Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Photo of Isaiah Berlin
Photo of Isaiah Berlin by Mats Lund,
taken 3 February 1997

Isaiah Berlin

First published Tue Oct 26, 2004; substantive revision Fri Feb 1, 2008

Isaiah Berlin (1909–97) was a British philosopher, historian of ideas, political theorist, educator and essayist. For much of his life he was renowned for his conversational brilliance, his defence of liberalism, his attacks on political extremism and intellectual fanaticism, and his accessible, coruscating writings on the history of ideas. His essay ‘Two Concepts of Liberty’ (1958) contributed to a revival of interest in political theory in the English-speaking world, and remains one of the most influential and widely discussed texts in that field: admirers and critics agree that Berlin's distinction between positive and negative liberty remains, for better or worse, a basic starting-point for theoretical discussions of the meaning and value of political freedom. Late in his life, the greater availability of Berlin's numerous essays began to provoke increasing scholarly interest in his work, and particularly in the idea of value pluralism; that Berlin's articulation of value pluralism contains many ambiguities and even obscurities has only encouraged further work on the subject by other philosophers.

1. Life

Isaiah Berlin was born in 1909 in Riga, capital of Latvia (then part of the Russian Empire), the son of Mendel Berlin, a prosperous timber merchant, and his wife Marie, née Volshonok. In 1915 the family moved to Andreapol, in Russia, and in 1917 to Petrograd, where they remained through both the Russian Revolutions of 1917, which Isaiah would remember witnessing. Despite early persecution by the Bolsheviks, the family was permitted to return to Riga in 1920; from there they emigrated, in 1921, to Britain. They lived in and around London; Isaiah attended St Paul's School and Corpus Christi College, Oxford, where he studied Greats (classical studies: ancient history and philosophy) and PPE (politics, philosophy and economics). In 1932 he was appointed a lecturer at New College; the same year he became the first Jew to be elected to a Prize Fellowship at All Souls, considered one of the highest accolades in British academic life.

Throughout the 1930s Berlin was deeply involved in the development of philosophy at Oxford; his friends and colleagues included J. L. Austin, A. J. Ayer and Stuart Hampshire, who met to discuss philosophy in his rooms. However, he also evinced an early interest in a more historical approach to philosophy, and in social and political theory, as reflected in his intellectual biography of Karl Marx (1939), still in print nearly 70 years later.

During the Second World War Berlin served in the British Information Services in New York City (1940–2) and at the British Embassy in Washington, DC (1942–5), where he was responsible for drafting weekly reports on the American political scene. In 1945–6 Berlin visited the Soviet Union; his meetings there with surviving but persecuted members of the Russian intelligentsia, particularly the poets Anna Akhmatova and Boris Pasternak, reinforced his staunch opposition to Communism, and formed his future intellectual agenda. After the War Berlin returned to Oxford. Although he continued to teach and write on philosophy throughout the later 1940s and into the early 1950s, his interests had shifted to the history of ideas, particularly Russian intellectual history, the history of Marxist and socialist theories, and the Enlightenment and its critics. He also began to publish widely read articles on contemporary political and cultural trends, political ideology, and the internal workings of the Soviet Union. In 1950, election to a Research Fellowship at All Souls allowed him to devote himself to his historical, political and literary interests, which lay well outside the mainstream of philosophy as it was then practiced at Oxford. He was, however, one of the first of the founding generation of ‘Oxford philosophers’ to make regular visits to American universities, and played an important part in spreading ‘Oxford philosophy’ to the USA.

In 1957, a year after he had married Aline Halban (née de Gunzbourg), Berlin was elected Chichele Professor of Social and Political Theory at Oxford; his inaugural lecture, delivered in 1958, was ‘Two Concepts of Liberty’. He resigned his chair in 1967, the year after becoming founding President of Wolfson College, Oxford, which he largely created, retiring in 1975. In his later years he hoped to write a major work on the history of European romanticism, but this hope was disappointed. From 1966 to 1971 he was also a visiting Professor of Humanities at the City University of New York, and he served as President of the British Academy from 1974 to 1978. Berlin was knighted in 1957, and was appointed to the Order of Merit in 1971. Collections of his writings, edited by Henry Hardy and others, began appearing in 1978; there are, to date, 12 such volumes, as well as an anthology, The Proper Study of Mankind, and the first of a projected three volumes of letters. Berlin received the Agnelli, Erasmus and Lippincott Prizes for his work on the history of ideas, and the Jerusalem Prize for his life-long defence of civil liberties, as well as numerous honorary degrees. He died in 1997.

1.1 Intellectual Development

Berlin was early influenced by British Idealism, as expounded by Green, Bosanquet and Bradley, which was then on the wane. While an undergraduate he was converted to the Realism of G. E. Moore and John Cook Wilson. By the time he began teaching philosophy he had joined a new generation of rebellious empiricists, some of whom (most notably A. J. Ayer) embraced the logical positivist doctrines of the Vienna Circle and Wittgenstein's earlier writings. Although Berlin was always sceptical towards logical positivism, its suspicion of metaphysical claims and its preoccupation with the nature and authority of knowledge strongly influenced his early philosophical enquiries. These, combined with his historical bent, led him back to the study of earlier British empiricists, particularly Berkeley and Hume, on both of whom he lectured in the 1930s and late '40s, and about both of whom he contemplated writing books (never written).

Berlin was also influenced by Kant and his successors. His first philosophical mentor was an obscure Russian-Jewish, Menshevik émigré named Solomon Rachmilevich, who had studied philosophy at several German universities, and who introduced Berlin to the great ideological quarrels of Russian history, as well as to the history of German philosophy since Kant. Later, at Oxford, R.G. Collingwood fostered Berlin's interest in the history of ideas, introducing him in particular to such founders of historicism as Vico and Herder. Collingwood also reinforced Berlin's belief—heavily influenced by Kant—in the importance of the basic concepts and categories by which human beings organise and analyse their experience, to human life.

While working on his biography of Marx in the mid-1930s, Berlin came across the works of two Russian thinkers who would be important influences on his political and historical outlook. One of these was Alexander Herzen, who became a hero, and to whom Berlin would sometimes attribute many of his own beliefs about history, politics and ethics. The other was the Russian Marxist publicist and historian of philosophy G. V. Plekhanov. Despite his opposition to Marxism, Berlin admired and praised Plekhanov as a man and historian of ideas. It was initially through Plekhanov's writings that Berlin became interested in the naturalistic, empiricist and materialist thinkers of the Enlightenment, as well as their Idealist and historicist critics. Plekhanov was also an early source for Berlin's absorption in the political debates of nineteenth- and early twentieth-century Russian liberals and radicals of various stripes, which informed his concern with both the philosophy of history and the ethics of political action.

During the Second World War, separated from his Oxford philosophical brethren, and exposed to political action, Berlin began to drift away from his early philosophical concerns. His doubts were encouraged by a meeting with the Harvard logician H. M. Sheffer, who asserted that progress was only possible in such sub-fields of philosophy as logic and psychology. His meeting with Sheffer led Berlin to realise that he lacked the passion and the belief in his own ability to continue pursuing pure philosophy. He concluded that as a philosopher proper he would make no original contributions, and would end his life knowing no more than he did when he began. He therefore determined to switch to the history of ideas, in which (he believed) originality was less essential, and which would allow him to learn more than he already knew. Berlin's approach to the history of ideas would, however, remain deeply informed by his philosophical persona, as well as by his political beliefs.

Berlin had always been a liberal; but from the early 1950s the defence of liberalism came to assume a central place in his intellectual concerns. This defence was, characteristically, closely related to his moral beliefs and to his preoccupation with the nature and role of values in human life; in his thinking about these issues Berlin would develop his idea of value pluralism, which assumed prominence in his work in the 1960s and '70s. In the early 1960s Berlin's focus moved from his more political concerns of the 1950s to a concern with the nature of the human sciences; throughout the 1950s and '60s he was working on the history of ideas, and from the mid-1960s nearly all of his writings took the form of essays on this subject, particularly on the romantic and reactionary critics of the Enlightenment.

By the early 1950s Berlin's major ideas and beliefs had emerged out of the confluence of his philosophical preoccupations, historical studies, and political and moral commitments and anxieties; and his major ideas were either already fully formed, or developing. Such essays of the late '50s as ‘Two Concepts of Liberty’ served as the occasion for a synthesis and solidification of his thoughts. Thereafter, he would continue to refine and re-articulate his ideas, but his course was set, and he appears to have been largely unaffected by later intellectual developments.

2. Philosophy of Knowledge and the Human Sciences

2.1 Conception of Philosophy

Berlin's conception of philosophy was shaped by his early exposure to, and rejection of, both Idealism and logical positivism. With the former he associated a too exalted view of philosophy as the ‘queen of the sciences’, capable of establishing fundamental, necessary, absolute and abstract truths. With the latter he associated the reductionist and deflationary view of philosophy as, at best, a handmaiden to the natural sciences, and at worst a sign of intellectual immaturity bred of confusion and credulity.

Berlin's approach combined a sceptical empiricism with neo-Kantianism to offer a defence of philosophy.[1] Like Giambattista Vico and Wilhelm Dilthey, as well as neo-Kantians such as Heinrich Rickert and Wilhelm Windelband, Berlin insisted on the fundamental difference between the natural and human sciences. He classed philosophy among the human sciences; but even there its status was unique. If earlier thinkers had regarded philosophy as a scientia scientiarum, Berlin regarded it as a scientia nescientiarum, the form of enquiry concerning what cannot be the object of empirical knowledge.

In the case of non-philosophical questions, even if the answer is unknown, the means for discovering the answer is known, or accepted, by most people. Thus questions of empirical fact can be answered by observation. Other questions can be answered deductively, by referring to established rules; this is the case, for example, with mathematics, grammar and formal logic. For example, even if we do not know the solution to a particularly difficult mathematical problem, we do know the rules and techniques that would have to be employed to find the answer.

According to Berlin, philosophy concerns itself with questions such that not only are the answers not known, but neither are the means for arriving at an answer, or the standards of judgement by which to evaluate whether a suggested answer is plausible or implausible. Thus the questions ‘How long does it take to drive from x to y?’ or ‘What is the cube root of 729?’ are not philosophical; while ‘What is time?’ or ‘What is a number?’ are. ‘What is the purpose of human life?’ or ‘Are all men brothers?’ are philosophical questions, while ‘Do most of such-and-such a group of men think of one another as brothers?’ or ‘What did Luther believe was the purpose of life?’ are not.

Berlin related this view to Kant's distinction between matters of fact and those structures or categories in terms of which facts are made sense of. Philosophy, being concerned with questions that arise from people's attempts to make sense of their experiences, involves consideration of the concepts and categories through which experience is perceived, organised and explained.

While Kant saw these organising categories as fixed and universal, Berlin believed that at least some of them are varying, transient or malleable. Not all categories are wholly prior to, or independent of, experience. Rather, the ideas through which we make sense of the world are closely tied up with our experiences: they shape those experiences, and are shaped by them, and as experience varies from one time and place to another, so do basic concepts.[2] Recognition of these basic categories of human experience differs both from the acquisition of empirical information and from deductive reasoning, for the categories are logically prior to both.

Philosophy involves the study of these ‘thought-spectacles’ through which we view the world; and since at least some of these categories change over time, at least some philosophy is necessarily historical. Because these categories are so important to every aspect of our experience, philosophy—even if it is always tentative and often seems abstract and esoteric—is an important activity, which responds to the vital, ineradicable human need to describe and explain the world of experience.

Berlin insisted on the social usefulness of philosophy, however indirect and unobtrusive.[3] By bringing to light often subconscious presuppositions and models, and scrutinising their validity, philosophy identifies errors and confusions that lead to misunderstanding, distort experience, and thus do real harm. Because philosophy calls commonly accepted assumptions into question, it is inherently subversive, opposed to all orthodoxy, and often troubling; but this is inseparable from what makes philosophy valuable, and indeed indispensable, as well as liberating. Philosophy's goal, Berlin concluded, was ‘to assist men to understand themselves and thus operate in the open, and not wildly, in the dark’ (1978b, 11).

2.2 Basic Propositions: Epistemology, Metaphysics, Logic[4]

Perhaps the most important work Berlin did in ‘pure’ philosophy, in the light of his most significant later ideas, concerned ‘logical translation’. In his essay of that title (reprinted in 1978b), Berlin criticised the assumption that all statements, to be genuine and meaningful, or to claim correctness, must be capable of being translated into a single, ‘good’ type of proposition, and asserted that the ideal of a single proper type of proposition was illusory and misleading. He identified two different and opposed approaches based on this erroneous assumption. One was the ‘deflationary’ approach, which sought to assimilate all propositions to one true type. Thus phenomenalism sought to reduce all statements to statements about immediately perceived sense-data. The other was the ‘inflationary’ approach, which posited entities corresponding to all statements, thus ‘creating’ or asserting the existence of things that (Berlin believed) didn't exist at all. Both of these errors rested on the demand for the ‘forcible assimilation’ of all propositions to a single type. Berlin suggested that this demand was based, not on a true perception of reality, but rather on the psychological need for certainty, as well as what he termed the ‘Ionian Fallacy’, the assumption that everything is made out of, or can be reduced to or understood in terms of, one and the same substance or type.[5]

Berlin insisted that there is no single criterion of meaningfulness, no absolutely incorrigible type of knowledge. He insisted that the quest for certainty was self-defeating: to restrict oneself to saying only that which could be said without any doubt or fear of being mistaken was to sentence oneself to silence. To say anything about the world requires bringing in something other than immediate experience:

Most of the certainties on which our lives are founded […] the vast majority of the types of reasoning on which our beliefs rest, or by which we should seek to justify them […] are not reducible to formal deductive or inductive schemata, or a combination of them […] The web is too complex, the elements too many and not, to say the least, easily isolated and tested one by one […] we accept the total texture, compounded as it is out of literally countless strands […] without the possibility, even in principle, of any test for it in its totality. For the total texture is what we begin and end with. There is no Archimedean point outside it whence we can survey the whole and pronounce upon it […] the sense of the general texture of experience […] is itself not open to inductive or deductive reasoning: for both these methods rest upon it (1978b, 114–15).

At the heart of Berlin's philosophy was an awareness of the awesome variety and complexity of reality, which we can only begin to comprehend: the many strands that make up human experience are “too many, too minute, too fleeting, too blurred at the edges. They criss-cross and penetrate each other at many levels simultaneously, and the attempt to prise them apart […] and pin them down, and classify them, and fit them into their specific compartments turns out to be impossible” (1978b, 119).

These two closely related propositions—that absolute certainty is an impossible ideal (Berlin once wrote that, if his work displayed any single tendency, it was a “distrust of all claims to the possession of incorrigible knowledge […] in any sphere of human behaviour”; 1978a, viii), and that not everything can or should be reduced or related to a single ideal, model, theory or standard—might be considered the centrepieces of Berlin's philosophy. They are central to his view of language and knowledge; they are equally important to his ethics and his philosophy of the human sciences. Also central to these different facets of his thought was Berlin's individualism or nominalism, his emphasis on the importance, and indeed priority, of particular things as objects of knowledge and of individual people as moral subjects.

2.3 The Distinction between Natural and Human Science

Berlin's individualism, the influence on him of neo-Kantianism, and what one scholar (Allen 1998) has called his anti-procrusteanism—his opposition to attempts dogmatically and inappropriately to impose standards or models on aspects of human experience which they don't fit—shaped his view of the nature of the human sciences, and their relationship to the natural sciences.[6]

Berlin criticised the positivist belief that the natural sciences are the paradigmatic form of knowledge, which the human sciences should measure themselves by and seek to emulate. He argued that the human sciences differed fundamentally from the natural sciences both in the nature of the subject of their study (as Vico and Dilthey had maintained), and in the sort of knowledge that they sought (as Rickert insisted). As a result, different methods, standards and goals were appropriate to each.

Most obviously, the human sciences study the world that human beings create for themselves and inhabit, while the natural sciences study the physical world of nature. Why should this make a difference in how they are studied? One answer is that the two worlds are fundamentally different in themselves. But this would seem to make claims that are inherently controversial and difficult to resolve. Berlin preferred the argument that the human and natural worlds must be studied differently because of the relationship between the observer or thinker and the object of study. We study nature from without, culture from within. In the human sciences, the scholar's own ways of thinking, the fabric of the scholar's life, every facet of his or her experience, is part of the object of study. The natural sciences, on the other hand, aim to understand nature objectively and dispassionately. The natural scientist must take as little for granted as possible, preferring hard evidence to ‘common sense’ when they diverge. But in the human sciences one cannot act in this manner: to study human life, it is necessary to begin from our understanding of other human beings, of what it is to have motives and feelings. Such understanding is based on our own experience, which in turn necessarily involves certain ‘common sense’ assumptions, which we use to fit our experience into patterns which make it explicable and comprehensible. These patterns may be more or less accurate; and we can judge their accuracy by seeing how well they fit experience as we know it. But we cannot divest ourselves entirely of the assumptions that underlie them.

Berlin asserted that the human sciences also differed from the natural sciences in that the former were concerned with understanding the particulars of human life in and of themselves, while the natural sciences sought to establish general laws which could explain whole classes of phenomena. The natural sciences are concerned with types, the human sciences with individuals. Natural scientists concentrate on similarities and look for regularities; at least some human scientists—historians, in particular—are interested in differences. To be a good historian requires a ‘concentrated interest in particular events or persons or situations as such, and not as instances of a generalisation’ (1978b, 138). The human sciences should not aim to emulate the natural sciences by seeking laws to explain or predict human actions, but should concern themselves with understanding the uniqueness of every particular human phenomenon. In the case of a natural science we think it more rational to put our trust in general laws than in specific phenomena; in the case of the human sciences, the opposite is true. If someone claims to have witnessed a phenomenon that contradicts well-established laws of science, we seek an explanation that will reconcile that perception with science; if none is possible, we may conclude that the witness is deceived. In the case of history we do not usually do this: we look at particular phenomena and seek to explain them in themselves.[7] There are, Berlin claimed, “more ways than one to defy reality”. It is unscientific to “defy, for no good logical or empirical reason, established hypotheses and laws”. But it is unhistorical, on the other hand, to “ignore or twist […] particular events, persons, predicaments, in the name of laws, theories, principles derived from other fields, logical, ethical, metaphysical, scientific, which the nature of the medium renders inapplicable” (1978b, 141–2).

Berlin emphasised the importance to a sense of history of the idea of its ‘one-directional’ flow. This sense of historical reality makes it seem not merely inaccurate, but implausible, and indeed ridiculous, to suggest, for example, that Hamlet was written in the court of Genghis Khan. The historical sense involves, not knowledge of what happened—this is acquired by empirical means—but a sense of what is plausible and implausible, coherent and incoherent, in accounting for human action (1978b, 140). There is no a priori shortcut to such knowledge. Historical thinking is much more like the operation of common sense, involving the weaving together of various logically independent concepts and propositions, and bringing them to bear on a particular situation as best we can, than the application of laws or formulae. The ability to do this is an empirical knack—judgement, or a sense or reality (1978b, 116).

Understanding of history is based on knowledge of humanity, which is derived from direct experience, consisting not merely of introspection, but of interaction with others. This is the basis for Verstehen, or imaginative understanding: the “recognition of a given piece of behaviour as being part and parcel of a pattern of activity which we can follow […] and […] describe in terms of the general laws which cannot possibly all be rendered explicit (still less organised into a system), but without which the texture of normal human life—social or personal—is not conceivable” (1978b, 128). The challenge of history is the need for the individual to go beyond his or her own experience, which is the basis of his or her ability to conceive of human behaviour. We must reconstruct the past not only in terms of our own concepts and categories, but in terms of how past events must have looked to those who participated in them. The practice of history thus requires gaining knowledge of what consciousness was like for other persons, in situations other than our own, through an “imaginative projection of ourselves into the past” in order to “capture concepts and categories that differ from those of the investigator by means of concepts and categories that cannot but be his own. […] Without a capacity for sympathy and imagination beyond any required by a physicist, there is no vision of either past or present, neither of others nor of ourselves” (1978b, 135–6). Historical reconstruction and explanation involves ‘entering into’ the motives, principles, thoughts and feelings of others; it is based on a capacity for knowing like that of knowing someone's character or face (1978b, 132–3).

2.4 Free Will and Determinism

The sort of historical understanding Berlin sought to depict was ‘related to moral and aesthetic analysis’. It conceives of human beings not merely as organisms in space, but as “active beings, pursuing ends, shaping their own and others' lives, feeling, reflecting, imagining, creating, in constant interaction and intercommunication with other human beings; in short, engaged in all the forms of experience that we understand because we share in them, and do not view them purely as external observers”. For Berlin, the philosophy of history was tied not only to epistemology, but to ethics. The best-known and most controversial facet of his writings on the relationship of history to the natural sciences was his discussion of the problem of free will and determinism, which in his hands took on a distinctly moral cast.[8] In Historical Inevitability Berlin attacked determinism (the view that human beings do not possess free will, that their actions and indeed thoughts are pre-determined by forces beyond their control) and historical inevitability (the view that all that occurs in the course of history does so because it must, that history pursues a particular course which cannot be altered, and which can be discovered, understood and described through laws of historical development). In particular he attacked the belief that history is controlled by impersonal forces beyond human control.

Berlin did not assert that determinism was untrue, but rather that to accept it required a radical transformation of the language and concepts we use to think about human life—especially a rejection of the idea of individual moral responsibility. To praise or blame individuals, to hold them responsible, is to assume that they have some control over their actions, and could have chosen differently. If individuals are wholly determined by unalterable forces, it makes no more sense to praise or blame them for their actions than it would to blame someone for being ill, or praise someone for obeying the laws of gravity. Indeed, Berlin suggested that acceptance of determinism—that is, the complete abandonment of the concept of human free will—would lead to the collapse of all meaningful rational activity as we know it.

Berlin also insisted that belief in historical inevitability was inspired by psychological needs, and not required by known facts; and that it had dangerous moral and political consequences, justifying suffering and undermining respect for the ‘losers’ of history. A belief in determinism served as an ‘alibi’ for evading responsibility and blame, and for committing enormities in the name of necessity or reason. It provided an excuse both for acting badly and for not acting at all.[9]

Berlin's insistence on the importance of the idea of free will, and the incompatibility of consistent and thoroughgoing determinism with our basic sense of ourselves and our experience as human beings, was closely tied to his political and moral philosophies of liberalism and pluralism, with their emphasis on the importance, necessity and dignity of individual choice. This insistence involved him in a number of fierce debates with other philosophers and historians in the 1950s and early 1960s, and helped to provoke a spate of writing in the English-speaking world on the philosophy of history, which might otherwise have languished.

Also controversial was Berlin's claim that the writing and contemplation of history necessarily involves moral evaluation. He did not, as some of his critics charged (e.g., Carr 1961), mean this as a call for sententious moralising on the part of historians. Berlin's argument was that, first, our normal way of regarding human beings as choice-making agents involves moral evaluation; to eliminate moral evaluation from our thinking completely would be to alter radically the way that we view the world. Nor would such an alteration truly move beyond moral evaluation; for such strenuous attempts at objectivity are themselves motivated by a moral commitment to the ideal of objectivity. Furthermore, given the place of moral evaluation in ordinary human thought and speech, an account couched in morally neutral terms will not be understood as morally neutral, nor will it accurately reflect the experience or self-perception of the historical actors in question. This last argument was particularly important to Berlin, who believed that historical writing should reflect and convey past actors' understanding of their situation, so as to provide explanations of why, thinking as they did, they acted as they did. He therefore insisted that the historian must attend to the moral claims and perceptions underlying historical events.

3. The History of Ideas

Berlin's emphasis on the subversive, liberating, anti-orthodox nature of philosophy led him to be particularly interested in moments of radical change in the history of ideas, and in original and marginal thinkers, while his emphasis on the practical consequences of ideas led him to focus on those transformations and challenges which, in his view, had wrought particularly decisive changes in people's moral and political consciousness, and thus in their behaviour. Finally, his awareness of the conflicts of his own day led him to concentrate mainly on modern intellectual history, and to trace the emergence of certain ideas that he regarded as particularly important, for good or ill, in the contemporary world.[10] The narrative of the history of ideas that Berlin developed and refined over the course of his works began with the Enlightenment, and focused on the initial rebellion against what Berlin regarded as that epoch's dominant assumptions.[11]

Many of Berlin's writings on the history of ideas were connected to his philosophical work, and to one another, in their pursuit of certain overarching themes. These included the relationship between the sciences and humanities and the philosophy of history; the origins of nationalism and socialism; the revolt against what Berlin called ‘monism’ in general, and rationalism in particular, in the early nineteenth century and thereafter; and the vicissitudes of ideas of liberty.

In Berlin's account, the thinkers of the Enlightenment believed human beings to be naturally either benevolent or malleable. This created a tension within Enlightenment thought between the view that nature dictates human ends, and the view that nature provides more or less neutral material, to be moulded rationally and benevolently (ultimately the same thing) by conscious human efforts—education, legislation, rewards and punishment, the whole apparatus of society.[12] Berlin also attributed to the Enlightenment the beliefs that all human problems, both of knowledge and ethics, can be resolved through the discovery and application of the proper method (generally reason, the conception of which was based on the methods of the natural sciences, particularly physics); and that genuine human goods and interests were ultimately compatible, so that conflict, like wickedness, was the result of ignorance, or of deception and oppression practiced by corrupt authorities (particularly the Church).[13]

Berlin saw the school (or schools) of thought that began to emerge shortly before the French Revolution, and became ascendant during and after it, particularly those in Germany, as profoundly antagonistic towards the Enlightenment. He was most interested in German romanticism, but also looked at other members of the larger movement he referred to as the ‘Counter-Enlightenment’. [14] Berlin's account sometimes focused on a attack on the Enlightenment's benevolent and optimistic liberalism by nationalists and reactionaries; sometimes on the rejection of moral and cultural universalism by champions of pluralism; and sometimes on the critique of naturalism and scientism by thinkers who advocated a historicist view of society as essentially dynamic, shaped not by the laws of nature, but by the contingencies of history.

Berlin has been viewed both as an adherent of the Enlightenment, who showed a fascination, whether peculiar or admirable, with its critics; and as a deep and profound critic and even opponent of the Enlightenment, and an admirer of its enemies. There is some truth in both of these pictures, neither of which does justice to the complexity of Berlin's views. Berlin admired many of the thinkers of the Enlightenment, and explicitly regarded himself as ‘on their side’; he believed that much of what they had accomplished had been for the good; and, as an empiricist, he recognised them as part of the same philosophical tradition to which he belonged. But he also believed that they were wrong, and sometimes dangerously so, about some of the most important questions of society, morality and politics, and regarded their psychological and historical vision as shallow and naïve. He also traced to the Enlightenment a technocratic, managerial view of human beings and political problems to which he was profoundly opposed, and which, in the late 1940s and early '50s, he regarded as one of the gravest dangers facing the world.

Berlin regarded the Enlightenment's enemies as in many ways dangerous and deluded, sometimes more so than the Enlightenment itself. He attacked or dismissed their metaphysical beliefs, and particularly the philosophies of history of Hegel and his successors. He was also wary of the aesthetic approach to politics that many romantics had practiced and fostered. And, while appreciative of some elements in the romantic conception of liberty, he saw romanticism's influence on the development of the idea of liberty as largely perverting. At the same time, he thought the Enlightenment's opponents had pointed to many important truths that the Enlightenment had neglected or denied, both negative (the power of unreason, and particularly the darker passions, in human affairs) and positive (the inherent value of variety and of personal virtues such as integrity and sincerity, and the centrality to human nature and dignity of the capacity for choice). Romanticism rebelled in particular against the constricting order imposed by reason, and championed the human will. Berlin was sympathetic to this stance, but also believed that the romantics had gone too far both in their protests and in their celebrations. He remained committed to the goal of understanding the world so as to be able to “act rationally in it and on it” (1990, 2).

4. Ethical Thought and Value Pluralism

The republication of Berlin's essays revealed as a central dimension of his thought his advocacy of the doctrine of value pluralism. Since the early 1990s value pluralism has come to be seen by many as Berlin's ‘master idea’, and has become the most discussed, most praised and most controversial of his ideas. Value pluralism was at the centre of Berlin's ethical thought; but there is more to that thought than value pluralism alone. Berlin defined ethical thought as “the systematic examination of the relations of human beings to one another, the conceptions, interests and ideals from which human ways of treating one another spring, and the systems of value on which such ends of life are based […] beliefs about how life should be lived, what men and women should be and do” (1990, 2–3). Just as Berlin's conception of philosophy was based on a belief about the importance of concepts and categories in people's lives, his conception of ethics was founded on his belief in the importance of normative or ethical concepts and categories—especially values.[15]

Berlin did not set out a systematic theory about the nature of values, and so his view must be gleaned from his writings on the history of ideas. His remarks on the status and origins of values are somewhat ambiguous, though not necessarily irreconcilable with one another. He seems, first, to endorse the romantic view—which he traces to Kant (although he also sometimes attributes it to Hume) that values are not discovered ‘out there’, as ‘ingredients’ in the universe, not deduced or derived from nature. Rather, they are human creations, and derive their authority from this fact. From this followed a theory of ethics according to which human beings are the most morally valuable things, so that the worth of ideals and actions should be judged in relation to the meanings and impact they have for and on individual human beings. This view underlay Berlin's passionate conviction of the error of looking to theories rather than human realities, of the evil of sacrificing living human beings to abstractions; it also related to Berlin's theory of liberty, and his belief in its special importance.

Yet while Berlin sometimes suggests that values are human creations, at other times he seems to advance what amounts almost to a theory of natural law, albeit in minimalist, empirical dress. In such cases he suggests that there are certain unvarying features of human beings, as they have been constituted throughout recorded history, that make certain values important, or even necessary, to them. This view of the origin of values also comes into play in Berlin's defence of the value of liberty, when he suggests that the freedom to think, to enquire and imagine without constraint or fear is valuable because human beings need to be able to have such mental freedom; to deny it to them is a denial of their nature, which imposes an intolerable burden, producing unappeasable frustration.

In an attempt to reconcile these two strands, one might say that, for Berlin, the values that humans create are rooted in the nature of the beings who pursue them. But this is simply to move the question back a step, for the question then immediately arises: Is this human nature itself something natural and fixed, or something created and altered over time through conscious or unconscious human action? Berlin's answer (see, e.g., 2004c) comes in two parts. He rejects the idea of a fixed, fully specified human nature, regarding natural essences with suspicion. Yet he does believe (however under-theorised, unsystematic and undogmatic this belief may be) in boundaries to, and requirements made by, human nature as we know it, highly plastic as it may be. This common human nature may not be fully specifiable in terms of a list of unvarying characteristics; but, while many characteristics may vary from individual to individual or culture to culture, there is a limit on the variation—just as the human face may vary greatly from person to person in many of its properties, while remaining recognisably human. Furthermore, it is also possible to distinguish between a human and a non-human face, even if the difference between them cannot be reduced to a formula. Indeed, at the core of Berlin's thought was his insistence on the importance of humanity or the distinctively human both as a category and as a moral reality which do not need to be reduced to an unvarying essence in order to have descriptive and normative force.

There is a related ambiguity about whether values are objective or subjective. One might conclude from Berlin's view of values as human inventions that he would regard them as subjective. Yet he insisted, on the contrary, that values are objective, even going so far as to label his position ‘objective pluralism’. It is unclear what exactly he meant by this, or how this belief relates to his view of values as human creations. There are at least two accounts of the objectivity of values that can be plausibly attributed to Berlin: first, that values are ‘objective’ in that they are simply facts about the people who hold them—so that, for instance, liberty is an ‘objective’ value because I value it, and would feel frustrated and miserable without a minimal amount of it; second, that the belief in or pursuit of certain values is the result of objective realities of human nature—so that, for instance, liberty is an ‘objective’ value because certain facts about human nature make liberty good and desirable for human beings. These views are not incompatible with one another, but they are distinct; and the latter provides a firmer basis for the minimal moral universalism that Berlin espoused.

Finally, Berlin insisted that each value is binding on human beings by virtue of its own claims, in its own terms, and not in terms of some other value or goal. This view was one of the central tenets of Berlin's pluralism.

4.1 Berlin's Definition of Value Pluralism

Berlin's development and definition of pluralism both began negatively, with the identification of the opposing position, which he referred to usually as monism, and sometimes as ‘the Ionian fallacy’ or ‘the Platonic ideal’. His definition of monism may be summarised as follows:

  1. All genuine questions must have a true answer, and one only; all other responses are errors.
  2. There must be a dependable path to discovering the true answers, which is in principle knowable, even if currently unknown.
  3. The true answers, when found, will be compatible with one another, forming a single whole; for one truth cannot be incompatible with another. This, in turn, is based on the metaphysical assumption that the universe is harmonious and coherent.

We have seen that Berlin explicitly denied that the first two of these assumptions characterised human knowledge as it now is, or ever has been. In his ethical pluralism he pushed these denials further, and added a forceful denial of the third assumption. According to Berlin's pluralism, genuine values are many, and may—and often do—come into conflict with one another. When two or more values clash, it does not mean that one or another has been misunderstood; nor can it be said, a priori, that any one value is always more important than another. Liberty can conflict with equality or with public order; mercy with justice; love with impartiality and fairness; social and moral commitment with the disinterested pursuit of truth or beauty (the latter two values, contra Keats, may themselves be incompatible); knowledge with happiness; spontaneity and free-spiritedness with dependability and responsibility. Conflicts of values are ‘an intrinsic, irremovable part of human life’; the idea of total human fulfilment is a chimera. ‘These collisions of values are of the essence of what they are and what we are’; a world in which such conflicts are resolved is not the world we know or understand (2002, 213). Berlin further asserted that values may be not only incompatible, but incommensurable. There has been considerable controversy over what Berlin meant by this, and whether his understanding of incommensurability was either correct or coherent. In speaking of the incommensurability of values, Berlin seems to have meant that there is no common measure, no ‘common currency’ for comparison, in judging between any two values in the abstract. Thus, one basic implication of pluralism for ethics is the view that a quantitative approach to ethical questions (such as that envisaged by Utilitarianism) is impossible. In addition to denying the existence of a common currency for comparison, or a governing principle (such as the utility principle, or for that matter the categorical imperative), value incommensurability holds that there is no general procedure for resolving value conflicts—there is not, for example, a lexical priority rule (that is, no value always has priority over another).

Berlin based these assertions on empirical grounds—on ‘the world that we encounter in ordinary experience’, in which “we are faced with choices between ends equally ultimate, and claims equally absolute, the realisation of some of which must inevitably involve the sacrifice of others” (2002, 213). Yet he also held that the doctrine of pluralism reflected necessary rather than contingent truths about the nature of human moral life and the values that are its ingredients. The idea of a perfect whole, the ultimate solution, is not only unattainable in practice, but also conceptually incoherent. To avert or overcome conflicts between values once and for all would require the transformation, which amounted to the abandonment, of those values themselves.

Berlin's pluralism was not free-standing, but modified and guided by other beliefs and commitments. One of these, discussed below, was liberalism. Another was humanism—the view that human beings are of primary importance, and that avoiding harm to human beings is the first moral priority. Berlin therefore held that, in navigating between conflicting values, the first obligation is to avoid extremes of suffering. He insisted that moral collisions, even if unavoidable, can be softened, claims balanced, compromises reached. The goal should be the maintenance of a precarious equilibrium that avoids, as far as possible, desperate situations and intolerable choices. Philosophy itself cannot tell us how to do this, though it can help by bringing to light the problem of moral conflict and all of its implications, and by weeding out false solutions. But in dealing with conflicts of values, the concrete situation is everything (1990, 17–18).

One of the main features of Berlin's account of pluralism is the emphasis placed on the act of choosing between values. Pluralism holds that, in many cases, there is no single right answer. Berlin used this as an argument for the importance of liberty—or, perhaps more precisely, an argument against the restriction of liberty in order to impose the ‘right’ solution by force. Berlin also made a larger argument about making choices. Pluralism involves conflicts, and thus choices, not only between particular values in individual cases, but between ways of life. While Berlin seems to suggest that individuals have certain inherent traits—an individual nature, or character, which cannot be wholly altered or obscured—he also insisted that they make decisions about who they will be and what they will do. Choice is thus both an expression of an individual personality, and part of what makes that personality; it is essential to the human self.

4.2 Value Pluralism Before Berlin

Berlin provided his own (somewhat peculiar) genealogy of pluralism. He traced the rebellion against monism first to Machiavelli, and depicted Vico and Herder as decisive figures. Yet he acknowledged that Machiavelli wasn't really a pluralist, but a dualist; and other scholars have questioned his identification of Vico and Herder as pluralists, when both avowed belief in a higher, divine or mystical, unity behind variety. Other scholars have credited other figures in the history of philosophy, such as Aristotle, with pluralism (Nussbaum 1986, Evans 1996). James Fitzjames Stephen advanced something that looks very much like Berlin's pluralism (Stephen 1873), though he allied it to a conservative critique of Mill's liberalism. In Germany, Dilthey came close to pluralism, and Max Weber towards the end of his life presented a dramatic, forceful picture of the tragic conflict between incommensurable values, belief systems and ways of life (Weber 1918, esp. 117, 126, 147–8, 151–3; cf. Weber 1904, esp. 17–18). Ethical pluralism first emerged under that name, however, in America, inspired by William James's pluralistic view of the universe. John Dewey and Hastings Rashdall both approximated pluralism in certain writings (Dewey 1908, Rashdall 1907); but pluralism was apparently first proposed, under that name, and as a specifically ethical doctrine, in language strikingly similar to Berlin's, by Sterling Lamprecht, a naturalist philosopher and scholar of Hobbes and Locke in several articles (e.g., 1920, 1921), as well as, somewhat later, by A. P. Brogan (1931). The dramatic similarities between not only Berlin and Lamprecht's ideas, but also their language, makes it difficult to believe that Lamprecht was not an influence on Berlin. However, there is no evidence that Berlin knew Lamprecht's work; and Berlin's tendency was more often to credit his own ideas to others than to claim the work of others as his own. A version of pluralism was also advocated by Berlin's contemporary Michael Oakeshott (although Oakeshott seems to have attributed conflicts of values to a mistakenly reflective approach to ethical issues, and suggested that they could be overcome through relying on a more habitual, less self-conscious, ethical approach).

4.3 The Emergence of Value Pluralism in Berlin's Work

Some of the elements of value pluralism are detectable in Berlin's early essay ‘Some Procrustations’, published while he was still an undergraduate at Oxford. This essay, drawing on Aristotle, and focusing on literary and cultural criticism rather than philosophy proper, made the case for epistemological and methodological, rather than ethical, pluralism. Berlin criticised the belief in, and search for, a single method, or theory, which could serve as a master-key for understanding all experience. He insisted that, on the contrary, different standards, values and methods of enquiry are appropriate for different activities, disciplines and facets of life. In this can be seen the seeds of his later work on the differences between the sciences and the humanities, of his attacks on systematic explanatory schemes, and of his value pluralism; but all these ideas had yet to be developed or applied. Berlin was further nudged towards pluralism by discovering a suggestion by Malebranche that happiness and goodness are incompatible; this struck him at the time as an ‘odd interesting view’, but it stuck, and he became convinced of its central and pregnant truth (2004, 72). Berlin set out his basic account of what he would later label monism in his biography of Marx (1939), but did not explicitly criticise it or set out a pluralistic alternative to it (although his lecture ‘Utilitarianism’, dating from the late 1930s, does set out an argument that anticipates his later claim that values are incommensurable). The basic crux of pluralism, and Berlin's connection of it to liberalism, is apparent in rough, telegraphic form in Berlin's notes for his lecture ‘Democracy, Communism and the Individual’ (1949), and pluralism is also advanced in an aside, not under that name, in Historical Inevitability (1954). Berlin referred to pluralism and monism as basic, conflicting attitudes to life in 1955 (Berlin et al., 1955). But his use of the term and his explication of the concept did not fully come together, it appears, until Two Concepts of Liberty (1958; even then, his articulation of pluralism is absent from the first draft of the essay).

Thereafter variations on Berlin's account of pluralism appear throughout his writings on romanticism. Late in his life, taking stock of his career, and trying to communicate what he felt to be his most important philosophical insights, Berlin increasingly devoted himself to the explicit articulation and refinement of pluralism as an ethical theory. He had referred to the discovery of the basic incompatibility and incommensurability of values as his one genuine discovery in a private letter of 1969; he devoted the lecture he gave in accepting the Agnelli Prize in 1988, ‘The Pursuit of the Ideal’, to explaining what pluralism meant, and this remains the most eloquent and concentrated summary of pluralism. Berlin also discussed pluralism in many interviews and printed exchanges with other scholars from the 1970s onward, in an attempt to work out the conflicts, controversies and confusions to which his ideas gave rise; but many of these resisted Berlin's attempts at resolution, and continue to figure in, and sometimes dominate, discussions of his work.

4.4 Value Pluralism after Berlin: Some Controversies

Since the 1990s, pluralism has become the most widely and hotly debated of the ideas Berlin advanced. This is due in part to Berlin's work, and in part to that of later philosophers who, either as followers or allies of Berlin or independently, have also articulated and advanced value pluralism or similar positions.[16] Although pluralism achieved its current prominence in interpretations of Berlin's work later in his life, it was identified earlier as a key component in his thought by a few prescient readers. Two of these readers advanced what remains one of the most common criticisms of Berlin's pluralism: that it is indistinguishable from relativism (Strauss 1961; Momigliano 1976; see MacCallum 1967a and Kocis 1989 for other early critiques).[17]

One problem that has bedevilled the debate is a persistent failure to define the terms at issue with adequate clarity. Pluralism, of course, has been the subject of repeated definition by Berlin and others (the repetition not always serving a clarifying purpose). However, the term ‘relativism’ often remains under-analysed in these discussions. Whether pluralism can be distinguished from relativism depends largely on how relativism is defined, as well as on how certain obscure or controversial components of pluralism are treated. It should also be noted that the question of whether values are plural is logically distinct from the question of whether they are objective, despite the frequent elision of the two topics in the literature on this subject.

One way of defining relativism is as a form of subjectivism or moral irrationalism. This is how Berlin defined it in his attempts to refute the charge of relativism against his pluralism. For Berlin, the model of a relativist statement is ‘I like my coffee white, you like yours black; that is simply the way it is; there is nothing to choose between us; I don't understand how you can prefer black coffee, and you cannot understand how I can prefer white; we cannot agree.’ Applied to ethics, this same relativist attitude might say: ‘I like human sacrifice, and you do not; our tastes, and traditions, simply differ.’ Pluralism, on the other hand, as Berlin defines it, holds that communication and understanding of moral views is possible among all people (unless they are so alienated from normal human sentiments and beliefs as to be considered really deranged). Relativism, in Berlin's definition, would make moral communication impossible; while pluralism aims to facilitate moral communication.

Another (related) way of differentiating pluralism and relativism, employed by Berlin and others, holds that pluralism accepts a basic ‘core’ of human values, and that these and other values adopted alongside them in a particular context fall within a ‘common human horizon’. This ‘horizon’ sets limits on what is morally permissible and desirable, while the ‘core’ of shared or universal values allows us to reach agreement on at least some moral issues. This view rests on a belief in a basic, minimum, universal human nature beneath the widely diverse forms that human life and belief have taken across time and place. It may also involve a belief in the existence of a specifically moral faculty or sense inherent to human beings. Berlin seems to have believed in such a faculty, and identified it with empathy, but did not develop this view in his writings.

Yet another way of defining relativism is to view it as holding that things have value only relative to particular situations; nothing is intrinsically good—that is, valuable in and for itself as an end in itself. A slightly different way of putting this would be to maintain that there are no such things as values that are always valid; values are valid in some cases, but not others. For instance, liberty may be a value at one place and time, but has no status as a value at another. Here, again, Berlin's pluralism is opposed to relativism, since it is premissed on a belief that, for human beings, at least some values are intrinsically rather than instrumentally good, and that at least some values are universally valid, even if others aren't—and even if this universal validity isn't recognised. He admitted that liberty, for instance, had historically been upheld as an ideal only by a small minority of human beings; yet he still held it to be a genuine value for all human beings, everywhere, because of the way that human beings are constituted, and, so far as we know, will continue to be constituted. Similarly, Steven Lukes has suggested that relativism seeks to avoid or dismiss moral conflict, to explain it away by holding that different values hold for different people, and denying that the competing values may be, and often are, binding on all people. Pluralism, on the other hand, sees conflicts of values as occurring both within, and across, cultures, and (at least in Lukes's formulation) maintains that custom or relatively valid belief-systems or ways of life cannot be appealed to as ways of overcoming value-conflict (Lukes 1989). This is not a position that Berlin explicitly advances; but his later writings suggest a sympathy for it.

Yet the charge that pluralism is equivalent to relativism is not so easily refuted, given certain ambiguities in Berlin's account. These centre on the nature and origins of values, the related question of the role of cultural norms, and the meaning of ‘incommensurability’.

As stated above, Berlin held both that values are human creations, and that they are ‘objective’; and the foundation for this latter claim is ambiguous in Berlin's work. The claim that values are objective in being founded on, or expressions of, and limited by certain realities of human nature would seem to provide a defence against relativism, in holding that there is an underlying, common human nature which makes at least some values non-relative. However, the argument that values are objective simply because they are pursued by human beings seems to allow for relativism, since it makes the validity of values dependent on nothing but human preferences, and allows any values actually pursued by human beings (and, therefore, any practices adopted in pursuing those values) to claim validity.[18]

One of the knottiest dimensions of Berlin's pluralism is the idea of incommensurability, which has been open to diverging interpretations. One can make a three-way distinction, between weak incommensurability, moderate incommensurability and radical incommensurability. Berlin goes beyond weak incommensurability, which holds that values cannot be ranked quantitatively, but can be arranged in a qualitative hierarchy that applies consistently in all cases. It is not, however, clear whether he presents a moderate or a radical vision of incommensurability. The former holds that there is no single, ultimate scale or principle with which to measure values—no ‘moral slide-rule’ or universal unit of normative measurement. This view is certainly consistent with all that Berlin wrote from 1931 onwards. Such a view does not necessarily lead to the conclusion that it is impossible to make judgements between values on a case-by-case basis, or that values, just because they can't be compared or ranked in terms of one master-value or formula, can't be compared or deliberated between at all.

Berlin does sometimes offer more starkly dramatic accounts of incommensurability, which make it hard to rule out this more radical interpretation of the concept, according to which incommensurability is more or less synonymous with incomparability. The latter states that values cannot be compared at all, since there is no ‘common currency’ in terms of which to compare them: each value, being sui generis, cannot be judged in relation to any other value, because there is nothing to judge them both in relation to. As a result, choices among values cannot be based on (objectively valid) evaluative comparisons, but only on personal preference, or on an act of radical choice. If this view is adopted, it is difficult to see how pluralism's practical consequences would differ from those of relativism, although some scholars—most notably John Gray—have attempted to work out a version of pluralism that will both accommodate this more radical interpretation of incommensurability, and yet be differentiated from relativism.

A related question concerns the role of reason in moral deliberation. If values are incommensurable, must all choices between conflicting values be ultimately subjective or irrational? If so, how does pluralism differ from radical relativism and subjectivism? If not, how, exactly, does moral reasoning work? How can we rationally make choices between values when there is no system or unit of measurement that can be used in making such deliberations? One possible answer to the last question is to offer an account of practical, situational reasoning that is not quantitative or rule-based. This is what Berlin suggests; but, once again, he does not offer a systematic explanation of the nature of non-systematic reason. (On incommensurability see Chang 1997 and Crowder 2002.)

In the area of political philosophy, the most widespread controversy over pluralism concerns its relationship to liberalism. This debate overlaps with that regarding pluralism's relationship to relativism, to the extent that liberalism is regarded as resting on a belief in certain universal values and fundamental human rights, a belief which relativism undermines. However, there are some who maintain that, while pluralism is distinct from, and preferable to, relativism, it is nevertheless too radical and subversive to be reconciled to liberalism (or, conversely, that liberalism is too inherently and deludedly universalistic or absolutist to be compatible with pluralism). The main proponent of this view, who is more responsible than any other thinker for the emergence and wide discussion of this issue, is John Gray (see, especially, Gray 1995). Gray asserts that pluralism is true, that pluralism undermines liberalism, and that therefore liberalism, at least as it has traditionally been conceived, should be abandoned.[19]

Gray's case has spawned a vast literature, concerning both Berlin's treatment of the relationship between pluralism and liberalism in particular, and this issue in general. Some theorists have agreed with Gray (Kekes, 1993, 1997); others have sought to show that pluralism and liberalism are reconcilable, although this reconciliation may require modifications to both liberalism and pluralism—modifications that are, however, justifiable, and indeed inherently desirable. The most extensive discussions to date are those by George Crowder and William Galston (Crowder 2002, 2004, Galston 2002, 2004).[20]

Berlin himself was devoted both to pluralism and to liberalism, which he saw not as related by logical entailment, but as interconnected and harmonious. The version of pluralism he advanced was distinctly liberal in its assumptions, aims and conclusions, just as his liberalism was distinctly pluralist. As Michael Walzer has remarked, Berlin's pluralism is characterised by “receptivity, generosity, and scepticism”, which are, “if not liberal values, then qualities of mind that make it […] likely that liberal values will be accepted” (Galston 2002, 60–1; Walzer 1995, 31).

5. Political Thought

5.1 Political Judgement and Leadership

Apart from his better-known writings on liberty and pluralism, Berlin's political thought centred on two topics, both of which were, for most of his career, to varying degrees marginal in the study of political theory. These were the nature of political judgement and the ethics of political action. Berlin addressed the former subject both directly and through his writings on individual statesmen who embodied models of different sorts of successful political judgement (for these, see the portraits collected in Berlin 1998, and Hanley 2004).

Berlin disputed the idea that political judgement was a body of knowledge, a science, which could be reduced to rules. Political action should be based on a ‘sense of reality’ founded on experience, empathetic understanding of others, sensitivity to the environment, and personal judgement about what is true or untrue, significant or trivial, alterable or unalterable, effective or useless etc. Such judgement necessarily involves personal instinct and flair, ‘strokes of unanalysable genius’. In the realm of political action, laws are few and skill is all (1996, 43).

Like the study of history, political judgement involves reaching an understanding of the unique set of characteristics that constitute a particular individual, atmosphere, state of affairs or event (1996, 45). This requires a capacity for integrating “a vast amalgam of constantly changing, multicoloured, evanescent, perpetually overlapping data”, a “direct, almost sensuous contact with the relevant data”, and “an acute sense of what fits with what, what springs from what, what leads to what […] what the result is likely to be in a concrete situation of the interplay of human beings and impersonal forces” (1996, 46). Such a sense is qualitative rather than quantitative, specific rather than general.

The faculty that allows for such judgement is, Berlin insists, not metaphysical, but ‘ordinary, empirical, and quasi-aesthetic’. This sense is distinct from any sort of ethical sense; it could be possessed or lacked by both virtuous and villainous politicians. Recognition of the importance of this sense of political reality should not discourage the spirit of scientific enquiry or serve as an excuse for obscurantism. But it should discourage the attempt to transform political action into the application of scientific principles, and government into technocratic administration.[21]

Berlin intended his writings on political judgement as a warning to political theorists not to overreach themselves. Political thought can do much good in helping us to think through politics. But political action is a practical matter, which should not, and cannot, be founded on, or dictated by, theory.

Berlin's writings on political judgement, activity and leadership are of a piece with his larger epistemological project: to bring to light the tension between the application of abstract or a priori theory and the recognition of direct perception; and to warn against the dangers of the former and assert the importance of the latter (he acknowledged that it was impossible to think without the use of analogies and metaphors, that thought necessarily involves generalisation and comparison; but he warned that it was important to be cautious, self-conscious and critical in the use of general models and analogies: see 1978b, 158). These writings also reassert the message of the youthful essay ‘Some Procrustations’: that the same rules should not be automatically applied to every facet of human life. Rationality consists of the application, not of a single technique or set of rules, but of those methods that have proven to work best in each particular field or situation. This view of political judgement also relates to Berlin's attempt to vindicate the importance of individual agency and personality, by insisting that political judgement is a personal quality, and effective political activity a matter of personal consideration, decision and action rather than impersonal administration or the deployment of institutional machinery.

5.2 Political Ethics: Ends, Means, Violence

While Berlin emphasised the place of questions about the proper ends of political action in the subject-matter of political theory, he also recognised the importance of discussions of the proper means to employ, and the relationship between these and the ends at which they aim. Berlin did not treat this question—the question of political ethics—directly in his work; nor did he offer simple or confident answers to the perennial questions of the morality of political action. Nevertheless, he did advance some theses about this branch of morality; and these were among his most heartfelt, and indeed passionate, pronouncements.

Berlin's primary mouthpiece for these messages was Alexander Herzen, the nineteenth-century Russian radical publicist.[22] The words of Herzen that Berlin repeated most insistently were those condemning the sacrifice of human beings on the altar of abstractions, the subordination of the realities of individual happiness or unhappiness in the present to glorious dreams of the future (Berlin also quoted similar sentiments from Benjamin Constant: see Berlin 1990, 16 and 2002, 3, as well as 1978a, 82–113 and 186–209 passim). The first principle of Berlin's political ethics was an opposition to such subordination, which Berlin viewed as the essence of fanaticism, and a recipe for inhumanity that was as futile as it was horrible.

Berlin, like Herzen, believed that ‘the end of life is life itself’, and that each life and each age should be regarded as its own end and not as a means to some future goal. To this Berlin added a caution (evocative as much of Max Weber as of Herzen) about the unpredictability of the future. Berlin's belief in the power of human agency was qualified by an awareness of how the consequences of any course of action are unknowable, and likely to be quite different from what was intended. This led Berlin, on the one hand, to stress the need for caution and moderation; and, on the other, to insist that uncertainty is inescapable, so that all action, however carefully undertaken, involves the risk of error and disastrous, or at least unexpected and troubling, consequences. The result was an ethic of political humility, similar to Weber's ethic of responsibility, but lacking its tone of grim, stoic grandeur.

Berlin often noted the dangers of Utopianism, and stressed the need for a measure of political pragmatism. He may therefore appear to have been staunchly in the tradition of political realism. Yet this was not quite the case: Berlin sought to warn against the dangers of idealism, and chasten it, so as to save it from itself and better defend it against cynicism. Berlin's pluralism points the way to a politics of compromise; yet Berlin also warned against the dangers of certain types of compromise, particularly those involving the employment of dubious means to achieve desired ends. Indeed, the problem of the relationship between ends and means runs through Berlin's writings. Berlin, characteristically, warned both against an insistence on total political purity—for, when values conflict and consequences are often unexpected, purity is an impossible ideal—and against a disregard for the ethical niceties of political means. Berlin regarded such an attitude as not only morally ugly, but foolish: for good ends have a tendency to be corrupted and undermined by being pursued through unscrupulous means. Furthermore, since the consequences of actions are so uncertain, it is often the case that political actors don't achieve their goals, or achieve them imperfectly; it is best not to make too many sacrifices along the way to accomplishing one's political goals, since that accomplishment is uncertain. To the realist argument that ‘You cannot make an omelette without breaking eggs’, Berlin responded: “The one thing we can be sure of is the reality of the sacrifice, the dying and the dead. But the ideal for which they die remains unrealised. The eggs are broken, and the habit of breaking them grows, but the omelette remains invisible” (1990, 16).

Berlin was thoroughly anti-absolutist; but he did insist that there were certain actions that were, except in the most drastic of situations, unacceptable. Foremost among these were the manipulation and humiliation of individuals by others, to the extent that those who are ‘got at’ or ‘tampered with’ by others are deprived of their humanity (see 2002, 339–43). Berlin warned particularly against the use of violence. He acknowledged that the use of force was sometimes necessary and justified; but he also reminded his readers that violence has particularly volatile and unpredictable consequences, and tends to spiral out of control, leading to terrible destruction and suffering, and undermining the noble goals it seeks to achieve. He also stressed the dangers of paternalistic, or otherwise humiliating and disempowering, attempts to institute reform or achieve improvement, which had a tendency to inspire a backlash of hatred and resistance.

Berlin's political ethics are best summarised in his own words:

Let us have the courage of our admitted ignorance, of our doubts and uncertainties. At least we can try to discover what others […] require, by […] making it possible for ourselves to know men as they truly are, by listening to them carefully and sympathetically, and understanding them and their lives and their needs, one by one individually. Let us try to provide them with what they ask for, and leave them as free as possible (1978a, 258).

For Berlin the acceptance of uncertainty was a call not only to cultivate humility, but to foster liberty.

5.3 The Concept of Liberty

Berlin's best-known contribution to political theory has been his essay on the distinction between positive and negative liberty. This distinction is explained, and the vast literature on it summarised, elsewhere in this encyclopaedia; the following therefore focuses only on Berlin's original argument, which has often been misunderstood, in part because of ambiguities in Berlin's account.

In Two Concepts of Liberty Berlin sought to explain the difference between two (not, he acknowledged, the only two) different ways of thinking about political liberty which had run through modern thought, and which, he believed, were central to the ideological struggles of his day. Berlin called these two conceptions of liberty negative and positive.[23] Berlin's treatment of these concepts was less than fully even-handed from the start: while he defined negative liberty fairly clearly and simply, he gave positive liberty two different basic definitions, from which still more distinct conceptions would branch out. Negative liberty Berlin initially defined as freedom from, that is, the absence of constraints on the agent imposed by other people. Positive liberty he defined both as freedom to, that is, the ability (not just the opportunity) to pursue and achieve willed goals; and also as autonomy or self-rule, as opposed to dependence on others.

Berlin's account was further complicated by combining conceptual analysis with history. He associated negative liberty with the classical liberal tradition as it had emerged and developed in Britain and France from the seventeenth to the early nineteenth centuries. Berlin later regretted that he had not made more of the evils that negative liberty had been used to justify, such as exploitation under laissez-faire capitalism; in Two Concepts itself, however, negative liberty is portrayed favourably, and briefly. It is on positive liberty that Berlin focuses, since it is, he claims, both a more ambiguous concept, and one which has been subject to greater and more sinister transformation, and ultimately perversion.

Berlin traces positive liberty back to theories that focus on the autonomy, or capacity for self-rule, of the agent.[24] Of these, Berlin found Rousseau's theory of liberty particularly dangerous. For, in Berlin's account, Rousseau had equated freedom with self-rule, and self-rule with obedience to the ‘general will’. By this, Berlin alleged, Rousseau meant, essentially, the common or public interest—that is, what was best for all citizens qua citizens. The general will was quite independent of, and would often be at odds with, the selfish wills of individuals, who, Rousseau charged, were often deluded as to their own interests.

This view went against Berlin's political and moral outlook in two ways. First, it posited the existence of a single ‘true’ public interest, a single set of arrangements that was best for all citizens, and was thus opposed to the main thrust of pluralism. Second, it rested on a bogus transformation of the concept of the self. In his doctrine of the general will Rousseau moved from the conventional and, Berlin insisted, correct view of the self as individual to the self as citizen—which for Rousseau meant the individual as member of a larger community. Rousseau transformed the concept of the self's will from what the empirical individual actually desires to what the individual as citizen ought to desire, that is, what is in the individual's real best interest, whether he or she realises it or not.

This transformation became more sinister still in the hands of Kant's German disciples. Fichte began as a radically individualist liberal. But he came to reject his earlier political outlook, and ultimately became an ardent, even hysterical, nationalist—an intellectual forefather of Fascism and even Nazism. Once again, this involved a move from the individual to a collective—in Fichte's case, the nation, or Volk. In this view, the individual achieves freedom only through renunciation of his or her desires and beliefs as an individual and submersion in a larger group. Freedom becomes a matter of overcoming the poor, flawed, false, empirical self—what one appears to be and want—in order to realise one's ‘true’, ‘real’, ‘noumenal’ self. This ‘true’ self may be identified with one's best or true interests, either as an individual or as a member of a larger group or institution; or with a cause, an idea or the dictates of rationality (as in the case, Berlin argued, of Hegel's definition of liberty, which equated it with recognition of, and obedience to, the laws of history as revealed by reason). Berlin traced this sinister transformation of the idea of freedom to the totalitarian movements of the twentieth century, both Communist and Fascist-Nazi, which claimed to liberate people by subjecting—and often sacrificing—them to larger groups or principles. As we have seen, to do this was for Berlin the greatest of political evils; and to do so in the name of freedom, a political principle that Berlin, as a genuine liberal, especially cherished, struck him as a particularly monstrous deception. Against this, Berlin championed, as ‘truer and more humane’, negative liberty and an empirical view of the self.

In addition to the debates concerning the conceptual validity and historical accuracy of Berlin's account (extensively documented in Harris 2002), there is considerable misunderstanding of Berlin's own attitudes to the concepts he discussed, and of the goals of his lecture. Berlin has often been interpreted, not unreasonably, as a staunch enemy of the concept of positive liberty. But this was never wholly the case. Berlin regarded both concepts of liberty as centring on valid claims about what is necessary and good for human beings; both negative and positive liberty were for him genuine values, which might in some cases clash, but in other cases could be combined and might even be mutually interdependent. Indeed, Berlin's own earlier articulations of his political values included a notable component of positive liberty alongside negative liberty (see e.g., 2002, 336–44). What Berlin attacked was the many ways in which positive liberty had been used to justify the denial, betrayal or abandonment of both negative liberty and the truest forms of positive liberty itself. Berlin's main targets were not positive liberty as such, but the metaphysical or psychological assumptions which, combined with the concept of positive liberty, had led to its perversion: monism, and a metaphysical or collective conception of the self. Two Concepts of Liberty, and Berlin's liberalism, are therefore not based on championing negative liberty against positive liberty, but on advocating individualism, empiricism and pluralism against collectivism, holism, rationalistic metaphysics and monism.

5.4 Liberty and Pluralism

In Berlin's account, the main connection between pluralism and liberalism centres on the centrality of choice to both. Berlin's argument is as follows. The conflicts between values and ways of life that are the matter of pluralism require people to make choices. These choices are of the utmost importance, because they involve the most basic and essential questions of human life—what one is to be and do. Those who have to make such choices are therefore likely to care about them, and to want some say in making them. Furthermore, the ability to make one's own choices between conflicting values is the crux of one's identity and dignity as a moral agent. (This step of the argument, it should be noticed, is not entailed by pluralism itself; but it is an assumption central to Berlin's moral individualism, which Berlin imports into his pluralism.)

Why might one deny individuals the opportunity to make choices for themselves? One answer (though not the only possible one) is that individuals may make the wrong choices, so that it is necessary to coerce or manipulate them to choose correctly. But pluralism holds that in cases where there are conflicts between genuine values, there may be no single right choice—more than one choice (though not necessarily all possible choices) may equally serve genuine human values and interests, even if it also involves the sacrifice or violation of other values or interests that are no more or less true and important. Similarly, there is no single ideal life, no single model of how to think or behave or be, to which people should attempt, or be brought, to conform as far as possible.

Pluralism, then, for Berlin, represents an argument that both undermines one of the main rationales for violating freedom of choice, and vindicates the importance and value of being able to make choices freely.[25] Some interpreters have argued that Berlin's vindication of the freedom to choose, while it rests in part on his pluralism, also requires the addition of moral principles, ideals and assumptions external to pluralism (though this need not, contra John Gray, mean that pluralism is incompatible with, or necessary undermines, liberalism); while others (such as George Crowder) have argued that Berlin's liberalism can be deduced from his pluralism alone.

At the same time, while pluralism is an important ingredient in Berlin's argument for the importance of liberty, it also modifies and moderates his liberalism, and prevents Berlin from being (as many proponents of negative liberty in the twentieth century and after have been) an unqualified classical liberal or libertarian. Negative and positive liberty are both genuine values which must be balanced against each other; and liberty of any sort is one value among many, with which it may conflict, and against which it needs to be balanced. Therefore Berlin was more sensitive than many classical liberal or libertarian thinkers to the possibility that genuine liberty may in fact conflict with genuine equality, or justice, or public order, or security, or efficiency, or happiness, and therefore must be balanced with, and sometimes sacrificed in favour of, other values. Berlin's liberalism includes both a conservative or pragmatic appreciation of the importance of maintaining a balance between different values, and a social-democratic appreciation of the need to restrict liberty in some cases so as to promote equality and justice and protect the weak against victimisation by the strong (see 2002, 214–15). Nevertheless Berlin remains a liberal in maintaining that preserving a certain minimum of individual liberty is a primary political priority. He justifies this view by an appeal to an empiricist version of a natural law argument, writing of the existence of ‘natural rights’ based on the way that human beings are constituted, mentally or physically; to attempt to alter or limit human life in certain ways is to block the desires, goals, aspirations inherent in being human as we know it (1996, 73–4). To deprive human beings of certain basic rights is to dehumanise them. While liberty should not be the only good pursued by society, and while it should not always trump other values, ethical pluralism lends it a special importance: for people must be free in order to allow for the recognition and pursuit of all genuine human values. Society should therefore make it a priority to provide the liberty necessary for Millian ‘experiments in living’ and for the perpetuation of social and personal variety (see Berlin 2002, 218–51).

5.5. Nationalism

Berlin used the term ‘nationalism’ somewhat confusingly, to refer to two quite distinct, and morally very different, phenomena. The first of these was the sense of belonging, of collective identity, of which Herder had written. The second was the ‘inflamed’ form of this sentiment, which, feeding off of resentment, frustration and humiliation, became ‘pathological’. Berlin was sympathetic to the former, critical of the latter; but he recognised the relationship of the two, and was thus aware of the power and allure of nationalism.

Berlin insisted that the struggles for national liberation that marked his own day—primarily in the late 1940s, '50s and '60s—were not struggles for either negative or positive liberty as such, but rather expressed a craving for collective recognition, for status, for the sense of living among and being governed—however harshly—by members of one's own group. Berlin credited to Herder the insight that belonging, and the sense of self-expression that membership bestows, are basic human needs; but it seems unlikely that he would have had to learn this lesson from Herder—it is more probable that it was his own appreciation of these needs that attracted him to that author in the first place. He was sharply aware of the pain of humiliation and dependency, the hatefulness and hurtfulness of paternalistic rule. His individualism and emphasis on liberty were qualified by his understanding of the human need for a sense of belonging to a community—an awareness sharpened, if not generated, by his own experience of exile, as well as by the influence of his mother's passionate Zionism.[26]

6. Conclusion

Berlin's life and work continue to be the subject of considerable scholarly attention. This attention has yet to yield a settled consensus about the merits, or indeed the meaning, of Berlin's work—and not only because Berlin evokes strong personal reactions, attracting admiration and affection, if not outright veneration, as a liberal saint (see e.g., Annan 1980, 1990, 1999; Hausheer 1979 and 2004), and inspiring hostility from critics on both the right and left, who have detected in Berlin's stance complacency, hypocrisy, a want of courage, and an excess of tolerance (see e.g., Scruton 1989, Hitchens 1998). This is to be expected, given Berlin's fierce opposition to Communism, combined with his refusal to ally himself to extreme anti-Communism, as well as his ambivalence or hesitancy on many divisive political issues of his own day.

However, even as the ideological battles of the Cold War begin to recede into the past, Berlin remains the object of varying interpretations and evaluations. This may appear odd in a thinker who wrote clearly, and without any attempt at secrecy or obscurity. But it is unsurprising, given the complexity of Berlin's vision, his aversion to systematic exposition or theorising, the multifaceted nature of his work, and the uniqueness of his position in the intellectual life of his times. These qualities make it difficult not only to evaluate Berlin, but even to situate him in the history of ideas; for he appears at once typical and atypical of the period in which he lived, and also both ahead of his time and extremely old-fashioned.

In his youth Berlin's intellectual development followed that of English-language philosophy, and he was at one point deeply involved in the advance of analytic philosophy; yet he drifted away from this, and his later writings and concerns are a world apart from most Anglo-American philosophy of its time. On the other hand, for all his range of historical and cultural reference and concern with moral and aesthetic questions, and despite the influence of Kant and Kant's successors on his thought, Berlin seems out of place in the world of Continental philosophy. Yet it would be a mistake to accept Berlin's own judgement that he had departed from the realm of philosophy altogether. For both the views he had formed while working as a professional philosopher, and his tendency to connect political, historical and cultural issues to deeper moral and epistemological questions, set his work apart from that of other historians and ‘public intellectuals’ of his day (to whom he otherwise bore a certain resemblance).

Berlin was, for much of his life, an intellectually lonely figure, pursuing the history of ideas in an academic setting that was unreceptive to it, and advocating a moderate liberalism in a time dominated by ideological extremism. And yet this plea for moderation and advocacy of liberalism was shared and taken up by many others at the time.[27] Intellectually, Berlin was often prescient, yet also strangely reactionary. His interest in political philosophy and dedication to the defence of liberalism anticipated the work of John Rawls (who had studied with Berlin at Oxford while a young academic); yet the resurgence of political theory initiated by Rawls's work coincided with a period of eclipse in Berlin's reputation. Berlin's concern with the problem of culture anticipated the centrality in political theory of questions of identity and membership that began in the 1990s; his sympathy for the sentiments and needs underlying nationalism, which set him apart from many liberal theorists of his own time, presaged the revival of ‘liberal nationalism’ in the works of younger thinkers such as Michael Walzer, David Miller, Yael Tamir and Michael Ignatieff. His attack on monism, on the quest for certainty and the project of systematic knowledge, has led him to be embraced by some proponents of anti-foundationalism such as Richard Rorty. Yet Berlin's work remains difficult to assimilate to intellectual movements or projects such as postmodernism or multiculturalism, the excesses and obscurities of which provoked quizzical scepticism in him towards the end of his life.

Nor is Berlin easy to identify seamlessly with those intellectual positions that he explicitly propounded—liberalism and pluralism. Berlin's place in the history of political thought is therefore, at present, paradoxical and unsettled. He appears as an important, and indeed emblematic, exponent of liberalism—along with Rawls, the most important liberal theorist of his century—whose ideas may nevertheless in the end undermine, or at least be difficult to reconcile, with liberalism. This question has come to preoccupy many readers of Berlin's work, and predominate in discussions of his legacy, to the extent of threatening to overshadow other aspects of his thought.

The debate over pluralism and liberalism raises genuinely important conceptual issues; yet it becomes somewhat misleading, both in itself and particularly as a guide to Berlin's thought, if pluralism and liberalism are both taken to be comprehensive doctrines, or if they are reified into independently existing, systematic entities. ‘Pluralism’ and ‘liberalism’ as general terms are abstractions which can be helpfully used to group, analyse and compare the positions of different thinkers, or to characterise different facets of the thought of a single thinker. Neither, however, is likely to capture the whole of an individual position; and neither in itself, even if linked to the other, encompasses or sums up Berlin's own outlook.

Berlin himself insisted that political and ethical theories arise from a thinker's basic conception of human nature, which in turn is founded on an entire philosophical outlook, a conception of the nature of the universe, reality, knowledge etc. This is certainly true of Berlin's own political and ethical thought, if not of that of every thinker. The vision underlying Berlin's political and ethical theory, while it may have been coherent (this is itself arguable), was not systematic, and it cannot be accurately characterised simply as pluralistic or liberal, if these terms are to have any specific meaning or any use in analysing positions other than Berlin's own. ‘Pluralism’ can be used, more narrowly, to describe Berlin's theory of values. It can also be employed more broadly, to capture something of his vision of reality, the universe and human nature—that is, the view that all of these things are complexes made up of separate and conflicting parts: that the self is protean and open-ended, that the universe is not a harmonious cosmos, that reality presents many separate aspects, which can and should be viewed from different perspectives. But pluralism, as explicitly defined by Berlin and others, does not cover Berlin's empiricism, or his historicism, or his awareness of the fallibility of human knowledge, or his belief in the primary importance of individuals as opposed to generalisations and abstractions, or his emphasis on the importance of free choice (which, while he sought to found it on pluralism, in fact appears to be independent of it). Nor does pluralism, with its emphasis on the place of tragic conflict and loss in human life, capture the affirmative zest for life and delighted enthusiasm for human beings that was central to Berlin's character as a man and thinker. Berlin's thought, like his writing, is made up both of swathes of sharp colour and of minutely variegated and subtle shades of light and darkness; it thus resists summary and simple conclusions, and repays persistent and open-ended study.


A. Works by Berlin

B. Books About Berlin

C. Other Works Cited

Other Internet Resources

Online articles on Berlin

Related Entries

Ayer, Alfred Jules | Berkeley, George | Bosanquet, Bernard | Bradley, Francis Herbert | Carnap, Rudolf | categories | causation: the metaphysics of | Collingwood, Robin George | determinism: causal | Dilthey, Wilhelm | Enlightenment | equality | Fichte, Johann Gottlieb | free will | Green, Thomas Hill | Hamann, Johann Georg | Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich | Herder, Johann Gottfried von | Herzen, Alexander | history, philosophy of | Hume, David | idealism: British | Kant, Immanuel | liberalism | libertarianism | liberty: positive and negative | logical positivism | Machiavelli, Niccolò | Marx, Karl | Mill, John Stuart | Montesquieu, Charles-Louis de Secondat, Baron de | Moore, George Edward | nationalism | neo-Kantianism | nominalism: in metaphysics | ordinary language | Plekhanov, Georgy | political philosophy: history of | Rickert, Heinrich | universals: the medieval problem of | value: pluralism | Vico, Giambattista | Vienna Circle | Weber, Max | Williams, Bernard | Windelband, Wilhelm | Wittgenstein, Ludwig


The authors would like to thank George Crowder, who read a draft of this entry and whose comments were most helpful.