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Medieval Mereology

First published Sat May 20, 2006; substantive revision Wed Jun 4, 2008

The study of wholes and parts is known as mereology. This article is an introduction to mereology as it is practiced in the Latin West, starting with Boethius in the sixth century A.D. and ending in the fourteenth century. It will highlight key medieval mereological concepts and principles and outline some of the fundamental issues that confront mereologists in the Middle Ages.  Specific philosophers and their doctrines will be used to illustrate some of these concepts, principles, and puzzles. Many of these concepts and principles may seem strange to the modern student of parts of and wholes, but behind this alien veneer one will see that medieval mereologists share many of our concerns about wholes, their parts, and the metaphysical implications of mereology.

1. Forums for medieval mereology

One can find discussions of parts and wholes throughout the medieval philosophical and theological literature. But there are two forums where the student of medieval mereology can reliably look to find sustained reflections on parts and wholes as such, namely, treatments of division and the Topics. The main authority on division and the Topics is the Roman philosopher Boethius (c. 480-524 A.D.). Boethius is now most famous for his Consolation of Philosophy, but his influence on medieval philosophy is as much due to his commentaries on Aristotle's Categories and On Interpretation, his theological treatises, and his handbooks on logic (see Chadwick 1981 and Marenbon 2003). Boethius' treatment of division is found in his handbook On Division (De divisione). His treatment of the Topics is found in his handbook On the Topical Differences (De differentiis topicis), and in his commentary on Cicero's treatment of the Topics (In Ciceronis Topica).

1.1 Division

The methods of “division” (Greek: diairesis, Latin: divisio) and “collection” (Greek: sunairesis, Latin: collectio) have their roots in Plato's later dialogues, and they are common in Ancient Neoplatonic and Aristotelian treatises on logic. Plato tells us that collection and division provide us with a way to understand the relationships between some unity and some plurality (Phaedrus 265d-266b, and Philebus 16c-17a). Division is a process whereby any sort of unity is resolved into a plurality. Collection is the process whereby a plurality is collected into a unity. 

For the Neoplatonists, division and collection are first and foremost applied to genera and species (such as Animal and Human), and instances of these universals (such as Brownie the donkey and Socrates). This primary mode of division is often interpreted as a logical exercise. In particular, it is a method for developing definitions of things, which can then be used in demonstrations.  Collection is construed as a method for classification.

The primary purpose of division for Late Ancient philosophers is to determine the hierarchical relations between a universal and that which falls under it. But divisions are applied to a variety of other items. There is no single, canonical list of divisions (for an overview, see Magee 1998, xxxvii-xlix). The list presented by Boethius is the one bequeathed to the Latin West (On Division 877c-d). Boethius distinguishes between two broad categories: substantial divisions and accidental divisions. These divisions are divided further. Of the substantial divisions there are:  

(1) The division of the genus into its species.

(2) The division of the whole into parts.

(3) The division of a word into its meanings.

Of the accidental divisions there are:

(4) The division of a subject into accidents.

(5) The division of accidents into subjects.

(6) The division of accidents into accidents.

The most important material for our purposes is Boethius' treatment of the first and second substantial modes of division.

1.2 The Topics

“Topic” is the standard translation for the Latin term locus. As Stump (1981 and 1982) and Green-Pedersen (1984) have pointed out, the notion of the Topic evolves over the course of its use in ancient and medieval logic, but in general, the study of the Topics helps one to discover a number of self-evidently true propositions, or “maximal propositions”, that can serve as warrants for arguments. For example, suppose that someone makes this inference:

If Socrates is human, Socrates is animal.

Students of the Topics claim that this inference is warranted by the following maximal proposition:

If a species is predicated of something, that species' genus is also predicable of that thing.

The student of medieval mereology will be extremely interested in the maximal propositions presented in treatments of the Topic from the whole and the Topic from the part.

Following a well-established Ancient tradition, the Topic from the whole is almost universally divided into two sub-Topics: 

(1) The Topic from the universal whole.

(2) The Topic from the integral whole.

From the beginning, the best medieval philosophers are aware of the subtleties of ordinary language. In particular, they are mindful of the distributive function of the adjectival term “whole” (totus/tota/totum). The phrase “totus x” can mean “all the parts of x taken together” or “the entire x”. This is often called the term's  “categorematic” sense. There is also a “syncategorematic” sense, which means “any part” (quaelibet pars) of x (see, e.g., Albert of Saxony Sophismata 45; John Buridan Summulae de Dialectica 4.3.7-1; Ockham Summa Logicae II, ch. 6 = Opera Philosophica I, 267-69).[1]   This sensitivity to the distributive uses of mereological language motivates medieval logicians to add further refinements to the theory of the Topics. By the thirteenth century, the Topic from the whole is routinely divided in a six-fold manner (see, e.g., Peter of Spain Tractatus V.11-18, pp. 63-67; and Radulphus Brito Commentary on Boethius' “De differentiis topicis” II, q. 9). In addition to the Topic from the universal whole and the Topic from the integral whole, there are these additional Topics:

(3) The Topic from the whole in quantity.

(4) The Topic from the whole in a respect (in modo).

(5) The Topic from the whole in place.

(6) The Topic from the whole in time.

The Topic from the whole in quantity classifies and considers propositions where the term is taken universally, such as “Every x is a y”, or “No x is a y”. The Topic from the whole in a respect considers a term in respect to some limiting qualification. So, for example, if x is white on its surface, then every part of x's surface is white. The Topic from the whole in place classifies propositions bounded by the term “everywhere” or its cognates. So, if water is everywhere, then water is here (where “here” designates a “part in place”). And, finally, the Topic from the whole in time considers inferences that one can make from propositions bounded by the term “always” or “never”. 

A full account of medieval mereology would consider carefully the details of all six sub-Topics. But of special interest to the mereologist are the treatments of the Topic from the integral whole and of the Topic from the integral part. In these discussions, medieval philosophers usually consider whether the traditional maximal propositions associated with these Topics in fact describe the logical and metaphysical relations that hold between an integral whole and an integral part. Specifically, the maximal proposition that applies to integral wholes is:

If the whole is, then the part is.

The maximal proposition said to apply to the integral part in relation to its whole is:

If the part is not, the whole is not.

These maximal propositions are quite startling. They seem to entail, for example, that if Socrates exists, then his hand must exist, and if Socrates' hand ceases to exist, then Socrates ceases to exist. As we will see in Section 4.2, such consequences do not escape the notice of medieval philosophers, and much of interest regarding the metaphysical implications of the Topics and their maximal propositions ensues.

2. Wholes

The ancient practice of collection and division, and especially the proclivity to call both the products of collection and the things to be divided wholes, has a lasting influence on medieval mereology.  For medieval philosophers a variety of items can be wholes.  Universals, concepts, material objects, masses (such as water or gold), souls, and time can all be wholes—and this is only to mention some of the more common items studied by medieval philosophers.

In general, anything that is composed out of other items or that can be divided into other items is a whole. However, one should be careful and not assume that just because something is a whole, that item is a mind-independent feature of the world. Peter Abelard, for instance, argues that temporal wholes (such as days, weeks, or hours) and universal wholes are not things (res), by which he means these wholes are not independent features of reality. (On temporal wholes, see Dialectica 554.14-23 and Logica Ingredientibus 2, 187.9-14. On universals, see Logica Ingredientibus 1, 10.8-16.18 and Logica Nostrorum 515.10-522.9. For a helpful overview of Abelard's anti-realist metaphysics, consult King 2004.)  Yet, provided that we do not reify these items, Abelard will allow us to treat items like days and hours as wholes consisting of parts, and he will allow us to talk about universals and their parts.      

Medieval philosophers attempt to impose order on this motley group of wholes by classifying them under three broad categories: integral wholes, universal wholes, and potential wholes. 

2.1. Integral wholes

Much of what we encounter in the material world is, or can be considered to be, a whole. Cars, houses, plants, and human beings are all composed out of bits of metal, plastic, cellulose, or flesh and bone. Cars, house, plants, and humans are not only divisible into these components; they are divisible into other parts such as carburetors, doors, leaves, and hands. 

Items such as cars, houses, plants, and humans are considered to be either continuous or contiguous integral wholes, depending upon a particular medieval philosopher's other metaphysical commitments.  Following Aristotle's division of quantities into continuous and discrete quantities (Cat. 6), medieval philosophers divide the integral whole into continuous integral wholes and discrete integral wholes. Continuous wholes are wholes whose parts share a common boundary. Discrete wholes are wholes whose parts do not share a common boundary. The parts of discrete integral wholes can be either close to one another, or relatively scattered. Contiguous wholes consist of parts that are discrete, but spatially close together. Discrete wholes whose parts are relatively diffuse are scattered integral wholes. 

Some early medieval philosophers only have aggregates like crowds or flocks or piles of stones in mind when they talk about contiguous wholes. But others think that man-made objects are contiguous wholes, and that only substances are continuous wholes. For instance, both Abelard and Aquinas think that only substances, such as individual donkeys, palm trees, and human beings, are continuous wholes. Abelard thinks that this is true because only God can fuse parts together into a continuous unity. Humans operations, no matter how finessed, are only capable of placing parts in close proximity to one another (Dialectica 417.4-37; 419.35-420.6). Drawing upon Aristotle's reflections on form and matter (especially in his De Anima, Physics and Metaphysics), Aquinas thinks that only substances possess a substantial form, which inheres in each and every part of the whole. Artifacts possess an accidental form, for artifacts have a form that orders and arranges the parts of the whole, but that does not inhere in each and every part of the whole (Summa Theol. I, q. 76, art. 8). We can tell whether a form is substantial or accidental by attending to the effect of the form's existence on the functionality of the parts. A substantial form inheres in the hands of a human being because if the form were removed, that part would cease to function as a hand (Quaestiones de Anima q. 10, pp. 158-59). The carburetor of a car, in contrast, when the form is removed from the car can still be a carburetor. It can be placed in another car and continue functioning as a carburetor.[2] 

In addition to artifacts and natural substances, some medieval philosophers expand the class of continuous integral wholes to cover homogeneous masses, such as some gold or some water, and the class of discrete integral wholes to include scattered mereological sums, such as the sum of this mountain and this dog. Abelard is one of the rare medieval philosophers who insist that any two items can constitute a discrete integral whole (see Dialectica 548.19-22).  This puts Abelard in the company of many modern mereologists—for example, David Lewis (1991, 74; cf. Simons 1987, 108-12 and the subsection on unrestricted fusions in the entry on mereology)—but it sets him apart from most medieval philosophers. As a composite becomes more gerrymandered, the composite's status as an integral whole is sometimes called into question.  For example, Abelard is attacked by some of his twelfth-century contemporaries for admitting that any two items can compose an integral whole (Anonymous Introductiones Montanae maiores, 69rb), and Aquinas insists that the more unified an entity is, the more whole it becomes (In Metaphysica expositio, lectio V, §§ 1102-4; cf. Jean Buridan Summulae de Dialectica 8.1.4). 

In addition to material beings, some medieval philosophers allow non-material items to be integral wholes. For example, thoughts and other mental items can be wholes, and Aquinas insists that actions such as penance are integral wholes (Summa Theologiae III, q. 90, art. 3). Abelard insists that temporal items are not integral wholes, but he seems to be in the minority. Non-material integral wholes do not sit easily under either the continuous or the discrete category, since their parts cannot be related to one another with respect to location. If asked to pick, medieval philosophers tend to label temporal wholes and events as continuous wholes, but they are not continuous in the way that a bronze rod is continuous. Their parts to not share some spatial boundary; they come after one another in continuous succession (Aquinas op cit. q. 90, art. 3, ad 3). For this reason, these wholes are sometimes called successive wholes. 

In short, an astounding variety of items can be integral wholes. Yet, no matter how large this category becomes, most medieval philosophers insist that the class of integral wholes does not exhaust the domain of those items that can be wholes. In particular, there are two types of item that require their own category: universals and souls.

2.2. Universal wholes

Many non-material items are considered to be integral wholes.  But most medieval philosophers mark off one special sort of non-material object, the universal, and treat it as a separate type of whole.

It was noted in Section 1.1 that universals, and especially species and their genera, are related to one another hierarchically. For instance, the species Human Being and the species Horse both fall under the genus Animal. Additionally, individuals are related hierarchically to their species and genera. Hence, Socrates and Cicero fall under the species Human Being and the genus Animal. These relations between universals and individuals are often described in the terms of collection and division. Cicero and Socrates and all other humans are collected into the species Human Being, and the species Human Being and Horse and all other species are collected in the genus Animal.  Correlatively, Animal is divided into its species, and Human Being is divided into individual humans. 

This language of collection and division invites medieval philosophers to call the divisible items wholes, and the products of these divisions parts. Nevertheless, most ancient and medieval philosophers who use mereological language to describe the relations between universals and individuals are not tempted to think that universals are literally composed out of individuals or lesser species.[3]  There are noteworthy exceptions.  For example, an anonymous twelfth-century philosopher carefully articulates and spiritedly defends a version of what is often called the collection (collectio) theory of universals (Pseudo-Joscelin De generibus et speciebus §§ 84-153 = Cousin 1836, 524-41; cf. Arlig 2005, 283-302). But, in general, universal wholes are clearly marked off from other kinds of whole, and their behavior is distinct from the behavior of potential and integral wholes.

There is one significant complication. In his On Division, Boethius distinguishes between genera and wholes (877c-d, see also In Cic. top. 331.18-19). Under his treatment of wholes, he distinguishes between universal wholes, which would include species that have individuals as parts, and other types of whole. The reasons why Boethius distinguishes genera from other universals are not entirely clear, but it appears that he wants to distinguish two kinds of universals: universals that have other universals as parts, and universals that have individuals as parts. In order to make sense of this distinction, it must be noted that for late ancient philosophers “genus” and “species” are relative terms. Animal is a genus in relation to Human Being and Horse, but it is a species of Substance. In other words, the terms “genus” and “species” designate hierarchical relations between two universals. Only some universals are genera and not species (e.g. Substance), and only some universals are species and not genera (e.g. Human Being). These most specialized species (specialissima) can only stand over individuals, not other universals. These specialissima are universal wholes, but they are not the only universal wholes. If “Animal” were the name of that whole consisting of all individual animals, then Animal too could be a proper universal whole. This whole could be a universal whole because, as we will see below (Sections 3.2 and 3.3), wholes will be distinguished by the parts that they have and by the relations that obtain between these parts and their whole.     

2.3. Potential wholes

In addition to integral wholes and universal wholes, Boethius introduces a third basic type of whole to medieval philosophers: the whole consisting of “powers” (potentiae) or “virtues” (virtutes) (On Division 888a). These wholes are often called virtual wholes or potential wholes.

Potential wholes are curious items. They are particulars, not universals. Yet unlike other particular wholes, potential wholes are not composed out of other items, and they are not separable into other items. Potential wholes, then, are in a sense part-less. However, they are divisible in one respect: this non-composite potential whole has different functions or powers that it performs. 

The most common type of potential whole is a human soul. A human soul is not composed out of other items, nor can the soul be cut up into other items. Nevertheless, the soul manifests itself in different ways, and often in different regions of the body. The soul is not fully characterized by any one of its powers. The soul is characterized only by the complete set of its powers.  While this set of powers does not literally compose the soul, they are considered to be parts of the whole soul. The soul would not be complete if it lacked one of these powers. 

The concept of the potential whole is difficult to grasp as it is. Unfortunately, Boethius makes matters worse when he claims that the division of a potential whole into its powers resembles both the division of a genus and the division of a whole:

For in that each and every part of it entails the predicate “soul” it is brought into connection with the division of a genus, each and every species of which necessarily entails the genus itself. On the other hand, in that not every soul is composed of all parts but each one is composed differently, in this it is necessarily brought into connection with the nature of a whole.  (On Division 888c-d; trans. Magee 1998, 41)

Some earlier medieval philosophers take Boethius' statement as an invitation to reduce the soul, and the potential whole in general, to either a genus or an integral whole. (One of the first attempts to place the division of soul under the division of the genus is found in a short letter from a mysterious ninth-century thinker identified only as “Master L”. The letter is preserved in the manuscripts of St. Gall, and is transcribed by De Rijk (1963, 75-78).)  However, the attempt to reduce soul to either a genus or an integral whole appears doomed, for potential wholes do not fit well under either category. Souls are particular, and hence, they cannot be universals of any kind, let alone genera. On the other hand, souls do not have parts in the same way that other true wholes have parts: Socrates can be separated into his hands, feet, and so forth; a chemical mixture can be reduced back into its ingredients. Even a universal whole can be separated into independently existing parts, namely, the individuals that are its parts. But a soul is neither composed out of its powers, nor is it separable into freestanding parts: the powers must be powers of a soul. 

By the middle of the twelfth century, philosophers propose an uneasy compromise. For example, the young Peter Abelard insists that there are actually two definitions of soul: a “superior” one in virtue of which the soul “has an affinity with a universal whole”, and an “inferior” definition in virtue of which soul has an affinity with an integral whole (De divisionibus 194.8-29). 

Many later medieval philosophers also seem to have some trouble understanding the nature of potential wholes. Buridan, for instance, suggests that mixtures—such as that of water and wine—are really potential wholes, because one cannot separate the mixture back into its starting ingredients (Summulae de Dialectica 8.1.5). Every actual portion of the mixture is watery-wine. The wine and the water are only present in the mixture potentially. Buridan, however, seems to be conflating two senses of “potentia”: “potentia” can mean “power”, or it can mean “a potentiality”. This second sense of “potentia” is connected to Aristotle's conception of actuality. (On Aristotle's notions of actuality and potentiality, consult the section on Actuality and Potentiality in the entry on Aristotle's metaphysics.) But the relation of parts to whole that is captured in Buridan's claim that the water and wine are potentially in the mixture is not the same parts-to-whole relation that holds between the capacities of the soul and the soul. The water and wine were at one point separate beings, and even if humans cannot separate wine from water, in principle they could be separated by a sufficiently powerful being (e.g., God). In contrast, the faculty of reason never existed and never can exist separately from the soul. But not all medieval philosophers are perplexed by potential wholes. Aquinas, for example, understands that the potential whole consists of powers, not elements that potentially exist in the whole. He treats potential wholes as a third primitive type of whole which is “intermediate between” the universal and the integral whole (Summa Theologiae I, q. 77, art. 1, ad 1). Aquinas places potential wholes between integral and universal wholes because the parts of potential wholes behave in one manner like the parts of universals and in another manner like the parts of integral wholes. Thus, in order to gain a better understanding of potential wholes, it is necessary to explore the relation of integral parts to integral wholes and the relation of the parts of universals to universal wholes. 

3. Parts

Many kinds of item can be wholes, and many kinds of item can be parts of these wholes. In general, any item that composes a whole is a part, and any item that is a product of a division of some whole is a part of that whole. The only clear restriction on what can be a part is that no part is identical to its whole. In other words, no medieval philosopher countenances what contemporary mereologists call improper parts. (On the contemporary notions of part, or improper part, and proper part consult the entry on contemporary [mereology], and also Simons 1987, 9-11.)

We will first consider the kinds of things that can be parts of integral wholes (Section 3.1). We will then turn to the parts of universals (Section 3.2). As it will turn out, some of the parts of universals can also be parts of integral wholes. This will prompt us to consider several criteria that medieval philosophers use to distinguish universal wholes from integral wholes (Section 3.3). Finally, we will return to consider potential wholes in light of these criteria for distinguishing universals from integral wholes (Section 3.4).

3.1. Parts of integral wholes

Consider the paradigmatic integral whole Socrates. Socrates is composed out of a soul and a body. His body is composed out of flesh, bone, and blood. And the flesh, bone, and blood in turn are ultimately created by combining the four basic elements, Earth, Air, Fire, and Water. All these components of Socrates can be considered integral parts of Socrates. 

Socrates is also divisible into a number of other parts. We can cut Socrates in half, and thereby create the top half of Socrates and the bottom half of Socrates. We can also divide Socrates into his hands, feet, torso, heart, and so forth. All these products of the divisions of Socrates can be considered integral parts of Socrates.

Medieval philosophers separate this plethora of integral parts into a number of distinct categories. The top and bottom halves of Socrates are often called quantitative parts, since they divide Socrates solely with respect to a quantity, or measure. Flesh, bone, and blood, as well as the elements that compose these components are often called quantitative parts as well, for they comprise Socrates' matter, and matter is often associated with quantity.

Not all medieval philosophers think that the elements are parts of Socrates. Abelard, for example, believes that the elements are ingredients, but not every ingredient is a part. Strictly speaking, only those items that compose some whole and remain in that whole after composition are parts of the whole (Dialectica 575.18-36). Hence, even though the flour is an ingredient of the bread, the flour is not a part of the bread. The flour has been altered by a chemical change, and so it does not remain once the bread is baked. Likewise, while the elements combine into a chemical mixture that becomes flesh, the earth and water that make up flesh are no longer present. Only the crumbs and flesh are properly parts of the bread and Socrates respectively.

Aquinas effectively agrees with Abelard on this point, but he articulates his position in terms of Aristotle's distinction between actuality and potentiality (In Metaphysicorum expositio, lectio V, § 1102). The elements that composed my body only exist in actuality when my body has been dissolved back into elemental matter. Aquinas adds that many other quantitative parts of integral wholes only exist potentially in their wholes. For example, this half of a bronze rod does not exist in actuality until the rod is cut in two and thereby ceases to be a continuous whole.

Medieval philosophers also like to draw a distinction between the homogenous and heterogenous parts of Socrates' body.  Heterogeneous parts are such that, if they are themselves divided, their constituents are not of the same type as the original. For example, a hand is composed out of fingers, knuckles, and a palm.  It is also, from another viewpoint, composed out of muscles, skin, and sinews. No part of the hand is a hand. However, some of the hand's parts are homogeneous. Muscle, skin, and blood are each homogeneous, since every bit of muscle is muscle, every bit of blood is itself blood, and every bit of skin is also skin. 

The distinction between heterogeneous and homogenous parts is bequeathed to medieval philosophers by Aristotle and Boethius.  Aristotle imposes a loose hierarchy on these types of parts, claiming that the heterogeneous parts are composed out of homogeneous parts (History of Animals 486a13-14). This in turn suggests that the division of a whole into its parts is best initiated by dividing it into its heterogeneous parts, and only then into its homogeneous parts. Boethius is less explicit, suggesting that there may be many equally acceptable ways to begin to divide up a thing into its parts (On Division 888a-b). 

Many of the heterogeneous parts of Socrates are best defined in terms of their function, not their measure. For example, hands are discriminated from feet based on what functions they perform for an animal. Many medieval philosophers believe that these functions are provided either by the form or the soul of the animal. For this reason, many medieval philosophers call functionally defined parts “formal parts”, or parts secundum formam. The fourteenth-century philosopher Walter Burley tells us that the formal parts “remain the same so long as the whole remains the same and complete” (De toto et parte, 301). In other words, so long as Socrates' soul occupies his body, and provided the hand is not cut off, Socrates' body remains complete and his hand remains a hand. Burley contrasts formal parts with material parts, and he places homogeneous parts such as flesh, bone, and blood under this category. Socrates' material parts are in constant flux; Socrates is constantly losing and replacing bits of flesh and blood.         

In addition to the formal parts, which get their being from the form, Socrates' form (which is usually identified with his soul) and his matter taken en masse can be considered parts of Socrates. But there is some dispute over whether form and matter areintegral parts of Socrates. Some believe that form and matter are integral parts. Aquinas, for example, claims that they are substantial integral parts of the whole (Summa Theol. I, q. 8, a. 2, ad 3; III, q. 90, a. 2). Others insist that forms are not integral parts. Abelard, for example, suggests that many forms supervene upon the material parts (Logica Ingredientibus 1, 79.9-10; cf. King 2004, 76). Such forms are not parts of the thing. The soul can be a part of the composite that is Socrates, but Abelard insists that souls are not forms. Abelard's view is due in part to the lack of Aristotle's works in the twelfth century.[4]

Armed with the full Aristotelian corpus, thirteenth- and fourteenth-century philosophers generally subscribe to Aristotle's dictum that the soul is the form of a living body (De Anima II.1, 412a). But this does not prevent some from separating the substantial parts of a thing—that is, form and matter, and soul and body—and the integral parts of a thing into coordinate species (e.g., Burley De toto et parte, 302). There are a number of reasons for doing this. First, the form does not behave like the other integral parts of the thing, for the form has the unique capacity to be present “as a whole” in each material part of the thing. But additionally, distinguishing between substantial parts and integral parts captures an important intuition about substances: Socrates can lose and gain matter without compromising his existence. But if Socrates were to lose his matter in total or his soul, he would cease to exist. 

This intuition invites some, such as Burley, to draw a further distinction between the thing considered as a material whole (secundum materiam) and the thing considered as a formal whole (secundum formam). Socrates considered as a formal whole—i.e. a unity of this form with some matter—persists through time and change. Socrates considered as a material whole is constantly in flux, since the sum of material parts on Monday is not identical to the sum of material parts on Friday (De toto et parte, 301). The distinction between the formal whole and the material whole will play a role in some medieval theories of persistence, and we will pursue this use of the distinction in short order (see Section 4.2). But, first, we must consider the parts of universals and the special problems that the parts of universals entail.

3.2. Parts of genera and universal wholes

Genera are divisible into their subordinate species, whereas universal wholes are divisible into their subordinate individuals. These subordinate items are said to be “subjective” parts of the universal whole or the genus, since the part is a subject and the whole is predicable of the part.  Socrates is a subjective part of Human Being and a subjective part of Animal, and for this reason Human Being and Animal are predicable of Socrates. That is, Socrates is a human being, and Socrates is an animal. However, to be a true subjective part, not only must the name of the whole be predicable of the part, the definition of the whole also must be predicable of the part. A statue of Socrates could in some contexts be called a human. (For example, when someone points to the statue and says, “That's a man.”, before she points to another statue and says, “And that's a horse.”)  But the statue of Socrates cannot be a subjective part of Human Being, since the statue is not a rational mortal animal. Socrates is a subjective part because he is a human being and a rational mortal animal.  

Genera and universal wholes both consist of subjective parts, but they differ with respect to what items are their subjective parts. This fact might explain why Boethius places universal wholes under the broader class of true wholes. Boethius offers four criteria for distinguishing between genera and true wholes (On Division 879b-d):

(a) The genus is divided by means of a qualitative difference, whereas the whole is divided by means of a quantitative difference.

(b) The genus is naturally prior to its species, whereas the whole is naturally posterior to its parts.

(c) The genus is the matter for its species, whereas the parts are the matter for the whole.

(d) The species is always the same thing as its genus, while the part is sometimes not the same thing as its whole.

Some of these criteria could be interpreted in a manner such that the universal consisting of individuals falls under the category of true wholes. Consider, for example, criterion (a). The genus Animal is divided by considering what sort (qualis) of animal something is. Human Being is a rational animal, Horse is an irrational animal. In contrast, Human Being is not divided with respect to what sort of human being Socrates is. Socrates and Cicero are both rational animals. The difference between Socrates and Cicero is due to the fact that this bit of matter which makes up Socrates is different from that bit of matter which makes up Cicero . A difference in matter is typically considered to be a quantitative difference. Hence, the parts of the universal whole Human Being appear to be distinguished by quantity rather than quality.

However, some of the other criteria do not clearly mark genera off from universal wholes. Consider, for example, the second criterion. Boethius seems to have something like this in mind when he articulates difference (b): the parts of a genus are dependent upon the genus, whereas the whole is dependent upon its parts. In other words, if there are no animals, there can be no dogs or humans. In contrast, the house depends upon its parts. If you take away the roof and floor, the house ceases to exist. But universal wholes seem to behave like genera, not houses. If we annihilate all individual humans, we do not eliminate the universal Human Being. Therefore, difference (b) does not cleanly demarcate genera from universal wholes.

The third and fourth criteria present their own special problems, since it is far from clear how to interpret these differences, let alone whether the universal whole behaves like the genus or the true whole. (On the interpretation of these four criteria, consult Magee 1998, 82-85, and Arlig 2005, 84-113.)

Thus, it is not clear that Boethius's four criteria adequately separate universals that consist of universals from universals that consist of individuals. It may be that the better division is that between universal wholes and integral wholes, not genera and true wholes, and indeed many medieval philosophers seem to take this route.

The reduction of genera and species to one category, the universal whole, is a minor revision compared to the problem to be explored in the next section. It seems that the same items can be both subjective parts of a universal whole and integral parts of an integral whole. This curious fact threatens to collapse the distinction between integral wholes and universal wholes. In other words, all wholes might be reducible to integral wholes.

3.3. Distinguishing universals from integral wholes with respect to their parts

Consider all the human beings on the planet. These individuals taken together are the integral whole composed of all human beings. Granted, this is a very large and diffuse discrete whole. But if we allow crowds and flocks to be integral wholes, there seems to be no principled reason to reject the existence of the sum of all humans. At the same time each of these human beings is a subjective part of the universal Human Being. If wholes are distinguished by the type of parts that they have, it seems that the universal Human Being is the same as the integral whole composed of all human beings.

Peter Abelard reports that there were some medieval philosophers who drew this very conclusion. Abelard describes and attacks this collection theory of universals in his Logica Ingredientibus (1, 13.18-15.22). For fuller presentations and evaluations of Abelard's critique, one should consult Henry (1984, 235-59), Freddosso (1978), Tweedale (1976, 113-15), and Arlig (2005, 272-83). Here I will give only one objection:  Abelard thinks that the collection theory gets the relation of dependence between the universal and the individuals backwards. According to Abelard, the collection theory is committed to the view that when Socrates dies, the universal Human Being is changed, and if one believes, as Abelard does, that a discrete integral whole is identical to the sum of its parts, then the Human Being that has Socrates as a part is not identical to the Human Being without Socrates. There is a new Human Being. But this, Abelard insists, is contrary to the orthodox understanding of universals, which states that while the individuals that fall under a universal are impermanent, the universal itself is permanent.  Indeed, Human Being would exist even if every human being were annihilated.  

The difference between integral wholes and universal wholes cannot be defined in terms of the kinds of items that are parts of the whole. Rather, the difference must be due to the way in which these items are parts of the whole. 

Some medieval philosophers prefer to focus on the fact that every part of a universal whole admits the predication of the name and the definition of the whole. In other words, the universal only consists of subjective parts. Hence, there is this difference between the integral whole that consists of all human beings and the universal Human Being: only whole human beings are parts of Human Being. Socrates and Cicero are parts of Human Being, but Socrates' finger and Cicero's head are not parts of Human Being. Socrates and Cicero are parts of Human Being because Socrates is a human being and Cicero is a human being. The parts of Socrates and Cicero are not parts of Human Being because Socrates' hand is not a human being and Cicero's head is not a human being. In contrast, some parts of the integral whole consisting of all human beings do not meet the criterion for being a subjective part. The integral whole consisting of all human beings contains all human beings plus all the parts of human beings. Socrates, Cicero, Socrates' hand, and Cicero's head are all parts of the integral whole consisting of all human beings.

Oftentimes medieval philosophers illustrate this difference between the universal whole and the integral whole by focusing on precisely how the whole is predicated of its parts (Aquinas Summa Theol. III q. 90, art. 3; Walter Burleigh De toto et parte, 302; and Buridan Summulae 8.1.4). This is due to the fact that the name and definition of the integral whole are, after all, predicable of the integral part, but not in the same way that the universal is predicable of its part. The universal whole's name and definition is predicable of each of its parts taken singularly.  For example, Socrates and Plato are both parts of the universal whole Human Being, and Human Being is predicable of both Socrates and Plato. That is,

Socrates is a human being, and Socrates is a rational, mortal animal.


Plato is a human being, and Plato is a rational, mortal animal.

This is true of every part of Human Being. In contrast, an integral whole is not predicable of its parts taken singularly.  That is, one cannot say that

This piece of wood is a house.

Integral wholes are only predicable of their parts taken all at once.

This wood and this stone and these other parts taken together are a house.

The case of the integral whole consisting of all human beings is only a little trickier. As it turns out, some of the parts of the sum of all human beings will accept the predication of the name of the whole. But if one examines the matter carefully, it turns out that the definition of the sum of all human beings is not the same as the species, for the sum of all human beings is not itself a rational, mortal animal.

As popular as this appeal to subjective parts is, many philosophers understand that by itself, this criterion will not work. This is due to the fact that some integral wholes are composed of homogenous parts. Boethius illustrates the problem with the example of a golden rod, which he believes is a homogenous substance (On Division 879d). Recall that if something is a homogenous substance, then every part of that thing is also the same substance. That is, if y is a homogenous whole and x is a part of y, the name and definition of y is also predicable of x. Every portion of gold can take both the name and the definition of gold, and hence, it seems that every part of the gold rod meets the standard of being a subjective part. Therefore, it seems that the gold rod is a universal, which is clearly absurd. 

Boethius resolves the puzzle of the rod and its parts by noting that while it is true that each portion of gold is gold, it is not true that a portion of the original quantity of gold is that original quantity of gold (Boethius On Division 880a)  Boethius' solution is often repeated (see Abelard De divisionibus 169.33-36, and Radulphus Brito In de Top. II, q. 9, p. 45; cf. Aquinas Summa Theol. I, q. 3, art. 7). The solution points to another difference between integral wholes and universals. As Abelard puts it, every integral whole “draws together” (comprehendere) some quantity (Dialectica, 546.21-27). The suggestion is that when some items compose an integral whole, that whole will be measurable with respect to some quantity or other. The integral whole that is measured by some quantity need not be composed out of material elements. Consider the mereological sum of the angel Gabriel and the angel Michael.  If this sum is a whole (and there seems to be no reason to deny this), it seems it is an integral whole.

However, there are some integral wholes which do not seem to embrace any quantity, namely, thoughts and actions. So there is need to locate yet another difference between universal wholes and integral wholes. 

The last difference that we will consider is this:  Universals, like Human Being or Horse, are not literally composed out of their species. Integral wholes, such as Socrates or a house, are composed out of their parts (John Buridan Summulae de Dialectica 6.4.4; Ockham Expositio in librum Porphyrii 2.16 = Opera Philosophica II, 54). Composites are dependent upon their components. Socrates is composed of his body and his soul. If these components did not exist and combine to form Socrates, Socrates would not exist. Components are often, but not necessarily, temporally prior to the whole that they compose.  For example, the house is composed by bits of wood, stone, and iron, and these parts existed prior to the existence of the house.  Universal wholes are neither dependent upon their parts, nor are the parts of a universal temporally prior to it.  The species existed long before Socrates or Cicero, and will exist long after Socrates and Cicero. Indeed, Human Being can exist, even if no individual human being exists. 

Unlike the appeal to quantity, the composition criterion can be applied to thoughts and actions, for a complex thought requires the simpler concepts that compose it, and penance requires that the actions that constitute penance occur. 

On the other hand, it appears that a universal is also a composite. Every universal except for the most general of genera, can be said to be “composed” out of a genus and a differentia. These parts are sometimes called “essential” parts of the universal since the genus and differentia together constitute the essence of the universal (see Aquinas Summa Theol. I q. 8, art. 2, ad 3; and I q. 76, art. 8).[5]  The essence of a universal is usually encoded in its definition.  For example, the definition of Human Being is rational mortal animal. Animal is the genus, and rationality and mortality are the differentiae

Many medieval philosophers try to dampen this criticism by suggesting that the universal is, strictly speaking, not composite; it merely mimics composition. Perhaps this is a viable response, but there is another problem with the composition requirement: it does not tell us why all the parts of integral wholes are integral parts.  It was already observed in passing that not all parts of an integral whole are plausibly components of their wholes. Consider Socrates. The elements are strictly what compose Socrates.  It is only when Socrates is composed that other parts, such as his hands and feet, come into existence. Or put another way, it is false to say that one makes a human being by cobbling together hands, feet, and head. Such a creature would be Frankenstein's monster, not a human being.

In sum, a number of proposals are offered for how one can distinguish universal wholes from integral wholes. But perhaps no single proposal is universally embraced because of the bewildering variety of items that are integral wholes. An obvious solution would be to reduce the number of items that can be integral wholes or integral parts, and as we have seen already, some philosophers in fact do this. 

3.4. Parts of potential wholes

Potential wholes add further complications. Like genera, and unlike integral wholes, potential wholes are not literally composed out of their parts. Potential wholes are items that are fundamentally simple. But, in other respect, the parts of the potential whole behave like parts of an integral whole. Specifically, the potential whole is not predicable of the potential part taken singularly.   

Aquinas separates potential wholes from both universals and integral wholes by considering two parameters: the presence of the whole in the part with respect to the whole's essence, and the presence of the whole in the part with respect to the whole's power (Summa Theol. I, q. 77, art. 1, ad 1). The universal whole “is present to each of its parts in its entire essence and power”.  It is for this reason that each part of the universal is a subjective part. In contrast, the integral whole is not in each of its parts either in respect to its entire essence or in respect to its power. Hence, the integral whole is not predicable of any one of its parts taken singularly. Finally, the potential whole is present to each of its parts with respect to its entire essence, but not with respect to its full power. This is why, even though one's soul is non-composite and cannot be cut up, one does not think with one's hands.

4. Mereology and metaphysics

Medieval philosophers are well aware that the study of wholes and their parts has numerous applications in metaphysics. I will conclude this study by examining two applications. First, I will look at how theorizing about parts and wholes informs medieval reflections on identity. Second, I will consider how mereology influences medieval theories of persistence, or survival through change.

4.1. Identity

Medieval philosophers think that no part is identical to its whole. The reasons why this is true are as varied as the types of parts and wholes themselves. If x is a quantitative part of y, then x is lesser in quantity than y. Brownie's form is not identical to Brownie, because Brownie is a composite of Brownie's form and Brownie's matter.  Socrates' soul is not identical to the human being who is Socrates, for the human being is a composite of body and soul. Socrates is not a universal, even though he is a human being. And the extension of Animal is greater than the extension of Human Being.

However, there is another question that does divide medieval philosophers. Consider integral wholes. An integral whole is composed out of its parts. But is it true that an integral whole is identical to the sum of these parts?  Some philosophers argue for the claim that the whole is identical to its parts.  Others argue that the whole is something over and above its parts (see, e.g., Ockham Summa Logicae I, ch. 54 = Opera Philosophica I, 178). To frame the problem more concretely, some philosophers argue that the house is identical to the walls, foundation, and roof taken altogether. Others argue that the house is not identical to these parts, even when taken together.  The former philosophers perhaps base their position on passages from Boethius' treatment of mereology, for Boethius claims,

Every thing is the same as the whole. For example, Rome is the same as that which is the whole citizenry. Each and every thing is also the same as all its parts when they are gathered together into a unity. For example, a man is the same as the head, throat, belly, feet, and the rest of the parts gathered together and conjoined into a unity. (In Cic. top. 285.24-28) 

Those who claim that the whole is not identical to its parts often appeal to Aristotle. For example, an anonymous commentator on Aristotle's Sophistical Refutations argues that “the five are not the two and the three” on the grounds that Aristotle has shown in his Metaphysics that “the composite, in general, is something other than its component parts” (Quaestiones super Sophisticos Elenchos q. 831, p. 346, cf. Aristotle Metaphysics H.6, 1045a9-10). 

One of the most sophisticated solutions to this dilemma is developed by Peter Abelard. Abelard claims that our notion of sameness and difference must be refined. Abelard distinguishes between sameness in being (essentia), numerical sameness, and sameness in property. (For detailed examinations of Abelard's theory of sameness and difference, see Brower 2004, 226-34, and Arlig 2005, 165-194.)  An x is the same in being as y if and only every part of x is a part of y and every part of y is a part of x. In other words, x is the same in being as y if and only if x and y mereologically coincide. If x is the same in being as y, then x is numerically the same as y. However, just because x is not the same in being as y, it does not follow that x is numerically distinct from y. This is because x and y could overlap—that is, share at least one part—even if they do not coincide. 

Abelard's analysis of numerical sameness and sameness in being is the key to his resolution of the puzzle whether a whole is identical to its parts, for while x and y may be numerically the same, it does not follow that they are the same in property. For example, a house and the part that compose it are the same in being and in number, but they are distinct in property. Abelard insists the appropriate arrangement of the parts is a necessary condition for the existence of a structured, composite object (Logica Ingredientibus II, 171.14-17; Dialectica 550.36-551.4). A house is not identical to the sum of the boards, bricks, and so forth that constitute the house. The parts could be sitting together on the building site without being arranged as a house, and a pile of house-parts does not yet possess the state of being a house. Whatever its status, the structure imposed upon the house-parts is itself not a part. Indeed, Abelard will insist that most of these structures (i.e. forms) are ontologically dependent upon the parts for their existence. Essentially, what Abelard is indicating is that certain things are true of, or can be predicated of the thing, which are not true of its matter, and vice versa. Nevertheless, this fact does not entail that the matter and the thing are numerically distinct entities. The claim that the whole is some thing over and above its parts is, in Abelard's view, too unrefined to capture the complex relationships that obtain between a thing and its parts.

Abelard's solution is made possible by his sophisticated understanding of mereological overlap (see the section on Basic Principles/Other Mereological Concepts, in the entry on mereology). His appreciation of mereological overlap in and of itself is a watershed. He is one of the first medieval philosophers to clearly understand this phenomenon.[6]  Abelard's appreciation of overlap allows him to provide an elegant solution to a common medieval puzzle, which we may call the Problem of the Many Men. Versions of this problem can be found in a number of medieval works. (See, for example, Abelard Theologia Christiana III, § 153, p. 252; Pseudo-Joscelin De generibus §§ 22-25 (= Cousin 1836, 511-13), and Albert of Saxony Quaes. in Arist. Physicam I qq. 7-8, and Sophismata 46, 25va-vb.)  The puzzle can easily be generated using a crude understanding of numerical sameness.  Assume that Socrates' body is perfectly intact: he has all his limbs, and their parts. Now consider every part of Socrates' body except one finger. Call this whole W. W is not numerically the same as Socrates, so it appears that they must be numerically distinct. Socrates' whole body is imbued with the soul of a man. But it also happens that W is imbued with the soul of a man. So, there are now two numerically distinct men where it initially appeared there was one. But it gets worse. Considering the body apart from one finger was only one of an indefinite number of such considerations. And by the same reasoning, these other bracketed wholes composed from Socrates' body are also men. Hence, it is easy to generate an indefinite number of numerically distinct men where commonsense tells us that there is only one. Abelard can easily unravel this puzzle by employing his distinction between difference in being and numerical difference.  True, there are many overlapping men, each of which is different in being from the others. But this does not entail that there are an indefinite number of numerically different men.

Abelard's solution to the Problem of the Many Men is not the only one employed by medieval philosophers. Albert of Saxony, for example, resolves the puzzle by claiming that nothing which is a part of something else can be a numerically distinct existing being (Quaes. in Arist. Physicam I q. 8, 131-32; Sophismata 46, 25vb). Socrates' body less the finger is not a distinct thing, let alone a man, since it is a part of Socrates.  Therefore, there are not many distinct men present in Socrates.  Note that Albert does not explicitly make use of the phenomenon of overlap, and curiously, many medieval philosophers ignore this potentially useful mereological principle.

4.2. Persistence

Medieval philosophers also worry about the identity of objects over time and through change. Medieval examinations of identity over time, or persistence, are often occasioned by reflection on the maximal proposition associated with the Topic from the integral whole, which states:

If the whole is, the part is.

When this maximal proposition is taken “destructively”, it states that

If the part is not, the whole is not.

But this seems to imply that if Socrates' hand does not exist, Socrates does not exist.

There is an innocent interpretation of this Topical maxim.  Recall that “the whole x” can mean “all the parts of x taken together”. Accordingly, the destructive reading of the maximal proposition could mean, if x does not exist, then the whole consisting of x and some other parts does not exist. Radulphus Brito seems to have this interpretation in mind when he claims that in the case of heterogeneous wholes, if even one part is destroyed, the “form of the whole” cannot last (Commentary II q. 9, p. 45).  Radulphus seems to mean that if I cut off Socrates' finger, the whole that consists of Socrates' finger and all the other parts is compromised. That is, Socrates has been mutilated, and his shape has been altered. 

But some medieval philosophers are tempted to read the destructive formulation of the maximal proposition in a more controversial manner, so that if Socrates loses a finger, Socrates is destroyed. Put another way, the maximal proposition could be interpreted to say,

If y exists and x is ever a part of y, then x must be a part of y whenever y exists.

One reason a medieval philosopher might be tempted to interpret the maximal proposition more radically is that, according to Boethius, integral wholes are dependent upon their parts. Recall that Boethius insists that the genus is prior to its species, but the parts are prior to their whole (see Section 3.2).  Boethius notes that he is not talking about temporal priority, but rather “natural” priority (On Division 879b).  It is not entirely clear what Boethius means by natural priority (see Magee 1998, 83-4), but he could easily be interpreted to mean that integral wholes are existentially dependent upon their parts. The species cannot exist unless its genus exists. In contrast, the whole cannot exist without its parts. Boethius' claim about the natural priority of parts to wholes has some measure of plausibility if one focuses on those parts that compose the whole. The composing parts had to be present in order to make up the whole. For example, wood, cement, and nails are the composing parts of a house. If there were no nails, wood, or cement, there would be no house. In other words, these composing parts are necessary conditions for the existence of the house, and hence, if the house exists, its composing parts must exist. 

Still, commonsense tells us that the composing parts need not remain present after the house has been composed. Some boards and some nails may be replaced in the house, but this does not compromise the existence of this house. So why would a medieval philosopher take the destructive formulation of the maximal proposition to imply that if Socrates loses a finger, Socrates ceases to exist?

To answer this question, consider Peter Abelard, who does interpret the maximal proposition in the extreme manner. Abelard's extreme interpretation of the maximal proposition is derived from his judgment that each whole is identical to a unique set of parts. This house must be composed out of these nails, these boards, and this cement. If I use other nails or other boards, I could make a house, but not this very house. This premise is no doubt controversial, but Abelard has principled reasons for holding it.  Abelard believes that the ultimate pieces of the universe are tiny, indivisible bits of matter, souls, and perhaps some forms. The items that we experience are composites of these elements. Each element is self-identical. Composite beings are individuated by the elements that make them up, and in the case of complex, composite beings—such as artifacts and substances—by the arrangement that these bits have. Given such a universe, it is quite plausible to assume that the identity of a composite item is solely determined by its parts. It would then easily follow that the removal or addition of a composing element entails that the new whole is not identical to the old whole. Another whole similar to the original might exist after the mereological change take place, but strictly speaking the two wholes are not identical. 

Most medieval philosophers are not as extreme as Abelard. They think it is absurd to claim that the whole is dependent upon the existence of each and every part. If we were to amputate Socrates' right hand, Socrates would not cease to exist. He would merely lack a hand. Still, there are some parts that would, upon removal, bring about the annihilation of Socrates. Remove, say, Socrates' heart or brain, and Socrates will be destroyed. Several twelfth-century philosophers codified this distinction into a theory of principal versus secondary parts (Pseudo-Joscelin §§ 6-10 = Cousin 1836: 507-8; anonymous author of the Introductiones maiores Montane 71va-72rb):

x is a principal part of y if and only if the removal of x entails the destruction of y.

x is a secondary part of y if and only if x is a part of y but not a principal part of y.

Examples of principal parts would be the ham of a ham sandwich, the heart of a cat, and the brain of Socrates. Examples of secondary parts are a crumb of the sandwich, a strand of hair belonging to the cat, and a fingernail of Socrates.

This understanding of principal parts is retained in later medieval treatments of logic and metaphysics. In particular, the distinction between principal parts and secondary parts is often recalled precisely when philosophers consider the veracity and generality of the destructive application of the maximal proposition associated with the Topic from the integral part. They insist that the destructive application only holds true in the case of principal parts; it does not hold for secondary parts (see, e.g., Buridan Summulae de Dialectica 6.4.4). 

What often underwrites this distinction between principal and secondary parts is a metaphysical commitment to forms that are not dependent upon their matter. Thus, it would not be surprising to learn that later medieval philosophers, who are now armed with Aristotle's robust notion of form, find persistence far from troubling. If a form is independent of its matter, it can be the metaphysical glue that holds an object together as it changes material components. For example, we have already seen that Burley draws a distinction between the whole secundum formam and the material whole (section 3.1). The formal whole persists so long as the form persists. The material whole is the only whole compromised by changes in material parts (De toto et parte, 301).  Most commonsense objects are identified with a whole with respect to form. Hence, Socrates and Brownie are not substantially compromised by material changes. 

But, interestingly, not all later medieval philosophers provide such a pat answer to the problem of persistence. For example, Buridan and his follower Albert of Saxony develop a theory that has some resemblances to Abelard's (Buridan Quaestiones in Physicam I, q. 10; Albert of Saxony Quaestiones in Aristotelis Physicam I q. 8).[7]  There are three senses of numerical sameness: there is a proper sense, a less proper sense, and an improper sense. Something is properly the same in number if all its parts remain the same and it neither acquires nor loses any parts. In this strictest of senses, no corruptible thing whatsoever persists through mereological change. Something is less properly the same in number if its “most principal part” remains numerically the same. This is the sense that allows us to claim that Socrates is numerically the same man now as that man ten years ago. In particular, Albert informs us, it is Socrates' intellective soul which is the principal part and guarantor of persistence through change. Finally, something is improperly the same in number if there is a continuous succession of beings that maintain a similar shape, disposition, and form. This improper mode of numerical sameness allows us to claim that the Nile River here today is numerically the same river as the Nile back in Herodotus' time.  In addition to rivers, Albert warns that plants and animals can only be numerically the same in this improper sense, for these creatures do not have the sort of soul that can act as a guarantor of less proper identity. Rather, over the span of its lifetime, neither the matter nor the form of Albert's horse remains numerically the same (Albert op cit., p. 131).

In view of this last claim, Buridan's and Albert's account is in conflict with orthodox Aristotelian doctrine, for they are committed to the view that the addition or subtraction of parts can bring about substantial change. In contrast to a more orthodox Aristotelian (such as Burley), who thinks that the same horse persists through changes, Albert and Buridan claim that strictly speaking we do not have one horse, but rather a succession of horses loosely unified by three facts: these successive beings have some of the same parts, this line of succession is continuous, and each member in the line of succession is a horse. Albert, in particular, denies that his analysis entails that every mereological change entails substantial change, but he does so by reinterpreting substantial change. Substantial change occurs only in those cases where the specific substantial name is changed (op cit., p. 128). So long as one can apply the name and definition of “horse” to the whole in question, no substantial change has occurred.

5. Concluding remarks

Medieval philosophers study a variety of wholes and parts, and they often do so with a remarkable degree of sophistication. To be sure, some aspects of medieval mereology are idiosyncratic, but many of the puzzles that medieval philosophers wrestle with are recognizably perennial. Medieval philosophers are particularly attuned to the relationship between mereology and other branches of metaphysics, and many of their solutions to puzzles of identity and survival are embraced by philosophers in other periods. Even the idiosyncratic aspects of medieval mereology belie a sophisticated appreciation of three fundamental questions in mereology, namely, what items are wholes, what items are parts, and under what conditions is one item a part of another item. This study can only hint at the richness of medieval mereology. In part, this is due to the sheer number of medieval authors who engage in mereological investigations. But it is also due to the fact that there is still more research to be done. Based on what we have already discovered, this author is confident that we will find many more interesting reflections on parts and wholes as more texts are unearthed, properly edited, and studied with care.


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Abelard [Abailard], Peter | Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Boethius, Anicius Manlius Severinus | Buridan, John [Jean] | Burley [Burleigh], Walter | identity | identity: over time | medieval philosophy | mereology