Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Hermann Lotze

First published Wed Jan 12, 2005

Rudolph Hermann Lotze (1817-1881) mediated the transition from the exuberance of German idealism, in the first half of the nineteenth century, to the sober, scholarly and scientific ethos that came to prevail in the second half. He adapted the notion of “chief” or defining problems in the philosophical sub-disciplines, inherited from Herbart, and brought opposing approaches to bear on them, in a quasi-systematic way, preparing the way for the modern textbook. A professor in a changing situation, moving toward bureaucratic centralization in an encompassing national state, he mostly restricted his attention to academic issues, appealing to his peers (and not the public) in the now rising professional journal (while maintaining a lively interest in things quotidian). As well, given the increasing amounts of data and importance of the burgeoning new disciplines, Lotze hoped to preserve a special place for philosophy as a value-theoretic investigation. Lotze's influence was far-reaching and not yet widely admitted or well understood. While he accidentally inspired numerous materialists, his strong association with certain traditionalist preachers, on the one hand, and liberal theological movements, on the other, blunted his interest for the philosophical revolutionaries of the twentieth century, while simultaneously preserving a continued line of influence.

1. Brief Chronology

2. Prefatory Remarks

After modernism, philosophy changed. But the change was slow in coming and, well before the full impact of high modernism, Hermann Lotze reigned as the single most influential philosopher in Germany, perhaps even the world. Although almost completely unread today, his substantial body of work exemplifies the new academic philosophy that flourished between the demise of the post-Kantian idealisms and the rise of scientific philosophy proper; he is usually credited with assisting “the rejection of Hegel and Absolute Idealism within the bounds of academic philosophy” (Schnädelbach, 1984, p. 169). Although the time period under discussion is sometimes denominated by the phrase “between idealism and positivism,” it might be more accurate to describe it as a transitory stage between the various ideological groupings of the post-Enlightenment (romanticism, materialism, et al.) and those diverging philosophical movements that only emerged in modernism proper (logical analysis, phenomenology, etc.). Thus, as a prominent figure within an essentially transitional period, Lotze's long shadow was, perhaps, predestined to gradually fade from the scene.

Were we unsympathetic, Lotze might be uncharitably (and falsely) caricatured with the appellation “Biedermeier,” especially if one took seriously the oft-repeated charge of methodological eclecticism (implicit in the all-to-common adoption of “ideal-realism” as an adequate descriptor of Lotze's project). It is true that Lotze refused to give pride of place to any particular method or theoretical approach. But this fact entails neither that Lotze himself possesses no particular method nor that he draws no determinate theoretical conclusions. Lotze's actual technique involves, instead, a peculiar dialectic, one which while attempting to give consideration to each side of a seeming antinomy, resolves ultimately in favor for one side, albeit one which is fundamentally transformed. Moreover, Lotze's approach — which takes place against the backdrop of significant political reaction and social revolution — exhibits a striking modernity in his patient discussions of competing approaches to various “problems,” one that proceeds without regard to their source in physiology, psychology or philosophy of mind. (We would do well to recall that it was precisely to such figures that the task of distinguishing amongst the heady mixture of early nineteenth-century science and pseudo-science fell.) His seminal interventions, according to one of his students, belong to “a period of transition and uncertainty; much of the light which the preceding age thought it possessed has vanished and the new light has not yet dawned” (Merz, 1907-14, p. 493). Accordingly, Lotze's work looks both forward and backward, anticipating both the methods and the emphases of the new philosophical spirit while clinging, nonetheless, to certain key assumptions of the very romantic Weltanschauung (cf. Richards, 2002) that he helped (ultimately) to undo.

One should further note something that might appear, at first glance, as purely trivial; this is the critical shift in tone and temper, from the prior hostile and polemical one, to one much more tentative and hesitant effected by Lotze:

In his reviews, criticisms, and polemical writings he is as dignified as Kant and Herbart had been; he is never impolite as Fichte and Schelling frequently were; nor does he fasten upon his opponents any stigma as Hegel frequently succeeded in doing; he is quite above that virulent and unmannerly invective by which Schopenhauer tries to crush, but never actually damages, the arguments of thinkers whom he chooses to regard as enemies. But the style of Lotze reflects one characteristic trait of modern thought. The confidence and self-assurance of Kant, Fichte, Hegel. Schopenhauer, and of the earlier Schelling have disappeared. (Merz, 1907-14, p. 493)

The new model of the academic researcher demands the replacement of prominent personalities — i.e., romantic ‘geniuses’ — by the new exemplar of the sober scientist. Significant, as well, are the new material constraints on the practice of philosophy: not just the rise of the university professor — after Kant — as the most prominent representative figure, but the correlative emergence of the professional journal as the typical venue of presentation and publication. Of course, the political repression following the failed revolutions of 1815 and 1848 surely played a crucial role in limiting the wider ambitions of philosophers and reinforcing the need for a more neutral tenor. Indeed, the same political pressures and bureaucratic demands associated with the state professor's status as “civil servant” began to figure prominently during the first half of the nineteenth century, harkening back to the Fichte's difficulties in the Atheismusstreit (1798/99) and leading up to, among other things, the dismissal of the “Göttingen Seven” (1837) — just to enumerate a few salient events from the German situation alone.

The efficient causes of this portentous change were not limited to the social-political sphere: in the numerous departments that came to make up the philosophical, or lower, faculty of the university, other important developments were also afoot. First, and foremost, there must be numbered the emergence of new, separate disciplines — such as geology, chemistry, biology and psychology — and the resulting squabbles over relative positions, proper boundaries, and the subsequent agon of “role purification” (see Kusch, 1995). In addition, the rapid advances in the scientific discovery had multiplied the previously manageable amounts of data and, hence, suggested to some that the task of philosophy was now to restrict itself to explaining “how the problems of speculation still connect themselves with the ever increasing mass of special knowledge that the labours of the new generation have accumulated” (Adamson, 1885b, p. 573). In this context, the cognate conceptions of philosophy as a synthesizing or supervisory endeavor began to gather adherents. Indeed, the “rehabilitation of philosophy” [Rehabilitierung der Philosophie] (see Schnädelbach, 1984, pp. 103ff) is perhaps the central foundational issue of the day and names “the attempt to allot to philosophy, in a scientific age, a domain of problems that would be independent of the special sciences” (ibid., p. 103). Here, as elsewhere, Lotze emulates Fichte: while science can surely explain what is, it can never elucidate the ultimate value or meaning of the phenomena it reveals — that alone is the task of philosophy (cf. ibid., p. 178).

Oddly — despite his one-time preëminence — Lotze founded no enduring school. However, his teaching directly influenced such prominent students as Windelband and Frege and his ideas were still being considered and debated as late as the 1920s by a numerous notables, including Heidegger and Carnap. Even in his own day, Lotze's reputation soon spread beyond the continent. As a result, he became a substantial force in the English-speaking world affecting, among others, Green, Bradley, and Bosanquet, in Britain, and Royce, James, and Santayana, in America. Indeed, it is principally by this means that he came to hold sway with both the early Moore and the early Russell. Furthermore, because his influence extended through both Anglo-America and the Continent, some have postulated his unconscious but seminal presence in the emergence of analytic philosophy (cf. Sluga, 1980, Gabriel, 2002, Milkov, 2000); and, likewise, studies of Lotze by historians of phenomenology (Rollinger, 2001, Hauser, 2003) have also begun to emerge.

Finally, in this same moment, when philosophy was only beginning its (eventual and complete) confinement to the academy — and becoming simultaneously more specialized and less provincial — Lotze was (notably) the darling of numerous Protestant theologians and preachers: both conservatives who sought to popularize him as a fanatical opponent of mid-century materialism, and others, of a more liberal character, who fastened on to his “personalism” as the proper antidote to the dangerous heterodoxies of pantheism, rationalism, agnosticism and atheism (cf. Hall, 1912, pp. 94n-96n). While Lotze himself may not have endorsed these distortions, there was, nonetheless, something about his work that permitted such misuse. Santayana, a keen observer of this very phenomena, insisted on inserting an important cautionary note: he remarked dryly that one ought not to be misled by Lotze's continuous reference to “souls” or “God” as “a certain acceptance which Lotze has found in conservative circles is perhaps due to insufficient considerations of his meaning”:

Lotze is inclined to give old names to new things; he is fond of a metaphysical nomenclature, and his terms are generally more mysterious and old-fashioned than his ideas. Thus he speaks of the soul, of substance, of free will, of efficient causation, of a personal God; but these phrases stand in his system for comparatively modest and legitimate conceptions. The words may please us in themselves; but we shall be disappointed if we welcome the things for love of the names they bear. (Santayana, 1971, p. 153)

It seems clear that Lotze, once again, followed the lead of Fichte in using traditional language to mask more deeply naturalistic conceptions than the surface meaning of the ordinary wording might initially suggest. (This peculiar feature of the expression of his thought must be made continually present by the active reader.) In any event, Lotze's continuing influence in the twentieth century (ironically) came mostly through the theological curriculum of classical liberal Protestantism, still in evidence until the late-1960s (cf. Reardon, 1968).

3. Life: philosophy of biology

As highlighted in the preceding chronology, Lotze officially began as a student of medicine and, after attaining the doctorate in philosophy, he quickly followed with a degree in medicine, awarded for his dissertation De futurae biologiae principibus philosophicis (1838). There later commenced other medically-oriented works, including his Allgemeine Pathologie und Therapie als mechanische Naturwissenschaften (1st: 1842, 2nd: 1848), Allgemeine Physiologie des Körperlichen Lebens (1851), and Medicinische Psychologie, oder Physiologie der Seele (1852). Lotze's output — in and around the Vörmarz — betrays a continuing preoccupation with both the theory and application of the biological sciences in medicine, physiology and psychology. But it is within this same time period that Lotze makes a fateful contribution, one later portrayed, by Lange, as his “involuntary service to materialism.” (Of course, from similar premises, Lotze drew sharply different conclusions than the materialistic thinkers he inadvertently inspired.) This “service” was his trenchant attack on the concept of “vital force” [Lebenskraft], widely held, by a variety of thinkers of differing orientations, to have struck the decisive blow (cf. Gregory, 1977, pp. 131f).

Lotze's medical dissertation was, under one description, his opening salvo in this attack, for in it he advocated the abandonment of key concepts of Naturphilosophie including, inter alia, “polarity” and “vital oscillation” (cf. Woodward & Pester, 1994, p. 167 and Pester, 1997, p. 58). But his targets also included the diagnostic terminology favored by the medical nosology of the day — most prominently, “asthenia” (and its cognate notions) and, as already mentioned, “vital force.” While the former was a contribution of the Brunonian theory, further elaborated in Germany by numerous (and peculiar) enthusiasts, the latter was a more widespread assumption of biological thought generally speaking. Yet despite such important differences, both might be pegged with the same fundamental flaw: both could be characterized as empty “abstractions” that falsely paraded as causally “explanatory” notions. Put in Kantian terms, they were both treated (wrongly) as though they were “constitutive” principles of human cognition.

Teleology, and teleological notions generally, while licit for certain heuristic purposes, pace Kant, cannot be raised to the level of cognitive principle. Hence, while enquiries into the biological realm may safely assume purposive function, as a necessary theoretical posit, such assumptions may serve only as regulative — not constitutive — principles in biological thought. Teleological notions, such as ‘order’ and ‘purpose’, are, as necessary presuppositions of our theorization generally, ineliminable. But such notions cannot be used explanatorily or, more precisely, in a way that effectively precludes further investigation into the actual causes of organic phenomena. In other words, from the perspective of scientific explanation itself, vital force has no role to play. Furthermore, philosophy itself always outstrips science and indicates “the need to go beyond what is already known and given in the direction of something as yet unknown and not given” (Schnädelbach, 1984, p. 172).

The basic Kantian insight was further ramified by Lotze: mechanism and teleology are coexisting, compatible modes of explanation, each with their own proper sphere, and not contradictory opposites: “[b]oth … are limited, and both imply one another. Mechanism is therefore no power controlling reality, but rather the way in which a purposeful reality realizes itself” (Robins, 1900, p. 11). A lazy reliance on hypothetical posits, Lotze suspected, merely betrays our unwillingness to engage in the difficult work of real scientific discovery. Furthermore by “mechanism” Lotze meant not a blind naturalistic or reductionist technique; rather, he used this word to signify a hypothetical-deductive method of explanation of phenomena (cf. Woodward & Pester, 1994, p. 165). This has important ramifications for the emerging biological sciences: if the essence of science lies in the employ of the hypothetical-deductive method of explanation — and not mathematization, as Kant had insisted — then biology and medicine, for instance, both might admit of a rigorous treatment worthy of the name ‘science’. Teleology does not replace explanation: it supplements it (cf. Lenoir, 1982, pp. 168ff).

However, materialists such as Czolbe were inspired by the elimination of vital force to continue metaphysical “house-cleaning” into the remaining parts of the super-sensual. But Lotze saw no connection between the rightful rejection of empty, and hence, un-scientific notions, on the one hand, and respectable, metaphysical concepts proper, on the other. And so, he believed it possible to be a physiologist, investigating the brain and the nervous system, and a metaphysician, of the soul, simultaneously. There is only one clear and consistent view in natural science: that of hypothetical-deductive physical science. Within this framework, the notion of vital force is, as already noted, dispensable, replaceable by physico-chemical explanations. This substitution had no effect, however, on the metaphysical concepts of necessity, finality and purpose, which must both be part of and govern any (proper) investigation. Materialism was thus forestalled, from Lotze's perspective, by his overriding commitment to a value-theoretic teleology.

With this proviso firmly in mind, one would have to admit that a properly scientific account could never rule out the existence of such thing as a “soul.” And yet traditional philosophical explanations, rooted in the spontaneity of thought, in practical reason, or in the freedom of the will, argued Lotze, cannot suffice to establish this “universal prejudice.” Nor may we rest content with the obvious fact that deductive explanations seem irrelevant when it comes to understanding mental life generally. There is, nonetheless, a “decisive fact of experience” which may serve to legitimate this posit: the unity of consciousness (Micro, I, p. 152). But it is not our perception of unity (consciousness) that underwrites this ulterior unity (the soul). Rather, “our belief in the soul's unity rests not on our appearing to ourselves as a unity, but in our being able to appear to ourselves at all” (Micro, I, p. 157). As Lotze further details his (transcendental) argument: “We did not conclude that the soul is one, because we appear to ourselves as a unity; but … by the fact that anything can appear to us” (Micro, I, p. 163). This, teleology is further supplemented by Kantian-style arguments which may further rebuff positivist impulses to construe philosophical investigations as superfluous. Perhaps, for this reason, Lotze's views are sometimes categorized under the very title that he, on occasion, used: “teleological idealism” (cf. Wagner, 1987, p. 75 & Schnädelbach, 1984, p. 177). Further, because Lotze comes to see nature itself as comprehensible as the life of a cosmic individual — or God — the unity of consciousness is part and parcel of the ultimate unity of the very cosmos itself (cf. Santayana, 1971, pp. 211ff).

4. Space: philosophy of psychology

The Lotzean soul functions as “a genuine stable point” (Micro, I, p. 143); thus, as a substantial and self-determining principle of unity in consciousness, it is the functional equivalent of Kant's “transcendental unity of apperception.” The soul is, further, “the abiding source of sensation [i.e., cognition], of feeling [i.e., of emotion], of effort [i.e., volition]” (Micro, I, p. 184). But it is also, Lotze emphasized in contradistinction to Kant, always a particular, embodied consciousness, living entwined in concrete and manifold relatedness. And, even more importantly, it is equally characterized by its innate capacities for emotion and volition, as well as for cognition: the soul encompasses all of the capacities of human consciousness and is not restricted to merely intellectual functions. Further, the soul is insofar as it lives (cf. OutMet, pp. 43-44). (Indeed, one interpreter goes as far as to suggest that Lotze embraced a “phenomenological” — rather than a traditional “metaphysical” — notion of the soul, citing the striking utterance: “Insofern ist der Name der Seele ein phaenomologischer Ausdruck” (cf. Sachs-Hombach,1993, p. 256).) But that there is such a soul is an undeniable conviction inspired by the only credible apprehension of human agency.

The Lotzean standpoint was created both to appeal to certain Herbartian emphases and to contrast sharply with others, for Herbart had modeled the soul (in part) on a Leibnizian monad: for him, it was a single, simple, independent, unchanging, indestructible substance. As such, it is utterly analogous to the one thing that, qua substance, underlies the many, shifting properties, which it bears. Such “reals,” which are absolutely simple, can, nonetheless, enter into causal relationships with other “reals” (be the souls or not). Hence, complex mental processes and psychological properties are constructed on the basis of the properties and relations of those “reals” we may identify as souls. (As shall soon become apparent, this conception is utterly abhorrent to Lotze, who embraces in its place, something that, at first glance, appears to be a form of phenomenalism, i.e., that to be a substance is nothing more than to appear as a substance.)

A strong commitment to the concept of soul — or mind or consciousness as distinct from brain activity — leads to a metaphysical question about the very possibility of exact spatial locality qua immaterial being. This, in turn, moves naturally to the prior epistemological issue of how the very perception of space is possible in the first place, given the essentially non-spatial character of mental representations. As Lotze begins with the assumption that these representations are non-spatial, he must account for how the soul can take the manifold of sensation and, subsequently, re-create the relative location of its elements in space. For if the brain and the soul are indeed distinct, then no spatial configuration in the brain could account for our mental apprehension of spatiality. Indeed, an even more basic problem is to account for the way in which “the fixed situation of the variously stimulated nerve extremities” becomes an object of consciousness at all (Micro, I, p. 307, cf. pp. 308-309).

Since spatial relations cannot proceed directly to consciousness, spatial localization is possible only if the non-spatial representations are accompanied by “a qualitative property of some kind which the impression acquires … in virtue of the peculiar nature of the place at which it comes into contact with the body” (Micro, I, p. 309). Consciousness takes up this accompanying qualitative information, such that “they act as marks or as local signs, under whose guidance it proceeds in spreading out the impressions into an image occupying space” (ibid.). As one contemporary commentator observes: Lotze theorized “a close connection between the muscle sensation associated with a sense organ and the local signs that accompany the sensations produced through stimulation of the sensory nerves of that organ” conceived of as a “an innate anatomical mechanism” (Hatfield, 1990, p. 160). This localization, Lotze believed, resulted from the “coloration” produced not by any innate characteristics of the stimulated nerve but by the associated motor impulses that will accompany stimulation of the nerve (cf. ibid.). It is only in such a way, Lotze contended, that non-spatial perceptions can be reconstructed, in our intuition, into a spatial dimension (cf. Micro, II, p. 605). It is a matter of further discussion whether Lotze's theory of Lokalzeichen accords best with contemporary (and competing) empiricist or nativist accounts (cf. Woodward, 1978).

In typical Lotzean fashion, the preceding discussion is held to be strictly irrelevant in assessing the epistemic nature of spatial representation. This stems, in part, as shall be discussed in the next section, from the fact that Lotze insisted that mere stimuli — and their concomitant relations of association — do not, by themselves, attain to the level of judgmental validity: the mental representations which compose judgments proper are an accomplishment of the mind (consciousness, soul) alone. Hence, space is, as Kant had maintained, epistemically ideal. In a rare, uncharacteristic agreement, he admitted that “this kernel of Kant's doctrine I accept unreservedly”: “space and all spatial connections are merely forms of our subjective intuition, not applicable to those things and those relations of things which are the efficient causes of all particular sensuous intuitions” (Micro, II, pp. 603-604). But Lotze affirmed this premises for reason quite different from Kant, for he believed that Kant had rested his claim of “the ideality of space on the argument that the spatial form of the intuition must be innate” (Hatfield, 1990, p. 163). While Lotze agreed that “… it is not we who are in space, but it is space which is in us” (OutRel, p. 53), this statement engenders no commitments about the ultimate justification of intuitive statements.

The upshot of this approach is that not only does this remove considerations of spatiality from the noumenal realm, but also to accord a new epistemic status to intuition simpliciter: Lotze spoke as though “it is simply given to us in intuition (by inspection) that between any two points only one straight line can be drawn; he referred the ‘first principles’of geometry to the same basis in intuition” (Hatfield, 1990, p. 163). Hence, Lotze counted the axioms of geometry as “self-evident truths,” their very self-evidence being grounded in their intuitive nature: “he conceived the role of intuition as that of revealing the self-evident” (ibid.). This picture is further enriched with Lotze's distinction of justification (logical) from genesis (psychological). On this view, psychological genesis (or the context of discovery) was irrelevant to the question of logical justification (or the context of justification). It is this approach that gives rise to an axiomatics, where the axioms were to be numbered among those things identified as the self-evident truths. (However, “self-evident,” for Lotze, was often times an accomplishment of thought and, hence, not strictly identifiable with the ordinary notion of the “obvious.”)

5. Thought: logic

As the last section made clear, Lotze made important contributions to the emerging project of neo-Kantian epistemology, including the new concept of validity (as detached and detachable from questions of psychological origin). Further, in his Logic, Lotze included much that would normally be considered under the separate heading of ‘epistemology’. Yet Lotze resolutely refused the mantle of “the theory of knowledge” for a simple but compelling reason: what went under that title in the 1850s and 1860s was a psycho-physiological investigation, for some early figures in the neo-Kantian revival (prominently, Helmholtz and Lange) construed the Müllerian doctrine of “specific nerve energies” as proof positive of the Kantian emphasis on the contributions of transcendental subjectivity in our apprehension of objects. Lotze continuously rebuffed such associations. If “theory of knowledge” named a psychological investigation, then validity would be subordinated to “the history of the psychological development of our thought” (Phil, p. 467). But psychology was to be counted “last” and not “first” in epistemic priority and “can never be the foundation of our whole philosophy” (ibid., p. 468).

Accordingly, many subsequent philosophers both recognized and credited Lotze with helping to make some of the earliest forays against the looming spectre of psychologism (cf. Heidegger, 2000, p. 29ff). Most critical here is, perhaps, Lotze's act-content distinction (cf. Micro, II, 630), one which followed Herbart, but preceded Brentano by decades. Furthermore, concept-formation is conceived to be a logical process over and above the mere psychological course of our ideas (further discussed below). Also, Lotze clearly opposed the pan-logicist deduction of Absolute Idealism with something approximating the regressive analysis favored by the subsequent neo-Kantians: “the more urgent and the greater work of philosophy must, I think, bear the shape of a regressive investigation which seeks to discover and to fix securely what principle is to be recognised and used as the living principle in the construction and course of the world” (Phil, p. 452). Discovery of truths of absolute and universal validity describes the a priori project Lotze first adumbrated, later embraced in the logicist program of his student Frege and in varieties of transcendentalism espoused by various neo-Kantians.

As already mentioned, concept-formation is freed from the peculiarities of the subjective psychological process by concentration on the creation and refining of objective thought contents. This logical process may proceed by reference to the “grammatical” categories of substantive, adjective and verb that may be taken to “mirror” the logical categories of object, concept and relation, respectively. As it has been explained, this picture allows for both an act-content distinction and the minimal structure required to get our metaphysics off the ground:

The three logical forms thus indicate the minimum amount of structure we must presuppose in order to come to any deeper understanding of reality. That is, one must minimally posit: (i) things, which serve as “fixed points” which may support and to which we may append (ii) dependent properties, … which may connect or relate to other such “fixed points” by means of (iii) relations … [further] [b]y naming part of our sensory-manifold, we separate out that part and make it a content which can be grasped by others. (Sullivan, 1991, p. 260)

In this way, Lotze made headway and yet, ironically, appeared retrograde to those who came after, those who found little comfort in the seeming correspondence of grammar and thought-contents.

Lotze figures mathematical logic as contiguous with the Leibnizian project of a lingua characteristica. Consequently his doubts about the latter extend to the former, which he dubs the “logical calculus.” This new symbolism — e.g., the Boolean expression of universal affirmative judgements with “y = vx” — is only “an ineffectual indication of what we knew before” (Log, p. 276). In his eyes, the Leibnizian project entailed the search for a logical language which would provide “a universal mode of characterizing conceptions” (ibid., p. 272). But Lotze's epistemological holism focused on the judgement, and its ultimate derivation from a priori principles, rather than the analysis of conceptual content. Furthermore, as just mentioned, Lotze's analysis of content is exhausted in his quasi-grammatical analysis and precludes, of course, a more complex construal involving, say, quantification and other second-order functions. (It is important to note, however, his introduction of a functional notation for the analysis of the relation of part-concepts.)

Now despite his rejection of formal logic as an unfruitful and unnecessary novelty, Lotze nonetheless held fast to the existence of “necessary laws of thought” as the strongest bulwark against relativistic skepticism. Indeed, the various kinds of skepticism, whatever there other differences, share a fatal flaw: they all must articulate a possible standard of truth and the very same time that they deny or demur the actual existence of such truth. Likewise, objections that such laws have only “subjective validity” (i.e., are valid only for us) and, hence, inadequate approximations of the external world presuppose some realist thesis (about the nature and existence of the external world) that has not yet been established (cf. Foster, 1882, pp. 43ff). Accordingly, Lotze must refuse the charms of any correspondence theory of truth and embrace, in their stead, a variant of the coherence theory. However, although coherence is a relation that is descriptive of ideal thought-contents, we must not expect that coherence entails the possibility of a completely coherent world-picture being graspable by any particular human knower. Hence, the laws of coherence are ideal laws of thought and philosophy must disclaim all ambition of arriving at a consummate and perfect system.

Once we abandon the project of further articulating relations between world and idea, however, we might appear to be stymied by charges of vicious “circularity” once we refuse to go outside the sphere of our own presentations. Lotze acknowledges this “circle” but deems it unavoidable:

The circle is inevitable, so we had better perpetrate it with out eyes open; the first thing we have to do is to endeavour to establish what meaning it is possible for us to attach to knowledge in its widest sense, and what sort of relation we can conceive to subsist between the subject which knows, and the object of its knowledge, consistently with those yet more general notions which determine the mode in which we have to conceive the operation of anything whatever upon anything else. What we have to do is to obtain the last-mentioned conception, which amounts to a metaphysical doctrine, and to treat the relation of subject and object as subordinate to it. (Phil, p. 451)

What is needed, within logic, is to concern ourselves with the general a priori structures of human cognition (for it is this investigation that leads one ineluctably to the existence of certain general yet necessary truths, which must frame our entire epistemological enterprise). This transcendental project is, however, subordinate to one constraint: a metaphysical system which can limit and constrain the realm of the possible which might make up our circle of ideas. Hence, we come ineluctably to the concept of being.

6. Being: metaphysics

Any post-Kantian discussion of the relation of thought to being must come to grips with Kant's rigid bifurcation between phenomenal appearance and noumenal reality. Of course, without strict adherence to this distinction, Kant's own position would collapse into Berkleyan phenomenalism. Accordingly, post-Kantians such as Herbart, who wanted to maintain a strong realism, had to rethink this central feature of Kantian metaphysics. But while Herbart maintained the possibility of some relation between noumena and phenomena, Lotze went further in dissociating the two; hence, Lotze was led to oppose, as well, the notion of a single unchangeable substance lying at the base of the thing and constituting its essence. Accordingly, phenomenal properties, which say nothing about the true nature of a thing, say everything about our peculiar capacity of perception. Yet Lotze assumed that changes at the phenomenal level must reflect changes at the noumenal and he persisted in the belief that although appearance is not like reality it does, nevertheless, provide knowledge of reality. And so, he mustered adherence to Herbart's realist standpoint while rejecting all correlative claims about the immutability of substance (cf. Santayana, 1971, pp. 152ff). Our only conclusion must be Santayana's: “… although he retains the word substance he abandons the notion for which it commonly stands” (Santayana, 1971, p. 153). Hence, we might be tempted to see Lotze as inaugurating the reign of the Funktionsbegriff over the Substanzbegriff (cf., Cassirer, 1923).

Additionally, the notion of being favored by Kant (and his realistic disciple Herbart) rested in the belief that the meaning of existence simpliciter could by captured in the formulation “absolute position.” As this standpoint has been encapsulated:

The Herbartian view is indicated in the notion of ‘pure being’ as Setzung: that ‘what we call the true Being should be found only in pure “position,” void of relation’. In fact, on this view, it is only because pure being lacks relation that existing things are able to enter into relations at all. Herbart concludes that reality is composed of something plural, simple and indestructible: what he called ‘the Reals’. Since reality is compounded of substances that can suffer no change, and are hence immutable, the relations (into which things ‘enter in’) must be utterly external and accidental. (Sullivan, 1998, p. 841)

Lotze rejects this portrayal of reality composed of simple unchangeable substances for, first, the concept of ‘position” ascribed to them is meaningless in abstracto and, second, utterly dependent upon the correlative notion of ‘relation’; conceptual relations are a creation of our thought, which stipulates a connection between otherwise divergent individual things. Subsequently it has no more claim to reality than spatiality, for it too simply implicates a mere form of perception. Also, the naïve conception of relations as metaphysically primitive gives rise to numerous problems of infinite regress (cf. Robins, 1900, pp. 88-89). In its place, Lotze substituted for this creation of pure thought a kind of linguistic contextualism: instead of affirmation of a particular concept, affirming, as an act, belongs to “nothing but a proposition in which the content of the notion is brought into relation with that of another” (Micro, II, p. 582). Notably, the contrasting conceptual folly has a metaphysical analogue, the insistence that “… things must be, before they can stand in the relations in which indeed alone their reality can become perceptible to us” (Micro, II, p. 583).

Lotze finesses the problem of causality — in its relation to the phenomena/noumena distinction — by replacing it with the notion of ground, or logical consequence. He is led to this conception by, among other things, the difficulties associated with the notion of metaphysical or transeunt causality. As he framed it, the problem was: if there were many separate, independently existing things, then there is no credible account forthcoming about how any single given thing may causally interact with any other single given thing. Further, Lotze's solution aims at, once again, making sense of the process of our thinking and not explicating any supposed relation of mind and world. Hence, he insists that the very indispensability of cause and effect in human cognition entails a necessary rejection of metaphysical pluralism: we must abandon “our preconceived idea that they [i.e., things] are originally many and self-existent, and … [instead adopt] the view that there is a truly existent being m … [and that] this m is the ground and basis of all individual beings a, b, c, …” (OutRel, p. 39).

To this end, Lotze utilizes Humean-style arguments, without thereby concurring with Humean conclusions (in particular Hume's radical psychologism). If Hume dissolved causality into a mental predisposition — a psychological expectation of uniformity — then Lotze reduced it, instead, to the efficient causality found in a regularly occurring sequence, which expresses a rule or law. Hence, while it makes no sense to inquire into the deeper bases of causality, there remains, nonetheless, plenty of work to do; for while it is utterly “idle” to “look for the reason of that causality” (Santayana, 1971, p.190) yet, nonetheless,

… [t]o note and describe sequences is all we can do in such a case; the ground for these sequences is simply the nature of the given thing, which is nothing but the law which those sequences exemplify and actualize. We have no business to ask for any further ground for these sequences; they are the nature of things. All we can do is reconcile our will and imagination to this given and unexplained order, by showing that it gives rise to aesthetic and moral values. (ibid.)

This leads us to a discussion of two key aspects of Lotze's metaphysics: how his functionalist approach entails both, on the one hand, monism and, on the other, instrumentalism.

First, as there cannot be a plurality of mutually distinct, independently existing things, we must encourage a monistic conception. Recall the aforementioned issue of how thing a (if such existed) might causally interact with thing b (ditto). James provides the most admirable gloss of Lotze's manner of reply:

The multiple independent things cannot be real in that shape, but all of them, if reciprocal action is to be possible between them, must be regarded as parts of a single real being, M. The pluralism with which our view began has to give place to a monism; and the ‘transeunt’ interaction, being unintelligible as such, is to be understood as an immanent operation.

The words ‘immanent operation’ seem here to mean that the single real being M, of which a and b are members, is the only thing that changes, and that when it changes, it changes inwardly and all over at once. When part a in it changes, consequently, part b must also change, but without the whole M changing this would not occur. (James, 1977, p. 31)

Of course, James himself strongly repudiated this argument and its conclusion, painting the former as verbal sophistry. But for Lotze this conclusion was inevitable if the universe and its elements were to be properly conceptualized as “a unity” or kosmos.

Second, things (and their posited but unproven existence) remain nothing but “ideas indispensable for the intelligibility of the changeable phenomenal world” (Micro, II, p. 584). The subject of metaphysics is reality but reality only as it can be made intelligible to human knowers. Also, there are limits and paradoxes involved in our previous commitment to “this absolute existence which we symbolise as m” (OutRel, p. 40). Beyond its oneness and existence we cannot — from within metaphysics — go. The ‘absolute’ thus functions as “a limiting conception” (ibid., p. 41). Furthermore, metaphysics has no intrinsic method for support and, in particular, is not preceded by epistemology. In this way, among others, Lotze's metaphysics attempted to chart a middle course, one set somewhere between the absolute idealism of Hegel and his followers, on the one hand, and the critical realism of Herbart and his disciples, on the other. But, most importantly, it attempted to carve out the requisite space for a conception that seemed naturalistic in its assumptions but which was wedded to the idealist notion of “unity” that was founded in self-consciousness or personality, whether this be attained by the philosopher-scientist alone or as supported by the continued consciousness of God.

7. Persons: value theory

As we have just seen, Lotze's monism — or his belief in the substantial unity of everything that exists — stands opposed to Herbart's earlier pluralistic atomism. His redescription of causality likewise coheres with his prior conviction that there must exist a human soul endowed with freedom of the will. Correlatively, Lotze encourages us to think of the world as the product of the will of God, of an infinite spirit: reality is, hence, that which corresponds to self-consciousness. But is this particular self-consciousness or spirit — which we may identify with the absolute — also personal in nature? Our first impulse yields a negative response simply because personality normally is associated with the notion of fixed limits (which would, of course, be inappropriate in an infinite, unlimited being). And yet, Lotze contends that we must conceive of God as the preeminent personality and so, once again, God's own personality is “an immediate certainty,” grasped as a necessity of the human mind.

While the centrality of ‘person’ is correctly associated with Kant, the idea undergoes a number of critical developments in the various strands of post-Kantian idealism. On the one hand, Kant had relied on personality in distinguishing rational being from mere things, by reference to the former's capacity for self-government or autonomy. Further, Kant had insisted that persons have “worth” or “value” and that this serves as a critical characteristic separating them from mere things (which may be said to have only a “price”). On the other, the scientific approach, when applied directly to human beings, appear to have rendered the notion of personality incomprehensible and superfluous. (Indeed, Lotze would probably not be at all surprised by the threat posed to personal identity resulting from reflection on the quantum theory!). Also, if Christianity is re-described as an ethical religion — stressing the essential aspects of interior life and, henceforth, abandoning all claims to metaphysical or cosmological significance — then it cannot stand as a bulwark against the materialist onslaught on inessential aspects of our subjectivity.

Against these and similar considerations Lotze argued that our own subjectivity is not founded in opposition to objectivity: the ‘I’ is not opposed and formed in reaction to the ‘not-I’ but rather in its encounter with a ‘thou’ (OutRel, pp. 65ff). Consequently, personality is an ethical concept par excellance and is, qua ethical, identifiable as the “ultimate reality.” Of course we cannot identify the world with our own subjective consciousness without falling into either solipsism or subjective idealism. Hence, we arrive, instead, at the necessary conclusion of objective idealism; this view Santayana aptly expresses as follows:

The seat of the value of the world is consciousness, but of course not exclusively human consciousness. These moments that contain the sense of things, the consciousness of the cosmic law, — those in fact that contain the personality of cosmic life — contain also its value, and the happiness to which it gives rise. To us the divine life is revealed in beauty, in our own seasons of happiness, and our faith in the deep roots that good has in nature. Our consciousness, however, constitutes but an echo of that consciousness in which the purpose of the world is realized; the goal of things is the happiness of God…. (Santayana, 1971, p. 223)

Reality is purposive and its contents form an ideal unity and this conclusion is fostered by an awareness of the view of the world comprised sub specie aeternitatis in the nature of supreme consciousness.

Further, Lotze's peculiar investigations into morality provide a case study in Lotzean dialectic. Moral rules cannot be understood as merely prudential maxims or as essentially self-regarding in nature: moral principles must possess an “intrinsic worth.” However, this fact should not capitulate us into either a mystical or religious position, on the one hand, or the “empty formalism” of Kantianism, on the other. For both utilitarians and egoists are so far right when they insist upon the necessary presence of pleasure and pain (as concrete content) in moral deliberation. But to escape such subjective egoism in morality is possible only “if we change our conception of our personality and its position in the world” (OutRel, p. 159). Characteristically, our untutored convictions suggest the idea that moral laws express and embody the will of God. To escape the subsequent Euthyphro-style questions and difficulties, we must identify God with the Good:

God is nothing else than that will whose purport and mode of action can be conceived of in our reflection as that which is good in itself — as a will which can only be separated by abstraction from the living form in which it exists in the real God. (ibid., p. 161)

Likewise our will expresses its moral nature in the ability to freely choose between competing values, without compulsion. But this choice is always rooted in a concrete reality — our feeling, for instance, that truth is to be pursued because it is good.

The reduction of cognition, emotion and volition to values was to fit hand-in-hand with other thinkers' preoccupation with the spectre of relativism. Although Lotze himself took refuge in a quasi-Platonic account, the neo-Kantians, among others, pushed farther in the attempt to ground value in some account of the nature of consciousness itself. Windleband, for example, developed the notion of a “normal [i.e., normative] consciousness,” which is to say a consciousness that was itself productive of norms or values. The further particulars here must await another occasion. But Schnädelbach's observations of a fundamental shift from Lotze's to Windelband's position — or, from a “teleological value—relevance of reality … as a relation of transcendental constitution in which value stood to valuation” to one which emphasized “the evaluating normal consciousness … [as] the basis of both axiology and ontology” (cf. Schnädelbach, 1984, p. 182) — surely calls out for a detailed investigation. Yet, in any event, it remains clear that only by tracing the fate of his singular contribution — the very concepts of value and validity — can Lotze's continuing relevance can be spotlighted.

8. Afterword

It might be supposed — wrongly — that interest in Lotze cannot be justified except on historical or antiquarian grounds. And, of course, combined with a Quinean divergence between the history of philosophy and philosophy proper, Lotze might be dismissed without even a further thought. However, such objections can be blunted if it can be shown that the work of Lotze continues to influence contemporary thought, albeit in a disguised, even subterranean way, through the thought of thinkers who came after him. Two relevant thinkers of continued interest to both sides of the modernist divide include: Nietzsche and Heidegger. Indeed, Nietzsche's central concern with the project of the “transvaluation” of all value — and his utterances to the effect that the value of life cannot be estimated — indicates his continuing engagement with the very paradigm which Lotze had helped put into place (this follows especially if one accepts Heidegger's own Nietzsche-interpretation; cf. Heidegger, 1977, pp. 70ff).

In like fashion, Heidegger's long engagement with the Lotzean foundations of his neo-Kantian teachers has not yet received proper acknowledgement. Especially revealing is the lecture course of Summer Semester 1919, which aimed at nothing less than “a phenomenological critique of transcendental philosophy of value” (Heidegger, 2000, p. 108). Thereby, Heidegger intended to utilize Brentano, Dilthey and Husserl, among others, to combat and reconstruct the insights of Windelband, Rickert and Lask, on the one hand, and also the Marburgers and even Simmel, on the other. And the common root of these heterogeneous schools and thinkers had to begin with Lotze's decisive contribution (cf. ibid., pp. 116-118). According to Heidegger, in the midst of the nineteenth century two errors emerged to prominence in philosophical practice: naturalism and historicism. The only school that avoided these two was “speculative theism” and it was under their influence that Lotze's breakthrough emerged: the decisive repudiation of naturalism without falling into mere “history of philosophy.” This was accomplished by Lotze's revival of the non-sensory while avoiding “the extravagant naturalistic supra-sensoriness of the old metaphysics” (Heidegger, 2000, p. 117). In his philosophy of value, Lotze “killed two birds with one stone”: “a safeguarding of the continuity and connection with German idealism, but simultaneously a critical deflection of speculative idealism” (ibid., p. 118). But this assessment would not stand, for by the Nietzsche lectures of 1936-40, Heidegger has come to believe that a reliance on the terminology of value and values was simply the positivist version of the metaphysical (which was supposed to have been thoroughly vanquished) (cf. Schnädelbach, 1984, pp. 190f).

Finally, by means of his enduring presence in liberal Protestant thought and literature, Lotze continued to be a topic of interest even in post-war American theological schools and seminaries. Indeed, through the impress of “personalism,” Lotze's thought imposed upon Martin Luther King the conception of a personal god and the metaphysical underpinnings for an insistence upon the “dignity and worth” of all “human personality.” But this underscores the unacknowledged fact that it is Lotze, and not Kant, that is the source of King's insistence on the dignity of the human person (and, hence, links back to an underground influence extending through the history of African-American philosophy of the twentieth century, beginning with DuBois' own Souls of Black Folk (1903) (cf. Rampersad, 1990, p. 74)). Understanding and incorporating the insights and achievements of the twentieth century return us, perforce, to their roots in the prior century. But so long as the nineteenth century remains “still the most obscure of all the centuries of the modern age up to now” (Heidegger, 1977, pp. 139-140), even the significance of our present endeavors may remain yet unknown and unknowable to us. The only alternative is blank incomprehension, the sort already possible within about fifty years of his death; for when Drury complained about the inclusion of Lotze as a special author in the second part of his Tripos, Wittgenstein could only reply: “Probably a man who shouldn't have been allowed to write philosophy” (Rhees, 1981, p. 121).


Primary Literature in English:

Log Logic, in three books: of Thought, of Investigation, and of Knowledge (1874), ed. and trans. B. Bosanquet, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1884; 2nd edition, 1887.
Met Metaphysics, in three books: Ontology, Cosmology, and Psychology (1879), ed. and trans. B. Bosanquet, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1884; 2nd edition, 1887.
Micro Microcosmus: An Essay Concerning Man and His Relation to the World (1856-58, 1858-64), trans. E. Hamilton and E. E. C. Jones, Edinburgh: T. & T. Clark, 1885; 4th edition, 1899.
OutLog Outlines of Logic and of Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed. and trans. G. T. Ladd, Boston, MA: Ginn & Co., 1887.
OutMet Outlines of Metaphysic, ed. and trans. G. T. Ladd, Boston, MA: Ginn & Co., 1884 .
OutRel Outlines of a Philosophy of Religion, ed. F. C. Conybeare, London: Swan Sonnenschein & Co., 1892.
Phil “Philosophy in the Last Forty Years. First Article.” (1880) In Kleine Schriften, v. 3, ed. D. Peipers, Leipzig: S. Hirzel, 1885-91.

Secondary and Other Relevant Literature:

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

analysis | Bosanquet, Bernard | Bradley, Francis Herbert | Cassirer, Ernst | Frege, Gottlob | geometry: in the 19th century | Green, Thomas Hill | Heidegger, Martin | Husserl, Edmund | James, William | Kant, Immanuel: aesthetics and teleology | Lange, Friedrich Albert | Nietzsche, Friedrich | physicalism | Royce, Josiah | Santayana, George | skepticism | value theory