The Identity Theory of Truth

First published Thu Mar 28, 1996; substantive revision Thu Jan 13, 2011

The simplest and most general statement of the identity theory of truth is that when a truth-bearer (e.g., a proposition) is true, there is a truthmaker (e.g., a fact) with which it is identical and the truth of the former consists in its identity with the latter. The theory is best understood as a reaction to the correspondence theory, according to which the relation of truth-bearer to truthmaker is correspondence. A correspondence theory is vulnerable to the nagging suspicion that if the best we can do is make statements that merely correspond to the truth, then we inevitably fail to capture the reality they are about and thus fall short of the truth we aim at. An identity theory is designed to overcome this suspicion.


1. Motivations and Sources

The theory has some roots in the ideas of mystical philosophers for whom the world is a unity in which there is no fundamental divide between the representing and the represented. (See, for example, Plotinus, The Enneads: 5th Ennead, 3rd Tractate, §5; 5th Ennead, 5th Tractate, §2.)

But it is also a response to certain related, more directly intellectual, pressures. One such pressure is the wish that there should be no gap between mind and world: that when we think truly, we think what is the case [see McDowell (1994), p.27]. This pressure is related to another: dissatisfaction with the correspondence theory of truth [e.g. Mackie (1973), p. 57]. Here, for example, is Frege:

A correspondence, moreover, can only be perfect if the corresponding things coincide and so are just not different things. … It would only be possible to compare an idea with a thing if the thing were an idea too. And then, if the first did correspond perfectly with the second, they would coincide. But this is not at all what people intend when they define truth as the correspondence of an idea with something real. For in this case it is essential precisely that the reality shall be distinct from the idea. But then there can be no complete correspondence, no complete truth. So nothing at all would be true; for what is only half true is untrue. Truth does not admit of more and less. [Frege (1918), p. 3]

Frege then goes on to deploy a charge of circularity against the likely reply that all the correspondence theory requires is correspondence in a certain respect. He himself concluded that truth was indefinable; but some have thought it possible to formulate an identity theory of a recognizably Fregean sort.

2. Judgments and Reality

The identity theory is clearly absurd from the point of view of those who, for instance, believe that truth-bearers are sentences and truthmakers non-linguistic states of affairs. But it may be available to those who hold the kinds of metaphysical views which make truth-bearers and truthmakers more alike. In the early twentieth century, a number of philosophers held theories of judgment which appear to do just this (see §3.2).

2.1 Pushing judgments towards reality

Some philosophers have tried to make judgments more like the reality they are about. Bertrand Russell (1903), reacting against idealism, at one stage adopted a view of judgment which did not regard it as an intermediary between the mind and the world: instead, a judgment involves the relation of a person to a proposition, where a proposition consists of the very things the judgment is about. This involves a kind of realism about judgments, and looks as though it offers the possibility of an identity theory of truth. For if one judges that Socrates is ugly, then one is related to a unified entity, the proposition, whose unity consists in the very object at issue, Socrates, instantiating the very property at issue, namely ugliness.

However, since both true and false judgments are composed of real constituents in just the same way, truth would not be distinguished from falsehood by being identical with reality. An identity theory of truth is thus unavailable on this view of judgment because it would be rendered vacuous by being inevitably accompanied by an identity theory of falsehood. As a result, those who have held this sort of view of judgments have typically embraced instead a theory of truth sometimes labelled ‘primitivism’, according to which truth is an unanalysable property of some judgments. [Russell (1904), p. 473; Moore (1901–2) expresses a closely related view; Cartwright (1987) treats primitivism and the identity theory as one view rather than as rivals.] While primitivism is not the only path available at this point, it is clear that all paths lead away from the identity theory of truth. The only identity theory to be found here is an identity theory of judgment.

Russell himself moved on to a series of multiple relation theories of judgment according to which a judgment was not a binary relation between a person and a proposition, but a multiple relation between a person and the several real world constituents which had made up propositions on his previous theory. With propositions out of the picture, the unity of a judgment was now to be effected by the judging relation (so that the unity was that of an act rather than an object) and Russell hoped he could thus draw a distinction between true and false judgments without resorting to primitivism. Whether Russell succeeded in this is controversial, but even if he did there is no chance for an identity theory of truth here either. For now there are no propositions to be identified with truthmakers, and judgments themselves cannot be identified with them either since judgments essentially contain the judging relation. Russell thus adopted a correspondence theory of truth. [Less brutally condensed accounts of these matters can be found in Baldwin (1991), Candlish (1989, 1999b and 2007).]

2.2 Pushing reality towards judgments

Other philosophers, notably those who have held the idealist view that reality is experience, have implied that facts are more like judgments. One such is F. H. Bradley, who explicitly embraced an identity theory of truth, regarding it as the only account capable of resolving the difficulties he finds with the correspondence theory. [See Bradley (1907).] The way he reaches it is worth describing in a little detail, for it shows how he could avoid allowing the theory to be rendered vacuous by an accompanying identity theory of falsehood.

Bradley argues that the correspondence theory's view of facts as real and mutually independent entities is unsustainable: the impression of their independent existence is the outcome of the illegitimate projection on to the world of the divisions with which thought must work, a projection which creates the illusion that a judgment can be true by corresponding to part of a situation: as, e.g., the remark ‘The pie is in the oven’ might appear to be true despite its (by omission) detaching the pie from its dish and the oven from the kitchen. His hostility to such abstraction ensures that, according to Bradley's philosophical logic, at most one judgment can be true—that which encapsulates reality in its entirety. This allows his identity theory of truth to be accompanied by a non-identity theory of falsehood, since he can account for falsehood as a falling short of this vast judgment and hence as an abstraction of part of reality from the whole; as this abstraction is a matter of degree (scientific laws, he thought, because of their generality, require much less abstraction than particular truths), the degree to which a judgment is true is the degree to which it is identical with reality as a whole, while its degree of falsehood is in inverse proportion. Although the consequence is that all ordinary judgments will turn out to be more or less infected by falsehood, Bradley thus allows some sort of place for false judgment and the possibility of distinguishing worse from better. One might argue that the reason the identity theory of truth remains only latent in Russell and Moore is the surrounding combination of their atomistic metaphysics and their assumption that truth is not a matter of degree.

For Bradley, then, that judgment is the least true which is the most distant from the whole of reality. But, as reality is a unified whole, at most one judgment can be fully true. But even this one judgment has so far been conceived as describing reality, and its truth as consisting in correspondence with a reality not distorted by being mentally cut up into illusory fragments. Accordingly, even this one, for the very reason that it remains a description, will be infected by falsehood unless it ceases altogether to be a judgment and becomes the reality it is meant to be about. This apparently bizarre claim becomes intelligible if seen as both the most extreme expression of his hostility to abstraction and a reaction to the most fundamental of his objections to the correspondence theory, which is the same as Frege's: that for there to be correspondence rather than identity between judgment and reality, the judgment must differ from reality and in so far as it does differ, to that extent must distort and so falsify it.

Thus Bradley's version of the identity theory turns out to be, in one way, misleadingly so-called. For when we come to the absolute, unqualified truth which has no degree of falsehood at all, the theory turns out to be eliminativist: with the attainment of truth of full degree, judgments disappear and only reality is left. It is not surprising that Bradley, despite expressing his theory in the language of identity, talked of the attainment of complete truth by saying, ‘[I]f their identity is worked out, thought ends in a reality which swallows up its character’, committing a ‘happy suicide’ (1897: 152). In the end, then, even the attribution of the identity theory of truth to one who explicitly endorsed it turns out to be dubious. [For a more detailed version of this section, see Candlish (1995). For different doubts about whether Bradley was an identity theorist, see Walker (1998).]

3. Propositions and Facts

The identity theory was absent for most of the twentieth century (at least from analytic philosophy) [though see Baylis (1948), Woozley (1949) and Chisholm (1966)]. Since it re-emerged towards the century's end, it has often been treated as the theory that true propositions and facts are identical (and that this identity constitutes the nature of truth). For some general linguistic and metaphysical arguments both for and against this identification, see §9 of the entry on propositions. (See also Cartwright 1989 and David 2001.) Even if such arguments favour an identification, however, it is not clear how we might conceive of propositions and facts so that they could be identical. In the following subsections we consider several ways of doing this.

3.1 Pushing propositions towards facts

One approach is to employ Russell's (1903) account of propositions as structured entities with real world constituents (for general discussion, see the entry on structured propositions). However, as we in effect saw above, Russellian propositions seem to make a poor basis for an identity theory of truth: either they are unified in the same way as facts, in which case false propositions are also identical with facts, or they are not, in which case no proposition can be identical with a fact.

One way to avoid this dilemma is to draw a distinction between what unifies a fact and what makes it obtain. This option is more clearly expressed using the terminology of states of affairs. It is one thing for a state of affairs, such as that Socrates is ugly, to be unified, and so to exist, or have being: it is another for that state of affairs to obtain, or be a fact, so that Socrates is in fact ugly. The state of affairs exists whether or not it obtains, whether or not Socrates is ugly, but only obtaining states of affairs are facts. On this view, a false proposition is identical with a non-obtaining state of affairs and so the mere existence of the proposition that Socrates is ugly does not entail that it is a fact that he is. This means that there is also a distinction between true and false propositions: true propositions are identical with facts—obtaining states of affairs—and false propositions are not [compare Meinong (1902/1983), Chisholm (1966) and Gaskin (2009)].

This theory may make it plausible to identify true propositions and facts, but what sort of theory of truth is it? Since, on this view, all propositions are states of affairs, what singles out the true propositions is that they obtain (are facts). Thus it seems that the property of truth is being identified with the property of obtaining. But what is this latter property? It may be a property that can apply to entities other than states of affairs. For example, for a possible state of affairs to obtain might be for it to be concretized, where objects and properties can also be concretized. Be that as it may, both the property of obtaining and the property of being concretized appear to be primitives. If so, then truth is a primitive property too [as Meinong (1902/1983) concluded]. Thus, as with Russell's original account, this theory threatens to slide into primitivism about truth.

3.2 Pushing facts towards propositions

Like Russellian propositions, Fregean propositions (or, in Frege's terminology, judged thoughts) are structured entities. Unlike Russellian propositions their constituents are concepts. Yet Frege himself said that ‘a fact is a thought that is true’ [Frege 1918: 25]. Fregean facts, then, must be very different from the sort of ‘worldly’ facts which are envisaged in correspondence theories. Because of this, an identity theory based on them does not seem to be immediately disabled by the inevitable accompaniment of an identity theory of falsehood.

It is arguable that at least on one ordinary conception of facts, facts might be Fregean. In particular, Strawson (1950) famously argued that we individuate facts as finely as propositions. Nevertheless there are reasons to think that, contra Strawson, worldly facts also have an important role to play, especially in the theory of truth. Specifically, there is surely some connection between true propositions and reality and, moreover, it appears platitudinous that true propositions are true in virtue of the way the world is. Why not say, then, that worldly facts are the things that make propositions true?

Recognizing this pressure, Julian Dodd (2000), who offers the most thorough identity theory that appeals to Fregean facts, attacks this idea at its root. That is, he argues that the entire truthmaker project—the search for things which make propositions true—is misguided. The viability of the truthmaker project remains controversial, but it is clear that this style of identity theory must at least deny that there are facts which are truthmakers. (For more details about the truthmaker project, see §8.5 of the entry on the correspondence theory of truth.)

In fact, it is clear that this approach does not attempt to give a theory about the relation between truths and reality. For this reason, it faces the difficulty of making out the claim that it is a theory of truth at all, since it lacks independent accounts of truth-bearers and truthmakers to give the theory substance. [See Candlish (1995, 1999a), Dodd and Hornsby (1992), Dodd (1996, 1999), Hornsby (1997, 1999).]

This difficulty is particularly prominent in Dodd (2000). For although this book in its very title proclaims its author's adherence to an identity theory, it actually defends a variety of deflationism: ‘truth is nothing more than that whose expression in a language gives that language a device for the formulation of indirect and generalized assertions’ (p. 133, emphasis Dodd's). What became of the identity theory? The answer lies in the fact that Dodd conceives his identity theory as consisting entirely in the denial of correspondence and the identification of facts with true thoughts. It actually has nothing to say about ‘the nature of truth’, as traditionally conceived, offering no definition of ‘is true’, no explanation of what truth consists in or of the difference between truth and falsehood. This theory is ‘modest’, to use Dodd's expression, as opposed to ‘robust’ identity theories which begin from the bipolar recognition of independent conceptions of fact (conceived as truthmaker) and proposition (conceived as truth-bearer) employed in correspondence theories, and then attempt in one way or another to eliminate the apparent gap between them. Dodd's view is that his ‘modest’ theory gets some bite from its opposition to correspondence theories; and he urges (as does Hornsby) that we should anyway scale down our expectations of what a theory of truth can provide. However, the history of identity theories of truth reveals them as tending to mutate into other theories when put under pressure, as one can see from the discussion in the present article. Dodd holds that this is a problem only for robust theories. Yet his theory also exemplifies a variety of this tendency: in the end, it evolves into deflationism.

In contrast, William Fish and Cynthia Macdonald (2007, 2009) have recently outlined an interpretation of John McDowell's (1994, 2005) conception of truth which they claim shows that Fregean propositions could be identical with ‘worldly’ facts. Following Frege, McDowell makes a distinction between sense and reference and holds that propositions are composed of senses. Also like Frege, he argues that facts are nothing more than true propositions, or true ‘thinkables’ in his preferred terminology. Fish and Macdonald interpret these claims to mean that propositions are composed of senses, but that senses can be facts. In other words, a proposition such as the proposition that that tiger is undernourished is, if true, a molecular fact. It is a molecular fact because it is composed of two other facts: namely, the fact that the object demonstrated is a tiger and the fact that it is undernourished. And these latter two facts are also senses, or concepts, under which the relevant objects and properties are presented to thought. If this conception can be coherently developed, then it may be possible to have a broadly Fregean account of propositions which identifies propositions with facts and yet adheres to a robust, worldly conception of facts.

Whatever the merits of this theory (and whether or not it faithfully represents McDowell's conception of truth), precisely because it identifies true propositions with worldly facts, it must face the problem of false propositions. As we have seen, the two available options appear to be to deny that there are false propositions or to become a primitivist about truth.

3.3 Disjunctivism

There is a third, disjunctivist option, however. In this context, disjunctivism is the position that the bearers of truth and falsity are fundamentally different entities. That is, true truth bearers are one kind of entity namely facts, and false truth bearers are some other, distinct kind of entity. However the details are worked out, by allowing two fundamentally different types of truth bearer, it is possible to identify facts with true truth bearers without also identifying them with false ones.

Disjunctivism of this sort would also be compatible with an identity theory of truth. For it is open to a disjunctivist to say that the nature of truth is that a proposition is true when it is a fact. The property of being true is the property of being a fact. Moreover, it is possible that we could give an account of facts independently of true propositions so that this theory had real content. For example, facts could be individuated by their constituents and the way those constituents are unified. A similar story might be told for falsehood.

The costs of disjunctivism are these. First, it is natural to say that whether I believe truly or falsely that wombats are fast runners, what I believe is the same. And, given an account of belief whereby to believe that wombats are fast runners is to stand in the believing relation to some thought content, then it seems that the object of my belief is the same whether I believe truly or falsely. So the disjunctivist account can appear unintuitive. Second, the disjunctivist needs an account of false truth bearers that gets their modal properties right. Suppose the disjunctivist wishes to identify facts and true propositions but not facts and false propositions. It is natural to say that the fact that wombats are fast runners does not exist in all worlds—it exists only in those worlds, such as the actual world, in which it is true that wombats are fast runners. This means that the entity I stand in the believing relation to, when I believe that wombats are fast runners, exists in some worlds but not in others—it exists only in those worlds in which it is true that wombats are fast runners. Likewise, since whatever is the entity that I would have stood in the believing relation to if wombats were not fast runners is essentially false, it exists only in those worlds in which wombats are not fast runners. Thus the question arises, what is the proposition which exists only in worlds in which wombats are not fast runners and that I would stand in the believing relation to if in such a world I were to believe that wombats are fast runners? Moreover, whatever that thing is, it clearly cannot be the proposition that wombats are fast runners in every world, since in some worlds, like the actual one, I stand in the believing relation to that proposition and it is true.

4. Quietism

Jennifer Hornsby (1997, 1999) and McDowell (on an alternative reading to that of Fish and Macdonald) endorse a version of the identity theory they see as truistic and which they put forward as an antidote to substantive theorizing about truth. The truism they emphasize is the truism that when one thinks truly what one thinks is the case. Moreover, they both say, following Wittgenstein (1921), the world is everything that is the case. Thus, when we think truly there is no ‘ontological gap’ between what we think and reality. While Hornsby and McDowell characterize the resulting view as an identity conception of truth, it is important to realize that they resist inflating the above remarks into an identification of truth bearers and truthmakers. To do so, they appear to think, is to move us beyond the truisms in a way which pushes us towards a correspondence theory of truth. The alternative appears to be to abandon the distinction between truth bearers and truthmakers entirely.

But do the ‘truisms’ already take us too far? For one thing, Hornsby and McDowell have a Fregean conception of propositions. This raises two questions. First, how can Fregean propositions, which have senses as constituents, be identical with worldly facts? Second, is the idea that there is no ontological gap between thought and reality a form of idealism? We have already seen the answer Fish and Macdonald offer to the first question. A more quietistic answer is that if we resist reifying thinkables and facts, then to speak literally of ‘constituents’ of either is misguided. In response to the second question, McDowell (1994) points out that denying there is an ontological gap between thought and reality does not imply that reality is dependent on what we think about it. True, it does entail that reality is structured in the same way as the concepts we have of it. But this is consistent with both realism and idealism.

McDowell's distinction between what he calls the realms of sense and reference may provide further help with these questions. The realm of reference is the realm of things and properties—these are the things we think about. The realm of sense, by contrast, is the realm of things we think, the realm in which rational relations hold, and the realm of things which are the case. Now, it is arguable that reality is the realm of reference. If this is right, then on McDowell's view reality is neither made up of senses, nor must it be conceptually structured. And while which things having which properties determines what the facts are, and so what is the case, we do not need to go so far as to think of facts as entities which have things and properties as constituents. However, as McDowell himself emphasizes, we can also think of reality as what is the case, and so belonging to the realm of sense. Perhaps, then, the appropriate picture is that the realms of sense and reference are not two distinct ontological realms, but rather two ways of conceptualizing the one underlying reality.

The truisms may thus not go too far, but do they go far enough? Even if Hornsby's and McDowell's versions of the identity theory conflicts with the correspondence theory, they seem compatible with both deflationism and primitivism. In fact, McDowell (2005: 87) and Hornsby (1997: 16–22) both point out that their views are distinct from deflationism only if deflationists are committed to denying the notion of truth can play a central role in theorizing about meaning; and Hornsby, at least, seems amenable to the idea that truth could be further illuminated, without being defined, by mapping its connections to other semantic concepts by constructing theories of interpretation—and this appears to be a form of Davidsonian primitivism about truth.

The quietistic approach to the identity theory seems to embody a now familiar lesson. To the extent that such theories are coherent, those who hold them often appear to end up endorsing some other theory of truth, typically primitivism or deflationism. Thomas Baldwin argues that the identity theory of truth, though itself indefensible, has played an influential but subterranean role within philosophy from the nineteenth century onwards, citing as examples philosophers of widely different convictions. [See Baldwin (1991). One of his attributions is queried in Stern (1993), others in Candlish (1995).] Whether or not Baldwin is right—and it is possible that the theory is no more than an historical curiosity—the identity theory of truth may turn out to be best thought of as comparable to solipsism: rarely, if ever, consciously held, but the inevitable result of thinking out the most extreme consequences of assumptions which philosophers often just take for granted.

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Bradley, Francis Herbert | facts | Frege, Gottlob | Meinong, Alexius | Moore, George Edward | propositions | propositions: structured | Russell, Bertrand | truth: coherence theory of | truth: correspondence theory of | truth: deflationary theory of | truth: revision theory of

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