the problem. Here are some reasons why the issue is so difficult. At the physiological level, the afferent nerve channels that carry information about thermal properties are very similar to those that code for pain and itch, and they also differ significantly from those involved in the coding of pressure, shape, and vibration (for some empirical background, see Lumpkin and Caterina (2007); for important recent caveats, see Saal and Bensmaia (2014)). In other words, thermal channels are physiologically and functionally more similar to the nociceptive channels involved in pain than they are to the channels involved in discriminative touch (Schepers and Ringkamp 2010). And yet thermal awareness is often considered part of touch, indeed, it has often been thought of as one of the central aspects of touch. Pains, on the other hand, are almost never considered part of touch.

Isolating touch on physiological and functional grounds is thus difficult. In addition, there is the problem that haptic touch involves many essential receptors that are located in the muscles, joints, and tendons, and not in the skin at all. Since these receptors are almost always thought to be involved in coding for touch, there is the additional problem that even the rich set of receptors in the skin are not the only ones involved in typical touch experiences.

Given these facts, touch cannot be associated solely with the skin in any simplistic way. The skin contains a heterogeneous set of distinct receptor populations, and these populations differ in their physiological and functional properties. In addition, our ways of classifying elements as part of touch don’t seem sensitive to any of these differences in obvious ways. It thus seems clear that the sense of touch isn’t simply that form of perceptual awareness constituted by signals made available through the receptors in our skin.

Perhaps because of this functional physiological diversity, the dominant view of touch in the recent cognitive science literature has typically treated touch as inherently multisensory rather than a single unified modality like vision and audition (for examples and discussion, see Loomis and Lederman 1986; Fulkerson 2011; Gallace and Spence 2014; Jones and Lederman 2006; Linden 2015).

Work in philosophy on the individuation of the senses has often found touch to be a difficult case. This often has little to do with the physiological and functional diversity alluded to above. Even if we focus only on the phenomenological features of tactual perception, or on the typical objects of tactual awareness, touch seems to possess a diversity that resists any single unified account. Aristotle noted that touch, unlike the other dominant modalities, seemingly lacked a single “proper sensible” (for a recent empirical treatment, see Kung 2005). On this account, a proper sensible is a sensory feature only available in a single modality, one that was constitutive of that modality (Marmodoro 2014). For vision color is the proper sensible. Any experience of color is visual, since no other modality provides awareness of that feature. The proper sensibles were contrasted with the common sensibles found in more than one modality. Touch doesn’t have a single plausible proper sensible. Instead it has multiple potential proper sensibles, including pressure and temperature. This too might be a strong reason for treating touch as a collection of distinct senses rather than a single modality.

The question of how to individuate sensory modalities has recently been of central importance in philosophy. In what follows, we will briefly consider a few key accounts and how they might apply to the sense of touch.

One approach is to treat the individual sensory modalities as specialized informational channels or “routes into” an organism (Keeley 2002). According to this criterion, touch would again seem to count as a collection of multiple sensory modalities, since touch involves a number of distinct informational channels. They differ in the nature of the stimuli they are sensitive to, the nature of their activation profiles and functional properties, and even in their evolutionary history.[1]

Another plausible view that in many ways is more amenable to unifying the sense of touch is to treat sensory modalities as a conventional kind, something we make use of but that isn't defined entirely by the relevant sciences (Nudds 2003). If this is right, then we shouldn’t expect there to be some underlying physiological unity or connection that grounds our conception of touch. Instead, we use the talk of sensory modalities to mark what a subject might know on the basis of the experience. On this account, what we call the sense of touch is that form of awareness that typically provides awareness of an object’s weight, texture, and temperature, etc. Learning that Anna touched the vase conveys the information that she was in a position to become aware of the warmth and solidity of the vase, among the other typical tangible properties.

We could also reject entirely the idea that we can adequately classify the senses along any single dimension. Instead, we could classify the senses using all of the available criteria, constructing a multidimensional space of possible sensory modalities (Macpherson 2010). On this account, touch would be classified according to its typical sensory organs, its representational content, the physical stimuli to which it is sensitive, and its phenomenal character. On this view, human touch would seemingly occupy a larger expanse of modality space than the other major human senses. This would probably reveal one kind of major difference in kind between human touch and the other sensory modalities.

Another option is to argue that, while touch does have a disunified and heterogeneous functional and physiological profile, this is also largely true of the other sensory modalities. What each of the systems that seem to be unisensory have in common then isn’t unity in any of the major criteria listed above (physiology, content, stimuli, etc.). Instead, it could be that each of the diverse systems involved in human touch function together to connect or bind sensory features together (Fulkerson 2014c). This binding thesis suggests one way in which the diverse systems involved in touch might hang together, even if there is no single dimension on which touch is always unified.

3. Touch and the Other Senses

In addition to its own constituent systems, touch interacts with other modalities in interesting ways. This is important in the history of philosophy especially because the most discussed interaction, or potential interaction, concerned the connection between touch and vision. Both senses bring information about shape and size and location, but they seem to do so in very different ways. The central question has long been the nature and strength of these differences.

This question has received the most attention in large part because of Molyneux’s famous letter to Locke (see the entry on Molyneux’s problem). Molyneux asked whether whether a subject born blind could, upon complete restoration of sight, tell a cube from a sphere (a difference learned through touch) using sight alone. This raises many questions about the transferability and connection between the spatial representations made available in touch and vision. There are many assumptions underlying Molyneux’s question, which have long been investigated by philosophers and psychologists (Evans 1985; Campbell 1996; Hopkins 2005).

In addition, there has been considerable discussion of how touch and vision might differ in terms of their spatial features. Vision, it seems, provides a rich felt awareness of objects in a spatial field–an area where there are potential objects but where none currently reside (that is, we seem in vision to be able to see empty space). Touch, on the other hand, doesn’t seem to present features in this way. Instead, like audition, touch seems only to bring awareness of individual objects that each seem to occupy a specific location.

The relation between touch and agency reveals more interesting areas for further investigation. In particular, it seems plausible that the sense of touch has a closer connection to our agential actions. This is partially a result of the fact that touch seems to require active exploratory movements, and these movements are often guided and voluntary. Given these close connections, it is probably not surprising that touch has such a close connection to agency. One could even use of this close connection between touch and agency to address epistemological problem of perception (see Smith (2002), and the entry on the problem of perception). When we press against a solid object, the resistance to our agential act of pressing gives our experience a more solid epistemic foundation than what we experience through the other sensory modalities. Only in touch do we seem to come into direct contact with reality, a reality that actively resists our voluntary actions.

Philosophers have also been interested in the relation between touch and other sensory modalities. It seems plausible to think that touch, unlike vision, does not have a full, 3 dimensional sensible field in external space. Instead, touch seems confined to the limits of the body, and so the tangible field is, unlike in the other modalities, defined by the limits and extent of the surface of the body. This supposed difference in the nature of their spatial awareness marks a clear structural difference between touch and vision, even when they represent the same sets of objective features. Similarly, one could claim that touch also differs from the other senses in always involving bodily awareness (O’Shaughnessy 1989). Externally–directed touch awareness on such a view would only be made possible against a background of bodily awareness. This sort of view has been labeled “the template view” (Scott 2001).

4. Tangible Qualities

Any discussion of a perceptual modality often turns to the nature of the perceptual qualities or features made available by that modality. A discussion of vision, for instance, naturally leads to metaphysical questions about the nature of the colors. A discussion of audition similarly would bring up questions about the nature of sounds. Touch is unique in this respect, however, since there has been little philosophical investigation of the nature of tangible qualities.

One exception, already noted above, concerns the thermal qualities of hot and cold. But even here, little attention has been paid to the metaphysical nature of these qualities. This is understandable, given that touch seems to bring us into contact with ordinary material objects and their properties. There doesn’t seem to be any serious worries about the nature of solidity, texture, vibration, and the like. There is an important question about the structure of felt tangible qualities, however. How are these ordinary tangible features represented or experienced?

One possibility is that, ultimately, all of the tangible qualities, with the exception of hot and cold, can be reduced to the spatial properties of objects (Armstrong 1962). Defending such a claim involves making an important distinction between transitive and intransitive bodily sensation. The transitive sensations are those like warmth and pressure that have a sensory component as well as a real world property. Intransitive sensations do not have any non–sensational real world feature. This is one way to separate out pains, twitches, and tingles from perceptual touch proper. The spatial view then states that nearly all of the objective tangible features made available through transitive sensation are relational spatial properties. On this relational view of touch, all immediate tactual perception involves a relation holding between our body and objects in contact with it. A rough surface is one that is solid, has hardness, and a certain uneven shape. A smooth surface only differs in having a regular shape. Roughness and smoothness can be analyzed in terms of shape. A hard object is one that does not change its shape. A soft object changes its shape under pressure. Liquidity is defined as having a particular shape in particular circumstances. Pressure plays a role here, so the view also requires a spatial account of pressure. One possibility is that pressure is a quality that has a tendency to cause a change in the shape of the body. Stickyness could be when something remains in contact with the same spot on the skin, slippery things do not. Despite the possibilities for reduction here, many of these moves feel ad hoc and unsupported by the empirical evidence. A better account is needed.

A more recent view holds that tangible qualities are best understood as intensive features that vary in intensity along a single dimension of variation (Fulkerson 2014b). When we feel vibration, for instance, it seems to increase in intensity (in this case, in frequency) along a single qualitative dimension. This seems to be true of most tangible features. They are not typically complex, but simples that vary along a single dimension. This view accords well with the empirical data and offers a unified explanation for the structural connections between an otherwise disjoint collection of sensory features. One worry for this view, however, again concerns our awareness of hot and cold. Variations in intensity alone do not seem apt for capturing the nature of hot and cold experiences (see below). Rather than varying along a single dimension, our experiences of hot and cold seem to vary in intensity in two directions around a neutral point (Gray 2012). Cold experiences are those that vary away from neutral in one direction; our experiences of warmth vary away from neutral in the other (increasing) direction. More importantly, it seems the nature of these movements depends more on changes in our current bodily state than the objective measures of temperature. So once again, thermal properties seem to pose additional difficulties not faced by other tangible qualities.

5. Thermal Awareness

Philosophers have long been interested in the thermal system. As noted above, thermal properties are difficult to connect with other tangible features for both spatial and intensity views. On either view, it seems difficult to make sense of the unique structure and bodily role played by our thermoreceptive systems. One possibility for this difficulty may be due to the fact that thermal properties are secondary qualities. A secondary quality is one that (in some manner) crucially depends on our subjective awareness. The idea is that out in the world there really is no such thing as “hot” and “cold”. Instead, there are only differing amounts of temperature or mean kinetic energy. We feel something much more structured than this through our skin (a fact most keenly developed in Gray 2012). We feel objects as very cold, to cool, and then on to neutral, and only within a fairly narrow total range. After this neutral point, objects take on an entirely different character, and start to feel warm, followed by hot (again, up to a limit). This space of thermal awareness involves a kind of inversion through a neutral point. But this neutral point is unique to human experience; there is no neutral point in the temperature taken objectively. More importantly, the temperatures that we typically feel as neutral depends on the context and especially on the current thermal conditions of our body and sensory surfaces.

This presents something of a problem for our naive conception of thermal awareness. We generally tend to think that our awareness of hot and cold provides objective or at least useful information about actual temperature. We use it to check baby bottles, determine if the heater is on, and make sure the bath isn’t going to scald us. If instead, thermal awareness only gives us awareness of a purely subjective experience only loosely connected with temperature, then it seems thermal awareness isn’t quite what we generally take it to be. A warm stimuli feels cold when our bodies are already heated, but it feels hot when our bodies are in a cold state. This difference can be experienced at once by simultaneously heating one hand in hot water and cooling another in an ice bath, and exposing them both to a neutral water bath. The same water will feel hot and cold at the same time.

Thermal awareness, and its unsteady connection to objective temperature, has been used to argue that sensory systems generally aren’t in the business of (only) conveying objective sensory information (Akins 1996). Instead, it seems to only convey information about our current bodily state (Craig 2002). If this is right, then it might explain some well–known but puzzling phenomena, such as metal feeling cool to the touch, and wood feeling warm, even when they are of the same objective temperature. It also explains our different levels of thermal awareness for body parts at different temperatures.

6. Touch and Bodily Awareness

The sense of touch is closely connected to bodily awareness. This connection is seemingly much stronger than what we find in the other senses (though this is somewhat controversial, as we’ll see). This close connection is easy to understand. Whenever we touch, and especially when we engage in active or haptic touch, we are forced to use our bodies. Setting aside the worries discussed above about defining the organ of touch, there is some truth to the claim that we touch with our whole body. After all, we touch using our skin, muscles, joints, and we can touch using nearly every surface along the whole body.[2] Armstrong’s view, discussed above, suggested that touch was always a felt relation between our bodies and some objective feature connected directly to us.

One possibility is that the sense of touch, while distinct from proprioception, nevertheless always involves it (O’Shaughnessy 1998, 2000; Ratcliffe 2008). Since proprioception is nothing other than awareness of the location and orientation of our own bodies, there is a strong sense in which touch nearly always involves awareness of the body. Citing groundbreaking work on the relation between tactual and bodily awareness by Merleau-Ponty (2002), Gibson (1966), and Martin (1992), Ratcliffe (2012) offers a detailed overview of the ways in which touch seems to bring both an awareness of things external to the body and of the body itself. The body is that by which we measure the features of things in the external world, and so is always present in our awareness of things through touch. There are many reasons for thinking of this connection as relatively weak. There are plausible examples, like playing sports or quickly touching objects, where we seem to have external awareness through touch but no direct bodily awareness (Scott 2001).[3]

Another possibility is that, while touch indeed involves bodily awareness, the nature and structure of this awareness is importantly different from what we see in typical cases of mediated perception. Touch does not involve awareness of the body as a part of some external feature (as in other cases of mediated perception) nor does it involve any explicit cognitive attitude. Instead, it could be that some bodily sensation is necessary for tactual perception (Richardson 2011). This view has the advantage both explaining why touch necessarily involves bodily awareness but also why it differs from more typical cases of mediated perception. In particular, it differs from the template view by dropping any requirement for a matching of spatial or other contents between the tactual perception and the bodily awareness. For this reason, it more easily accommodates extended touch.

Extended touch, or awareness of distal objects and features through a cane or other tool, can be used to argue for a related but distinct view of the relation between perceptual touch and bodily awareness (Fulkerson 2012). That we experience through touch objects and features located some distance from the body raises questions about the mediating role of bodily awareness. Given the nature of extended touch, it seems implausible to hold that there is anything like a matching of the contents of perceptual touch (or the features made available through touch) with the content or features involved in the bodily awareness. Instead, perceptual touch seems to depend on bodily awareness informationally. The idea is that both bodily awareness (proprioception and kinesthesis especially) and discriminative touch make use of the very same sensory inputs. Perceptual touch is the result of extracting distal information from the more proximal bodily information, for use by dedicated downstream systems (cf. Serino and Haggard 2010). Since all perceptual touch will be the result of such extraction, there will always be bodily information available for awareness.

These various views all take a stand on the extent to which touch brings direct awareness of external features and objects, and to what extent such awareness is mediated by awareness of the body. In addition, they are usually forced to take a stand on the spatial contents of perceptual touch. On views according to which all external tactual awareness is ultimately a form of bodily awareness, it is simply not possible to have extended touch experiences. On other views that hold a less restrictive dependence between perceptual touch and bodily awareness, there is an additional burden to explain how distal touch is possible. These choices have analogues in the empirical literature. Some, for instance, want to make a clear distinction between “interoception” and “exteroception” (Craig 2002). According to this view, many aspects of touch, though primarily its thermal properties and most forms of pure bodily sensation (itch, tingles, twinges, etc.) are primarily directed not at the external world, but at the present state of our bodies. This is part of how our bodies maintain homeostasis. This results in the possibility of very different functional roles for certain aspects of bodily awareness, especially as they function in the generation of perceptual touch.

7. Touch and Action

As noted in the beginning, touch seems to have both a passive and an active nature. In its more passive forms, touch involves cutaneous activations across the surface of the body. These include bodily sensations of hot and cold, pressure, vibration, and the like. In addition, these activations have a limited, entirely bodily spatial character. This form of touch has played an important role in the early empirical study of touch, especially in determining the nature and acuity of our sensory receptor populations. This has often been accomplished through the measure of the two–point threshold mentioned above. This distance varies across the body and is a reliable guide to the density and spatial resolution of many tactual receptors on the body.[4] While these passive forms of touch are important, especially in the empirical investigation of touch, in typical, unconstrained touch, we use every part of our bodies to actively explore the environment. We use our hands and arms and fingers, we move our trunks and legs, and we actively feel with nearly every surface of our body. Touch in ordinary use involves specialized movements and grips. Such prehensile manipulation through touch is often distinguished from stereognosis, or object recognition through touch. In addition, these movements recruit and make use of many receptive systems that seem inherently active. For instance, haptic touch involves feedback from our movements, along with information from our motor activities (both in motor planning and efference copies). Perhaps most importantly, it also includes information from receptors in our muscles and joints. All of these elements interact and play a critical role in forming and developing our sense of touch. For this reason, touch, especially of the active, haptic variety, seems like an ideal model for views of perception according to which perception is essentially a form of action, or at least a form of experience that involves action in a unique manner.

Given its active nature and dependence on exploratory movement, many have taken touch to be best understood as an extended “ haptic system” that includes both surface receptors and motor areas (Gibson 1966). The wider haptic system so understood involves the entire body and brings direct awareness of things in the environment by engaging and actively connecting together a number of distinct sensory networks. Many later theorists have been influenced by this compelling account of touch.

The connections between touch and exploration run deep. To cite just one example, subjects have a remarkable ability to determine the size and shape of many large objects simply by hefting and wielding the objects through space (Turvey 1996). These actions provide a rich and distinctive form of awareness that cannot be generated or recreated through skin activations alone. These dynamic touch experiences reveal the strong connection between touch and action.

Many theorists now think of perception as inherently active. This is a large, diverse group, one that includes motor theorists, enactivists, and many others (see the entry on embodied cognition). Touch, especially of the dynamic and interactive kind described by Gibson and Turvey, would seem to provide strong evidence in favor of such views. Or at the least, if the case is to be made, one would expect it to be strongest for the sense of touch in its dynamic forms. To cite here just one prominent example: Noë (2004) defends an account of perception that takes it to be essentially a form of action. He begins his discussion by arguing that vision is “touch like”, involving sampling and exploratory probing of the environment. The active nature of touch is never in question, and can be used in this context as a model for understanding other forms of perception. It is true that haptic touch seems inherently active, but many detailed questions remain about the metaphysical relations between action and touch (for instance, whether action is merely causally necessary or constitutive of touch). This is likely to be an area of ongoing active research.

8. Pleasant Touch

A final area of increasing philosophical investigation concerns the role of pleasure and pain in perception, something typically referred to as “affect”.[5] The question is central to our full understanding of the richness and complexity of perceptual experience. While perception is often assumed to be entirely receptive and descriptive, it is just as often evaluative and motivational. When we smell something awful or see something graphic, we have intense reactions to these experiences, and are directly motivated to act in various ways. These forms of affective perceptual experience seemingly bridge the gap between experience, emotion, and evaluative judgment. For these reason, there are many importantly different accounts available for explaining the valenced nature of these experiences.

Touch again is an excellent source for such investigation. Our tactual experiences often seem to have a felt pleasant or unpleasant character. This isn’t simply an associated but distinct state of pleasure or pain that accompanies the perceptual experience, but part of the perceptual experience itself. Paradigm examples include the pleasure derived from delicious food or the awfulness of certain bad smells. Here again, touch is ready for increased investigation. In recent years, researchers have discovered a specialized class of afferent nerve channels that seem to be responsible for the experience of pleasantness (Löken et al. 2009; McGlone et al. 2012). These channels, called CT-Afferents, are maximally responsive to slow, regular activations like those generated by a feather pulled gently across the arm. These channels seem like pleasant versions of the famous C-fibers implicated in pain experiences.

While the discovery of these afferents has been an exciting development in our understanding of affective perceptual experience, they also raise many questions. How can a receptor “code for pleasantness”? Are there other similar receptors for pleasant touch in glabrous skin (the smooth, hairless skin of the lips and palms where they are no CT–afferents). What do these receptors mean for our understanding of pleasure and pain and affective experience more generally? And returning to where we started, we can seriously wonder whether and to what extent the CT system seems to be a part of touch. The CT system seems, unlike that for cutaneous pain, to be a genuine component of the touch system; on the other hand, the CT system also doesn’t appear to have any direct discriminative function. CT interactions reveal much about the complex ways in which emotions and motivation can come to be closely connected to perceptual experience. They can also be seen as a bridge to a better understanding of affiliative touch, the close form of caring touch that forms an essential element of social bonding and human development, especially of the immune system (Field 2003). This should prove to be an area of increasing research.


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