The Identity Theory of Truth

First published Fri May 1, 2015

[Editor's Note: The following new entry by Richard Gaskin replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous authors.]

The identity theory of truth was influential in the formative years of modern analytic philosophy, and has come to prominence again recently. Broadly speaking, it sees itself as a reaction against correspondence theories of truth, which maintain that truth-bearers are made true by facts. The identity theory maintains, against this, that at least some truth-bearers are not made true by, but are identical with, facts. The theory is not normally applied at the level of declarative sentences, but to what such sentences express. It is these items—or, again, some of them—that are held to be identical with facts. Identity theorists diverge over the details of this general picture, depending on what exactly they take declarative sentences to express, whether Fregean Thoughts (at the level of sense), Russellian propositions (at the level of reference), or both, and depending also on how exactly facts are construed. But, to give a precise illustration, an identity theorist who thinks that declarative sentences express Russellian propositions will typically hold that true such propositions are identical with facts. The significance of the identity theory, for its supporters, is that it appears to make available the closing of a certain gap that might otherwise be thought to open up between language and world and/or between mind and world. If its supporters are right about this, the identity theory of truth potentially has profound consequences both in metaphysics and in the philosophies of mind and language.

1. Definition and preliminary exposition

Declarative sentences seem to take truth-values, for we say things like

  • (1) “Socrates is wise” is true.

But sentences are not the only bearers of truth-values: we also allow that what such sentences express, or mean, may be true or false. So we also say such things as

  • (2) “Socrates is wise” means that Socrates is wise,[1]


  • (3) That Socrates is wise is true


  • (4) It is true that Socrates is wise.

If, provisionally, we call the things that declarative sentences express, or mean, their contents—again provisionally, these will be such things as that Socrates is wise—then the identity theory of truth, in its most general form, states that (cf. Baldwin 1991: 35):

  • (5) The content of a declarative sentence is true just if it is (identical with) a fact.

A fact is here to be thought of as, very generally, a way things are, or a way the world is. On this approach, the identity theory secures an intimate connection between language (what language expresses) and world. Of course there would in principle be theoretical room for a view that identified not the content of, say, the true declarative sentence “Socrates is wise”—let us assume from now on that this sentence is true—with the fact that Socrates is wise, but rather that sentence itself. However, it would seem that this is not a version of the theory that anyone has ever advanced, nor does it appear that it would be plausible to do so (see Candlish 1999b: 200–2; Künne 2003: 6). The early Wittgenstein does, of course, regard sentences as being themselves facts, but they are not identical with the facts that make them true.

Alternatively, and using a different locution, one might say that, to continue with our favored example,

  • (6) That Socrates is wise is true just if that Socrates is wise is the case.

The idea here is that (6) makes a connection between language and reality: on the left-hand side we have something expressed by a piece of language, and on the right-hand side we allude to a bit of reality. Now (6) might look truistic, and that status has indeed been claimed for the identity theory, at least in one of its manifestations. John McDowell has argued that what he calls true “thinkables” are identical with facts (1996: 27–8, 179–80). Thinkables are things like that Socrates is wise regarded as possible objects of thought. For we can think that Socrates is wise; and it can also be the case that Socrates is wise. So what we can think can also be (identical with) what is the case. That identity, McDowell claims, is truistic. On this approach, one might prefer one’s identity theory to take the form (cf. Hornsby 1997: 2):

  • (7) All true thinkables are (identical with) facts.

And on this approach the identity theory aims to secure an intimate connection between mind (what we think) and world.

A point which has been obscured in the literature on this topic, but which should be noticed, is that (7) asserts a relation of subordination: it says that true thinkables are a (proper or improper) subset of facts; it implicitly allows that there might be facts that are not identical with true thinkables. So (7) is not to be confounded with its converse,

  • (8) All facts are (identical with) true thinkables,

which asserts the opposite subordination, and says that facts are a (proper or improper) subset of true thinkables, implicitly allowing, this time, that there might be true thinkables that are not identical with facts. (8) is quite distinct from (7), and if (7) is controversial, (8) is equally or more so, but for reasons that are at least in part different. (8) denies the existence of facts that cannot be grasped in thought. But many philosophers will hold it to be evident that there are, or at least could be, such facts—perhaps certain facts involving indefinable real numbers, for example, or in some other way going beyond the powers of human thought, perhaps even divine thought (if there is such a thing). So (8) could be false; its status remains to be established; it can hardly be regarded as truistic. Accordingly, one might expect that an identity theorist who wished to affirm (7), and certainly anyone who wanted to say that (7) (or (6)) was truistic, would—at least qua identity theorist—steer clear of (8), and leave its status sub judice. Surprisingly, however, a good number of identity theorists, both historical and contemporary, incorporate (8) as well as—or even instead of—(7) into their statement of the theory. Richard Cartwright, who published the first modern discussion of the theory in 1987, though he found difficulties in the formulation, wrote that if one were formulating the theory, it would say “that every true proposition is a fact and every fact a true proposition” (1987: 74). McDowell states that

true thinkables already belong just as much to the world as to minds [i.e., (7)], and things that are the case already belong just as much to minds as to the world [i.e., (8)]. It should not even seem that we need to choose a direction in which to read the claim of identity. (2005: 84)

Jennifer Hornsby takes the theory to state that true thinkables and facts coincide (1997: 2, 9, 17, 20)—they are the same set—so that she in effect identifies that theory with the conjunction of (7) and (8), as also, in effect, does Julian Dodd (2008a: passim). Now, (8) is certainly an interesting thesis that merits much more consideration than it has hitherto received (at least in the recent philosophical literature), and, as indicated, the above theorists can appeal to the fact that early expositions of the identity theory seem to have had as much invested in (8) as in (5) or (7): on this point see §2 below. Nevertheless, it will make for clarity of discussion if we associate the identity theory of truth, more narrowly, with something along the lines of (5) or (7), and omit (8) from this particular discussion.[2] That will be my policy here.

Whether or not (6) is truistic, both (5) and (7) involve technical or semi-technical vocabulary, and so can hardly count as truisms. Moreover, they have been advanced as moves in a technical debate—concerning the viability of the correspondence theory of truth—and so on that basis, too, can hardly be regarded as truistic (Dodd 2008a: 179). What (5) and (7) mean, and which of them one will prefer as one’s statement of the identity theory of truth, if one is favorably disposed to that theory—one may of course be happy with both—will depend, among other things, on what exactly one thinks about the nature of such entities as that Socrates is wise. In order to get clear on this point, discussion of the identity theory has naturally been conducted in the context of the Fregean semantical hierarchy, which distinguishes between levels of language, sense, and reference. Frege recognized what he called “Thoughts” (Gedanken)[3] at the level of sense corresponding to (presented by) declarative sentences at the level of language. McDowell’s thinkables are meant to be Fregean Thoughts, the change of terminology being intended to stress the fact that these entities are not thoughts in the sense of dated (and perhaps spatially located) individuals, but are abstract contents that are at least in principle (particular cases may introduce restrictions) available to be grasped by different thinkers at different times and places. So a Fregean identity theory of truth would regard both such entities as that Socrates is wise and, correlatively, facts as sense-level entities: this kind of identity theory will then state that true such entities are identical with facts. This approach will naturally favor (7) as its expression of the identity theory.

By contrast with Frege, Russell abjured the level of sense and (at least around 1903–4) recognized what, following Moore, he called “propositions” as worldly entities composed of objects and properties. A modern Russellian approach might adopt these propositions—or something like them: the details of Russell’s own conception are quite vague—as the referents of declarative sentences, and an identity theorist who followed this line might prefer to take a particular reading of (5) as his or her slogan. So this Russellian would affirm something along the lines of:

  • (9) All true Russellian propositions are identical with facts (at the level of reference),

by contrast with the Fregean’s

  • (10) All true Fregean Thoughts are identical with facts (at the level of sense).

This way of formulating the relevant identity claims indicates immediately that it would, at least in principle, be open to a theorist to combine (9) and (10) in a hybrid position that (i) departed from Russell and followed Frege by admitting both a level of Fregean sense and one of reference, and also, having admitted both levels to the semantic hierarchy, (ii) both located Fregean Thoughts at the level of sense and located Russellian propositions at the level of reference. Sense being mode of presentation of reference, the idea would be that declarative sentences refer, via Fregean Thoughts, to Russellian propositions. (For this disposition, see Gaskin 2006: 203–20; 2008: 56–127.) So someone adopting this hybrid approach would affirm both (9) and (10). Of course, the facts mentioned in (9) would be categorially different from the facts mentioned in (10), and one might choose to avoid confusion by distinguishing them terminologically, and perhaps also by privileging one set of facts, ontologically, over the other. If one wanted to follow this privileging strategy, one might say, for instance, that only reference-level facts were genuine facts, the relata of the identity relation at the level of sense being merely fact-like entities, not bona fide facts. That would be to give the combination of (9) and (10) a Russellian spin. Alternatively, someone who took the hybrid line might prefer to give it a Fregean spin, saying that the entities with which true Fregean Thoughts were identical were the genuine facts, and that the corresponding entities at the level of reference that true Russellian propositions were identical with were not facts as such, but fact-like correlates of some sort. Just so far, of course, these privileging strategies leave the status of the entities they are treating as merely fact-like unclear; and, as far as the Fregean version of the identity theory goes, commentators who identify facts with sense-level Fregean Thoughts usually, as we shall see, abjure reference-level Russellian propositions altogether, rather than merely downgrading their ontological status, and so affirm (10) but reject (9). We shall return to these issues in §4 below.

2. Historical background

The expression “the identity theory of truth” was first used—or, at any rate, first used in the relevant sense—by Stewart Candlish in an article on F.H. Bradley published in 1989. But the general idea of the theory had been in the air during the 1980s: for example, in his discussion of John Mackie’s correspondence theory of truth, first published in a Festschrift for Mackie in 1985, McDowell noted that if we say something like

A true statement is one such that the way things are is the way it represents them as being,

we thereby make

truth consist in a relation of correspondence (rather than identity) between how things are and how things are represented as being, (1998: 137 n. 21)

the implication here being that identity would be the right way to conceive the given relation. And versions of the identity theory go back at least to Bradley,[4] and to the founding fathers of the analytic tradition (Sullivan 2005: 56–7 n. 4). The theory can be found in G.E. Moore’s “The Nature of Judgment” (1899), and in the entry he wrote (perhaps at the same time) on “Truth” for J. Baldwin’s Dictionary of Philosophy and Psychology (1902–3) (1993: 4–8, 20–1; see Baldwin 1991: 40–3). Russell embraced the identity theory at least during the period of his 1904 discussions of Meinong (see, e.g., Russell 1973: 75), and possibly also in his The Principles of Mathematics of 1903, and for a few years after these publications as well.[5] Frege has a statement of the theory in his 1919 essay “The Thought”, and may have held it earlier.[6]

Wittgenstein’s Tractatus (1922) is usually held to propound a correspondence rather than an identity theory of truth. In the Tractatus, declarative sentences (Sätze) are said to be facts (arrangements of names), and states of affairs (Sachlagen, Sachverhalte, Tatsachen) are also said to be facts (arrangements of objects): a sentence is true just if there is an appropriate relation of correspondence (an isomorphism) between sentence and state of affairs. Interestingly, it has been suggested (by Peter Sullivan) that Wittgenstein’s position in the Tractatus may actually be closer to an identity theory than has traditionally been supposed (Sullivan 2005: 58–9). The idea is that Wittgenstein’s simple objects are in fact to be identified with Fregean senses, and that in effect the Tractatus contains an identity theory along the lines of (7) or (10).[7] The orthodox position, which will be presupposed here, is that, like Russell, the Tractarian Wittgenstein simply abjures the level of the Fregean sense, so that his semantical hierarchy consists exclusively of levels of language and reference, with nothing of a mediatory or similar nature located between these levels, and accordingly that, since he does not recognize the existence of proposition-like entities (either at the level of sense, obviously, or at the level of reference), Wittgenstein does not have the wherewithal to expound an identity conception of truth—at least not a plausible one, since, as was noted above (§1), no one wants to identify true sentences with the facts or states of affairs that make them true (if any).

Note that Wittgenstein has two different conceptions of fact, a factive and a non-factive one. According to the former conception, facts necessarily obtain or are the case; according to the latter, facts may fail to obtain or not be the case. (This non-factive conception is explicit at Tractatus 1.2–1.21, and presupposed at 2.1; see Johnston 2013: 382.) Identity theorists normally presuppose the factive conception, and that is the policy which will be followed here; but the non-factive conception will be tangentially relevant in §5 below. Similarly, for Wittgenstein states of affairs may either obtain or fail to obtain—both possibilities are, in general, available to them—and he says or implies of the world both (i) that it is everything that is the case, and (ii) that it is everything that is the case as well as everything that is not the case (Tractatus 1.1, 2.04–2.063; see Stenius 1960: 51).

3. Motivation

What motivates the identity theory of truth? It is best viewed as a response to difficulties that seem to accrue to at least some versions of the correspondence theory of truth (cf. Dodd 2008a: 120, 124). The correspondence theory holds that truth consists in a relation of correspondence between something linguistic or quasi-linguistic, on the one hand, and something worldly on the other. Generally, the items on the worldly end of the relation are taken to be facts or (obtaining) states of affairs. For many purposes these two latter kinds of entity (facts, obtaining states of affairs) are assimilated to one another, and that strategy will be followed here. The exact nature of the correspondence theory will then depend on what the other relatum is taken to be. The items mentioned so far make available three distinct versions of the correspondence theory, depending on whether this relatum is taken to consist of declarative sentences, Fregean Thoughts, or Russellian propositions. Modern correspondence theorists make a distinction between a truth-bearer, which would typically be one of these three items, and truth-makers,[8] which are held to be facts. On this approach, true declarative sentences, Fregean Thoughts, or Russellian propositions correspond to facts in the sense that facts are what make those sentences, Thoughts, or propositions true, when they are true. (Henceforth we shall normally speak simply of Thoughts and propositions, understanding these to be Fregean Thoughts and Russellian propositions respectively, unless otherwise specified.)

That immediately gives us a constraint on the shape of worldly facts. Take our sample sentence “Socrates is wise”, and recall that this sentence is here assumed to be true. At the level of reference we encounter the object Socrates and (assuming realism about properties)[9] the property of wisdom, and both of these may be taken to be entities in the world, but neither amounts to a fact: neither amounts to a plausible truth-maker for the sentence “Socrates is wise”, or for its expressed Thought, or for its expressed proposition. That is because the existence of Socrates, just as such, and the existence of wisdom, just as such, are not enough to make it true that Socrates is wise (Armstrong 1997: 115–16; Dodd 2008a: 7). (Even if we add in further universals, such as the relation of instantiation, and indeed the instantiation of instantiation to any degree, the basic point is not altered.) Rather, if there are to be truth-makers in the world, it seems clear that they will have to be structured, syntactically or quasi-syntactically, in the same general way as declarative sentences, Thoughts, and propositions. For convenience we can refer to structure in this general sense as “propositional structure”: the point then is that neither Socrates, nor the property of wisdom, nor (if we want to adduce it) the relation of instantiation is, just as such, propositionally structured. Following this line of thought through, we appear to reach the conclusion that nothing short of full-blown entities like the fact that Socrates is wise will be competent to make the sentence “Socrates is wise”, or the Thought or proposition expressed by that sentence, true.[10]

The question now is: can we regard such entities as truth-makers for corresponding sentences, Thoughts, or propositions? Consider first the suggestion that the worldly fact that Socrates is wise is the truth-maker for the reference-level proposition that Socrates is wise. There surely are such facts as the fact that Socrates is wise: we appear to talk about such things all the time. The problem would seem to be not with the existence of such facts, but rather with the relation of correspondence which is said by the version of the correspondence theory that we are currently considering to obtain between the fact that Socrates is wise and the proposition that Socrates is wise. As emerges from this way of expressing the difficulty, there seems to be no linguistic difference between the way we talk about propositions and the way we talk about facts, when these entities are specified by “that” clauses. That suggests that facts just are true propositions. If that is right, then the relation between facts and true propositions is not one of correspondence—which, as Frege famously observed (1918–19: 60; 1977: 3; Künne 2003: 8), implies the distinctness of the relata—but identity.

This intuition can be strengthened by noting the following point about explanation. Correspondence theorists have typically wanted the relation of correspondence to explain truth: they have usually wanted to say that it is because the proposition that Socrates is wise corresponds to a fact that it is true, and because the proposition that Socrates is foolish—or rather: It is not the case that Socrates is wise (after all, his merely being foolish is not enough to guarantee that he is not wise, for he might, like James I and VI, be both wise and foolish)—does not correspond to a fact that it is false. But the distance between the true proposition that Socrates is wise and the fact that Socrates is wise seems to be too small to provide for explanatory leverage. In fact, there seems to be no distance at all. Suppose we ask: Why is the proposition that Socrates is wise true? If we reply by saying that it is true because it is a fact that Socrates is wise, we seem to have explained nothing, but merely repeated ourselves (cf. Strawson 1971: 197; Anscombe 2000: 8). There are, to be sure, circumstances in which we tolerate statements of the form “A because B” where an appropriate identity—perhaps even identity of sense, or reference, or both—obtains between “A” and “B”. For example, we say things like “He is your first cousin because he is a child of a sibling of one of your parents” (Künne 2003: 155). But here there is a definitional connection between left-hand side and right-hand side, which is not so with “The proposition that Socrates is wise is true because it is a fact that Socrates is wise”. In the latter case there is no question of definition; rather, we are supposed, according to the correspondence theorist, to have an example of metaphysical explanation, and that is what, according to the identity theorist, fails. After all, the identity theorist will insist, it seems obvious that the relation, whatever it is, between the proposition that Socrates is wise and the fact that Socrates is wise must, given that the proposition is true, be an extremely close one: what could this relation be? If the identity theorist is right that the relation can hardly be one of metaphysical explanation (in either direction), then it seems hard to resist the apparent insinuation of the linguistic data that the relation is one of identity.

It is for this reason, incidentally, that identity theorists normally insist that their position should not be defined in terms of an identity between truth-bearer and truth-maker. That way of expressing the theory is too much in thrall to correspondence theorists’ talk (cf. Candlish 1999b: 200–1, 213). For the identity theorist, to speak of both truth-makers and truth-bearers would imply that the things allegedly doing the truth-making were distinct from the things that were made true. But, since in the identity theorist’s view there are no truth-makers distinct from truth-bearers, and since nothing can make itself true, it follows that there are no truth-makers simpliciter, only truth-bearers. That is: if there were truth-makers, they would have to be identical with truth-bearers; but they could not be so identical; so there are no truth-makers. On this approach correspondence appears to give way to identity as the relation which must obtain between a proposition and a fact if the proposition is to be true. And explanatory pretensions will have to be abandoned, or at least severely curtailed: for while it is, according to the identity theorist, correct to say that a proposition is true just if it is identical with a fact, false otherwise, it is perhaps hard to maintain that anything very illuminating has been said about truth (cf. Hornsby 1997, 2). What the identity theorist has attempted to do is spell out some conceptual connections that we habitually draw between the notions of proposition, truth, and fact; and some may feel that this does not take us very far. (Of course, an identity theorist will counter that to go further would be to fall into error.) That is why McDowell, for one, prefers to talk of an identity conception of truth (2005: 83), rather than an identity theory, which he regards as too grand a term for the view in question.[11] So much for the thesis that facts are truth-makers and propositions truth-bearers; an exactly parallel argument applies to the version of the correspondence theory that treats facts as truth-makers and Thoughts as truth-bearers.

Although it is not strictly relevant to the motivation of the identity theory, we might look briefly, for the sake of completeness, at the suggestion that facts make declarative sentences true. So far, this seems to be a thesis that the identity theorist can accept: there is no threat of triviality, or of a collapse to an identity relation, because worldly facts such as that Socrates is wise are genuinely distinct from linguistic items such as the sentence “Socrates is wise”. So the identity theorist need not jib at the suggestion that such sentences have worldly truth-makers, if that is how the relation of correspondence is being glossed. But one might question the appropriateness of the gloss: for it does not seem possible, without falsification, to draw detailed links between sentences and bits of the world. After all, different sentences in the same or different languages can surely “correspond” to the same bit of the world, and these different sentences might have very different (numbers of) components. The English sentence “There are cows” contains three words: are there then three bits in the world corresponding to this sentence, and jointly making it true? What about the fact that an equivalent sentence in another language might contain a different number of words? It is natural to think that, if the correspondence idea is to be doing serious work in the assertion that a true declarative sentence corresponds to something in the world, there must be a reasonably robust structural isomorphism between sentence and world; but then the fact that quite differently structured and constituted sentences—“There are cows”, as it might be, and its translations into other languages—ought to correspond to the same piece of reality will raise a severe difficulty. How can a three-word sentence and a ten-word sentence both “correspond” in any interesting sense to reality? Both sentences can be true, of course, and we often use the phrase “corresponds to the facts” as a variant locution for “is true”; but the correspondence theorist is after more than merely a fancy way of talking. So it could well be objected that we are going down a blind alley here. The relation of “correspondence” between world and sentence seems not to be doing real work in establishing the truth-value of a sentence; rather, the point will surely be that a sentence is true just if it expresses a true Thought or a true proposition (or both), and here the identity theorist will insist, as we have seen, that the relation of a true Thought or proposition to a fact is one of identity, not correspondence. But, whether or not it is attractive, it would at least be theoretically possible to combine an identity theory of truth at the level of Thought or proposition (or both) with a correspondence theory at the level of language.[12]

4. Identity, sense, and reference

Identity theorists are agreed that, in the case of any particular relevant identity, a fact will constitute the worldly relatum of the relation, but there is significant disagreement among them on the question what the item on the other end of the relation is—whether a Thought or a proposition (or both). As we have seen, there are three possible positions here: (i) one which places the identity relation exclusively between true Thoughts and facts, (ii) one which places it exclusively between true propositions and facts, and (iii) a hybrid position which allows identities of both sorts (identities obtaining at the level of sense will of course be quite distinct from identities obtaining at the level of reference). Which of these positions an identity theorist adopts will depend on wider metaphysical and linguistic considerations that are strictly extraneous to the identity theory as such.

Identity theorists who favor (i) generally do so because they want to have nothing to do with propositions as such. That is to say, such theorists eschew propositions as reference-level entities: of course the word “proposition” may be, and sometimes is, applied to Fregean Thoughts at the level of sense, rather than Russellian propositions at the level of reference. For example, Hornsby (1997: 2–3) uses “proposition” and “thinkable” interchangeably. So far, this terminological policy might be considered neutral with respect to the location of propositions and thinkables in the Fregean semantic hierarchy: that is to say, if one encounters a writer who talks about “thinkables” and “propositions”, perhaps identifying them, one does not yet know where in the semantic hierarchy this writer thinks they belong. We cannot assume, unless we are specifically told so, that they are necessarily meant to belong to the level of sense. After all, someone who houses propositions at the level of reference holds that these reference-level entities are thinkable, in the sense that they are graspable in thought (perhaps via Thoughts at the level of sense). But they are not thinkables if this latter word is taken to be a technical term referring to entities at the level of sense, as it is taken by McDowell and Hornsby, who both identify their thinkables with Fregean Thoughts, which are clearly sense-level entities. For clarity the policy here will be to continue to apply the word “proposition” exclusively to Russellian propositions at the level of reference.

Note that the above point shows that the McDowell/Hornsby way with the word “thinkable” is unhappy: for someone who (say) locates propositions at the level of reference, and also locates Fregean Thoughts at the level of sense to present these propositions, holds such reference-level propositions to be, in a relatively non-technical sense, thinkable—that is, graspable in thought via Fregean senses. To that extent Frege’s own word “Thought” (capitalized) seems to be a better fit for the relevant sense-level propositionally structured entities than the neologism “thinkable”, which turns out to be too imprecise, and my policy here will be to use “Thought” in the relevant sense, namely to mean propositionally structured sense-level entities that are presented by declarative sentences and are capable of being taken up into thought. McDowell was moved to change the terminology from “Thought” to “thinkable” by the reflection that such things are not private entities, or available to particular individuals only, or episodes that are occurrent only at particular times and places, but are objective, publicly available contents able to be entertained by different thinkers at different times and places. So long as we continue to bear this important point in mind, there would seem to be no difficulty, and some advantage, in continuing to use the Frege’s own terminology.

Usually, as we have said, identity theorists who favor (i) above have this preference because they repudiate propositions as reference-level entities. There are several reasons why such identity theorists feel uncomfortable with propositions, construed as entities at the level of reference. There is a fear that these entities, if they existed, would have to be construed as truth-makers; and identity theorists, as we have seen, want to have nothing to do with truth-makers (Dodd 2008a: 112). That fear could be defused if facts were also located at the level of reference for true propositions to be identical with. This move would take us to an identity theory in the style of (ii) or (iii) above. Another reason for suspicion of reference-level propositions is that commentators often follow Russell in his post-1904 aversion specifically to false objectives, that is, to false propositions in re (Russell 1966: 152; Cartwright 1987: 79–84). Such entities are often regarded as too absurd to take seriously as components of reality. (So Baldwin 1991: 46; Dodd 1995: 163; 1996; 2008a: 66–70, 113–14, 162–6.) More especially, it has been argued that false propositions in re could not be unities: that the price of unifying a proposition at the level of reference would be to make it true (Dodd 2008a: 165). That, if right, would surely constitute a reductio ad absurdum of the whole idea of reference-level propositions. For if there cannot be false reference-level propositions, it seems that there cannot be true ones either. If, on the other hand, one is happy with the existence of propositions in re or reference-level propositions, both true and false,[13] one is likely to favor an identity theory in the style of (ii) or (iii). And, once one has got as far as jettisoning (i) and deciding between (ii) and (iii), there must surely be a good case for adopting (iii): for if one has admitted propositionally structured entities both at the level of sense (Thoughts) and at the level of reference (propositions), there seems no good reason not to be maximally liberal in allowing identities between entities of these two types and, respectively, sense- and reference-level kinds of fact (or fact-like entities).

Against what was suggested above about Frege (§2), it has been objected that Frege could not have held an identity theory of truth (Baldwin 1991: 43); the idea here is that, even if he had acknowledged states of affairs as bona fide elements of reality, Frege could not have identified true Thoughts with them on pain of confusing the levels of sense and reference. As far as the exegetical issue is concerned, the objection overlooks the possibility that Frege might have identified true Thoughts with facts construed as sense-level entities, rather than with states of affairs taken as reference-level entities; and, as we have noted, Frege does indeed appear to have made the former identification (Dodd and Hornsby 1992). Still, the objection raises an important theoretical issue. It would surely be a serious confusion to try to construct an identity across the categorial division separating sense and reference, in particular to attempt to identify true Fregean Thoughts with reference-level facts or states of affairs.[14] It has been suggested that McDowell and Hornsby are guilty of this confusion;[15] they have each rejected the charge,[16] insisting that, for them, facts are not reference-level entities, but are, like Fregean Thoughts, sense-level entities.[17]

But, if one adheres to the Fregean version of the identity theory ((i) above), which identifies true Thoughts with facts located at the level of sense, and admits no correlative identity, in addition, connecting true propositions located at the level of reference with facts or fact-life entities also located at that level, it looks as though one faces a difficult dilemma. At what level is the world to be placed? Suppose first one puts it at the level of reference (this appears to be Dodd’s favored view: see 2008a: 180–1, and passim). In that case the world will contain no facts or propositions, but just objects and properties hanging loose in splendid isolation from one another, a dispensation which looks suspiciously like an unacceptable Kantian transcendental idealism. (Simply insisting that the properties include not merely monadic but also polyadic ones, such as the relation of instantiation, will not in itself solve the problem: we will still just have a bunch of separate objects, properties, and relations.) If there are no true propositions—no facts—or even false propositions to be found at the level of reference, but if also, notwithstanding that lack, the world is located there, the objects it contains will be bare objects, not things of certain sorts. Some philosophers of a nominalistic bias might be happy with this upshot; but the problem is how to make sense of the idea of a bare object—that is, an object not characterized by any properties. (Properties not instantiated by any objects, by contrast, will not be problematic, at least not for a realist.)

So suppose, on the other hand, that one places the world at the level of sense, on the grounds that the world is composed of facts, and that that is where facts are located. This ontological dispensation is explicitly embraced by McDowell (1996: 179). The problem with this way out of the dilemma would seem to be that Fregean sense is constitutively mode of presentation of reference, so that on this approach the world would be made up of modes of presentation—of what? Of objects and properties? These are certainly reference-level entities, but if they are presented by items in the realm of sense, which is being identified on this approach with the world, then again, as on the first horn of the dilemma, they would appear to be condemned to an existence at the level of reference in splendid isolation from one another, rather than in propositionally structured combinations, so that once more we would seem to be committed to a form of Kantian transcendental idealism (Suhm, Wagemann, Wessels 2000: 32; Sullivan 2005: 59–61; Gaskin 2006:199–203). Both ways out of the dilemma appear to have this unacceptable consequence. The only difference between those ways concerns where exactly in the semantic hierarchy we locate the world; but that in itself is, arguably, of relatively less concern to metaphysicians than the requirement to avoid divorcing objects from the properties that make them things of certain sorts, and both ways out of the dilemma flout this requirement.

To respect the requirement, we need to nest reference-level objects and properties in propositions, or proposition-like structures, also located at the level of reference. And then some of these structured reference-level entities—the true or obtaining ones—will, it seems, be facts, or at least fact-like. Furthermore, once one acknowledges the existence of facts, or fact-like entities, existing at the level of sense, it seems in any case impossible to prevent the automatic generation of facts, or fact-like entities, residing at the level of reference. The generation occurs by a simple process of abstraction, such reference-level facts or fact-like entities being merely equivalence classes of suitable Thoughts (that is, Thoughts expressed by synonymous sentences according to some appropriate standard of synonymy). One has to decide how to treat these abstracted entities theoretically. If one were to insist that the sense-level entities were the genuine and only facts, the corresponding reference-level entities would be merely fact-like, and contrariwise. But, regardless whether the propositionally structured entities automatically generated in this way by sense-level propositionally structured entities are to be thought of as facts or merely fact-like, it would seem perverse not to identify the world with these abstracted entities.[18] To insist on continuing to identify the world with sense-level rather than reference-level propositionally structured entities would seem to fly in the face of a requirement to regard the world as maximally objective and maximally non-perspectival. McDowell himself hopes to avert any charge of embracing an unacceptable idealism consequent on his location of the world at the level of sense by reminding us that senses present their references directly, not descriptively, so that reference is, as it were, contained in sense (1996: 179–80). But an opponent might reply that the requirement of maximal objectivity forces an identification of the world with the contained, not the containing, entities in this scenario, which in turn forces—if the threat of Kantian transcendental idealism is to be obviated—the upshot that the contained entities be propositionally structured as such, that is, as contained entities, and not simply in virtue of being contained in propositionally structured containing entities.[19]

5. Difficulties with the theory and possible solutions

5.1 The modal problem

G.E. Moore raised a difficulty for the identity theory (1953: 308) which has been repeated since (see, e.g., Fine 1982: 46–7; Künne 2003: 9–10). The proposition that Socrates is wise exists in all possible worlds where Socrates and the property of wisdom exist, but in some of those worlds this proposition is true and in others it is false. The fact that Socrates is wise, by contrast, only exists in those worlds where the proposition both exists and is true. So it would seem that the proposition that Socrates is wise cannot be identical with the fact that Socrates is wise. They have different modal properties, and so by the principle of the indiscernibility of identicals they cannot be identical.

Note, first, that this problem, if it is a problem, has nothing especially to do with the identity theory of truth or with facts. It arises already for true propositions and propositions taken simpliciter before ever we get to the topic of facts. That is, one might think that the proposition that Socrates is wise is identical with the true proposition that Socrates is wise (assuming, as we are doing, that this proposition is true), and yet the proposition taken simpliciter and the true proposition appear to have different modal properties: the true proposition that Socrates is wise does not exist at worlds where the proposition that Socrates is wise is false, but the proposition taken simpliciter obviously does. And indeed the problem, if it is a problem, is still more general, and purported solutions to it go back at least to the Middle Ages (when it was discussed in connection with Duns Scotus’ formal distinction).[20] Suppose that Socrates is a cantankerous old curmudgeon. Now grumpy Socrates, one would think, is identical with Socrates. But in some other possible worlds Socrates is of a sunny and genial disposition. So it would seem that Socrates cannot be identical with grumpy Socrates after all, because in these other possible worlds, while Socrates goes on existing, grumpy Socrates does not exist—or so one might think.

Can the identity theorist deal with this problem, and if so how? Here is one suggestion. Suppose we hold, staying with grumpy Socrates for a moment, that, against the assumption made right at the end of the last paragraph, grumpy Socrates does in fact exist in the worlds where Socrates has a sunny disposition. The basis for this move would be the thought that, after all, grumpy Socrates is identical with Socrates, and Socrates exists in these other worlds. So grumpy Socrates exists in those worlds too; it is just that he is not grumpy in those worlds. (Suppose Socrates is very grumpy; suppose in fact that grumpiness is so deeply ingrained in his character that worlds in which he is genial are quite far away and rather few in number. Someone surveying the array of possible worlds, starting from the actual world and moving out in circles, and stumbling at long last upon a world with a pleasant Socrates in it, might register the discovery by exclaiming, with relief, “Oh look! Grumpy Socrates is not grumpy over here!”.) Similarly, one might contend, the true proposition, and fact, that Socrates is wise goes on existing in the worlds where Socrates is not wise, because the true proposition, and fact, that Socrates is wise just is the proposition that Socrates is wise, and that proposition goes on existing in these other worlds, but in those worlds that true proposition, and fact, is not a true proposition, or a fact. (In Scotist terms one might say that the proposition that Socrates is wise and the fact that Socrates is wise are really identical but formally distinct.) Note that this does not involve the Wittgensteinian non-factive conception of facts: for there is nothing according to this picture which is a fact but does not obtain when these properties are indexed to the same parameters (in particular: are taken to hold of the same possible world).

This solution was, in outline, proposed by Richard Cartwright in his 1987 discussion of the identity theory (1987: 76–8; cf. David 2002: 128–9; Dodd 2008a: 86–8). According to Cartwright, the true proposition, and fact, that there are subways in Boston exists in other possible worlds where Boston does not have subways, even though in those worlds that fact would be not be a fact. (Compare: grumpy Socrates exists in worlds where Socrates is genial and sunny, but he is not grumpy there.) So even in worlds where it is not a fact that Boston has subways, that fact, namely the fact that Boston has subways, continues to exist. So far so good, but Cartwright arguably makes two mistakes in describing this solution. First, he draws on Kripke’s distinction between rigid and non-rigid designation, suggesting that his solution can be described by saying that the expression “The fact that Boston has subways” is a non-rigid designator. But that is surely mistaken: that expression goes on referring to, or being satisfied by (depending on how exactly one wants to set up the semantics of definite descriptions: see Gaskin 2008: 56–81), the fact that Boston has subways in possible worlds where Boston does not have subways; it is just that, though that fact exists in those worlds, it is not a fact there. But the expression in question is perfectly rigid. The second slip-up that it seems to be possible to detect in Cartwright’s presentation is that he allows for a true reading of

The fact that there are subways in Boston might not have been the fact that there are subways in Boston.

But Cartwright should surely say that this sentence is just false, period (David 2002: 129). The fact that there are subways in Boston would still have gone on being the same fact in worlds where Boston has no subways, namely the fact that there are subways in Boston; it is just that in those worlds this fact would not have been a fact. You might say, in that world the fact that there are subways in Boston would not be correctly described as a fact, but in talking about that world we are talking about it from the point of view of our world, and in our world it is a fact. (Similarly with grumpy Socrates.)

Now, an objector will no doubt want to press the following point against the above argument on behalf of the identity theorist. Consider again the fact that Socrates is wise. Surely, the objector will say, it is more natural to maintain that that fact does not exist in a possible world where Socrates is not wise, rather than that it exists there all right, but is not a fact. After all, imagine a conversation about a world in which Socrates is not wise and suppose that Speaker A claims that Socrates is indeed wise in that world. Speaker B might counter with:

No, sorry, you're wrong. There is no such fact in that world; the purported fact that Socrates is wise simply does not exist in that world.

It might seem odd to insist that B is not allowed to say this and must say instead,

Yes, you’re right that there is such a fact in that world, namely the fact that Socrates is wise, but in that world that fact is not a fact.

How might the identity theorist respond to this objection? One possible strategy would be to make a distinction between fact and factuality, as follows. Factuality, one might say, is a reification of facts. Once you have a fact, you also get, as an ontological spin-off, the factuality of that fact. The fact, being a proposition, exists at all possible worlds where the proposition exists, though in some of these worlds it is not a fact, since the proposition is false in those worlds. The factuality of that fact, by contrast, only exists at those worlds where the fact is a fact—where the proposition is true. So factuality is a bit like a trope. Compare grumpy Socrates again. Grumpy Socrates, the identity theorist might contend, exists at all worlds where Socrates exists, though at some of those worlds he is not grumpy. But Socrates’ grumpiness—that particular trope—exists only at worlds where Socrates is grumpy. That seems to obviate the problem, because the suggestion being canvassed here is not that grumpy Socrates is identical with Socrates’ grumpiness—so that the fact that these two entities have different modal properties need embarrasses no one—but rather that grumpy Socrates is identical with Socrates. Similarly, the suggestion is not that the proposition that Socrates is wise is identical with the factuality of the fact that Socrates is wise, but that it is identical with that fact. So the identity theorist would accommodate the objector’s point by insisting that facts exist in all sorts of possible worlds where their factualities do not exist.

Finally, the reader may be wondering why this problem was ever raised against the identity theory of truth in the first place. After all, one might think, the identity theorist does not say that propositions simpliciter are identical with facts, but that true propositions are identical with facts, and now true propositions and facts surely have exactly the same modal properties: for regardless how things are with the sheer proposition that Socrates is wise, at any rate the true proposition that Socrates is wise must be thought to exist at the same worlds as the fact that Socrates is wise, whatever those worlds are. However, as against this quick way with the purported problem, there stands the intuition, mentioned and exploited above, that the true proposition that Socrates is wise is identical with the proposition that Socrates is wise. So long as that intuition is in play, the problem indeed arises—for true propositions, in the first instance, and then for facts by transitivity of identity. But the identity theorist will maintain that, as explained, the problem has a satisfactory solution.

5.2 The “right fact” problem

Candlish (1999a: 238–9; 1999b: 202–4), following Cartwright (1987: 74–5), has urged that the identity theory of truth is faced with the difficulty of getting hold of the “right fact”. Consider a version of the identity theory that states:

  • (11) The proposition that p is true just if it is identical with a fact.[21]

Candlish’s objection is now that (11)

does not specify which fact has to be identical with the proposition for the proposition to be true. But what the identity theory requires is not that a true proposition be identical with some fact or other, it is that it be identical with the right fact. (1999b: 203)

In another paper Candlish puts the matter like this:

But after all, any proposition might be identical with some fact or other (and there are reasons identified in the Tractatus for supposing that all propositions are themselves facts), and so all might be true. What the identity theory needs to capture is the idea that it is by virtue of being identical with the appropriate fact that a proposition is true. (1999a: 239)

The reference to the Tractatus is suggestive. Of course, we must beware of confusion at this point: the Tractatus does not have propositions in the sense of that word figuring here, that is, it does not recognize Russellian propositions (propositions at the level of reference). Nor indeed does it recognize Fregean Thoughts. In the Tractatus, as we have noted (§2), declarative sentences (Sätze) are facts (arrangements of names), and states of affairs (Sachlagen, Sachverhalte, Tatsachen) are also facts (arrangements of objects). And it is usually held, as we have said, that Wittgenstein propounds a correspondence theory of truth connecting the two, so that (assuming that that orthodoxy is correct) the Tractatus is not immediately relevant to a context in which the identity theory of truth is in question. But what is interesting in Candlish’s allusion to the Tractatus is the reminder that propositions (in our sense) are Tractarian in the sense that they are structured arrangements of entities, namely objects and properties. (Correlatively, Fregean Thoughts are structured arrangements of senses.) False propositions (and false Fregean Thoughts) will equally be arrangements of objects and properties (respectively, senses). So the difficulty that Cartwright and Candlish have identified can be put like this. Surely any proposition, whether or not it is true, is identical with some fact or other given that a proposition is an arrangement of entities of the appropriate sort. If propositions just are facts, then every proposition is identical with some fact—at the very least, with itself—whether it is true or false. So surely the right-to-left direction of (11) is incorrect.

J.C. Beall (2000) has attempted to dissolve this problem on the identity theorist’s behalf by invoking the principle of the indiscernibility of identicals. If we ask, in respect of (11), what the “right” fact is, it seems that we can answer that the “right” fact must at least have the property of being identical with the proposition that p,[22] and the indiscernibility principle then guarantees that there is only one such fact. However, this proposal does not deal with the difficulty that we have just identified. For suppose that the proposition that p is false. That proposition will still be identical with itself, of course, and if we are saying (in Wittgensteinian spirit) that propositions are facts, then that proposition will be identical with at least one fact, namely itself. So it will satisfy the right-hand side of (11), its falsity notwithstanding. But now, having said that, an obvious patch-up suggests itself: the right fact is surely the fact that p. Gloss (11) with

  • (12) The proposition that p is true just if (a) it is a fact that p, and (b) the proposition that p is identical with that fact.

Falsity now no longer presents a difficulty, because if it is false that p then it is not a fact that p, so (a) fails, and there is no appropriate candidate for the proposition that p to be identical with.[23] Notice that, in view of the considerations already aired in connection with the modal problem ((i) of this section), we have to be careful here. Suppose that it is true that p in the actual world, but false at some other possible world. It would be wrong to say, given the line taken above, that, in the possible world where it is false that p, there is no such fact as the fact that p. There is indeed such a fact, because it is (in the actual world) a fact that p, and that fact, and the true proposition, that p, go on existing in the possible world where it is false that p; it is just that that fact is not a fact in that possible world. But (12) deals with this subtlety. In the possible world we are considering, where it is false that p, though the fact that p exists, it is not a fact that p, so (a) fails, and there is accordingly no risk of our getting hold of the “wrong” fact. Note also that if we follow a Wittgensteinian line, we will indeed allow the (false) proposition that p to be identical with a fact—at the very least with itself—but we can now, given the failure of (a), say with a clear conscience that that fact is the wrong fact, which does not suffice to render the proposition true.

5.3 The “slingshot” problem

If the notorious “slingshot” argument worked, it would pose a problem for the identity theory of truth. The argument exists in a number of different, though related, forms, and this is not the place to explore all of these in details.[24] Here we shall look briefly at what is one of the simplest and most familiar versions of the argument, namely Davidson’s. This version of the argument aims to show that if true declarative sentences refer to anything (for example to propositions or facts), then they all refer to the same thing (to the “Great Proposition”, or to the “Great Fact”). This upshot would be quite unacceptable to an identity theorist of a Russellian cast, who thinks that declarative sentences refer to propositions, and that true such propositions are identical with facts: any such theorist is naturally going to want to insist that the propositions referred to by different declarative sentences are, at least in general, distinct, and likewise that the facts with which distinct true propositions are identical are also distinct. Davidson expresses the problem that the slingshot argument purportedly throws up as follows:

The difficulty follows upon making two reasonable assumptions: that logically equivalent singular terms have the same reference; and that a singular term does not change its reference if a contained singular term is replaced by another with the same reference. But now suppose that “R” and “S” abbreviate any two sentences alike in truth value. (1984: 19)

He then argues that the following four sentences have the same reference:

  • (13) \(R\)
  • (14) \(\hat{z} (z = z \mathbin\& R) = \hat{z} (z = z)\)
  • (15) \(\hat{z} (z = z \mathbin\& S) = \hat{z} (z = z)\)
  • (16) \(S\)

(The hat over a variable symbolizes the description operator: so “\(\hat{z}\)” means the \(z\) such that …) This is because (13) and (14) are logically equivalent, as are (15) and (16), while the only difference between (14) and (15) is that (14) contains the expression (Davidson calls it a “singular term”) “\(\hat{z} (z = z \mathbin\& R)\)” whereas (15) contains “\(\hat{z} (z = z \mathbin\& S)\)”,

and these refer to the same thing if S and R are alike in truth value. Hence any two sentences have the same reference if they have the same truth value. (1984: 19)

The difficulty with this argument, as a number of writers have pointed out (see, e.g., Yourgrau 1987; Gaskin 1997: 153 n. 17; Künne 2003: 133–41), and the place where the identity theorist is likely to raise a cavil, lies in the two assumptions on which it depends. Davidson calls these assumptions “reasonable”, but they have both been widely questioned. The first assumption is “that logically equivalent singular terms have the same reference”. Why should one accept this assumption? Intuitively, the ideas of logical equivalence and reference seem to be quite distinct, indeed to have, as such, little to do with one another, so that it would be odd if there were some a priori reason why the assumption had to hold. And it is not difficult to think of apparent counterexamples: the sentence “It is raining” is logically equivalent to the sentence “It is raining and (either David Cameron is Prime Minister or it is not the case that David Cameron is Prime Minister)”, but the latter sentence seems to carry a referential payload that the former does not. Of course, if declarative sentences refer to truth-values, as Frege thought, then the two sentences will indeed be co-referential, but to assume that sentences refer to truth-values would be question-begging in the context of an argument designed to establish that all true sentences refer to the same thing. The second assumption is “that a singular term does not change its reference if a contained singular term is replaced by another with the same reference”; this assumption is also dubious, though to spell out details would take us too far afield into the semantics of definite descriptions.[25] At any rate, enough has been said to indicate that the identity theorist does, plausibly, have a viable response to the slingshot argument.

5.4 The congruence problem

Two further objections to the identity theory may be dealt with more briefly. One objection, which goes back to an observation of Strawson’s made in 1950 (1971: 196; cf. Künne 2003: 10–12), is based on the point that canonical names of propositions and of facts are not straightforwardly congruent: they are not intersubstitutable salva proprietate, vel sim. For example, we say that propositions are true, not that they obtain, whereas we say that facts obtain, not that they are true. How serious is this point? The objection in effect presupposes that for two expressions to be co-referential, or satisfied by one and the same thing, they must be syntactically and proprietorially congruent, i.e., that (a) they can fill the same slots in sentences, with the same results in terms of well- or ill-formedness; and (b) predicates that can properly and sensibly be attached to the one expression can properly and sensibly be attached to the other. But this assumption is (in both its parts) highly controversial, and it may be possible for the identity theorist simply to deny it. (See Gaskin 2008: 106–10, for argument on the point, with references to further literature; cf. Dodd 2008a: 83–6.)[26]

5.5 The individuation problem

It might appear that we individuate propositions more finely than facts: for example, one might argue that the fact that Hesperus is bright is the same fact as the fact that Phosphorus is bright, but that the propositions in question are different (Künne 2003: 10–12). The identity theorist has a number of strategies in response to this objection. One would be simply to deny it, and maintain that facts are individuated as finely as propositions: if one is a supporter of the Fregean version of the identity theory, this is likely to be one’s response (see, e.g., Dodd 2008a: 90–3). Alternatively, one might respond by saying that, if there is a good point hereabouts, at best it tells only against the Fregean and Russellian versions of the identity theory, not against the hybrid version. The idea here would be that—so this identity theorist is ready to concede—we normally think of facts as extensional, reference-level entities; and this theorist also agrees that we also, at least sometimes, individuate propositions or proposition-like entities intensionally. These twin points then do indeed tell against either a strict Fregean or a strict Russellian version of the identity theory: they tell against the strict Fregean position because, as well as individuating facts intensionally, we also, sometimes, individuate facts extensionally; and they tell against the strict Russellian position because, as well as individuating facts extensionally, we also, sometimes, individuate facts intensionally. But the hybrid version of the identity theory is not touched by the objection, because that theory accommodates factual entities, of some sort, at both levels of sense and reference, but different sorts at these different levels—either facts at the level of sense and correlative fact-like entities at the level of reference or vice versa. It will follow that Thoughts and propositions are available, if true, to be identical with the factual entities of the appropriate level (sense and reference, respectively), and the individuation problem does not arise. Propositions or propositionally structured entities will be individuated just as finely as we want them to be individuated, and at each level of resolution there will be facts or fact-like entities, individuated to the same resolution, for them to be identical with, if true.

5.6 Truth and Intrinsicism

The solutions to these problems, if judged satisfactory, perhaps point us in the direction of a conception of truth that has been called “intrinsicist” (Wright 1999: 207–9), or “primitivist” (Candlish 1999b: 207). This was a conception recognized by Moore and Russell who, in the period when they were sympathetic to the identity theory, spoke of truth as a simple and unanalysable property (Moore 1953: 261; 1993: 20–1; Russell 1973: 75; Cartwright 1987: 72–5; Johnston 2013: 384). The point here is as follows. There are of course particular, individual explanations of the truth of many propositions. For example, the true proposition that there was a fire in the building will be explained by alluding to the presence of combustible material, enough oxygen, a spark caused by a short-circuit, etc. So, case by case, we will (at least often) be able to provide explanations why given propositions are true, and science is expanding the field of such explanations all the time. But according to the intrinsicist, there is no prospect of providing a general explanation of truth, in the sense of an account that would explain, in utterly general terms, why any true proposition was true. At that general level there is nothing interesting to be said about what makes true propositions true: there are only the detailed case-histories. The intrinsicist is quite happy to embrace one or another version of the identity theory of truth. What is abjured is the idea that the truth of a true proposition might consist in a relation to a distinct fact—that the truth of the true proposition that Socrates is wise, for example, might consist in anything other than identity with the fact that Socrates is wise. There seems point in holding that, on this approach, truth is held to be both intrinsic to propositions, and primitive.[27] Intrinsicism is not a popular position these days: Candlish describes it as “so implausible that almost no one else [apart from Russell, in 1903–4] has been able to take it seriously” (1999b: 208); but it may be an idea whose time has come.

Candlish (ibid.) thinks that intrinsicism and the identity theory are competitors, but that view is not mandatory. Intrinsicism says that truth is a simple and unanalysable property of propositions; the identity theory says that a true proposition is identical with a fact (and with the right fact). These statements will seem to clash only if the identity theory is taken to propound a heavy-duty analysis of truth. But if, following recent exponents of the theory, we take it rather to be merely spelling out a connection between two entities that we have in our ontology anyway, namely true propositions and facts, and which turn out (like Hesperus and Phosphorus) to be identical, on the basis of a realization that an entity like that Socrates is wise is both a true proposition and a fact, then there will seem to be no clash between intrinsicism and the identity theory. The identity theory, one might say, analyses the way in which truth is a simple and unanalysable property.


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