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Singular Propositions

First published Sat Jul 19, 1997; substantive revision Tue Dec 11, 2007

Singular propositions (also called ‘Russellian propositions’) are propositions that are about a particular individual in virtue of having that individual as a direct constituent. (This characterization assumes a structured view of propositions — see propositions: structured — which we shall assume throughout this essay.) Alleged examples of singular propositions are the propositions that Mont Blanc is more than 4,000 meters high, that Socrates was wise, and that she [pointing to someone] lives in New York. Singular propositions are to be contrasted with general propositions and particularized propositions. The former are propositions that are not about any particular item and the latter are propositions that are about particulars or individuals but do not contain those individuals as constituents. Examples of the former are the propositions that most Americans favor a tax cut and that some music is great; examples of the latter are the propositions that the inventor of bifocals was bald and that the tallest spy is a man. A singular proposition is directly about an object whereas a particularized proposition is indirectly about an object in virtue of that object satisfying the condition that is a constituent of the proposition — in our cases, the conditions being a unique inventor of bifocals and being a tallest spy.

The acceptance or rejection of singular propositions lies at the center of many issues in semantics, the philosophy of language and mind, and metaphysics. In this essay, we shall look at some of the arguments for singular propositions, discuss problems their existence gives rise to, and show how singular propositions are related to certain questions in metaphysics.

1. Fregeanism and Russellianism

Assuming a propositionalist semantics — according to which sentences (in context) are assigned propositions as contents which are the primary bearers of truth values and the objects of the propositional attitudes like believing, hoping, and saying — there are, roughly speaking, two kinds of theories in the philosophy of language and many versions of these theories. (We shall assume propositionalism without argument. We make this assumption knowing that many philosophers have serious doubts about the existence of propositions. However, our current purpose is to ask whether there are any positive reasons that can be given in favor of singular propositions even granting that there are propositions.) There are the Fregean theories that employ some version of Frege's distinction between sense and reference and the Russellian theories that eschew this distinction. If Fregeanism is true, all thought about concrete individuals is indirect, mediated by senses that are independent of those individuals. (Some maintain that Frege recognized only de re senses — senses whose existence and identity is dependent upon their reference — as the senses of proper names, in which case he would not have subscribed to a Fregean theory, as characterized above. The

Supplement: Evans on Frege

has a short further discussion.) The easiest way to get a grip on this is to think of senses as purely qualitative satisfaction conditions. Such a condition determines an object in virtue of the qualities it instantiates. According to Russellianism, on the other hand, we can think about an individual directly; we can have a thought about an individual by having that individual as an immediate constituent of the thought. Thus for Frege objects are not constituents of propositions. Propositions are composed of senses, but not the objects themselves, and the senses are individuated independently of any individual. If Fregeanism is true, then there are no singular propositions. If Russellianism is true, on the other hand, then singular propositions play a crucial role in the semantics of natural languages and a complete theory of the mind and its thoughts.

Before discussing the reasons for and against singular propositions directly, we shall discuss the theories of Frege and Russell. The hope is that such a discussion will provide a context for the more specific issues concerning the existence of singular propositions.

Gottlob Frege famously distinguished between an expression's reference and its sense. (The classic source is (Frege 1892/1948). The distinction was first introduced a year earlier in (Frege 1891). It is commonly thought, and Frege asserts as much, that the sense-reference distinction was not present in (Frege 1879/1967). But this early work does contain a seeming anticipation of the distinction, as well as the same argument from the opening paragraphs of (1892/1948) against the metalinguistic solution promoted in (1879/1967), which is extremely puzzling.) We shall focus on proper names like ‘Socrates’. (Frege maintained that the sense-reference distinction applied to all classes of expressions, including sentences. The reference of a sentence is a truth value and its sense a thought.) The reference of the name ‘Mark Twain’ is the man Mark Twain himself, while its sense is a mode of presentation or way of thinking of that object.

Frege argued for the distinctness of sense from reference as follows. Suppose, for reductio, that the sole semantic value of the name ‘Mark Twain’ were its reference. Then, as the name ‘Samuel Clemens’ is coreferential, the two names would be identical in their semantic values. But then, given a plausible assumption of compositionality, the sentences ‘Mark Twain was a famous American author’ and ‘Samuel Clemens was a famous American author’ would also be semantically identical. But this is counterintuitive. It seems that fully competent speakers can believe what the one expresses without believing what the other expresses. (Imagine someone who has had an American literature class, having read Huck Finn and Tom Sawyer, in which biographical facts were withheld. Our agent will then accept the one sentence and reject the other.) If this is so, then the two sentences express different propositions. And if they express different propositions, there must be some semantically relevant difference between the names ‘Mark Twain’ and ‘Samuel Clemens’. As their references do not differ, sense is distinct from reference.

An expression's sense is intended to capture its cognitive value. The above argument is intended to show that different coreferential proper names can present the same object in different ways and it can be a cognitive achievement to come to learn that the object presented in these different ways is one and the same. Reference alone, Frege persuasively argued, cannot capture cognitive value. Capturing the cognitive significance of an expression is a primary role senses played in Frege's system. But they also played several other roles as well: They were the primary bearers of truth values, the indirect references of sentences and hence the objects denoted by that clauses like ‘that Frege denied the existence of singular propositions’, and the objects of propositional attitudes, most importantly. These roles give rise to the following theses concerning the individuation of senses.

If two sentences have different truth values, then they have different senses.

If two sentences are such that it is possible for a competent speaker to reflectively and sincerely accept the one and not the other, then they have different senses.

For any pair of sentences, s1 and s2, and propositional attitude verb Vs, if it is consistent for a Vs that s1 to be true and a Vs that s2 to be false, then s1 and s2 have different senses.

Implicit in Frege's case for the sense-reference distinction is a strong case that singular propositions are not the semantic contents of natural language sentences and are not the objects of the propositional attitudes. Singular propositions are too coarse-grained to account for what a competent speaker understands in virtue of grasping the meaning of a sentence. But the content of a sentence is, intuitively, what an agent grasps when she understands a sentence and what she believes when she accepts it. Frege concluded that singular propositions are ill-suited for the purposes of semantics and psychology. (For further discussion, see the entry Frege.)

Bertrand Russell's philosophies of language and thought are importantly different from Frege's. (Russell held many distinct views. We focus here on the Russell roughly from 1905 through 1912.) First, Russell held what we can call an acquaintance-based theory, according to which some thought about individuals is direct, in the sense of involving singular propositions involving those very individuals. Second, whereas Frege introduced senses to help solve the puzzles discussed above, Russell employed logical analysis and his theory of definite descriptions. We take each point in turn.

Russell maintained that an agent must be acquainted with every constituent of a thought that she is in a position to entertain. Call this the Acquaintance Principle. (The principle makes an appearance in (Russell 1905), but the view behind the principle is worked out in (Russell 1910; 1912).) Russell thought that we are acquainted only with our occurrent sense data and universals (and he sometimes included the self, when he wasn't feeling skeptical of awareness of the self as an entity). So, Russell maintained that the only singular propositions we can grasp are ones with these items as constituents.

We can trace the fundamental source of Russell's restrictivism about acquaintance to the claim that one is acquainted only with that for which misidentification is rationally impossible. If it is possible for one to be presented with o twice over and rationally not realize it as the same object, then one is not acquainted with o; one's thoughts about o are, in that case, indirect. This line of reasoning relies on the Fregean claim that identity confusions are to be explained in terms of differences in thought constituents. Our English student's confusion regarding Mark Twain is thus to be explained in terms of different thoughts and hence different thought constituents corresponding to the different ways of thinking about the man Mark Twain associated with the expressions ‘Mark Twain’ and ‘Samuel Clemens’.

Neo-Russellians are less restrictive about the objects of acquaintance, including extra-mental particulars in this class. David Kaplan's pioneering work (Kaplan 1977/1989) is typically the starting point, although Russell himself started out with such a position, maintaining, for example, that Mount Blanc itself is a constituent of the thought that Mount Blanc has snowfields. Neo-Russellians must deny the Fregean claim that whenever misidentification is rationally possible, there is a difference in thought constituents. They might still agree with Fregean intuitions about the truth and falsity of propositional attitude ascribing sentences — agreeing, for example, that ‘Peter believes that Mark Twain was a famous American author’ is true while ‘Peter believes that Samuel Clemens was a famous American author’ is false — but insist that this does not require a difference at the level of thought constituents, following, for example, Mark Crimmins and John Perry (Crimmins and Perry 1989) or Mark Richard (Richard 1990). Such neo-Russellians claim that the truth or falsity of a belief attitude ascribing sentence involves more than just the agent of the report having among her beliefs the proposition expressed by the sentence embedded in the reporting sentence. Alternatively, the neo-Russellian might also deny the Fregean intuitions about the truth and falsity of propositional attitude ascribing sentences, following, for example, Nathan Salmon (Salmon 1986) in accounting for those intuitions in nonsemantic terms. Either way, however, given that misidentification of extra-mental particulars is obviously possible, the permissive theory of acquaintance requires denying what we above called the Fregean attitude towards misidentification; not all cases of misidentification involve differences in thought constituents.

We have seen how Russell's adherence to the Acquaintance Principle together with his adoption of a Fregean attitude towards misidentification led him to deny that we can think directly about extra-mental particulars. Russell admitted that there is an extra-mental reality filled with extra-mental particulars that we can and do think about. Like Frege, all such thought, Russell insisted, is indirect. But Russell did not follow Frege in introducing senses as the mediators between individuals in the world and our thought about them. Rather, Russell appealed to logical analysis through his theory of descriptions. For Russell, all thought about extra-mental particulars is descriptive. By (Russell 1910), the canonical form such thought took is something like the following: The thing that caused THIS [demonstratively referring to one's occurrent sense datum] is such-and-such. We can work up to this by seeing how Russell contrasts three thoughts about Bismarck to the effect that he unified Germany (1910, 114-17). First, assuming acquaintance with the self, there is Bismarck's thought about himself. This thought is singular with respect to Bismarck. The proposition involved in this thought is the singular proposition that Bismarck unified Germany. “But if a person who knew Bismarck made a judgment about him, the case is different. What this person was acquainted with were certain sense data which he connected (rightly, we will suppose) with Bismarck's body” (114). No human but Bismarck can grasp this singular proposition. Consider, then, someone — say, Wilhelm II — who has perceived Bismarck. On Russell's view, Wilhelm's thought can be represented as follows, where BOB is the sense datum Wilhelm has in virtue of his perception of Bismarck.

<[the x: x has a body that is the cause of BOB] x unified Germany>

This proposition is particularized with respect to the external object Bismarck, but direct and thus singular with respect to the occurrent sense datum being demonstratively referred to. Finally, contrast this judgment with someone who has never perceived Bismarck but has only heard about him indirectly. Such agents cannot relate Bismarck directly to their sense data because, unlike Wilhelm, none of their sense data are caused by Bismarck's body. Hence, they must either think of him purely qualitatively — as, say, the first Chancellor of the German Empire, treating the German Empire as if it were a purely qualitative condition — or more indirectly, as the person written about in the books causing these sense data, thought standing in front of the books that are the source of the agents' thoughts about Bismarck.

For Russell, sense data are the direct objects of thought in terms of which we think about extra-mental reality under descriptions relating, typically causally, those bits of reality to the directly referred to sense data. (It is worth noting that the basic idea does not require Russell's theory of perception. For example, John Searle has a similar view according to which we think immediately about experiences, which are not analyzed in terms of the mind's being presented with sense data. We then think of extra-mental objects as the causes of such and such occurrent experiences. See (Searle 1983).) For Russell, while there are thoughts about particulars that are wholly qualitative and wholly general, the paradigm form our thought about external reality takes is ultimately grounded in acquaintance, albeit acquaintance with sense data as opposed to extra-mental reality itself. This is in stark contrast to the canonical form such thought takes in Frege's system, in which there is no direct reference to any individuals, including sense data, and all thought is entirely indirect. (For further discussion, see the entries Bertrand Russell, knowledge by acquaintance vs. description, and descriptions.)

Russell rejected Frege's senses and attempted to solve the problems that they were introduced to solve by logical analysis and scope distinctions. The result was that propositions expressed by sentences such as ‘The inventor of bifocals was bald’ did not have senses as constituents. However, they did not have objects as constituents either. Roughly speaking, Russell had propositional functions — functions from objects to propositions — in place of senses. Yet at the bottom level such a view seems to require singular propositions. These are the basic or atomic propositions upon which the complex propositions are built. Frege's atomic propositions are composed of senses while Russell's require individuals.

David Kaplan (Kaplan 1975a) has argued that the essential difference between Frege's and Russell's theories of language and thought is nothing more nor less than the acceptance of singular propositions. If we were to add singular propositions to Frege's theory then with some modifications we could reduce Frege's view to Russell's view. Hence, if Kaplan is correct and there are singular propositions as well, then we need not introduce the complexities of a Fregean theory of sense and we can focus our semantical attention on the simpler Russellian theories. There are propositionalist views that are neither wholly Fregean nor Russellian in their acceptance of singular propositions. For example, the views of Evans and the many neo-Fregeans that have followed him to varying degrees do not fit into either camp, as they admit a sense-reference distinction, denying that the content of the thought that Bismarck unified Germany, for example, is void of any modes of presentation of Bismarck, and yet do not think of senses as object-independent, wholly qualitative conditions.

2. Reasons for Singular Propositions: The modal argument

The first argument in favor of singular propositions we shall examine is based on Saul Kripke's modal argument (Kripke 1970/1980). Kripke presented the argument as an argument that proper names like ‘Nixon’ are not synonymous with ordinary definite descriptions like ‘the first US president from California’, rather than an argument for singular propositions, the existence of which he never endorsed in print. David Kaplan (Kaplan 1977/1989, 512-13), however, used the argument to conclude that demonstratives are directly referential expressions and hence are used to express singular propositions. The argument can be presented as follows.

Suppose that David is standing at a table with two men; Charles on his left and Paul on his right. Paul lives in New Jersey and Charles lives in Illinois. David points to the person on his right and utters sentence (1) below at time t.

(1) He lives in New Jersey.

David has expressed a proposition that we can label p that is about Paul. Suppose p weren't a singular proposition. Then p does not have Paul as a constituent, but is about Paul in another way. We then need to find some descriptive proposition with which to identify p. Consider the propositions expressed by the following sentences.

(2) The person on David's right (at t) lives in New Jersey.
(3) The person David demonstrated at t lives in New Jersey.

Both of these propositions are about Paul indirectly, in virtue of the (contingent) properties he has (namely, being to David's right at t and being demonstrated at t by David, respectively). Now consider a counterfactual circumstance in which Paul and Charles have switched places but in which everything else about them remained the same, consistent with this switch, and in particular, in which Paul still lived in New Jersey and Charles in Illinois. In such a case, intuitively, p would be true while the propositions expressed by (2) and (3) would be false, in which case the former is distinct from either of the latter.

It is important to be clear that we are asking what the truth value of the proposition expressed by David's utterance of (1) (i.e., p) and the propositions expressed by (2) and (3) would be in the described counterfactual circumstance. We are not asking what proposition David would have expressed by uttering (1) in the counterfactual circumstance. It is true that different propositions would have been expressed by (1) in different circumstances of utterance or different contexts. Paul can utter (1) pointing to Charles or Charles can utter (1) pointing to David. In these different contexts different propositions will be expressed, which may well have different truth values. Our claim is that the proposition expressed by David's actual utterance of (1) has, in the described counterfactual circumstance, a different truth value than the propositions expressed by (2) and (3).

Since p differs in truth value in the described counterfactual circumstance from the propositions expressed by (2) and (3), it follows that p is distinct from the propositions expressed by (2) and (3). This is because it is an axiom of propositional theory that if p = p*, then p and p* have the same truth value in all counterfactual circumstances, as propositions are the objects that are true or false in counterfactual circumstances and so one and the same proposition cannot both be true and not true in a given counterfactual circumstance. These considerations suggest that the proposition expressed by David's utterance of (1) is about Paul directly and hence that p is a singular proposition. This is because any proposition that is about Paul indirectly, in virtue of qualities that he contingently instantiates, will give rise to a similar argument.

We shall consider two responses to the modal argument. The first involves a denial of the above axiom of propositionalism. Michael Dummett (1991) and Jason Stanley (1997a/b; 2002) have developed this response by denying that propositions are the bearers of modal properties. Dummett distinguishes senses from what he calls ingredient senses. Senses give the contents of expressions, are the bearers of truth and falsity, and are the objects of the attitudes. Ingredient senses, on the other hand, are the bearers of modal properties like being necessarily or contingently true or false and being true or false at a world. Because propositions are not the bearers of modal properties, Dummett and Stanley can accept that (1) is true with respect to our counterfactual situation while (2) and (3) are false even though the proposition expressed by (1) is the same as the proposition expressed by either (2) or (3). (It may be possible to get the same results without denying that propositions are the bearers of modal properties by offering a nonstandard semantics of modal adverbs like ‘necessarily’ and ‘contingently’ according to which they ascribe properties — the property of being true in every/some world, say — to propositions but are sensitive to more than just the proposition they operate on. One model for this is the way ‘so-called’ functions in a sentence like ‘Superman is so-called for his super powers’. To our knowledge such a theory has yet to be worked out in detail, but we have no doubt that it could be.)

The second response involves finding a property Paul essentially has, where an individual has a property essentially just in case, necessarily, if that object exists, then it has that property) and that, necessarily, only Paul has. (Following (Plantinga 1974), call such a property an individual essence of Paul.) The property being on David's right is not an individual essence of Paul, as Paul might have existed without having had it and Charles might have had it instead. But it is easy to turn such contingent properties into necessary ones by rigidifiying them. (See (Plantinga 1978).) Paul essentially has the property of actually being on David's right. For any world w, Paul has that rigidified property in w just in case in the actual world Paul has the (contingent) property of being on David's right. And, if Paul is the only person to have that property in the actual world, then the rigidified property is not only an essential property of Paul but also an individual essence of Paul. Such a property “tracks” Paul across every possible world. Consider then the propositions expressed by (4) and (5).

(4) The person actually on David's right (at t) lives in New Jersey.
(5) The person actually David demonstrated at t lives in New Jersey.

As far as the modal argument goes, these propositions can be identified with p, as, for every world w, they have exactly the same truth value in w as p intuitively does.

We do not claim that either response is ultimately satisfying. Indeed, we are satisfied by neither. But their presence does show that the modal argument fails to bring out the essential problems with descriptivism and the fundamental need for singular propositions. The following two arguments for singular propositions do a better job on this front.

3. Reasons for Singular Propositions: The argument from indexicals and demonstratives

David Kaplan (Kaplan 1977/1989) and John Perry (Perry 1977; 1979; 1980a/b; 2001) argue that an adequate theory of indexicality requires singular propositions. An indexical is an expression whose content is not fixed by linguistic meaning alone but requires extra-linguistic contextual supplementation. Take, for example, the sentence ‘I am happy’, considered in isolation from any particular utterance or specifications of who is uttering it at what time. The question of whether or not it is true is hardly sensible. That question makes sense only when we either consider an utterance of the sentence or provide the specification of at least an agent as speaker. (We are here refusing to decide the issue whether it is utterances of sentences that are the primary bearers of semantic values or sentences in context. For present purposes, the choice is irrelevant.) Both Kaplan and Perry argue that a Fregean account of indexical expressions like ‘I’, ‘today’, and ‘here’ and demonstrative expressions like ‘he’, ‘this’, and ‘there’ is inadequate. In this section we shall focus on the arguments of the classic (Perry 1977).

Perry argues against the Fregean claim that there is a single entity — sense — that answers to the three principles of sense individuation presented in section 1. He argues that this identification leads to several problems when applied to indexicals. Perry argues that one kind of entity answers to Accept and a distinct entity kind of entity answers to Truth and Attitude. More generally, Perry argues that an adequate account of indexicals and demonstratives in thought and language requires that we have one entity serving as cognitive values and a distinct entity serving as the contents of thoughts and sentences and bearers of truth value. The mistake of the Fregean is to think that there is a single item that can do all of the work. It is this mistake that is ultimately behind the following arguments against Fregeanism.

Consider the following sentence.

(6) George quit his job today.

(6) doesn't express a complete proposition on its own because ‘today’ does not have a complete sense on its own. Suppose that George held exactly one job, which he quit on 1 Aug 2000. (6) is then true as uttered on 1 Aug 2000 and false as uttered on any other day. Perry considers three Fregean accounts of the sense expressed by a use of ‘today’ in (6) and argues that they all fail. The first identifies the the sense of ‘today’ with its role or character; the second identifies it with an equivalence class of ordinary Fregean senses; and the third involves looking to the beliefs of the speaker for its sense.

We begin with the first, according to which the sense of a use of ‘today’ is its role. This account, in effect, denies that ‘today’ is an indexical. This is because the role of an expression is the rule that takes one from a particular utterance of the expression to its content on that use, which is the same across all uses. An expression's role is related to its linguistic meaning. The role of ‘today’ is a rule that takes one from a given use to the day of that use; the role of ‘I’ is a rule that takes one from a given use to the speaker of that use. So, if the sense of ‘today’ were its role, the same thought would be expressed by every utterances of (6), regardless of the day of occurrence. But, as we have seen, different utterances of (6) have different truth values. But then, by Truth, those utterances express different thoughts. Furthermore, the account violates Accept, as it is possible to rationally take differential attitudes towards different utterances of (6). The sense of a use of ‘today’ is not its role.

According to the second Fregean account, the sense of a use of an indexical like ‘today’ is the class of referentially equivalent ordinary Fregean senses. The equivalence class of thoughts for an utterance of (6) on 1 Aug 2000 is the class of thoughts composed of the (incomplete) sense of ‘George quit his job’ and any completing sense that determines 1 Aug 2000. Referential equivalence classes function much like singular propositions, in that they do not place any restrictions on the way in which the agent conceives of the referent of the thought. This makes them poor candidates for accounting for the cognitive value of a sentence, as they lead to violations of Accept. Consider the following case, derived from a case of Perry's. Suppose that you are sitting in a large harbor city and see the bow of a ship, with the name ‘Enterprise’ clearly in view, sticking out behind a building. You also see the stern of a ship, with no name, sticking out behind another building two blocks away. The water view is obstructed by buildings for the intervening two blocks. You might then accept your companion's utterance of the sentence ‘This is the Enterprise’, pointing at the bow of the ship, but reject her utterance of the sentence ‘This is the Enterprise’, pointing at the stern of the ship. Associated with both utterances is the same equivalence class of Fregean senses, as both uses of ‘this’ refer to the same ship. But, because you competently accept the one and not the other, by Accept, different senses are expressed. We get the same results for (6) by considering someone who is confused about what day it is. They might then accept an utterance of (6) on 1 August 2000 while rejecting an utterance of ‘George quit his job on 1 August 2000’, without a change of mind and despite the fact that the same equivalence class is associated with both. If the sense of a use of ‘today’ is intended to capture that use's cognitive significance, as it clearly should on a Fregean account, we should reject this second account.

The failings of the first two accounts as plausible Fregean accounts of (6) are fairly evident. The third Fregean account turns to the attitudes of the speaker to determine the sense of a given use of an indexical. Perry presents the key idea as follows.

To understand a demonstrative, is to be able to supply a sense for it on each occasion, which determines as reference the value the demonstrative has on that occasion…. [W]e can say that for each person the sense of the demonstrative ‘today’ for that person on a given day is just the sense of one of the descriptions D (or some combination of all the descriptions) such that on that day he believes [‘Today is D’]. (Perry 1977, 11-12)

Perry requires that the descriptions D should be nonindexical. Perry then presents three arguments against this suggestion. (Kaplan presents similar arguments against what he calls the Fregean theory of demonstratives in (Kaplan 1977/1989).)

The first objection is the irrelevancy of belief objection. Believing that you live in the medieval age and possessing accurate descriptive information of the medieval age does not make your uses of ‘today’ about 1 August 1204, even though that is the date the best fits your conception of the date of your utterance. Your uses of ‘today’ are about whatever day they occur on, whatever descriptions you identify with that day. But if the sense of a use of a ‘today’ were determined by the beliefs of the speaker, and if sense determines reference, then it would seem that your utterance should be about 1204. So, the beliefs of the speaker are irrelevant to the day an utterance of ‘today’ is about.

This objection works the best with “automatic” or “pure” indexicals like ‘today’ and ‘I’ rather than “non-automatic” indexicals or “true” demonstratives like ‘she’ and ‘this’ which require an associated demonstration to refer in context. This is because the reference of a use of a true demonstrative is at least arguably determined in part by the speaker's beliefs and audience-directed intentions, whereas the reference of a pure indexical is settled by objective, attitude-independent factors of the occasion of utterance, like who is speaking when and where. (There is, however, a debate about whether or not speaker beliefs and intentions are relevant even to true demonstratives. See (Bach 1992), (Bertolet 1993), and (Reimer 1991a/b; 1992) for further discussion.)

We noted above that Perry assumes that the descriptive beliefs that determine the sense of a use of ‘today’ themselves are not indexical. Lifting this ban removes some of the sting from the irrelevancy of belief objection. For consider the agent's belief that she would express by saying, ‘‘Today is the day of this very utterance’’. Whereas the purely qualitative descriptive conditions a speaker believes the day of her speech satisfies may well be about a different day than the day referred to by her use of ‘today’, it is much less clear that the above descriptive condition is satisfied by the wrong day. (It is also harder to imagine a nonproblematic case where the agent is confused about whether or not the day referred to by her use of ‘today’ satisfies this description, as she may be confused about whether or not it satisfies some purely qualitative description.) But there are at least two problems with the Fregean appealing to such descriptions. The first is that it is far from clear that ordinary agents actually have such beliefs when they competently utter a sentence like (6). It is also questionable whether all speakers who competently use ‘today’ have the concepts of an utterance. If they do not, then they are in a position to believe what is expressed by an utterance of ‘Today is fine’ without believing what is expressed by an utterance of ‘The day of this utterance is fine’. Second, even if they did, the same question of the sense of the use of ‘this’ would arise once again, with all of the problems Perry raises for the sense of (6). There is no room, in Frege's system, for irreducibly indexical thoughts, as Frege is clear that thoughts are true or false absolutely, which an irreducibly indexical thought could not be (just as the sentence ‘I am happy’ is not itself true or false absolutely). Insofar as the Fregean claims that truth is an absolute property of thoughts, she must explicate the indexicality of language and judgments using only nonindexical propositions or thoughts. (It is, however, an intriguing possibility for the Fregean to give up this claim and treat the truth or falsity of a thought (as opposed to a sentence) as being relative to a sequence of parameters like a person, place, time, etc.. Then the Fregean could claim that the thought expressed by an utterance of (6) is itself irreducibly indexical and is only true or false relative to an assignment of parameters. We do not know of such a form of Fregean theory that has been worked out in detail.)

Perry's second objection is the nonnecessity of belief objection. This objection turns on the fact that ignorance of unique qualitative properties of what day it is is not a barrier to referring to that day with one's use of ‘today’. Consider the case of Rip Van Winkle. “When he awakes on October 20, 1823, and says with conviction ‘Today is October 20, 1803,’ the fact that he is sure he is right does not make him right, as it would if the thought expressed were determined by the sense he associated with ‘today’” (Perry 1977, 12). (The case of Rip Van Winkle is very rich. For further discussion, see (Evans 1981/1985), (Kaplan 1977/1989, 538), and Perry 1997).) Van Winkle need not have a correct conception of the day of utterance to be talking and thinking about that day with his use of ‘today’. It suffices to simply be located on that day and say, ‘‘Today is fine,’’ knowing the general rule of how uses of ‘today’ function. A similar point can be made about ‘I’, using a case of a person suffering from complete amnesia, who intuitively still speaks of herself when she says, ‘‘I am here’’, despite lacking true beliefs of identifying biographical information, and ‘here’, using a case of a person who is lost. As was the case with Perry's first objection, however, the nonnecessity of belief objection is less persuasive with true demonstratives, where some kind of correct conception of the intended reference is arguably needed to demonstrate it.

In his response to Perry, Gareth Evans (Evans 1981/1985) claims that retaining indexical beliefs across changes in circumstance requires keeping track of the objects the beliefs are about. So, for example, to believe the same thing today that I believed yesterday when I uttered (yesterday) the sentence ‘Today is fine’ requires more than simply competently uttering today the sentence ‘Yesterday was fine’. I must in addition, Evans claims, have been keeping track of the day and so properly registered the change in day. This makes belief necessary for retention of indexical beliefs, even with beliefs expressed by sentences with pure indexicals. As Van Winkle does not successfully track the twenty some years between his falling asleep and waking up, he does not retain the temporally indexical beliefs he had the night he fell asleep. Evans is less clear, however, that a proper conception of the day is necessary for formation (as opposed to retention) of a temporally indexical belief, which is what Perry's second objection denies. Furthermore, the tracking condition has strange consequences. Losing track of time isn't something that is always internally accessible. So, there can be pairs of cases where “everything is all the same” as far as the agents of the cases can discern and yet in one case the agent has lost track of time and so has lost the temporal beliefs she once had and in the other she has not. This is counterintuitive, especially if belief contents are intended to capture how the agent conceives the world, as they are for someone who takes a principle like Accept to individuate thoughts.

Perry's third and final objection is the nonsufficiency of belief. Consider the case of Hume and Heimson. Heimson believes that he is Hume. But Heimson isn't just crazy (although he is crazy); he is also well informed about every aspect of Hume's life. Still, Hume says something true when he utters the sentence ‘I wrote the Treatise’ and Heimson says something false. If so, then, by Truth, they say different things, despite the similarity in their qualitative descriptive beliefs. Even though Heimson's descriptive beliefs about who he is best fit Hume, still his self-thoughts are about Heimson and not Hume. The Fregean cannot, Perry claims, account for this.

Perry assumes that Fregean thoughts are generally accessible, as they are entirely composed of logical operations and purely qualitative conditions. But then the thought Hume grasps when he thinks to himself ‘‘I wrote the Treatise’’ is a thought available for Heimson to grasp as well. (This assumption of general accessibility is at odds with what Frege says in his late work (Frege 1918/1956), where he claims that “everyone is presented to himself in a particular and primitive way, in which he is presented to no-one else” (298). In his discussion of Dr. Lauben, Frege denies that all thoughts are generally accessible and that the thought Dr. Lauben grasps when he thinks to himself, ‘‘I am cold,’’ for example, is a thought that can be expressed by any sentence with a proper name. It is important to realize that this limited accessibility thesis Frege held in later work is distinct from the view alluded to above according to which a thought is irreducibly indexical. The former view is consistent with Dr. Lauben's thought being absolutely true or false, whereas the latter view is not.) Frege did not always hold this limited accessibility view, however. In an earlier, unpublished work intended as a logic textbook he writes:

In this case [the sentence ‘I am cold’] the mere words do not contain the entire sense; we have in addition to take into account who utters it. There are many cases like this in which the spoken words have to be supplemented by the speaker's gesture and expression, and the accompanying circumstances. The word ‘I’ simply designates a different person in the mouths of different people. It is not necessary that the person who feels cold should give utterance to the thought that he feels cold. Another person can do this by using a name to designate the one who feels cold. (Frege 1914, 134-5)

Frege here seems to be claiming that the thought you have when you say to yourself, ‘‘I am cold,’’ is a thought someone else can express by pointing at you and saying, ‘‘S/he is cold,’’ which is exactly what Frege denied in (1918/1958). Furthermore, although Frege only posits private senses only for ‘I’, the worries that drove him to this view can be raised with other indexicals like ‘here’, ‘today’, and ‘now’. It becomes less and less plausible to posit context-bound senses for each place, day, and moment. In any event, the move to such perspective-bound thoughts has not been generally accepted, even by followers of Frege.) Any generally accessible thought, Perry argues, will violate Accept. For suppose that there were a purely qualitative descriptive condition F that Hume associates with his use of ‘I’ and that gives its sense; say, the condition expressed by the expression ‘the author of the argument against the rationality of induction’. It would seem that, insofar as Hume forgot (or never knew) that he himself is uniquely F but retained his ability to think of himself with the expression ‘I’, it is possible for him to competently, reflectively, and sincerely accept the sentence ‘I wrote the Treatise’ while not accepting ‘The F wrote the Treatise’. No such purely qualitative, generally accessible proposition, Perry concludes, is equivalent in cognitive significance to Hume's thought that he himself wrote the Treatise. But Fregeanism entails that there is such a thought. So Fregeanism is false.

So far we have focused on Perry's case against Fregean accounts of indexicals in thought and language. Let's move briefly to Perry's positive, anti-Fregean view of indexicality. Perry's views have gone through important and often drastic changes from his early views in (1977; 1979) to his later views in (2001), which we shall not try to sort out here. A broadly similar view is also presented in (Kaplan 1977/1989), where Kaplan distinguishes content and character, claiming that the latter captures the cognitive significance of an expression and the former is the bearer of truth value and the object of the propositional attitudes, often being a singular proposition. Perry initially (1977) distinguished “thoughts” and “senses,” but later (1979; 1980a/b) made the same distinction in terms of belief contents and belief states. (Perry also initially identified the “thought” associated with an expression with its role, which is proven false by cases like the Enterprise case discussed above. If an expression's role is identified with its linguistic meaning, then the two occurrences of ‘this’ surely have the same role. The two utterances of ‘this’ have distinct associated demonstrations, but demonstrations are not part of linguistic meaning.) The core idea behind this broad kind of account, however, is that an adequate account of indexicality in thought and language involves two distinct items, one that is roughly characterized by Truth and Attitude — propositions — and the other that is roughly characterized by Accept and is intended to capture the “cognitive significance” of an expression and through which propositions are grasped. The former is, in the case of indexical beliefs, a singular proposition. This distinction, Perry claims, is the key to solving the problems with self-locating beliefs that we have discussed above; it is the Fregean's identification of the items that answer to Accept and Truth and Attitude that leads to the problems surveyed above.

Let's apply the view to the case of Heimson. What, on Perry's view, distinguishes Hume from Heimson? Both Hume and Heimson are in the same first-person belief state when they say to themselves, ‘‘I wrote the Treatise.’’ Furthermore, the belief content Hume has when he is in that belief state — namely, the singular proposition that Hume wrote the Treatise — is a belief content readily available for Heimson to entertain as well. However, only Hume can grasp that belief content by entering a first-person belief state. When Heimson enters a first-person belief state, he grasps a different singular proposition that Heimson wrote the Treatise and when Heimson grasps that singular proposition that Hume wrote the Treatise, it is in virtue of being in some kind of third-person belief state. Perry is thus able to account for the similarities between Heimson and Hume (they are in the same belief state) and what is distinctive of Hume (only he grasps the singular proposition that Hume wrote the Treatise when in a first-person belief state).

Belief states are important because they are involved in explaining, predicting, and rationalizing behavior. Perry provides a host of memorable cases that make this point. Here's one. Consider two people who both utter to themselves the sentence ‘I am being attacked by a bear’. Perry plausibly claims that, all other things being equal, both people will act in similar ways. There is a common explanation of both of their behaviors only by appeal to their belief states, as they each apprehend distinct propositions. To think that they apprehend the same proposition fails to do justice to the intuition that the one has a thought about himself and the other has a thought about herself. Furthermore, if one were to grasp the singular proposition concerning herself that she is being attacked by a bear, but not in a first-person way (say, in virtue of seeing her reflection in a mirror with the reflection of a bear sneaking up without realizing that the person being seen is herself), she would not act in the same way. Explanation, prediction, and rationalization are all sensitive to belief states. To quote Perry on this point:

[I]n virtue of being in a belief state in a certain environment, we believe a certain object. Because the same object can be believed in different ways, from different environments or “points of view,” classifying people by objects believed is not always particularly useful…. Consider the sentence ‘There is a hungry lion coming towards me’. Now consider the contexts relative to which this sentence is true. They all consist of persons and times such that the person is being approached by a hungry lion at that time. It is a good idea for all of these people to run like crazy [presumably, at that time or at least shortly thereafter]. In a sense they do not need to know what they believe. Even if they have forgotten who they are and lost track of time, they know enough to run. (In another sense, they do know what they believe even then.) Most of these people will not believe the same thing. But each of them will believe in something that provides them with good reason to run. (Perry 1980a, 323)

But belief states are not contents; they are not true or false and they are, intuitively, not what we say when we utter a sentence, etc. (as, for example, you say something about you when you utter the sentence ‘I am happy’). We must thus also recognize belief contents as distinct elements. (For further discussion of the issues raised in this section, see the entries indexicals and propositional attitude reports.)

4. Reasons for Singular Propositions: The reduplication argument

Peter Strawson's reduplication argument, in (Strawson 1959, 20-22), can be construed as a powerful argument for singular propositions, even if that is not how Strawson himself intended the argument. What Strawson employs the argument to support is that demonstrative identification is fundamental to our ability to identify and hence refer to, in speech and thought, objects in the world. Strawson distinguishes demonstrative identification and descriptive identification. Demonstrative identification of o is enabled by one's being able to sensibly discriminate o from other objects. So one can demonstratively identify only that which one has perceived. But one can think about and hence identify far more that just that with which one has perceived. Such items are descriptively identified. Objects one identifies demonstratively are directly identified and not identified in virtue of their satisfies qualities by which the agent conceives the object. (This distinction should be reminiscent of Russell's distinction between thought by acquaintance and thought by description. We shall return below to a comparison of Russell and Strawson.) Strawson's notion of demonstrative identification is thus closely related to the notions of direct reference and singular propositions.

A reduplication universe is one in which the same set of qualities are distributed in the same pattern across two regions. There are both temporal and spatial versions of reduplication. We shall focus on the spatial version, as Strawson does. If our universe were a reduplication universe then, in some other region of the universe, there are qualitatively identical objects to those in our immediate surroundings. In particular, we can suppose that, for everything inside one's light cones, there is in some far off region of the universe outside one's light cone a qualitative twin of that thing, including oneself. Strawson's claim is that, in such a universe, all identification, including descriptive identification, is grounded in demonstrative identification and so demonstrative identification is a distinctive and fundamental form of identification. If all thought were purely qualitative, as we have described the Fregean view to be, then, according to Strawson, there would be no determinate thought about any particulars in the reduplication universe, which is implausible.

Suppose that Sally is standing in front of Bill, thinking that he has a stain on his shirt. In another region of the universe there is a qualitatively identical set of circumstances. So, there is Sally*, who is just like Sally, standing in front of Bill*, who is just like Bill, thinking that he has a stain on his shirt. For any purely qualitative condition Bill satisfies, Bill* satisfies it too. Nonetheless it seems highly intuitive that Sally is thinking about Bill and not Bill* (and Sally* is thinking about Bill* and not Bill); after all, it is Bill and not Bill* that she is standing in front of and who is the obvious source of her judgment. But suppose that all forms of identification are fundamentally descriptive identification, so that identifying an object requires qualitatively discerning it from all others. Then, as Sally cannot discern Bill from Bill* in wholly qualitative terms, her thought is not determinately about Bill rather than Bill*. So she must be able to identify Bill in some other way, in virtue of her perceptual contact with Bill rather than Bill*. It is even more implausible, we think, when one considers Sally's thought about herself. Isn't it just completely obvious that Sally is thinking of herself and not Sally* when she says to herself, ‘‘I am hungry’’? But if her thought about herself were in terms of purely qualitative conditions, then she would be unable to think determinately of herself instead of Sally*. So, she must be capable of an alternative form of thought and identification that is distinct from and does not presuppose descriptive identification. Call this form of identification demonstrative identification. We have argued that it is distinct from and does not depend upon descriptive identification.

The argument we have presented above presupposes that Sally and Sally* and Bill and Bill* are numerically distinct but qualitatively indiscernible pairs of objects. Although many philosophers find this to be a genuine possibility, thanks in large part to Max Black (Black 1952) and Robert Adams (Adams 1979), there is a long tradition that finds such situations deeply problematic, as they find plausible the identity of indiscernibles (PII), according to which, for any objects x and y, if, for every quality F, x is F if and only if y is F (i.e., if x and y are qualitatively indiscernible), then x=y. But the argument can be developed in such a way that it does not presuppose the falsity of PII. Let there be some quality that Bill and Bill* lacks. Then the distinctness of Bill from Bill* is consistent with PII. But now let Sally (and thus Sally*) be unaware of Bill's (and Bill*'s) instantiating that quality. As long as Bill and Bill* are qualitatively indiscernible as far as Sally is concerned and yet intuitively Sally is thinking of Bill and not Bill*, the above argument for the irreducibility of demonstrative identification to descriptive identification goes through.

So far we have argued that demonstrative identification is not reducible to descriptive identification. But Strawson makes the stronger claim that, in the reduplication universe, descriptive identification depends on demonstrative identification. To get this stronger claim consider some object that Sally has never perceived but can intuitively think about — say, Bill's mother. Strawson claims that considering this case proves false the claim “that where the particular to be identified cannot be directly located [i.e., cannot be demonstratively identified because it cannot be perceptually discriminated], its identification must rest ultimately on description in purely general [i.e., qualitative] terms” (Strawson 1959, 21). Bill's mother (call her Morgan) is qualitatively indiscernible from Bill*'s mother. So Sally is unable to distinguish in purely qualitative terms Morgan from every other object in the universe. But intuitively she can nonetheless think of her, even though she cannot demonstratively identify her. This is because Sally can demonstratively identify Bill and thus have thoughts determinately about Bill as opposed to his qualitative twin Bill* and then think of Morgan under the descriptive condition Bill's mother. As Bill is directly given, this is a condition that Morgan and not her qualitative twin Morgan* satisfies. Thus Sally's ability to descriptively identify objects in the universe is ultimately grounded in her ability to demonstrative identify some stock of objects, identifying other objects in virtue of the unique relations they bear to members of that stock. Strawson argues that the general way of relating objects one has not perceived to those demonstratively identified is by way of spatio-temporal relations. (See (1959, 22) in particular, but much of the discussion that follows in chapter 1 is aimed at establishing the Kantian claim that spatio-temporal relations are the privileged set of relations for enabling identification of particulars.)

Let's grant that to have a thought determinately about an individual in a reduplication universe requires possessing an irreducible, fundamental form of demonstrative identification. What bearing, then, does that fact have on thought about individuals in nonreduplication universes and in particular thought about individuals in our universe, which we take, rightly we can suppose, to be a nonreduplication universe. Although Strawson does not argue in this way, the following line seems compelling. Grant that our universe is in fact not a reduplication universe. But it is metaphysically possible that it were and had it been, then it would have been all the same to us. (Recall, we have supposed that the reduplication is outside one's light cone.) In particular, intuitively, our thought would not have taken a different form than it actually has merely with the addition of a qualitative copy of the happenings in our universe. But the considerations above show that, had we been living in a reduplication universe, then demonstrative identification would have been irreducible and fundamental. But then it is also actually irreducible and fundamental, even though we do not actually live in a reduplication universe, as it could have been that we did live in a reduplication universe and it is implausible that that fact alone would affect the structure of our thoughts about the individuals around us.

We shall end this section by briefly comparing Strawson's view with Russell's and the contemporary neo-Russellian's views. We have seen that, for Russell, like Strawson, demonstrative identification plays a crucial role, in the form of acquaintance. But unlike Strawson, Russell denies that we demonstratively identify physical objects. Still, Russell can deliver the intuitively correct results that Sally's thoughts are determinately about Bill and not Bill*, even though she is not, on Russell's view, able to demonstratively identify Bill. This is because Sally can demonstratively identify her sense data that are caused by Bill and not Bill*. On Russell's view, Sally descriptively identifies even Bill, but the descriptive condition she employs contains direct reference to her occurrent sense data. She is thus able to form a descriptive (although not purely qualitative) condition that Bill satisfies and Bill* does not.

Both Strawson and Russell think that thought about particulars is ultimately grounded on direct reference. But they disagree about what we can directly refer to, Strawson claiming that it includes perceived objects in the external world and Russell claiming that it only includes mental particulars. It is important to note, however, that as far as the reduplication argument is concerned, this difference is not of consequence. As long as there is some stock of individuals that are thought of directly and not in terms of purely qualitative conditions that can serve as the anchors in terms of which the qualitatively indiscernible objects can then be discerned, the intuition that Sally is thinking determinately of Bill and not Bill* is respected.

Strawson maintains that an agent can demonstratively identify only objects that she has perceived. Neo-Russellians typically go a step further, claiming that an agent can think directly about objects she has not perceived in virtue of standing in the appropriate communicative chains. So, even though you have never perceived Plato, we will safely suppose, you can nevertheless think directly about Plato in virtue of your standing in a communicative chain that ultimately traces back to perceptions (on the part of other agents in the communicative chain) of Plato. (The best presentation of this view is by Kent Bach (Bach 1994, chapter 2).) Some neo-Russellians go even further and maintain that there needn't be any perceptual contact at all with an object to think about it directly. (See, for example, David Kaplan (Kaplan 1975b), who maintains that the dthat-operator can transform any designating expression into a directly referential term, competence with which enables an agent to think about the designation of the original term directly. Hence, Le Verrier was able to think about Neptune directly despite the lack of perceptual contact with the planet (we will suppose) in virtue of his competence with the expression ‘dthat[the cause of the perturbations in Uranus's orbit]’. See also (Jeshion 2002) for a similar view, in that she too thinks perceptual contact with an object is not necessary for thinking of that object directly, although she does not appeal to Kaplan's dthat-operator.

We thus have a spectrum of views that agree that there is direct reference to individual in thought and language but disagree about the range of this form of reference, with Russell's very restrictive view of direct reference, according to which an agent can only think directly about her occurrent sense data, to the very liberal view of direct reference held by Kaplan and Jeshion, according to which objects that have never been perceived can be thought about directly. All of these views respect the intuition that Sally's thoughts are determinately about Bill and not Bill*. Thus, while the reduplication argument makes a very powerful case that there is some direct reference and hence that singular proposition are necessary for an adequate account of reference to individuals in thought and language, it does not settle the further issue of how much of our thought is direct and involves the grasping of singular propositions and what is thought by description. That is, while the reduplication argument might settle that there are singular propositions, we must appeal to different considerations, like those involved in the argument from indexicals and demonstratives, to resolve the further issue of what individuals can be constituents of singular propositions and under what conditions.

5. Modal Problems for Singular Propositions

We have seen some reasons for thinking that there are singular propositions and that an adequate semantics of natural language and account of the contents of propositional attitudes must employ them. But singular propositions also give rise to a number of important problems, beside those concerning propositional attitudes and apparent substitution failures already discussed. We shall end this essay by discussing two related problems: Modal problems and temporal problems. These problems will lead us to connect singular propositions to several important issues in metaphysics.

Consider the following proposition.

(7) George Bush does not exist.

While (7) is false, it might have been true. (The number designates the proposition as opposed to the sentence, as before.) That is, it is possibly true. But suppose (7) is a singular proposition, involving George Bush as a constituent. Then there are problems, given the following two principles.

(P1) Necessarily, for all propositions p, had p been true, then p would have existed.
(P2) Necessarily, if (7) were true, then George would not have existed.

Both principles are highly plausible. (P1) is plausible because being true is a property and there must be something that has a property in order for that property to be instantiated. So, had it been that a given proposition were true, then there must have been something — namely, that proposition — that had the property of being true. (P2) is even more plausible, as it simply states the intuitive truth conditions of the truth of (7), being an instance of the propositional equivalent of the Tarski truth-schema s is true iff s. But these principles can seem to entail that, if (7) is a singular proposition, then it is not possibly true. For suppose it were a singular proposition and were true. Then there is a world w in which (7) is true. By (P1), (7) exists in p (for otherwise it wouldn't be true in w). But then all of its constituents exists in w as well, as a complex does not exist in a world unless all of its constituents exist in that world. But then George Bush exists in w. So, by (P2), (7) is not true in w, which contradicts our original assumption that it is true in w. So, either (7) is not a singular proposition or it is not possibly true.

The basic structure of this argument derives from Alvin Plantinga's argument (Plantinga 1983) against what he calls existentialism, the thesis that all individual essences are dependent upon the individuals that instantiate them. Timothy Williamson (Williamson 2001) has recently used the same basic principles, together with the assumption of existentialism, to argue that necessarily everything necessarily exists. Plantinga himself does not conclude that (7) is not a singular proposition. Rather, he concludes that a singular proposition about o can exist even though o does not exist. (See in particular (Plantinga 1983, 8-9), where he argues that the notion of constituency is too confused to allow us to conclude that the constituent of a singular proposition must exist in a world for that proposition to exist in that world.) Plantinga also argues that the property being identical to o can exist without o, even though he strongly suggests that he views this property as being constructed by λ-abstraction from the the proposition that o is identical to o. Plantinga would have been much better served, we believe, by denying that there are singular propositions about contingent existents, on the grounds that if there were, propositions like (7) would not be possibly true, which is counterintuitive. He could say either that there are primitive properties that are stipulated to be individual essences but that can exist unexemplified (rather than accepting, as he does, that o's individual essence is the property being identical to o) or that an individual essence of an object is the rigidification of a condition that it uniquely satisfies (see the discussion of Plantinga's response to the modal argument above in section 2). It is then George Bush's individual essence, rather than Bush himself, that is the constituent of (7) and that is expressed by the name ‘George Bush’. If Bush's individual essence were a constituent of (7) and so (7) were not a singular proposition, then, as Bush's individual essence can exist unexemplified and without Bush, we do not violate (P1) and (P2) by claiming that there are worlds in which (7) is true.

There are different replies to Plantinga's argument one can make depending on the metaphysical position one takes with respect to modality. If one is a possibilist, like David Lewis (Lewis 1986), then one makes a distinction between something's being actual and something's existing, as what is actual is but a small proper subset of what exists, according to the possibilist. Then what exists in a world does not exhaust what exists simpliciter. Bush is around to serve as a constituent of a proposition, even with respect to worlds in which he does not exist, because he exists in some worlds. The possibilist can thus claim that the truth of (P1) does not entail that, if p is true in w, then p exists in w; rather, it only entails that w exists.

Matters are more difficult if one is an actualist, claiming that everything is actual. Then, if one accepts the existence of singular propositions, one has two options. First, one might deny that propositions like (7) are possibly true, accepting that necessarily everything necessarily exists, as Bernard Linsky and Edward Zalta (Linsky and Zalta 1994) and Williamson (Williamson 2001) do. This position is only as plausible as the explanation that is offered of the intuitive contingency of ordinary objects like Bush. If existence is claimed to be a necessary property, then some contingent property must be offered in its place that can be used to explain the intuition that (7) might have been true. Linsky and Zalta claim that being concrete is a contingent property. They claim that Bush might have been nonconcrete and that, when we consider a world in which he is nonconcrete, we (wrongly) conclude that he does not exist there. Although the virtues of this view are many, not the least of which is the simple and straightforward modal logic it validates, we are very reluctant to accept that concreteness is a contingent property. Second, if one insists that propositions like (7) are singular propositions that are possibly true, then one must claim that (7) is true even at worlds in which it does not exist, thus denying (P1). (Robert Adams (Adams 1981), Harry Deutsch (Deutsch 1994), Kit Fine (Fine 1977; 1985), Greg Fitch (Fitch 1996), and Chris Menzel (Menzel 1991; 1993) all develop different versions of this response.) As an analogy consider John's assertion ‘‘It is possible I do not exist.’’ John can describe or represent a circumstance or world where John does not exist. So, too, (7) can represent a circumstance or world where (7) does not exist. For (7) to be possibly true is for (7) to represent a circumstance or world that could obtain. It is not required that (7) be a part of the world or circumstance that (7) represents any more than it is required that John be a part of the world that he describes with his assertions.

None of the solutions are without problems. Plantinga's own solution requires mysterious entities — individual essences that could exist unexemplified and thus that are individuated independently of the individuals that instantiate them. Linsky and Zalta's solution runs contrary to the robust intuition that what individuals there happen to be is a contingent matter and requires that ordinary existents could exist as nonconcrete objects. And the final solution seems to require a distinction between how matters stand in a possible world or from the perspective of that possible world and how matters stand at that world and it also requires complicating one's quantified modal logic. (For a more detailed discussion of the issues raised in this section, see the entry actualism.)

6. Temporal Problems for Singular Propositions

The second problem with singular propositions that we will consider also concerns the fundamental problem of combining so-called abstract objects (such as propositions) with ordinary individuals. The modal problem arises because of the intuition that ordinary individuals might not have existed, while propositions are often taken to exist necessarily. The temporal problem we shall consider in this section arises because ordinary individuals change over time, including coming into and going out of existence. Propositions, on the other hand, are usually taken to be eternal objects — things that do not change over time.

Consider the following proposition.

(8) Socrates exists.

Does (8) exist? Socrates is long gone; he no longer exists. But if (8) does not exist how can it be false, as it evidently is? Moreover, if (8) does exist then exactly what age is the constituent of (8)? 21? 37? It seems a bit absurd to say that the age of a constituent of a proposition is thus and so, yet if Socrates himself is a constituent of (7), then he must be a certain age. No human person exists without being a certain age. (Note several things: First, these questions arise regardless of the truth value of the proposition; if it is true, the same questions arise. Second, and relatedly, these questions do not depend upon the particular predicate being used; if we had instead ascribed the property of wisdom to Socrates, the same questions arise. Finally, adding a past-tense also seems to not help with this particular problem, as we are still left wondering what entity besides the no longer existent Socrates fills the subject slot.)

We raised two issues with (8). The first issue is similar to the modal problem discussed in the previous section. The second issue also has a modal analog, as follows. Bush in fact has two arms, but he might have had only one. But then if Bush himself is a constituent of the proposition that Bush has two arms, then he must either have exactly two arms or exactly one arm, it would seem, as no human person exists without having a certain number of arms. But neither answer seems satisfying. As we shall spell out below, this issue is closely related to the problems of change and accidents, in general, and David Lewis's (Lewis 1986, chapter 4) problems of temporary and accidental intrinsics more specifically.

The reply that one makes to the temporal objections is like the reply that one makes to the alethic modal objection in that it depends on one's metaphysical views concerning time and individuals. We begin with the first issue and then turn to the second.

The temporal analog of possibilism is eternalism, according to which what exists at a time is but a small proper subset of what exists simpliciter. (Works that defend eternalism include (Heller 1990), (Lewis 1986), (Mellor 1981; 1998), (Quine 1963), (Sider 1997; 2001), (Smart 1955), and (Williams 1951).) The eternalist can maintain that although Socrates does not exist presently, he does exist simpliciter and so he is available to be the constituent of the singular proposition (8), even at times at which he does not exist.

Presentism is the temporal analog of actualism. Presentists maintain that everything is present; entities like Socrates, that do not presently exist, simply do not exist at all. (Works that defend presentism include (Crisp 2002; 2005; 2007a/b), (Hinchliff 1988; 1996), (Markosian 2003), (Prior 1959, 1962, 1965, 1970, 1977), and (Zimmerman 1996; 1998a/b).) Presentists have a harder row to hoe in accounting for the apparent falsity of (8). In the previous section we outlined three actualist solutions to the problems the intuitive truth of (7) raise. There are temporal analogs of each of those three solutions that can be applied to the the case at hand. First, just as Plantinga distinguished an individual from its individual essence, claiming that the latter can exist unexemplified and hence independently of the former, employing an object's individual essence as a constituent of the possibly true singular negative existential, so too a presentist might appeal to such individual essences. The presentist could then claim that (8) is not a singular proposition containing Socrates himself as a constituent, as there is no such entity, but rather a proposition with Socrates's individual essence as a constituent. (8)'s falsity and existence is then perfectly compatible with Socrates's nonexistence. Second, the presentist might deny that Socrates does not exist, maintaining that he has instead become a nonconcrete but existent object, taking the temporal analog of the view held by Linsky and Zalta. Then, although (8) is true, a related proposition concerning Socrates's concreteness is false. (It is worth pausing to notice how implausible it is to maintain that a concrete object becomes nonconcrete or that a nonconcrete object becomes concrete.) Third, one could appeal to the temporal analog of the Adams, et al. view, distinguishing how matters stand in a time and how they stand at a time. It is, however, questionable that this distinction will enable much progress in offering a presentist account of the falsity of (8), as we still face the problem of explaining what proposition it is, exactly, that is false at the present time given that Socrates is nowhere, according to the presentist, to be found. Finally, there is a fourth presentist solution worth discussing, which also has a modal analog. One might insist that, although Socrates does not exist, Socrates is nonetheless a constituent of reality, in the range of the most unrestricted of quantifiers, and available as a constituent of singular propositions. This is because there are entities that do not exist. This form of Meinongian presentism has been defended by Mark Hinchliff (Hinchliff 1988; 1996). Many, however, find the distinction between being and existing obscure and the Meinongian metaphysics rather incredible. (For further discussion of eternalism and presentism, see the entries spacetime: being and becoming in modern physics and time. For discussion of Meinongianism, see nonexistent objects).)

Above we raised a second set of questions concerning (8). If (8) is a singular proposition with Socrates the man as a constituent, then what state does Socrates exist in? Consider the following proposition. (We switch to a proposition concerning a presently existing object so as to avoid the issues discussed above.)

(9) Bush is age 61.

Intuitively, (9) is true in August 2007 and false in, say, August 1998. (Not everyone agrees that the truth of a proposition, as opposed to a tensed sentence, varies across time. We shall return to this briefly below.) Suppose (9) is a singular proposition with Bush as a constituent. Well, we should ask: How old is that constituent? No answer seems to satisfy. By the law of excluded middle, either it satisfies the condition ‘x is age 61’ or it doesn't. But if it does, then it seems a little strange to think of (9) as being false, which it is in 1998. If it doesn't, then it seems a little strange to think of (9) as being true, which it is in August 2007. And it is also strange to think of that (9) itself as changing in its constituents across time. But then what do we say about the fact that (9) seems to change its truth value precisely because Bush changes his age?

How one deals with these questions depends on one's metaphysical views of the nature of persistence through time and change. Broadly speaking, there are two realist views of change: There are views that take persisting objects as primitive, maintaining that they are “wholly present” (see (Crisp and Smith 2005) for an interesting attempt to articulate this notion) at each time at which they exist. and there are views that reduce persisting objects to more fundamental, momentary objects. The first view is called endurantism or three-dimensionalism, versions of which are defended in (Chisholm 1976), (Forbes 1987), (Geach 1966; 1967), (Haslanger 1985; 1989a/b; 2003), (Hinchliff 1988; 1996), (Johnston 1983; 1987), (Lowe 1987; 1988; 1998), (Mellor 1981; 1998), (Thomson 1983), (van Inwagen 1990; 2000), (Wiggins 1968; 1980; 2001), and (Zimmerman 1996; 1998a/b), among others. (There are important differences between the versions of endurantism these defended in these works, related to whether or not “tense is taken seriously”, presentism is accepted or rejected, whether or not seemingly monadic properties like being age 61 are treated as relations between individuals and times, and whether or not the instantiation relation between individuals and properties is claimed to obtain only relative to a time. We cannot attempt to sort these differences out here, although we shall say something about them below.) The second view is called perdurantism, four-dimensionalism, or the doctrine of temporal parts, versions of which are defended in (Armstrong 1980), (Heller 1990), (Jubien 1993), (Lewis 1971; 1976; 1986; 1988), (Quine 1960; 1963), (Robinson 1982), (Russell 1927), (Smart 1955; 1972), (Taylor 1955), and (Williams 1951), among others. (See the entries identity over time and temporal parts for further discussion.)

Perdurantists maintain that a persisting object is a sum of momentarily existing temporal parts, where the momentary temporal parts are the fundamental entities in the ontology. A persisting object like Socrates persists through an interval of time, on this view, by having numerically distinct temporal parts existing at every moment in that interval. And a persisting object like Bush changes from t to t′ by having numerically distinct temporal parts existing at t and t′ that have different properties. The perdurantist has an easy answer to our question. The object that is a constituent of a proposition is a complete object in that all the temporal stages or parts of the object in question are involved. So part of Bush is 52 and part is 61, but the entity (the persisting object Bush) that is a constituent of (9) is the sum of all these parts.

On the other hand, if one is an endurantist, then matters become more complex. Endurantists either eschew the notion of temporal parts altogether or think that they are ontologically-dependent entities — dependent on persisting objects and moments, much as Aristotle thought that accidental unities are dependent on substances and their qualities. They thus cannot appeal to a single object (the perdurantist's collection of temporal parts) that has all of the properties a persisting object ever has.

There are several options available to the endurantist. First, one might hold that at each time, t, at which Bush existed there is a singular proposition involving Bush and t, but deny that there is a proposition (like (9)) that is independent of a time. One could then question our assumption above that propositions like (9) change their truth value. There are, instead, distinct propositions like the following. (We assume, for simplicity, that a month is the shortest interval of time.)

(9August 1998) Bush is age 61 in 1998.

(9August 2007) Bush is age 61 in 2007.

These propositions are not time neutral and hence if they are ever true/false, they are always true/false. (9August 1998) isn't just false in August 1998; it is also false in August 2007. Proponents of this view are likely to think that different utterances of the sentence ‘Bush is age 61’ express different propositions, depending on the time at which they occur. An utterance of that sentence in August 2007 expresses the proposition (9August 2007) and a different utterance of that same sentence in August 1998 expresses the distinct proposition (9August 1998). A proponent of such a view might then find it natural to claim that the constituent of a proposition like (9August 2007) is Bush, in whatever state he is in in August 2007. In general, the constituent of a singular proposition is in the state that it is in in the time with which the proposition is saturated with.

A close cousin to perdurantism is the stage view, proponents of which include Katherine Hawley (Hawley 2001) and Theodore Sider (Sider 1996; 1997; 2000; 2001), according to which the subject of a temporal predication like (9) is an momentary individual — the temporal part that perdurantists claim is a proper part of the persisting object. So, whereas a perdurantist claims that a name like ‘Bush’ designates a sum of temporal parts, the proponent of the stage view maintains that it designates a single temporal part. A past-tensed predication like ‘x was governor of Texas’ is true of that entity just in case there is an earlier temporal part that bears the counterpart-relation to that entity that satisfies the condition is ‘x is governor of Texas’ (and similarly for future-tensed predications). The stage theorist who accepts singular propositions is likely to accept a view like the one considered above, where different propositions, with different temporal parts as constituents and different times, are expressed by different utterances of the sentence ‘Bush is age 61’.

Our question has been: If Bush is a constituent of (9), then what state is Bush in or what qualities does he have? The question is supposed to have bite because Bush has different qualities at different times. But there is a dimension to our question that we have yet to bring out: Namely, what is the individual Bush? There are at least two views. According to the first, the bundle theory, Bush is a bundle of properties. According to the second, the substratum theory, Bush is something distinct from his properties in which his properties inhere. If one accepts the bundle theory, then our question gets traction, as we now must ask which qualities are in the bundle that the individual is identified with. And if the object undergoes a change in quality F, then we must choose, it would seem, between F and its contrary as a member of that bundle. But if one accepts the substratum theory, then the question dissolves. If Bush himself is a bare particular, himself independent of his qualities, then we have an easy answer to our question. We can say that the constituent of (9) is the bare particular Bush who himself is independent of all his qualities. This view is consistent with endurantism and the assumption that (9) is a temporally neutral proposition that changes its truth value across time. The issues between the bundle theory and the substratum theory are many and complex. (See the entry substance for further discussion.)

Many find the substratum view implausible. But the endurantist might distinguish the temporary properties (i.e., the properties an object has at some times and not at others) from the nontemporary or permanent properties, claiming that the constituent of a singular proposition is clothed only in its nontemporary properties, claiming that, while not a bare particular, the individual that is a constituent of (9) is clad only in its nontemporary properties. A more satisfying version of this view will distinguish accidental properties from necessary properties, as there are accidental nontemporary properties, like the location of one's birth. (For example, if Sue was born in Provo, Utah, then it is always the case that she was born in Provo, Utah; that property does not change. But it is still the case that Sue might have been born elsewhere, as her mother could have been located elsewhere at the time of her birth. So, Sue's location of birth is nontemporary but accidental.) The same issues regarding singular propositions and the temporary properties of the constituents of those propositions arise regarding singular proposition and the accidental properties of those constituents. So, claiming that the individuals that are constituents of singular propositions are independent of their accidental properties but involve their essences provides a unifying account of both the modal and temporal versions of our second question from above.

In summary, when we ask how an object that no longer exists can be a constituent of a proposition, we need to consider the various metaphysical views concerning ordinary individuals and their relationship to time. If we can think of (or refer to) Socrates even though Socrates does not exist, then Socrates can be a constituent of a proposition though Socrates does not exist. What then shall we say of the proposition that Socrates exists? Does it exist or not? If it does not exist, then that does not prevent us from thinking of it (as with Socrates). On the other hand if we are prevented from thinking of Socrates because he no longer exists, then there are no singular propositions about Socrates. But that does not prevent there being singular propositions about currently existing objects. There may well be a fundamental asymmetry between thought of presently existing objects and (wholly) past and future objects. Such a view requires abandoning the view that propositions are eternal, as some of them go out of existence when the object they are about go out of existence. Furthermore, even singular propositions about presently existing objects give rise to puzzles, insofar as the objects they are about are persisting objects that change across time.


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actualism | existence | facts | Frege, Gottlob | indexicals | logic: classical | logical atomism: Russell's | names | propositions: structured | reference | Russell, Bertrand | time


Sadly, Gregory Fitch passed away January 27, 2007. Prior to his death, he made arrangements for Michael Nelson to take over the entry as co-author. Although the two authors discussed much of this material and shared a common perspective on the content of this article, Sections 3 and especially 4 are new and were written independently by the new co-author. Fitch's original, solely authored entry is available in the SEP Archives, and can be accessed at the URL = <>. (See the version history.) Thanks to Penelope Mackie for extremely helpful editorial advice.