The Deflationary Theory of Truth
According to the deflationary theory of truth, to assert that a statement is true is just to assert the statement itself. For example, to say that ‘snow is white’ is true, or that it is true that snow is white, is equivalent to saying simply that snow is white, and this, according to the deflationary theory, is all that can be said significantly about the truth of ‘snow is white’.
There are many implications of a theory of this sort for philosophical debate about the nature of truth. Philosophers often make suggestions like the following: truth consists in correspondence to the facts; truth consists in coherence with a set of beliefs or propositions; truth is the ideal outcome of rational inquiry. According to the deflationist, however, such suggestions are mistaken, and, moreover, they all share a common mistake. The common mistake is to assume that truth has a nature of the kind that philosophers might find out about and develop theories of. For the deflationist, truth has no nature beyond what is captured in ordinary claims such as that ‘snow is white’ is true just in case snow is white. Philosophers looking for the nature of truth are bound to be frustrated, the deflationist says, because they are looking for something that isn't there.
The deflationary theory has gone by many different names, including at least the following: the redundancy theory, the disappearance theory, the no-truth theory, the disquotational theory, and the minimalist theory. There is no terminological consensus about how to use these labels: sometimes they are used interchangeably; sometimes they are used to mark distinctions between different versions of the same general view. Here we will use ‘deflationism’, and ‘the deflationary theory of truth’ to denote the general view we want to discuss, and reserve other names for specific versions of that view.
- 1. History of Deflationism
- 2. The Equivalence Schema
- 3. Varieties of Deflationism
- 4. The Utility of Deflationary Truth
- 5. Is Truth A Property?
- 6. The Deflationary Theory of Falsity
- 7. Objections to Deflationism
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
The deflationary theory has been one of the most popular approaches to truth in the twentieth century, having received explicit defense by Frege, Ramsey, Ayer, and Quine, as well as sympathetic treatment from many others. (According to Dummett 1959, the view originates with Frege.) The following passages all contain recognizable versions of the doctrine, though they differ on points of detail.
It is worthy of notice that the sentence ‘I smell the scent of violets’ has the same content as the sentence ‘it is true that I smell the scent of violets’. So it seems, then, that nothing is added to the thought by my ascribing to it the property of truth. (Frege 1918)
Truth and falsity are ascribed primarily to propositions. The proposition to which they are ascribed may be either explicitly given or described. Suppose first that it is explicitly given; then it is evident that ‘It is true that Caesar was murdered’ means no more than that Caesar was murdered, and ‘It is false that Caesar was murdered’ means no more than Caesar was not murdered. They are phrases which we sometimes use for emphasis or stylistic reasons, or to indicate the position occupied by the statement in our argument….In the second case in which the proposition is described and not given explicitly we have perhaps more of a problem, for we get statements from which we cannot in ordinary language eliminate the words ‘true’ or ‘false’. Thus if I say ‘He is always right’, I mean that the propositions he asserts are always true, and there does not seem to be any way of expressing this without using the word ‘true’. But suppose we put it thus ‘For all p, if he asserts p, p is true’, then we see that the propositional function p is true is simply the same as p, as e.g. its value ‘Caesar was murdered is true’ is the same as ‘Caesar was murdered’. (Ramsey 1927)
…it is evident that a sentence of the form "p is true" or "it is true that p" the reference to truth never adds anything to the sense. If I say that it is true that Shakespeare wrote Hamlet, or that the proposition "Shakespeare wrote Hamlet" is true, I am saying no more than that Shakespeare wrote Hamlet. Similarly, if I say that it is false that Shakespeare wrote the Iliad, I am saying no more than that Shakespeare did not write the Iliad. And this shows that the words ‘true’ and ‘false’ are not used to stand for anything, but function in the sentence merely as assertion and negation signs. That is to say, truth and falsehood are not genuine concepts. Consequently there can be no logical problem concerning the nature of truth. (Ayer 1935).
The truth predicate is a reminder that, despite a technical ascent to talk of sentences, our eye is on the world. This cancellatory force of the truth predicate is explicit in Tarski's paradigm:‘Snow is white’ is true if and only if snow is white.
Quotation marks make all the difference between talking about words and talking about snow. The quotation is a name of a sentence that contains a name, namely ‘snow’, of snow. By calling the sentence true, we call snow white. The truth predicate is a device for disquotation. (Quine 1970).
In addition to being popular historically, the deflationary theory has been the focus of much recent work. Perhaps its most vociferous contemporary defenders are Hartry Field and Paul Horwich.
One reason for the popularity of deflationism is its anti-metaphysical stance. Deflationism seems to deflate a grand metaphysical puzzle, a puzzle about the nature of truth, and much of modern philosophy is marked by a profound scepticism of metaphysics. Another reason for the popularity of deflationism concerns the fact that truth is a semantic notion, and therefore takes its place along with other semantic notions, such as reference, meaning, and content. Many philosophers are concerned with trying to understand these semantic notions. The deflationary theory is attractive since it suggests that, at least in the case of truth, there is less to be puzzled about here than one might expect.
Perhaps because of the widespread interest in deflationism, the theory has received many different formulations. The result is that there is not so much a deflationary theory of truth as many. In recent times, however, the deflationary theory has most often been presented with the help of a schema, which is sometimes called the equivalence schema:
(ES) <p> is true if and only p.
In this schema angle brackets indicate an appropriate name-forming device, e.g. quotation marks or ‘the proposition that …’, and occurrences of ‘p’ are replaced with sentences to yield instances of the schema. With the help of (ES), we can formulate deflationism as the view, roughly, that the instances of this schema capture everything significant that can be said about truth. Theories which depart from deflationism deny that the equivalence schema tells us the whole truth about truth. Since such theories add to the equivalence schema, they are often called inflationary theories of truth. (The equivalence schema is associated with Alfred Tarski (1944, 1958), but it is far from obvious that Tarski was any sort of deflationist. We will largely set Tarski aside here.)
Formulated in this way, deflationism does not give an explicit definition of truth, for (ES) is not a definition of anything. Indeed, some deflationists (most notably Horwich 1998b) do not provide an explicit definition of truth at all. Instead, they provide an explicit definition of having the concept of truth. To be more precise, the suggestion is that someone has the concept of truth just in case he or she is disposed to accept all (noncontroversial) instances of the equivalence schema, i.e., every sentence of the form ‘<p> is true if and only if p’ that is not paradoxical or in some other way deviant. Of course, such deflationists may think that, in saying something about what it is to have the concept of truth, they have told us what the concept of truth is. But the latter is a by-product of the former; for this reason, we can say that these deflationists are proposing an implicit definition of the concept of truth.
Are there versions of deflationism, or positions allied to deflationism, which do not employ the equivalence schema or some similar device? Yes, but we shall mention them here only to set them aside. One such view — which may be called expressivism — is the analogue of emotivism in ethics. (This view of truth is often associated with Strawson 1950, though the attribution is a difficult one.) According to emotivism, at least in one of its most traditional forms, utterances of the form ‘torture is wrong’ do not, despite appearances, predicate ‘is wrong’ of torture; rather utterances of ‘torture is wrong’ merely indicate a negative attitude on the part of the speaker toward torture. Expressivism is the parallel position about truth. According to expressivism, utterances of the form ‘S is true’ do not, despite appearances, predicate ‘is true’ of S; rather ‘S is true’ merely indicates preparedness on the part of the speaker to assert S.
Another such view is the prosentential theory of truth advanced by Dorothy Grover (see Grover, Camp and Belnap 1973, and Grover 1992) . According to this theory, sentences formed with the predicate ‘is true’ are prosentences, where a prosentence is a device for achieving anaphoric cross-reference to sentences uttered previously in a conversation, just as pronouns are devices for achieving anaphoric cross-reference to names uttered previously in a conversation. According to the prosentential theory, for example, just as in
(1) Mary wanted to buy a car, but she could only afford a motorbike.
we interpret ‘she’ as a pronoun anaphorically dependent on ‘Mary’, so too in
(2) Snow is white. That is true, but it rarely looks white in Pittsburgh.
we interpret ‘That is true’ as a prosentence anaphorically dependent on ‘Snow is white’.
Expressivism and the prosentential theory are close cousins of deflationism, and, in some uses of the term, might reasonably be called deflationary. However, they are also sufficiently different from those versions of deflationism that utilize the equivalence schema to be set aside here. The important difference between expressivism and the prosentential theory on the one hand, and deflationism as we are understanding it on the other, concerns the logical structure of sentences such as ‘S is true’. For the deflationist, the structure of such sentences is very straightforward: ‘S is true’ predicates the property expressed by ‘is true’ of the thing denoted by ‘S’. We might express this by saying that, according to deflationism, ‘S is true’ says of S that it is true, just as ‘apples are red’ says, of apples, that they are red or ‘John sleeps’ says, of John, that he sleeps. Both expressivism and the prosentential theory deny this, though for different reasons. According to expressivism, ‘S is true’ is properly interpreted not even of subject-predicate form; rather it has the structure ‘Hooray to S’. Obviously, therefore, it does not say, of S, that it is true. According to prosententialism, by contrast, while ‘S is true’ has a subject-predicate structure, it would still be mistaken to interpret it as being about S. For consider: according to the prosentential theory, ‘S is true’ is a prosentence which stands in for the sentence denoted by S just as ‘she’ in (1) is a pronoun which stands in for the name ‘Mary’. But we do not say that ‘she’ in (1) is about the name ‘Mary’; similarly, according to the prosentential theory, we should not say that ‘S is true’ is about S. To suppose otherwise would be to misconstrue the nature of anaphora.
Different interpretations of the equivalence schema yield different versions of deflationism.
One important question concerns the issue of what instances of the equivalence schema are assumed to be about (equivalently: to what the names in instances of the equivalence schema are assumed to refer). According to one view, instances of the equivalence schema are about sentences, where a name for a sentence can be formulated simply by quoting the sentence — thus "‘Brutus killed Caesar’" is a name for ‘Brutus killed Caesar’. In other words, for those who hold what might be called a sententialist version of deflationism the equivalence schema has instances like (3):
(3) ‘Brutus killed Caesar’ is true if and only if Brutus killed Caesar.
To make this explicit, we might say that, according to sententialism, the equivalence schema is (ES-sent):
(ES-sent) The sentence ‘s’ is true if and only if s
Notice that in this schema, the angle-brackets of (ES) have been replaced by quotation marks.
According to those who hold what might be called a propositionalist version of deflationism, by contrast, instances of the equivalence schema are about propositions, where names of propositions are, or can be taken to be, expressions of the form ‘the proposition that p’ — thus, ‘the proposition that Brutus killed Caesar’ is a name for the proposition that Brutus killed Caesar. For the propositionalist, in other words, instances of the equivalence schema are properly interpreted not as being about sentences but about propositions, i.e., more like (4) than (3):
(4) The proposition that Brutus killed Caesar is true if and only if Brutus killed Caesar.
To make this explicit, we might say that, according to propositionalism, the equivalence schema is (ES-prop):
(ES-prop) The proposition that p is true if and only if p.
To interpret the equivalence schema as (ES-sent) rather than (ES-prop), or vice versa, is to yield a different deflationary theory of truth. Hence sententialism and propositionalism are different versions of deflationism. (There are also some further ways to interpret the equivalence schema, but we shall set them aside here.)
The other dimension along which deflationary theories vary concerns the nature of the equivalence that the theories interpret instances of the equivalence schema as asserting. On one view, the right hand side and the left hand side of such instances are analytically equivalent. Thus, for sententialists, (3) asserts that, "‘Brutus killed Caesar’ is true" means the same as ‘Brutus killed Caesar’; while for propositionalists (4) asserts that ‘the proposition that Brutus killed Caesar is true’ means the same as ‘Brutus killed Caesar’. A second view is that the right hand side and the left hand side of claims such as (3) and (4) are only materially equivalent; this view interprets the ‘if and only if’ in both (3) and (4) as the biconditional of classical logic. And a third view is that claims such as (3) and (4) assert a necessary equivalence between their right hand sides and their left hand sides; that is, both (3) and (4) are to be interpreted as material biconditionals that hold of necessity.
This tripartite distinction between analytic, necessary, and material equivalence, when combined with the distinction between sententialism and propositionalism, yields six different versions of deflationism:
It is this variegated nature of deflationism that to a large extent dictates the many names that have been used for the theory. The labels ‘redundancy theory’, ‘disappearance theory’ and ‘no-truth theory’ have been used mainly to apply to analytic versions of deflationism: positions A or B. The label ‘disquotational theory’ tends to apply to sententialist versions, and in fact to material sentential deflationism: position C. The label ‘minimalist theory’ is a label used recently by Paul Horwich (1998b) to apply to necessary versions, and in fact to necessary propositional deflationism: position F. It will not be important for us to examine all of these versions of deflationism in detail; to a large extent philosophers prefer one or other versions of these views on the basis of views from other parts of philosophy, views about the philosophy of language and metaphysics. However, it will be convenient here to settle on one version of the view. We will therefore follow Horwich in concentrating mainly on position F. Horwich calls this view ‘minimalism’, but we will continue simply with ‘deflationism’.
The deflationist idea that the equivalence schema (ES-prop) provides an implicit definition of the concept of truth suggests that truth is, as the label ‘redundancy theory’ suggests, a redundant concept, a concept that we could do without. On the contrary, however, advocates of the deflationary theory (particularly those influenced by Ramsey) are at pains to point out that anyone who has the concept of truth in this sense is in possession of a very useful concept indeed; in particular, anyone who has this concept is in a position to form generalizations that would otherwise require logical devices of infinite conjunction.
Suppose, for example, that Jones for whatever reason decides that Smith is an infallible guide to the nature of reality. We might then say that Jones believes everything Smith says. To say this much, however, is not to capture the content of Jones's belief. In order to do that we need some way of expressing an infinite conjunction of something like the following form:
If Smith says that snow is white, then snow is white, and if he says snow is pink, then snow is pink, and if he says that snow is chartreuse, then snow is chartreuse,…and so on.
The equivalence schema (ES-prop) allows us to capture this infinite conjunction. For, on the basis of the schema, we can reformulate the infinite conjunction as:
If Smith says that snow is white, then the proposition that snow is white is true, and if he says snow is pink, then the proposition that snow is pink is true, and if he says that snow is chartreuse, then the proposition that snow is chartreuse is true,…and so on.
In turn, this reformulated infinite conjunction can be expressed as a statement whose universal quantifier ranges over propositions:
For every proposition x, if what Smith said = x, then x is true.
Or, to put the same thing more colloquially:
Everything Smith says is true.
This statement give us the content of Jones's belief. And the important point for deflationists is that we could not have stated the content of this belief unless we had the concept of truth as described by the deflationary theory. In fact, for most deflationists, it is this feature of the concept of truth — its role in the formation of generalizations — that explains why we have a concept of truth at all. This is, as it is often put, the raison d'être of the concept of truth.
Given deflationists place such heavy emphasis on the role of the concept of truth in expressing generalizations, it is ironic that some versions of deflationism have been criticized for being constitutionally incapable of accounting for generalizations about truth (Gupta 1993, Halbach 1999, Soames 1999, Armour-Garb 2004). For example, theories that implicitly define truth using only the instances of (ES-prop) do not allow us to derive a generalization like (Conjunction).
(Conjunction) For all propositions p, q (the conjunction of p and q is true if and only if p is true and q is true).
Since the instances of (ES-prop) are a collection of particular propositions and (Conjunction) is a universal generalization, it is not possible to derive (Conjunction) from the instances of (ES-prop). Yet it is plausible that a theory of truth should allow us to derive general truths about truth, like (Conjunction). This suggests that deflationary theories of truth formulated using only the instances of (ES-prop) are inadequate.
It is for this reason that some deflationists use a version of (Gen) to formulate their theory of truth.
(Gen) For all x, x is true if and only if there is some p such that x = <p>, and p.
There are two things to notice about (Gen). First, unlike (ES-prop) it is not a schema, but a universally quantified formula. For this reason, it is possible to derive (Conjunction) from it. That (Gen) is universally quantified also means it can be used as an explicit definition of truth. So although deflationists often only implicitly define truth, it is possible for a deflationist to offer an explicit definition. Thus we have another dimension along which deflationary theories can vary.
Second, the existential quantifier in (Gen) must be a higher-order quantifier that quantifies into sentential position. Wolfgang Künne (2003) takes the existential quantifier to be an objectual (domain and values) quantifier ranging over propositions. A different approach would be to take the existential quantifier as a substitutional quantifier where the substitution class consists of sentences. Christopher Hill (2002) offers a further, idiosyncratic, alternative and treats the existential quantifier as a substitutional quantifier whose substitution class is the set of all propositions. However, all these approaches have drawn criticism on the grounds that the use of higher-order quantifiers to define truth is circular (Platts 1980, Horwich 1998b, McGrath 2000), and may get the extension of the concept of truth wrong (Sosa 1993). Unfortunately, we cannot assess these criticisms here. We shall continue to concentrate mainly on those versions of deflationism formulated using instances of (ES-prop).
An alternative deflationist approach to the generalization problem is to attempt to show that, despite appearances, theories that only appeal to the instances of (ES-prop) nevertheless do have the resources to derive the problematic generalizations. Field (1994a), for example, suggests that we allow reasoning with schemas and proposes rules that would allow the derivation of generalizations. Horwich (1998b) suggests a more informal approach according to which we are justified in deriving (Conjunction) since an informal inspection of a derivation of some instance of (Conjunction) shows us that we could derive any instance of it.
It is commonly said that, according to the deflationary theory, truth is not a property and therefore that, according to the theory, if a proposition is true, it is mistaken to say that the proposition has a property, the property of being true. There is something right and something wrong about this view, and to see what is wrong and right about it will help us to understand the deflationary theory.
Consider the two true propositions (5) and (6):
(5) Caracas is the capital of Venezuela.
(6) The earth revolves around the sun.
Do these propositions share a property of being true? Well, in one sense of course they do: since they are both true, we can say that there both have the property of being true. In this sense, the deflationary theory is not denying that truth is a property: truth is the property that all true propositions have.
On the other hand, when we say that two things share a property F, we often mean more than simply that they are both F; we mean in addition that there is intuitively a common explanation as to why they are both F. It is in this second sense in which deflationists are denying that truth is a property. Thus, in the case of our example, what explains the truth of (5) is that Caracas is the capital of Venezuela; and what explains this is the political history of Venezuela. On the other hand, what explains the truth of (6) is that the earth revolves around the sun; and what explains this is the nature of the solar system. The nature of the solar system, however, has nothing to do with the political history of Venezuela (or if it does the connections are completely accidental!) and to that extent there is no shared explanation as to why (5) and (6) are both true. Therefore, in this stronger sense, they have no property in common.
It will help to bring out the contrast being invoked here if we consider two properties that have nothing to do with truth, the property of being, i.e. the property of having existence, and the property of being a mammal. Consider Hillary Rodham Clinton and the Great Wall of China. Do these objects have the property of existence? Well, in one sense, they do: they both exist so they both have the property of existence. On the other hand, however, there is no common explanation as to why they both exist. What explains the existence of the Great Wall is the architectural and defense policies of classical China; what explains the existence of Hillary Rodham Clinton is Mr and Mrs Rodham. We might then say that existence is not a property and mean by this that it does not follow from the fact that two things exist that there is a common explanation as to why they exist. But now compare the property of existence with the property of being a mammal. If two things are mammals, they have the property of being a mammal, but in addition there is some common explanation as to why they are both mammals — both are descended from the same family of creatures, say. According to deflationism, the property of being true is more like the property of existence than it is like the property of being a mammal.
Depending on one's views about what it takes to be a property, then, one might be tempted to say here that being true is not a property, because it is not like being a mammal. But in fact most contemporary deflationists, pursuing the analogy between truth and existence, describe truth as a logical property (for example, Field 1992: 322; Horwich 1998a: 37; Künne 2003: 91).
Truth and falsity are a package deal. It would be hard to imagine someone having the concept of truth without also having the concept of falsity. One obvious question to ask the proponent of the deflationary theory of truth, then, is how the theory is to be extended to falsity.
A natural account of the concept of falsity defines it in terms of the concept of truth. Thus, someone has the concept of falsehood just in case they accept instances of the schema:
(F-prop) The proposition that P is false if and only if the proposition that P is not true
A second, and initially slightly different, account of falsity defines it directly in terms of negation. According to this view, someone has the concept of falsity just in case they accept instances of the schema:
(F-prop*) The proposition that P is false if and only if it is not the case that P
Many deflationists suppose that that (F-prop) and (F-prop*) in fact implicitly define the same concept of falsity (cf Horwich 1994). The key idea here is that there seems no reason to distinguish being true from being the case. If there is no distinction between being true and being the case, presumably there is also no distinction between ‘It is not the case that p’ and ‘It is not true that p’. In addition, however, ‘It is not true that p’ is plausibly synonymous with ‘the proposition that p is not true’; and this means that (F-prop) and (F-prop*) are equivalent. As we will shortly see, this account of falsity, though certainly a natural one, leaves the deflationary theory open to an important objection concerning truth-value gaps.
Our concern to this point has been only with what the deflationary theory is. In the remainder of this article, we consider six objections. These are by no means the only objections that have been advanced against deflationism — Horwich (1998b) considers thirty-nine different objections! — but they do seem particularly obvious and important.
We noted earlier that deflationism can be presented in either a sententialist version or a propositionalist version. Some philosophers have suggested, however, that the choice between these two versions constitutes a dilemma for deflationism (Jackson, Oppy and Smith 1994). The objection is that if deflationism is construed in accordance with propositionalism, then it is trivial, but if it is construed in accordance with sententialism it is false. To illustrate the dilemma, consider the following claim:
(7) Snow is white is true if and only if snow is white
Now, does snow is white refer to a sentence or a proposition? If, on the one hand, we take (7) to be about a sentence, then, assuming (7) can be interpreted as making a necessary claim, (7) is false. On the face of it, after all, it takes a lot more than snow's being white for it to be the case that ‘snow is white’ is true. In order that ‘snow is white’ be true, it must be the case not only that snow is white, it must in addition be the case that ‘snow is white’ means that snow is white. But this is a fact about language that (7) ignores. On the other hand, suppose we take snow is white to denote a proposition; in particular, suppose we take it to denote the proposition that snow is white. Then the theory looks to be trivial, since the proposition that snow is white is defined as being true just in case snow is white. In short, the deflationist is faced with a dilemma: take deflationism to be a theory of sentences and it is false; take it to be a theory of propositions, on the other hand, and it is trivial.
Of the two horns of this dilemma, it might seem that the best strategy for deflationists is to remain with the propositionalist version of their doctrine and accept its triviality. A trivial doctrine, after all, at least has the advantage of being true. Moreover, the charge of triviality is something that deflationists might well be expected to wear as a badge of honor: since deflationists are advocating their theory as following from mundane facts about which everyone can agree, it is no wonder that the theory they advocate is trivial.
However, there are a number of reasons why deflationists have typically not endorsed this option. First, the triviality at issue here does not have its source in the concept of truth, but rather in the concept of a proposition. Second, a trivial version of deflationism says nothing about the theory of meaning, where by ‘theory of meaning’ we mean an account of the connections between sentences of natural language and the propositions they express. After all, if deflationists are attending only to propositions, they are evidently not attending to the relation between sentences and propositions. Of course, one might point out that other theories of truth are also silent on the theory of meaning — why then can deflationism not be? However, the fact is that many deflationists present their doctrine as a central part of a much bigger philosophical project, viz., to provide a deflationary account of all the semantic notions, that is, notions such as truth, reference, and meaning. The problem for deflationists who grasp the second horn of the dilemma is that they must admit that there is no way to complete this project: the deflationary theory of truth can only be maintained by remaining silent about the theory of meaning. And this means that deflationism should be understood as a much more modest project than it is often taken to be.
The other possible response to this dilemma is to accept that deflationism applies inter alia to sentences, but to argue that the sentences to which it applies must be interpreted sentences, i.e., sentences which have meaning. Of course, if the sentences to which deflationism applies are interpreted sentences, then there will be no force to the objection that deflationism is ignoring the fact that sentences have meaning. Deflationism, on this interpretation, is not so much ignoring this fact as assuming it.
On either plausible response to the dilemma, then, the deflationist makes use of the notion of meaning to explain truth. This fact has led a number of philosophers to argue that, on pain of circularity, deflationism cannot be combined with theories of meaning that make use of the notion of truth to explain meaning — in particular, that deflationism is incompatible with truth-conditional theories of meaning (e.g. Dummett 1959, Davidson 1990, Horwich 1998b, Kalderon 1999, Collins 2002). Other philosophers have also suggested that deflationism is incompatible with truth-conditional theories of meaning on the grounds that granting truth any kind of explanatory role is inconsistent with deflationism (Davidson 1990, Field 1986, 1994).
If deflationism is inconsistent with truth-conditional theories of meaning, this is not obviously an objection to deflationism. After all, there are alternative theories of meaning available: both Paul Horwich and Hartry Field have in different ways defended a version of a use theory of meaning (see Field 1994a, Horwich 1998a). There is, however, a lot of work to be done before a use theory can be regarded as a successful theory of meaning.
What about the claim that deflationism is inconsistent with truth-conditional theories of meaning? As William G. Lycan notes (Bar-On et al 2005), the charges of circularity in the literature have been impressionistic and so remain difficult to evaluate. Moreover, on the surface at least, the circularity charge would seem to show that even inflationism about truth is inconsistent with truth-conditional theories of meaning, since all theories of truth will have to take meaning for granted in some sense — for example, in deciding which sentences are truth-apt (For criticisms of the circularity charge, see Gupta 1993, Horisk 2008, Lance 1997, Williams 1999.)
On the other hand, worries about the explanatory role truth plays in truth-conditional theories of meaning can only be evaluated if we know, first, what sort of explanatory role truth plays in such theories, and, second, what sort of explanatory roles are ruled out by deflationism. It seems clear, for example, that if the concept of truth is only employed in truth-conditional theories of meaning as a device of generalization, there is no inconsistency with deflationary theories of truth. But does truth have only this role in truth-conditional theories of meaning? The compatibility of deflationism about truth and truth-conditional theories of meaning seems to us an important and unanswered question. (For recent discussion, see Williams 1999, Bar-On et al 2005, Collins 2002, Gupta and Martinez-Fernandez 2005, Horisk 2007 and Field 2005.)
It is often said that what is most obvious about truth is that truth consists in correspondence to the facts — for example, that the truth of the proposition that the earth revolves around the sun consists in its correspondence to the fact that the earth revolves around the sun. The so-called correspondence theory of truth is built around this intuition, and tries to explain the notion of truth by appeal to the notions of correspondence and fact. Even if one does not build one's theory of truth around this intuition however, many philosophers regard it as a condition of adequacy on any theory of truth that the theory accommodates the correspondence intuition.
It is often objected to deflationism, however, that the doctrine has particular trouble meeting this adequacy condition. One way to bring out the problem here is by focusing on a particular articulation of the correspondence intuition, an articulation favoured by deflationists themselves (Horwich 1998b). According to this way of spelling it out, the intuition that a certain sentence or proposition ‘corresponds to the facts’ is the intuition that the sentence or proposition is true because of a certain way the world is; that is, the truth of the proposition is explained by some contingent fact which is usually external to the proposition itself. We might express this by saying that someone who endorses the correspondence intuition so understood would endorse:
(8) The proposition that snow is white is true because snow is white
Now, the problem with (8) is that, when we combine it with the deflationary theory-or at least with a necessary version of that theory-we can derive something that is plainly false. Someone who holds a necessary version of deflationism would clearly be committed to the necessary truth of:
(9) The proposition that snow is white is true iff snow is white.
And, since (9) is a necessary truth, it is very plausible to suppose that (8) and (9) together entail:
(10) Snow is white because snow is white.
Unfortunately, however, (10) is false. The reason is that the relation reported by ‘because’ in (8) and (10) is a causal or explanatory relation, and such relations must obtain between distinct relata. But the relata in (10) are (obviously) not distinct. Hence (10) is false. But this means that the conjunction of (8) and (9) must be false, and that deflationism is inconsistent with the correspondence intuition. To borrow a phrase of Mark Johnston's — who mounts a similar argument in a different context — we might put the point differently by saying that, if deflationism is true, then what seems to be a perfectly good explanation in (8) goes missing; if deflationism is true, after all, then (8) is equivalent to (10), and (10) is not an explanation of anything.
How might a deflationist respond to this objection? One response is to provide a different articulation of the correspondence intuition. For example, one might point out that the connection between the proposition that snow is white and snow's being white is not a contingent connection, and suggest that this rules out (8) as a successful articulation of the correspondence intuition. That intuition (one might continue) is more plausibly given voice by (8*):
(8*) ‘Snow is white’ is true because snow is white.
However, when (8*) is conjoined with (9), one cannot derive the problematic (10), and thus, one might think, the objection from correspondence might be avoided. Now certainly this is a possible suggestion; the problem with it, however, is that a deflationist who thinks that (8*) is true is most plausibly construed as holding a sententialist, rather than a propositionalist, version of deflationism. A sententialist version of deflationism, on the other hand, will in turn supply a version of (9), viz.:
(9*) ‘Snow is white’ is true iff snow is white
which, at least it is interpreted as a necessary truth, will conspire with (8*) to yield (10). And we are back where we started.
Another response would be to object that ‘because’ creates an opaque context — that is, the kind of context within which one cannot substitute co-referring expressions and preserve truth. If ‘because’ creates an opaque context, then it would be illegitimate to suppose that (8) and (9) entail (10). This too is a possibility; however, it is not clear that ‘because’ creates opaque context of the right kind. In general we can distinguish two kinds of opaque context: intensional contexts, which allow the substitution of necessarily co-referring expressions but not contingently co-referring expressions; and hyper-intensional contexts, which do not even allow the substitution of necessarily co-referring expressions. If the inference from (8) and (9) to (10) is to be successfully blocked, it is necessary that ‘because’ creates a hyper-intensional context. However, it is open to a friend of the correspondence objection to argue that, while ‘because’ creates an intensional context, it does not create a hyper-intensional context.
A final, and most radical, response would be to reject the correspondence intuition outright. This response is not in fact as drastic as it sounds. In particular, the deflationist does not have to say that someone who says ‘the proposition that snow is white corresponds to the facts’ is speaking falsely. Deflationists would do better to say that such a person is simply using a picturesque or ornate way of saying that the proposition is true, where truth is understood in accordance with the deflationary theory. Indeed, the deflationist can even agree that for certain rhetorical or conversational purposes, it might be more effective to use the ‘correspondence to the facts’ talk. Nevertheless, it is important to see that this response does involve a burden, since it involves rejecting a condition of adequacy that many regard as binding on a theory of truth
Philosophy of language has isolated a class of propositions that are supposed to fail of truth-value. According to some moral philosophers, for example, moral propositions — such as the injunction that one ought to return people's phone calls — are neither true nor false. The same thing is true, according to some philosophers of language, about propositions which presuppose the existence of something which does not in fact exist — such as the claim that the present King of France is bald; about propositions that are vague — such as the proposition that wall hangings are furniture; and about propositions that are paradoxical, such as those that arise in connection with the liar paradox. Let us call this thesis the gap, since it finds a gap in the class of propositions between those that are true and those that are false.
The deflationary theory of truth is inconsistent with there being a gap in the class of propositions, and this has been thought by many to be an objection to the theory. The reason for the inconsistency is very simple, and flows directly from the deflationist theory of falsity that we considered earlier. Suppose, for reductio, that the gap is correct and thus that there is a proposition Q which lacks a truth-value. Obviously, since Q lacks a truth-value, it is not the case that it is true or false. But now consider the equivalence schema (F-prop):
(F-prop) The proposition that P is false if and only if the proposition that P is not true
It is clear from (F-prop) that if it is not the case that Q is true or false, then it is not the case that Q is true or not true. But that is a contradiction: it must be the case that Q is true or not true. We have been led to this contradiction by accepting the following: the claims that all the instances of (ES-prop) and (F-prop) are true, the gap, and classical logic. Clearly, then, we must give up one of these things. But which? And which can we give up consistently with deflationism?
One strategy that is obviously consistent with deflationism is the rejection of classical logic (perhaps rejecting or restricting the law of excluded middle, for example). We shall largely ignore this approach here. Another strategy would be to restrict (ES-prop), so that it is not asserted that all instances of (ES-prop) are true (Horwich 1998b). However, there are reasons to be suspicious of such a restriction. To see this, consider the following two propositions:
(11) All inclusive disjunctions are true if and only if one of the disjuncts is true.
(12) All the propositions asserted by the Pope are true.
Both (11) and (12) are generalizations we express with the help of the truth predicate. And yet both seem to require the truth of all instances of (ES-prop). In particular, we may use (12) as a way of acknowledging our agreement with everything the Pope said, even if some of the propositions he asserted were moral propositions. This suggests that we need to use a notion of truth according to which instances of (ES-prop) hold even for moral statements, and even if they are neither true nor false.
A third strategy modifies deflationism by jettisoning the account of falsity that the deflationist offers, while hanging on to the account of truth. This strategy is a fairly desperate one, however. To begin with, if we give up the account of falsehood, it is not clear that we have an account of truth. Truth and falsehood are, as we have said, a package deal. Moreover, the deflationary theories of falsity that we considered are motivated in large part by classical logic. Presumably, it would be desirable to maintain classical logic if at all possible, and this means that we should maintain the deflationist account of falsity. Finally, one can generate a problem for the gap even if we operate without falsity, and only with truth (Rescher 1969). Suppose, again for reductio, that there is a proposition Q that is neither true nor false. Now, if Q is neither true nor false, then the proposition that Q is true will be false. But this means that for at least one instance of the equivalence schema, one side of the biconditional will be false, and the other side will be neither true nor false. On all logics that involve truth-value gaps, however, such a biconditional will be counted either as false or else as neither true nor false. Either way, the result is that the equivalence schema is not true in all instances.
A fourth strategy argues that the gap, as we have presented it, is malformed. According to this strategy, one should not respond to the phenomena that prompt the gap by suggesting that certain propositions lack truth values; one should rather suggest that certain declarative sentences lack truth values, i.e., because they fail to express propositions at all. Thus, if we take presupposition failure as our example, the suggestion is that instead of supposing that the proposition that the present King of France is bald does not have a truth value if the King of France does not exist, one should rather suppose that the sentence ‘the present King of France is bald’ does not express a proposition, and therefore fails to have a truth value. This kind of approach removes any conflict between the gap and deflationism. The gap says, or implies, that certain sentences fail to express propositions; deflationism says, or implies, that if those sentences did express propositions, they would have truth values. But there is clearly no contradiction in supposing, on the one hand, that a certain sentence fails to express a proposition and, on the other, that if it did, it would have a truth value.
This strategy for dealing with the gap returns us to the problems we mentioned earlier concerning which theories of meaning are compatible with deflationism. For example, some have argued that deflationism is incompatible with truth-conditional theories of meaning and so cannot accept that some declarative sentences do not have truth-conditions or express propositions (e.g. Field 1994a, Armour-Garb 2001). Even if this is true, however, the deflationist can maintain that only meaningful declarative sentences have truth-conditions or express a proposition and that a use theory of meaning will distinguish the meaningful sentences from the meaningless. Still, it is unclear whether any use theory of meaning can make the appropriate distinctions — for example, whether it can distinguish ‘The present King of France is bald’ from ‘The present Prime Minister of Australia is bald’.
A fifth strategy is to reject the gap entirely, and to simply agree that there is no gap that divides either propositions or sentences. This may initially seem to be an overreaction to the inconsistency of deflationism and the gap; however, what lies behind this strategy is the thought that it is not clear that the various phenomena that motivate the gap ought to be regarded as phenomena which involve failure of truth value, whether of sentences or propositions. In the case of presupposition failure, for example, it is not clear that the problem is best explained by a failure of certain sentences to have truth values, or by the presence of conventional or conversational implicatures that govern utterances of those sentences. The possibility of a broadly pragmatic account of the phenomena suggests that one might accommodate the intuitions behind the gap without supposing that there is a gap in the class of propositions (for an example, see Stalnaker 1975). Similarly, in the case of vague propositions, one might adopt epistemicism: the position that vague words like ‘bald’ in fact have precise extensions, but that we can never know what these precise extensions are (see Williamson 1994, Horwich 1998b). Like the previous strategy, however, more work is required to show that this approach is able to account for the various linguistic phenomena that prompt the gap.
A final strategy for dealing with the gap takes seriously the deflationist idea that attributions of truth to a proposition have the same semantic value as the propositions to which truth is attributed. So far we have assumed that attributions of truth to the proposition Q, where Q lacks a truth value, are false. However, an alternative approach is to suppose that if Q lacks a truth value, then both the proposition that Q is true and the proposition that Q is false lack truth values too. This allows us to accept that the instances of (ES-prop) involving propositions that lack truth value are true, since the two sides of the biconditional will have the same semantic value. Of course, if we accept the law of excluded middle — that is, we accept that either Q or not-Q — then we must also accept that either Q is true or not-Q is true. Given that, by hypothesis, Q lacks a truth value, this may seem odd. In particular, it is unclear how we can express the fact that Q lacks a truth value. For we cannot describe this case by saying that Q is neither true nor false.
To avoid this consequence, we may wish to distinguish two notions of truth at this point. One notion of truth, call it the weak notion (Yablo 1985, Field 1994b), is implicitly defined by the instances of (weak-ES), all of which are asserted to hold.
(weak-ES) the proposition that p is weakly true if and only if p
Because all instances of (weak-ES) are true, it is the weak notion that is required to express (11).
(11) All inclusive disjunctions are true if and only if one of the disjuncts is true.
In short, weak truth is such that attributions of weak truth to a truth-bearer have the same semantic value as the truth-bearer itself. In contrast, a strong notion of truth will not make all instances of (strong-ES) hold.
(strong-ES) the proposition that p is strongly true if and only if p.
In particular, propositions that lack truth value will falsify (strong-ES). This strong notion of truth appears to be required if we wish to say that it is neither true that Q nor true that not-Q. For these sorts of reasons, some have suggested that ordinary truth-talk vacillates between using a weak and a strong notion of truth (see Field 1994b, McGee 2005). If this is right, then perhaps deflationists can focus on the weak notion of truth as primary, and try to define up a strong notion of truth from it and additional resources consistent with their position (see Field 1994b for an attempt).
There are, then, a number of strategies for dealing with the gap that are prima facie compatible with deflationism. However, in each case there are reasons to worry about either the plausibility of the strategy, or about whether, on closer inspection, deflationism will turn out to be inconsistent with the strategy.
One of the major tasks of philosophical logic in the twentieth century has been to provide a theory of truth that can deal with the ancient problem of the liar paradox. Consider the following proposition.
(The Liar) The Liar is not true.
If we accept the relevant instance of (ES-prop) for The Liar, and classical logic, then contradiction quickly follows. Moreover, since deriving this contradiction does not rely on the supposition that some proposition is neither true nor false, appealing to a weak notion of truth will not help with this problem. Indeed, since the weak notion of truth implies that all instances of (ES-prop) are true, it is precisely this notion of truth that allows the contradiction to be derived. A stronger notion of truth that restricted (ES-prop) in certain ways might be able to avoid the liar paradox.
Partly for this reason, a number of philosophers have recently argued that The Liar poses a special problem for deflationary theories of truth (see Beall and Armour-Garb (eds.) 2005). That is, since it is unclear whether deflationists can appeal to a strong notion of truth, they seem to be at a special disadvantage in dealing with the liar paradox. Moreover, it has been argued that one particular way of motivating a restriction of (ES-prop) is incompatible with deflationism: namely, that paradoxical sentences like The Liar are meaningless, or do not express propositions. (Armour-Garb 2001; but see Beall 2001 for a contrary view.)
However, as we mentioned above, not all deflationary theories are committed to the truth of all instances of (ES-prop). Horwich's minimal theory of truth, for example, only consists of all the non-pathological instances of (ES-prop). One possible deflationist response to The Liar, then, is to simply bar the problematic instances of (ES-prop) from the theory of truth. There are several problems with this strategy. For one, by making this ad hoc manoeuvre we lose the ability to explain why the pathological instances of (ES-prop) are pathological. After all, it is surely something about the concept of truth, and in particular the role of the relevant instances of (ES-prop), that explains why the liar paradox arises (Soames 1999, Gupta 2006). Another problem is that it is very difficult, if not impossible, to spell out in advance which instances of (ES-prop) are paradoxical (Kripke 1975, McGee 1992, Yablo 1993). A final problem is that it appears we need to assume that the paradoxical instances of (ES-prop) are true if we are to assert (11) (Armour-Garb 2004, Gupta 2006).
(11) All inclusive disjunctions are true if and only if one of the disjuncts is true.
These problems facing accounts that merely restrict the instances of the equivalence schema suggest an alternative deflationist response to the liar. For both the fact that The Liar's instance of (ES-prop) is required to explain its (The Liar's) pathology, and the fact that we need The Liar's instance of (ES-prop) to assert (11), give us good reason to suppose that even the paradoxical instances of (ES-prop) are true. Moreover, these reasons hold whether we are deflationists or inflationists. If this is right, then, since the paradox is generated merely from the relevant instance of (ES-prop) by classical logic, The Liar poses no special problem for deflationists (Gupta 2006). And since everyone's problem is no one's, the liar paradox cannot be used against deflationists. This defence of deflationism can be bolstered by noting that, like inflationists, deflationists can try to deal with the liar paradox by modifying classical logic (Field 2003), by adopting epistemicism (Restall 2006), or by adopting a revision theory (Gupta and Belnap 1993). (See also Maudlin 2004.)
However, there is a further line of argument that suggests there is a special problem for deflationists in this vicinity. The ideal theory of truth will be both consistent (e.g. avoids the liar paradox) and adequate (e.g. allows us to derive all the essential laws of truth, like (11)). Yet it has been recently argued that even if deflationists can give a consistent theory of truth, they cannot provide an adequate theory. The argument for this conclusion turns on the notion of a conservative extension of a theory. Informally, a conservative extension of a theory is one that does not allow us to prove any sentences that couldn't be proved from the original, unextended theory. More formally, and applied to theories of truth, a truth theory, Tr is conservative over some theory T formulated in language L if and only if for every sentence φ of L in which the truth predicate doesn't occur, if Tr ∪ L ⊢ φ, then L ⊢ φ. As is well known, certain truth theories are conservative over arithmetic — e.g. theories that implicitly define truth using only the instances of (ES-prop) — and certain truth theories are not — e.g. Tarski's compositional theory (Tarski 1944). Specifically, the addition of certain truth theories allows us to prove that arithmetic is consistent, something we famously can't do if we are confined to arithmetic itself.
Now, it has recently been argued (a) that conservative truth theories are inadequate and (b) deflationists are committed to conservative truth theories (Shapiro 1998, Ketland 1999). The details of the arguments for (a) are complicated and we will pass over them here (but see Field 1999 for criticism). To get a flavour of the arguments for (b), consider Shapiro's rhetorical question: ‘How thin can the notion of arithmetic truth be, if by invoking it we can learn more about the natural numbers?’ Shapiro is surely right to press deflationists on their frequent claims that truth is 'thin' or 'insubstantial'. It might also be a worry for deflationists if any adequate truth theory allowed us to derive non-logical truths, given the common deflationist assertion that truth is a logical property. On the other hand, deflationists themselves insist that truth is an expressively useful device, and so they cannot be faulted merely for promoting a theory of truth that allows us to say more about matters not involving truth. Whether there is more of a worry for deflationists in the non-conservativeness of certain truth-theories depends on subtle questions about what sort of axioms count as essential laws of truth and whether all conservative truth theories are inadequate (Shapiro 1998, Field 1999, Ketland 1999). Perhaps most importantly, though, the debate over conservativeness highlights how unclear we are about the commitments of deflationism.
It is commonly said that our beliefs and assertions aim at truth. The idea here, of course, is not that our beliefs and assertions are always true in a statistical sense, or even that they are mostly true. The idea is rather that truth is a norm of assertion. This fact about assertion and truth has often been seen to suggest that deflationism must be false. However, the felt contradiction between normativity and deflationism is difficult to make precise.
The first thing to say is that there is certainly a sense in which deflationism is not inconsistent with the idea that truth is a norm of assertion. To illustrate this, notice that we can obtain an intuitive understanding of the content of this idea without mentioning truth at all, so long as we focus on a particular case. Suppose for whatever reason that Mary sincerely believes that snow is green, has good evidence for this belief, and on the basis of this belief and evidence asserts that snow is green. We might say that there is a norm of assertion which implies that Mary is in this case open to criticism. After all, since snow is evidently not green, there must be something incorrect or defective about Mary's assertion that it is. It is this incorrection or defectiveness that the idea that truth is a norm of assertion is trying to capture.
But now let us see if we can give a general statement of the norm that lies behind this particular case. The problem of providing a general statement seems to be difficult, and for reasons that by now should be familiar. To state the norm in general we would need to be able to do something we cannot really do, namely, to complete an infinite conjunction of something like the following form:
If someone asserts that snow is green, and snow is not green then he or she is open to criticism, and if someone asserts that grass is purple, and grass is not purple then he or she is open to criticism,…and so on.
Given the equivalence schema (F-prop*) provided by the deflationary theory of falsity, however, this infinite conjunction can be reformulated as:
If someone asserts that snow is green and the proposition that snow is green is false, then he or she is open to criticism, and if someone asserts that grass is purple and the proposition that grass is purple is false, then he or she is open to criticism, and so on.
In turn, this reformulated infinite conjunction can be reformulated as a statement whose universal quantifier ranges over propositions:
For all propositions p, if someone asserts that p, and p is false, then he or she is open to criticism
Or, to put it as some philosophers might:
Truth is a norm of assertion.
For after all, if truth is a norm of assertion, then, if you assert something false, you are open to criticism. In short, then, deflationists are certainly not denying that truth is a norm of assertion; on the contrary, the concept of truth is required to state that very generalization.
If the problem of normativity is not the straightforward one that deflationists cannot account for the idea that truth is a norm of assertion, what is the problem? Crispin Wright argues that the problem is not so much that deflationists cannot account for normativity; rather, he suggests that the problem is twofold: first, that any theory of truth that does account for normativity is ipso facto not a deflationary theory properly so-called, and second, that any theory of truth which employs the equivalence schemas can account for normativity (Wright 1992; and see Price 1998 for discussion). The result is that, since most contemporary varieties of deflationism evidently employ the equivalence schemas, most contemporary varieties of deflationism are not varieties of deflationism properly so-called.
Wright's objection from normativity is a difficult one to assess. For one thing, it is difficult to find Wright's reason for supposing that the equivalence schemas play such a central role in the explanation of normativity. As we have seen, the equivalence schemas are crucial in providing a general statement of the idea that truth is a norm of assertion, but there seems for all that no internal connection between truth and the norm in question, and thus no internal connection between the equivalence schemas and that norm (cf. Price 1998). Nor is it clear what role normativity plays in the distinction between an inflationary and a deflationary theory of truth. Certainly it is not good enough to simply define deflationism so that any deflationary theory cannot account for normativity. Of course, it is a consequence of a definition of this sort that a theory of truth is either inflationary or false; but then again, no deflationist will accept the definition.
Whatever one thinks of the details of Wright's objection, however, it does have far-reaching consequences for deflationism about truth. What the objection forces us to consider is the possibility that there is no very clear distinction between an inflationary and a deflationary theory of truth. Indeed, this possibility — that there is no clear inflationary/deflationary distinction — is the topic of the final objection to deflationism that we will discuss.
The final objection begins by drawing attention to a little known doctrine about truth that G.E. Moore held at the beginning of the century. Richard Cartwright describes the view as follows: “a true proposition is one that has a certain simple unanalyzable property, and a false proposition is one that lacks the property” (1987, p. 73). This doctrine about truth is, of course, to be understood as the analogue for truth of the doctrine that Moore held about good, namely that good is a simple, unanalyzable quality.
The problem that this Moorean view about truth presents for the deflationary theory might best be expressed in the form of a question: what is the difference between the Moorean view and deflationism? Of course, there is a sense in which the flavour of the Moorean view is very different from the flavour of the deflationist theory about truth. After all, what could be more inflationary than thinking that truth is a property of a proposition that is unanalyzable? Certainly Moore's view about good has been viewed in this light. However, the fact that one view has a different flavour from another does not mean that, at bottom, they are not the same view. One might perhaps suggest that, according to the deflationary theory, the concept of truth has an important logical role, i.e., to capture generalizations. However, this doesn't really answer our question. For one thing, it isn't clear that Moore's notion might not also capture generalizations. For another, the idea that the deflationary concept of truth plays an important logical role doesn't distinguish the metaphysics of deflationism from the metaphysics of the Moorean view; and it is the metaphysics of the matter that the present objection really brings into focus. Alternatively, one might suggest that the distinction between truth according to deflationism and truth according to Moore's view is the distinction between having a simple unanalyzable nature, and not having a nature at all. However, what is that distinction? It is certainly not obvious that there is any distinction between having a nature about which nothing can be said and having no nature at all.
The problem is particularly acute in light of the fact that deflationism has often been discussed in the context of various claims about reductionism. In many discussions of deflationism, for example, the opponent is assumed to be a particular version of a correspondence theory that attempts to reduce the correspondence relation to certain relations of causation (Field 1986 is a good example). However, it should be noted that this kind of view is also opposed to the kind of position that takes semantic facts-such as a proposition's being true-as primitive (Field 1972 is a good example). And the problem that we are considering for deflationism is that these two views are not simply identical in being opposed to the kind of view that explains correspondence in terms of causation: it is that they are identical simpliciter. The suggestion, in short, is that deflationism is identical to what initially seems to be its complete opposite, Moorean inflationism.
The decision to be an inflationist or a deflationist about truth has been called “the biggest decision a theorist of truth must make” (Boghossian 1990). Certainly this is true at an intuitive level. But it is sobering also to realize that it is not exactly clear what this decision amounts to when subjected to philosophical scrutiny. And this suggests that there is still a lot of work to be done before we can arrive at a final evaluation of the deflationary theory of truth.
- Armour-Garb, B., 2001. ‘Deflationism and the Meaningless Strategy’, Analysis, 61 (4): 280–89.
- Armour-Garb, B., 2004. ‘Minimalism, the Generalization Problem, and the Liar’, Synthese, 39: 491–512.
- Armour-Garb, B. and JC Beall (eds.), 2005. Deflationary Truth, Chicago and La Salle: Open Court Press.
- Ayer, A.J., 1935. ‘The Criterion of Truth’, Analysis, 3: 28–32.
- Bar-On, D., C. Horisk and W.G. Lycan, 2005. ‘Postscript to ‘Deflationism, Meaning and Truth-Conditions’’, in B. Armour-Garb and J.C. Beall (eds.) 2005.
- Beall, J.C., 2001. ‘A Neglected Deflationist Approach to the Liar’, Analysis, 61 (2): 126–9.
- Beall, J.C. and Armour-Garb, B. (eds.) 2006. Deflationism and Paradox, Oxford: Clarendon.
- Boghossian, P.A., 1990. ‘The Status of Content’, The Philosophical Review, XCIX (2): 157–184.
- Cartwright, R., 1987. ‘A Neglected Theory of Truth’. In R. Cartwright, Philosophical Essays, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1987.
- Collins, J., 2002. ‘Truth or Meaning? A Question of Priority’, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 65: 497–536.
- David, M., 1996. Correspondence and Disquotation: An Essay on the Nature of Truth, New York: Oxford University Press.
- Davidson, D., 1990. ‘The Structure and Content of Truth’, Journal of Philosophy, 87: 279–328.
- Devitt, M., 1990. Realism and Truth, 2nd Edition, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Dummett, M., 1959. ‘Truth’, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, n.s. 59: 141–162. Reprinted in M. Dummett, Truth and Other Enigmas, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1978.
- Field, H., 1972. ‘Tarski's Theory of Truth’, Journal of Philosophy, 69: 347–75.
- Field, H., 1986. ‘The Deflationary Conception of Truth’, in G. MacDonald and C. Wright (eds.), Fact, Science and Morality, Oxford: Blackwell.
- Field, H., 1992. ‘Critical Notice: Paul Horwich's ‘Truth’’, Philosophy of Science, 59: 321–30.
- Field, H., 1994a. ‘Deflationist Views of Meaning and Content’, Mind, 103 (411): 249–84.
- Field, H., 1994b. ‘Disquotational Truth and Factually Defective Discourse’, Philosophical Review, 103 (3): 405–52.
- Field, H., 1999. ‘Deflating the Conservativeness Argument’, Journal of Philosophy, 96: 533–40.
- Field, H., 2003. ‘A Revenge-Immune Solution to the Semantic Paradoxes’, Journal of Philosophical Logic, 32: 139–77.
- Field, H., 2005. ‘Reply to Anil Gupta and Jose Martinez-Fernandez’, Philosophical Studies, 124: 105–28.
- Frege, G., 1918. ‘Thoughts’, in his Logical Investigations, Oxford: Blackwell, 1977.
- Grover, D., 1992. A Prosentential Theory of Truth, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
- Grover, D., Camp, J., and Belnap, N., 1975. ‘A Prosentential Theory of Truth’, Philosophical Studies, 27: 73–125.
- Gupta, A., 1993. ‘A Critique of Deflationism’, Philosophical Topics, 21: 57–81.
- Gupta, A., 2006. ‘Do the Paradoxes Pose a Special Problem for Deflationists?’, in JC Beall and B. Armour-Garb (eds.) 2006.
- Gupta, A., and Belnap, N. 1993. The Revision Theory of Truth, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
- Gupta, A. and Martinez-Fernandez, J., 2005. ‘Field on the Concept of Truth: Comment’, Philosophical Studies, 124: 45–58.
- Halbach, V., 1999. ‘Disquotationalism and Infinite Conjunctions’, Mind, 108: 1–22.
- Hill, C., 2002. Thought and World: An Austere Portrayal of Truth, Reference, and Semantic Correspondence, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Holton, R., 2000. ‘Minimalism and Truth-Value Gaps’, Philosophical Studies, 97 (2): 137–68.
- Horisk, C., 2007. ‘The Expressive Role of Truth in Truth-Conditional Semantics’, The Philosophical Quarterly, 57: 535–557
- Horisk, C., 2008. ‘Truth, Meaning, and Circularity’, Philosophical Studies, 13: 269–300
- Horwich, P. (ed.), 1994. Theories of Truth, New York: Dartmouth.
- Horwich, P., 1998a. Meaning, Oxford: Clarendon.
- Horwich, P., 1998b. Truth, Oxford: Blackwell (first edition 1990).
- Jackson, F., Oppy, G. and Smith, M. ‘Minimalism and Truth Aptness’, Mind, 103 (411): 287–302.
- Kalderon, E., 1999. ‘The Transparency of Truth’, Mind, 106: 475–97.
- Ketland, J., 1999. ‘Deflationism and Tarski's Paradise’, Mind, 108: 69–94.
- Kirkham, R.L., 1992. Theories of Truth, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
- Kripke, S., 1975. ‘Outline of a Theory of Truth’, Journal of Philosophy, 72: 690–716.
- Künne, W., 2003. Conceptions of Truth, Oxford: Clarendon.
- Lance, M., 1997. ‘The Significance of Anaphoric Theories of Truth and Reference’, in E. Villanueva, (ed.), Philosophical Issues 8: Truth.
- Leeds, S., 1978, ‘Theories of Truth and Reference’, Erkenntnis, 13: 111–129.
- Maudlin, T., 2004. Truth and Paradox: Solving the Riddles, Oxford: Clarendon.
- McGee, V., 2005. ‘Maximal Consistent Sets of Instances of Tarski's Schema (T)’, Journal of Philosophical Logic, 21: 235–41.
- McGrath, M., 2000. Between Deflationism and Correspondence, New York: Garland Publishing.
- O'Leary Hawthorne, J. and Oppy, G., 1997. ‘Minimalism and Truth’, Noûs, 31: 170–96.
- Platts, M., 1980. ‘Introduction’, in M. Platts (ed.), Reference, Truth and Reality: Essays on the Philosophy of Language, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
- Price, H., 1998. ‘Three Norms of Assertibility’, in J. Tomberlin (ed.), Philosophical Perspectives, 12: pp. 41–54.
- Quine, W.V.O., 1970. Philosophy of Logic, Englewood Cliffs: Prentice Hall.
- Ramsey, F.P., 1927. ‘Facts and Propositions’, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 7 (Supplementary): 153–170.
- Rescher, N., 1969. Many-Valued Logic, New York: McGraw-Hill
- Restall, G., 2006. ‘Minimalists Can (and Should) Be Epistemicists, and it Helps if They Are Revision Theorists Too’, in JC Beall and B. Armour-Garb (eds.) 2006.
- Shapiro, S., 1998. ‘Proof and Truth: Through Thick and Thin’, Journal of Philosophy, 95: 493–521.
- Strawson, P., 1950. ‘Truth’, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 24: 111–56.
- Soames, S., 1999. Understanding Truth, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Sosa, E., 1993. ‘Epistemology, Realism, and Truth: The First Philosophical Perspectives Lecture’, Philosophical Perspectives, 7, Language and Logic: 1–16.
- Stalnaker, R., 1975. ‘Pragmatic Presupposition’, reprinted in S. Davis (ed.), Pragmatics: A Reader, New York: Oxford University Press, 1991.
- Tarski, A., 1944. ‘The Semantic Conception of Truth’, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, IV: 341–75.
- Tarski, A., 1958. ‘The Concept of Truth in Formalized Languages’, in A. Tarski, Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics: Papers form 1923 to 1938, Oxford: Oxford University, 1958.
- Williams, M., 1999. ‘Meaning and Deflationary truth’, Journal of Philosophy, 96: 545–64.
- Williamson, T., 1994. Vagueness, London: Routledge.
- Wright, C., 1992. Truth and Objectivity, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Yablo, S., 1985. ‘Truth and Reflection’, Journal of Philosophical Logic, 14: 297–349.
- Yablo, S., 1993. ‘Paradox Without Self-Reference’, Analysis, 53: 251–2.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
[Please contact the authors with suggestions.]
We would like to express our thanks to Stewart Candlish, James Chase, Jacob Hohwy, Graham Oppy, and Huw Price for help in constructing this entry.