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Rigid Designators

First published Tue Oct 24, 2006

A rigid designator designates the same object in all possible worlds in which that object exists and never designates anything else. This technical concept in the philosophy of language has critical consequences felt throughout philosophy. In their fullest generality, the consequences are metaphysical and epistemological. Whether a statement's designators are rigid or non-rigid may determine whether it is necessarily true, necessarily false, or contingent. This metaphysical status is sometimes out of accord with what one would expect given a statement's apparent epistemological status as a posteriori or a priori. Statements affected include central ones under investigation in philosophical subdisciplines from the philosophy of science to mind to ethics and aesthetics. Hence, much of the discussion in various subdisciplines of philosophy is explicitly or implicitly framed around the distinction between rigid and non-rigid designators.

1. A Basic Characterization of Rigid Designators and their Interest

1.1 Names, Ordinary Descriptions, and Identity Statements

Philosophical work performed by rigidity is discussed in §3 below, after a more thorough characterization of the notion of rigidity is provided. However, a modicum of understanding about that work is needed for any understanding of what is interesting about rigid designators. Hence, before moving on to refinements in characterizing the notion of rigidity, I rehearse here a famous application made by Saul Kripke, who coined the word ‘rigid designator’. Kripke is not the first philosopher to discuss the idea behind the term he coined, but his illuminating discussions have made the importance of rigidity widely appreciated.

Kripke (1980) famously argues that because a rigid designator designates the same object in all possible worlds, an identity statement in which the identity sign is flanked by two rigid designators must be necessarily true if it is true at all, even if the statement is not a priori. His classic example is the identity statement ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’, which is true, but which was discovered a posteriori to be true. ‘Hesperus’ is a name that was given to a heavenly body seen in the evening, and ‘Phosphorus’ is a name that was, unknown to the first users of the name, given to that same heavenly body seen in the morning. The heavenly body is Venus.

One might initially suppose that since the statement ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ was only discovered empirically to be true, it must be contingently true. But, says Kripke, it is necessarily true. The only respect in which it might have turned out false is not metaphysical but epistemic: thus, one could as well say of a geometrical theorem before it is proven that it might or might not turn out to be true or that it might or might not be provable without the parallels postulate. But if it is true and is provable without the parallels postulate, that is a matter of metaphysical necessity. In the same way, if the statement ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is true, that is a matter of metaphysical necessity.

‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is necessarily true if true at all because ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ are proper names for the same object. Like other names, Kripke maintains, they are rigid: each designates just the object it actually designates in all possible worlds in which that object exists, and it designates nothing else in any possible world. The object that ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ name in all possible worlds is Venus. Since ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ both name Venus in all possible worlds, and since Venus = Venus in all possible worlds, ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is true in all possible worlds.

A description like ‘the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ is, on the other hand, not rigid. That explains why the identity statement

(H) ‘Hesperus = the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’

is true but not necessarily true. While Hesperus is in fact the brightest object in the evening sky apart from the moon, Hesperus might have been dimmer: had, say, Hesperus been obscured by cosmic dust, Mars might have been the object designated by ‘the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ rather than Hesperus. In that case, the above identity statement (H) would have been false. So the reason that (H) could have been false is that ‘the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ does not designate Hesperus rigidly. It designates Hesperus in this world, which explains why (H) is true, but this description designates Mars in some other worlds, which explains why (H) could have been false: (H) would have been false had some other such world been actual.

1.2 Standard Clarifications from Kripke

Some potential misunderstandings are well known.

First, a rigid designator designates the same object in all possible worlds as it is used in the actual world, not as it is used in other possible worlds in which the object gets picked out: for although we identify objects in other worlds by our own names, natives of some of these worlds use other names (Kripke 1980, p. 77). A few philosophers resist this clarification. They find the idea of differentiating between the reference of terms in our world with respect to other worlds, on the one hand, and the reference of terms as used in other worlds, on the other hand, fatally confused (for critical discussion, see Fitch 2004, pp. 103–4). But such objections are not popular.

Second, although the statement (H) is not necessarily true, it is nevertheless Kripke's view and the standard view that the object that is in fact the brightest in the evening sky, Venus (Hesperus), is necessarily identical to Hesperus.

Third and finally, ‘Hesperus’ is rigid because it picks out Hesperus in all worlds that contain Hesperus. In worlds not containing Hesperus, the designator fails to name anything other than Hesperus. There is more than one account of a rigid designator that conforms to that requirement. On one such account, a rigid designator designates its designatum in every possible world containing the designatum and in other possible worlds the designator fails to designate. In places, Kripke suggests that this is his idea:

when I use the notion of a rigid designator, I do not imply that the object referred to necessarily exists. All I mean is that in any possible world where the object in question does exist, in any situation where the object would exist, we use the designator in question to designate that object. In a situation where the object does not exist, then we should say that the designator has no referent and that the object in question so designated does not exist (Kripke 1971, p. 146; a disclaimer is reported in Kaplan 1989b, p. 570 note 8).

In other places, Kripke seems to have in mind another account of rigidity: one according to which a rigid designator designates its object in every possible world, whether or not the designatum exists in that world. Hence, he says, “If you say, ‘suppose Hitler had never been born’ then ‘Hitler’ refers here, still rigidly, to something that would not exist in the counterfactual situation described” (Kripke 1980, p. 78).

It may be that no substantive issues ride on which conception of rigidity is adopted (Stanley 1997a, pp. 557, 566ff.; see also Brock 2004, p. 285 note 13). On the other hand, some philosophers have held that true statements using a proper name to express that so and so might not have existed are unintelligible unless the relevant name refers to the object in all worlds, period. That might provide a substantive reason for favoring the latter type of rigidity, obstinate rigidity, as Salmon calls it (1981, p. 34). Obstinate rigidity has sometimes been favored on grounds like these (see, e.g., Plantinga 1985, p. 84: particularities of Plantinga's characteristically interesting account are discussed in the section on individual essences in the entry on actualism) Kripke's quote above hints that obstinate rigidity might afford this kind of advantage. But Kripke never argues for one position or another. Despite occasional slips in favor of one or another refined version of rigidity, he deliberately sidesteps these “delicate issues” when he gives them his full attention (1980, p. 21, n. 21).

There are stronger and weaker brands of necessity corresponding to the possible notions of rigidity. Kripke argues that a sentence like ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is at least “weakly” necessary (1971, p. 137): true in all those possible worlds in which Hesperus exists and Phosphorus exists. The statement may enjoy a stronger necessity, too, which would render it true in all worlds, period.[1] In this entry, “necessity” is to be understood as weak necessity (at least).

1.3 Grammatical Categories and Rigid Expressions

Rigidity is most straightforwardly applied to proper names of concrete objects. There is general agreement that ‘Hesperus’ and ‘George W. Bush’ refer rigidly.

Rigidity is also applied commonly to indexicals, like ‘now’ or ‘you’. If, when I use ‘you’ in a context, my utterance means something like the person at the door, then presumably it is not rigid. You may be at the door, but in another possible world it is another philosopher who comes visiting. On the other hand, if (as Kaplan proposes: 1989a) ‘you’ refers directly to an individual, without amounting to a disguised description meaning the same as a description like ‘the person at the door’, then it would seem to be rigid. So if I say, pleasantly surprised, “You made good time,” we could discuss reasons for this and conditions under which this might not have been the case, but in all of our considerations the same individual, and not anyone else who might have been at my door in good time or not, is the one in question. The individual in question is the one who is in fact identical to you (as any account could put it).

There is some controversy over the relationship between rigidity and indexicals. According to some writers, ‘you’ means, in some contexts at least, something like the person at the door, so it is not used rigidly (Nunberg 1993; Smith 1989 §5). Often, but not always, such views are motivated by considerations about propositional attitudes (see, for further discussion, see the entry on indexicals, the section on indexicals in the entry on reference, and the section connecting possible worlds and structured propositions in the entry on structured propositions).

Another category of singular terms is definite descriptions. Some definite descriptions, like ‘the successor of 2’, are counted as rigid by nearly everyone: see §2.1. No one supposes that all definite descriptions are rigid (on all uses: see §2.3.1); as we have seen, ‘the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ is not rigid.

Terms for natural kinds like ‘gold’ and ‘water’ are widely supposed to function as singular terms some of the time. They are frequently counted as rigid. Other singular terms for properties that are sometimes counted rigid include ‘redness’ and ‘loudness’. More controversial are singular terms for properties that are more artificial: ‘bachelorhood’, or ‘soda pop’.

Not just singular terms but also general terms, like ‘tiger’, ‘hot’, and ‘red’ are often recognized as rigid (following Kripke's suggestion: 1980, p. 134). These terms raise complications not present for singular terms.

Objections to counting terms for kinds and properties rigid, whether they are singular or general, are discussed below (§4.2).

Terms from other grammatical categories, as well, might admit a rigid/non-rigid distinction. Philosophers have not attended much to the status of verbs and adverbs, in this connection. Compare ‘to begin writing’, ‘to commence writing’, and ‘to do what the teacher commanded at time t’ (where the command was, “Begin writing”). Evidently, the necessity of ‘One is about to begin writing if and only if one is about to commence writing’ is not enjoyed by ‘One is about to begin writing if and only if one is about to do what the teacher commanded at time t’. Arguably, the reason for the modal differences has to do with the rigidity or non-rigidity, in some appropriately extended sense, of the contained verbs. Something similar applies to adverbs. Compare ‘She ran quickly’, ‘She ran fast’, and ‘She ran in the manner signaled by her coach’ (where the signal means: Run quickly!). There is room for contributions to the literature in this area of extension.

2. Relations Between Rigidity and Associated Theories and Phenomena

Rigidity is generally discussed in the literature in connection with several theories about reference that were introduced or reintroduced or discussed feverishly about the time Kripke called attention to rigid designation. The relationship between rigidity and these other theories, which is often blurred in the literature, can be brought into focus in a way that is fairly uncontroversial, in many instances.

2.1 Direct Reference

About the time Kripke named rigidity, Kaplan named the theory of “direct reference” (in “Demonstratives,” eventually published as 1989a: see 1989b, p. 571). As the theory is usually understood, it is the position that the semantic content of a name or other directly referring expression is nothing more than the referent: the referent is all that the name contributes to a proposition expressed by a sentence containing it. So there is no descriptive information semantically conveyed by a directly referring expression. If we think of propositions as “structured entities looking something like the sentences which express them,” as Kaplan invites us to do, we can think of directly referring terms as terms whose contribution to a proposition lacks the structure that characterizes the contribution of definite descriptions. In the case of a definite description, “the constituent of the proposition will be some sort of complex, constructed from various attributes by logical composition. But in the case of a singular term which is directly referential, the constituent of the proposition is just the object itself” (Kaplan 1989a, p. 494; see also the section relating possible worlds and structured propositions in the entry on structured propositions).

Direct reference theorists (e.g., Soames 2002, pp. 240, 243), also called “Millians” after J. S. Mill, insist that ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ and ‘Hesperus = Hesperus’ express the same proposition or share the same content. At first glance, these statements appear to say different things, but if ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ contribute no descriptive information (like is a morning star or is an evening star) to the proposition expressed by either sentence, but only the referent, which is the same for each term, then the sentences have to say the same thing despite first appearances.

It is generally acknowledged that rigidity cannot be identified with direct reference. That is because some expressions designate rigidly by means of describing the designatum: e.g., ‘The successor of 2’, which rigidly designates 3. Kripke calls designators like ‘The successor of 2’ rigid de facto, rather than rigid de jure: the description happens to be satisfied by the same object in every possible world and never anything else. Compare the intuitively distinct case of de jure rigidity in a name, like ‘George W. Bush’. Here the intent is to refer to this person in all possible worlds, whatever descriptions may designate him.

Even though there are rigid designators that are not directly referential, it is plausible to suppose that all directly referential expressions are rigid designators (as Kaplan suggests: 1989b, p. 571). Rigid directly referential expressions would evidently be rigid de jure. According to some philosophers (Salmon 1981, p. 33 note 35), it would be metaphysically possible to coin non-rigid directly referential expressions, by devising some means of assuring that they change their designatum from world to world; even this claim may be controversial (cf. Soames 2002, pp. 264–5; King 2001, p. 311), modest as it is, as a claim about possible languages rather than English, French, etc.

Let me take stock briefly. Not all rigid expressions are directly referential; there are descriptions that are rigid de facto. But it is plausible that all directly referential expressions, assuming there are any, are rigid and rigid de jure. There remain the questions of whether all terms that are rigid de jure would have to be, and whether they are, directly referential.

The theory of direct reference for names is so intimately associated with the theory that names are rigid de jure that some philosophers have supposed that names cannot be rigid in this way, because names are not directly referential (see Fitch's 2004 discussion, p. 54). But there are reasons for supposing that an expression could be rigid de jure without being directly referential (as some direct reference theorists agree: e.g., Kaplan 1989b, p. 577 note 25; cf. Salmon 2003, p. 486–7; see also Stanley's 1997a discussion: 570–1). If expressions could be rigid de jure without being directly referential, then even if names are not directly referential, they might be rigid de jure.

Here are some considerations in favor of saying that an expression could be rigid de jure without directly referring to its designatum. Suppose that ‘Petrarch’ is, contrary to direct reference theorists, a disguised description, shorthand for ‘The famous humanist most closely associated, in α, with the Italian Renaissance’, where ‘α’ is a name for the actual world. This is one simple, though perhaps not highly plausible, account available to opponents of the theory of direct reference: it will do for illustration of this point.[2] If this descriptive account is correct, then ‘Petrarch’ is rigid: in any other possible world w, ‘Petrarch’ designates the entity that, in α (not w), is the famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance. That person is Petrarch. ‘Petrarch’ refers to the same individual in all possible worlds and never to any other individual, so it is rigid. Plausibly, in this circumstance ‘Petrarch’ is also rigid de jure and not de facto: after all, it is by stipulation or design that the term refers, in all possible worlds, to the same item. This term is assigned the task of picking out in any world the item that meets certain world-indexed descriptive requirements (for discussion of world-indexed properties, see Plantinga 1974, pp. 62–5). The designatum must first be picked out in α by whether it meets the descriptive requirements (with or without the indexing) there in α: but the purpose of the indexing is to keep the term referring, with respect to other worlds, to that same item picked out originally in α by virtue of meeting the right requirements there.

If the above considerations are sound, then there could be rigid de jure terms that fail to be directly referential. Whether there in fact are any rigid de jure terms in natural language that fail to be directly referential depends on whether the theory of direct reference is correct or not. Direct reference theorists hold that widely recognized examples of terms that are rigid de jure, like ordinary proper names (‘George W. Bush’, ‘Petrarch’, ‘Italy’), are directly referential, and many seem to think that all terms that are rigid de jure are directly referential. “Descriptivists,” who oppose direct reference, hold that ordinary proper names and the like are not directly referential: they may hold that no terms are directly referential, doubting the coherence of direct reference. Depending on which camp is right, names and other rigid de jure terms may or may not be directly referential.

So, while opponents of the theory of direct reference are free to deny that names are rigid or rigid de jure (as, e.g., Rosenberg does: 1994), it is hardly clear that this is a general requirement for accounts opposed to direct reference. Many opponents of the theory of direct reference maintain that names are rigid or rigid de jure (Plantinga 1985, pp. 82–7; Sidelle 1992; 1995; Justice 2003). Kripke remains uncommitted one way or the other about the theory of direct reference (1979; 1980, pp. 20–21), but of course he is the first to come to mind among those committed to the position that proper names are rigid de jure (1980, p. 21, n. 21).

2.2 Causal Grounding

Another theory of reference that was named about the time ‘rigid designator’ was coined, and that is widely associated with rigid designation, is the causal theory of reference. All that is relevant here is one method of term dubbing associated with that theory. According to a typical causal theorist, many terms are coined in a “baptismal ceremony,” during which the dubber points at an object in her perceptual field (hence, the object's causal role), and establishes reference by appeal to this object. The baptismal object might become the referent, if the term's coiner says something to this effect: “Term t is to be used for that object.” The baptismal object might also be a sample of a substance that becomes the referent, if the term's coiner says something to this effect: “Term t is to be used for the substance instantiated by that object.” Or the object might have some other connection to the referent, as might happen if the term's coiner says something to this effect: “Term t is to be used for the ceremonial function of that ancient artifact,” or “Term t is to be used for the leader of that wolf pack.” Most of these examples involve a definite description, which is used to “fix the reference” (Kripke 1980, pp. 54–6, 135), and not as a synonym: the term is to apply to the designatum even with respect worlds in which it does not satisfy the description. In all of these examples, whether the relevant term designates in a given instance depends on the properties of the object used to ground reference in the baptismal ceremony. The relevant properties may not be known to the term's coiner.

Some philosophers seem to think that rigid terms are just those coined in accordance with a baptism like the above.[3] But causal grounding is not closely tied to rigidity. Since many philosophers deny that rigidity applies to designators for kinds (see §4.2), designators for other entities serve better to illustrate. First, designators that are rigid can fail to be causally grounded. ‘The successor of 2’, which is rigid de facto, may be a case in point. ‘3’ might be an example of a rigid de jure term that is not causally grounded. And there can evidently be terms for concrete objects that are rigid but not causally grounded. You coin ‘Joy’ in the following way: “‘Joy’ is to be used for the most joy-filled individual.” Here you use the description to fix the reference, not as a synonym: whatever individual is most filled with joy is the designatum, even when we are discussing worlds in which that same individual is glum. Reference is not secured by way of causal grounding; you never point to anything in a baptismal ceremony.[4] Yet the designator is rigid.

So designators that are rigid might fail to be causally grounded. Designators that are causally grounded might also fail to be rigid. You find an old painting. After engaging in some convoluted discussion about legal ownership, you decide to clarify your terms: “Let the expression ‘Originalowner’ designate, for any possible world w, the original owner in w of that painting” (you point at the painting). You have causally grounded ‘Originalowner’ by means of a baptismal ceremony; but the referent varies from world to world, depending on who first owned the painting. The term is not rigid.

2.3 Descriptivism

I have suggested that names might be disguised descriptions that are world-indexed. Of course, they might not be disguised descriptions that are world-indexed, too (a popular objection is discussed below in §2.3.2; for more objections, see Soames 2002, pp. 39ff.); but the point here is that so far as the thesis that names are rigid designators is concerned, the matter could go either way. In sections (2.3.1) and (2.3.2), I discuss strategies for maintaining descriptivism according to which a name like ‘Petrarch’ has the same content as a traditional, non-world-indexed description like ‘The famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance’.

2.3.1 Names as Wide-Scope Descriptions

One proposal to defend traditional, non-world-indexed descriptivism has taken the label “widescopism.” According to this proposal, the rigidity of names is or may be treated as a matter of scope. ‘Petrarch’, on this view, may be a disguised ordinary description meaning the same as ‘The famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance’. It is natural to think that ‘Petrarch’ cannot have this semantic content, since ‘Petrarch might not have been famous’ seems unambiguously true, but ‘The famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance might not have been famous’ has a false reading. It can have the same truth conditions as a scoped sentence something like, ‘It might have been the case that: for some x, x is the famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance and x has never been famous’, which is false. But according to the proposal in question, the false reading for ‘The famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance might not have been famous’ does not show that ‘Petrarch’ fails to mean the same as ‘the famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance’. The other reading is the relevant one. According to that reading, the name takes wide scope, and the truth conditions are the same as those for a sentence like, ‘For some x, x is the famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance and it might have been the case that: x has never been famous’, which is true.

Kripke (1980 pp. 11–15) points out that there are problems with this attempt to accommodate rigidity. Some sentences have no modal operators. When we evaluate these sentences with respect to other worlds, we do not seem to admit that the designatum changes, as it would if names were non-rigid descriptions taking the proper scope in modal contexts. Thus, we can describe a possible world in which Petrarch dies as an infant. With respect to such a world, would ‘Petrarch is never famous’ be true? It seems so. But on the proposal in question, the sentence would say the same as ‘The famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance is never famous’, which is false with respect to any world. Also, it seems that we can make names appear inside the scope of a modal operator: “It might have been the case that: Petrarch never became famous.” This would apparently be impossible to do on the view in question, but we seem to be able to do it. On the basis of such considerations, Kripke rejects this proposal for accommodating rigidity within descriptivism.

Kripke's arguments seem to have persuaded most of his audience, and his principal target, Michael Dummett, has responded by making some modifications (1981, pp. xvii-xix). But the issue is not dead; more sophisticated versions of this basic Dummettian position continue to be defended by able philosophers (see, e.g., Sosa 2001; Hunter 2005; cf. Caplan 2005; Everett 2005).

2.3.2 Assertoric Content and Ingredient Sense

Assuming that Kripke's arguments against widescopism are successful, it might appear that any statement S containing a proper name cannot have the same content as a statement S′ that differs from S just in the respect that a proper name in S is replaced by a non-rigid designator in S. Following Stanley (whose precise formulations differ slightly from this and from each other: 1997a, pp. 568–9; 1997b, p. 135), we might call this the Rigidity Thesis.

But Dummett has still another suggestion that, if successful, would refute the Rigidity Thesis (or at least one understanding of it: see note 7). Consider the similarity between (1)–(4):

(1) The famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance wrote the epic Africa

(2) The famous humanist now most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance wrote the epic Africa

(3) The famous humanist here most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance wrote the epic Africa

(4) The famous humanist in α most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance wrote the epic Africa.

In some intuitive sense, it might seem that these statements share the same content. Thus, for example, what one believes when one assents to any of (2)–(4) might seem to be what one believes when one assents to (1). Even so, (1)–(4) contribute different semantic values to complex sentences in which they are embedded. What one believes when assenting to (1′) is not what one believes in assenting, say, to (2′):

(1′) It will always be the case that the famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance wrote the epic Africa

(2′) It will always be the case that the famous humanist now most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance wrote the epic Africa.

(1′) is dubiously true, at best. It might well be that Lorenzo Valla will overtake Petrarch at some future time, being a famous humanist more closely associated with the Italian Renaissance than Petrarch. And Valla did not write the epic Africa. On the other hand, (2′) is true, at least assuming, for the sake of an illustration, that (1) and (2) are true. On that assumption, it does not matter that Valla might overtake Petrarch later: that will be too late to affect their respective status as it is now.

Given that (1)–(4) make different semantic contributions to complex sentences in which they are embedded, must we reject the earlier suggestion that they share the same content? Here we might use a tip from Dummett to resist an affirmative answer. We might acknowledge that (1)–(4) share the same truth conditions, which amount to at least one bona fide use of ‘content’. Thus, for Dummett, a speaker who could classify sufficiently detailed possible states of affairs[5] into those that render any statement like these “correct and those that render it incorrect, may be said to know the assertoric content of the sentence” (1991, p. 48). And we might also acknowledge a distinct phenomenon that is responsible for different contributions (1)–(4) make to larger sentences in which they are embedded: Dummett calls this distinct phenomenon a sentence's “ingredient sense.” “Ingredient sense is what semantic theories are concerned to explain” (p. 48).

Armed with the distinction between assertoric content and ingredient sense, we might reject the Rigidity Thesis. We might maintain that (1)–(4) have the same assertoric content and hence that they say the same thing: anyone who asserts one of these (or believes it, rejects it, and so on), also asserts the others. Where they differ is in ingredient sense.

There are a number of lines of thinking that converge on the conclusion that (1)–(4) share the same assertoric content even though they differ in ingredient sense. I have already suggested that some might find it natural to take (1)–(4) as expressing the same “semantic content” in some meaningful sense (perhaps the only meaningful sense: see note 7): if so, Dummett's distinction indicates how one might coherently maintain that position. Such a position might be especially natural in view of “descriptive names,” like Evans’ famous ‘Julius’, which is a rigid designator for whoever invented the zipper (Evans 1979). It might seem natural to say that ‘Julius is an inventor’ has the same content as ‘Whoever invented the zipper is an inventor’, even though the former is contingent and the latter necessary.

There are other related considerations in favor of saying that (1)–(4) share the same assertoric content even though they differ in ingredient sense: here I merely sketch a couple of considerations from Stanley, who develops Dummett's suggestion in admirable detail in a series of interesting papers (1997a, 1997b, 2002). First, one might maintain that what one asserts, when one asserts (1), is simply true or false, and not true now but false later, true here but false in some other community where Valla is more highly esteemed than Petrarch, true in α but false in other possible worlds. Yet what (1) contributes to the likes of (2)–(4) is not simply true or false: it is rather something like a function from times, places, or worlds, respectively, to truth values. That function generates a different truth value depending on the argument (Stanley 1997a, p. 577; see also King 2003 §1; for related claims, see Lewis 1998). Hence, the line of thinking concludes, what is asserted, when one asserts (1), is assertoric content and not ingredient sense.

Another line of thinking by which one might argue that (1)–(4) share the same assertoric content even though they differ in ingredient sense starts from general considerations about what kind of animal “content” is. For Stanley, the content of a statement is closely tied to what it is used to communicate in normal contexts, where “normal” has to do with the competence of speakers, their intentions to use words as others do, and so on (1997b, 136; 2002). In such contexts, he says, (1)–(4) are used to communicate the same thing. So they have the same content, the same meaning. Meaning, which facilitates communication in the right contexts, is constituted by presuppositions on the part of speakers. In contexts of modal evaluation, two sentences asserting the same thing can diverge in their contribution to larger sentences or diverge in truth value with respect to counterfactual worlds under consideration because “meaning-constituting presuppositions are irrelevant for modal evaluation. It is the purpose of modal evaluation to suspend presuppositions,” on this way of thinking about content (Stanley 2002, p. 338; see also 1997b, p. 155).

If the distinction between assertoric and ingredient sense is tenable, and if (1)–(4) share the same assertoric content even though they differ in ingredient sense, so that the Rigidity Thesis is false, then this opens the door to holding that proper names share the same content as ordinary, non-indexed descriptions after all, even though names are rigid and ordinary, non-indexed descriptions are not rigid. In that case, something along the lines of the venerable descriptivism associated with Frege and Russell (see the subsection on description theories in the entry on reference and the section on descriptive theories of proper names in the entry on descriptions), which Kripke is widely thought to have devastated, survives. One way to develop a descriptivism along these lines would be to say that a name like ‘Petrarch’ is something like a disguised description that is shorthand for ‘the famous humanist most closely associated in α with the Italian Renaissance’. Although this description for which ‘Petrarch’ is shorthand is world-indexed, it shares the descriptive content of the non-indexed ‘the famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance’. On this suggestion, since ‘Petrarch’ shares the content of the rigid description, it also shares the content of the nonrigid description.

Kripke's reservations about a position like that just described go deeper than arguments from rigidity or indeed arguments from any considerations pertaining to the metaphysics of modality: there are quite distinct worries about whether speakers would have to be in possession of the relevant descriptive information to use ‘Petrarch’, for example. Could not someone refer to Petrarch by ‘Petrarch’ if she supposed that Valla were the famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance and she associated with ‘Petrarch’ only the description ‘a clergyman who criticized the Avignon papacy’? If so, a standard argument runs, the content of ‘Petrarch’ cannot be the same as that of ‘the famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance’. There may be a few descriptive names of the relevant variety in natural language: Dummett adduces ‘St. Joachim’, which he takes to have been “introduced as denoting the father of the Blessed Virgin, whoever that may have been” (1991, p. 48), and Kripke adduces ‘Jack the Ripper’, introduced for the murderer of so and so (1980, 79–80). But it is unlikely that there are many such descriptive proper names in natural language. Still, it may be that more sophisticated descriptivisms appealing to more sophisticated descriptions could overcome worries like these further, non-metaphysical worries about typical names (see, e.g., Nelson 2002).

2.3.3 Descriptivism, Anti-Descriptivism, and the Importance of Rigidity

None of the above considerations (from §2.3.2) in favor of the fruitfulness of distinguishing assertoric content and ingredient sense is beyond controversy. One might resist (for a clear and interesting discussion that is critical, see Everett 2005, pp. 125–38; see also Shieh 2001, pp. 379–80). But the question of whether the foregoing descriptivist line of thinking is sound, or whether any descriptivist line is sound, is less important here than the question of what rides on the answer for rigidity.

If the Dummettian line of thinking from §2.3.2 is sound, does rigidity lose its interest? It would appear that the answer is No.[6] The fundamental work for rigidity sketched already in §1.1 and discussed in greater detail below in §3 seems largely independent of these issues.

The fundamental work in question concerns the metaphysics of modality, for the most part. But assertoric content does not have much to do with the metaphysics of modality, so observations about content are unlikely to undermine or to pertain to the significance of rigidity's work: “the propositional content of a sentence in a context is not its modal content” (Stanley 2002, 338).[7]

Some of the fundamental work discussed below concerns epistemology: e.g., the issue of whether a sentence like ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is a posteriori as well as necessarily true. Would the above considerations from the foregoing section (§2.3.2) undermine Kripke's ideas here, at least, even if the considerations do not undermine Kripke's ideas about modality? That seems unlikely. On the contrary, the claim that names, though rigid, share the semantic content of descriptions seems likely to vindicate Kripke's claims about the epistemic status of statements like the above, if anything. That is because one could say that ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ differ in assertoric content (in an extended sense, applied to designators rather than statements) but they do not differ in ingredient sense or modal content. Because they do not differ in ingredient sense or modal content, being rigid designators for the same thing, ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is necessarily true. Because they do differ in assertoric content, ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is a posteriori; ‘Hesperus = Hesperus’, by contrast, is a priori since both occurrences of ‘Hesperus’ have one and the same assertoric content. So descriptivism of this sophisticated sort suggests one means to retain Kripke's epistemic claims. Anti-descriptivism in the form of direct reference, by contrast, is incompatible with at least one interpretation of the claim that ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is “a posteriori” (but only one interpretation: see below §3.1), because on the theory of direct reference, ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ just share the same content, end of story: so ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ shares the same content as ‘Hesperus = Hesperus’, which is a priori just in virtue of content (again, on one interpretation of the claim that the statement is “a priori”).

Rigidity's work is compatible with descriptivism. Although some philosophers seem to have the impression that the important work that rigidity performs is to refute descriptivism, this seems to be a mistake. A related impression is that the important work that Kripke performs is to refute descriptivism: the rigidity of terms and more just falls out of anti-descriptivism, so anti-descriptivism is what really matters at bottom (see below, §4.2). But there are strong reasons to resist this assessment of rigidity's importance or lack thereof, too.

First, it can be replied that even if names are non-descriptive, directly referring terms, it does not follow that they are rigid: a directly referential designator can be nonrigid, at least in principle (see §2.1). If this thought is right, then the work that rigidity performs for names does not follow from anti-descriptivism. More is required.

Further, even if rigidity does follow from anti-descriptivism, anti-descriptivism does not follow from rigidity: so rigidity's work is not limited to that of direct reference. We have seen that descriptive designators may be rigid: e.g., world-indexed designators. But rigidity performs much of the same work on these as on arguably nondescriptive expressions like names. For example, ‘The evening star in α = the morning star in α’ would seem to be a necessarily true, a posteriori statement whose necessity and aposteriority cannot be explained in terms of the nondescriptive nature of the designators flanking the ‘=’ sign.

Suppose we limit our consideration to names. By ignoring non-names, we can ignore descriptive designators that are rigid, provided that names are nondescriptive, directly referring designators: suppose again that they are. Suppose, further, that rigidity follows from anti-descriptivism. Even granted these assumptions, it might be wise to distinguish sharply the significance of rigidity from that of the theory of direct reference. That is because rigidity's importance does not hang on the outcome of controversies surrounding the theory of direct reference. For contexts in which the theory of direct reference is taken for granted, rigidity and its consequences at least for names might be helpfully explained in terms of how they follow from direct reference: direct reference can take center stage. But contexts abound in which the theory of direct reference cannot be taken for granted, since it is a controversial theory (as proponents concede: Salmon 2003, p. 475; Soames 2005, p. 3). In such contexts, it is unhelpful or misleading to explain rigidity's significance, which obtains regardless of the fate of direct reference, in terms of direct reference. Along the same lines, there are contexts in which direct reference is called into question; it should not be thought that rigidity is thereby called into question. The fate of rigidity's significance is distinct from the fate of direct reference's significance.[8]

Finally, even if direct reference is to be taken for granted and rigidity for names does follow from direct reference, one might not draw the conclusion that rigidity loses interest. Here is an analogy. Few would say that if the theory of special relativity, with all of its claims about the relativity of space and time, follows from the theory of general relativity, then special relativity loses interest because in that case, general relativity is what really matters: special relativity and much more just follow from it. There is evidently something wrong with this attempt to devalue the theory of special relativity. It would be better to say that part of what is interesting about general relativity concerns its implications for the relativity of space and time, as explained by the theory of special relativity: special relativity retains its interest as part of a larger, more fundamental theory. In the same way, rigidity might be said to lose no interest even if it is explained by something more fundamental.

It might be tempting, then, to think that if descriptivism survives, then rigidity is useless because its work, which is to refute descriptivism, is left unperformed. It might also be tempting to think that if descriptivism is defeated but by considerations that are more fundamental than rigidity and that give rise to rigidity, then rigidity is superfluous because its work is performed but by other phenomena. The foregoing paragraphs offer reasons for thinking that these tempting lines of thought are erroneous. If these reasons are sound, then unless there are other, quite unheralded ties between rigidity and descriptivism or its opposition, rigidity's interest would seem to be largely independent of the fate of these rival theories about semantic content.

3. Philosophical Work for Rigidity.

As I have indicated, rigidity does interesting epistemological and metaphysical work. In sections (3.1)–(3.5) below, I discuss various areas of work.

3.1 The Necessary A Posteriori

Basic epistemological and metaphysical work performed by rigidity is indicated in §1.1. Because of the rigid designation of the names it contains, ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is necessarily true. Since empirical work on the part of astronomers was required to determine that the statement is true, we seem to have an illustration of necessary, a posteriori truth. Thus, rigid designation seems to play a crucial role in securing necessity with surprising epistemological significance. Prior to discussion about rigid designation, the necessary a posteriori was generally thought to be an empty category. Rigid designation, along with other referential mechanisms discussed in connection with it, like reference fixing and causal grounding, has changed all that. Thus, Putnam observes that rigidity has “startling consequences for the theory of necessary truth” (1975, p. 232).

Since Kant there has been a big split between philosophers who thought that all necessary truths were analytic and philosophers who thought that some necessary truths were synthetic a priori. But none of these philosophers thought that a (metaphysically) necessary truth could fail to be a priori (Putnam 1975, p. 233).

There is no question that a major reason for excitement about rigidity is that it underwrites the necessary a posteriori (Schwartz 2002, pp. 270ff.). However, in light of the theory of direct reference, this apparent coup may have been overstated or misunderstood. As I have observed (§2.1), direct reference theorists insist that ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ and ‘Hesperus = Hesperus’ express the same proposition or share the same content even though these statements have the appearance of saying different things. For direct reference theorists, to say that Hesperus = Phosphorus is to say no more and no less than to say that Hesperus = Hesperus. Since it is a priori that Hesperus = Hesperus, it is a priori that Hesperus = Phosphorus. For this reason, the claim that rigidity presents propositions that are necessarily true and a posteriori might be disputed (Soames 2002, pp. 240, 243; Salmon 1986, 133–42; Fitch 1976; for further discussion, see Fitch 2004, pp. 110–13; Hughes 2004, pp. 84–108).[9]

So it is controversial, though common, to say that rigidity assures that the proposition Hesperus = Phosphorus is necessarily true and a posteriori. On the other hand, it may be less problematic or less controversial to say that rigidity assures that the sentence or statement (interpreted sentence) ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is necessarily true even though we can find this out only a posteriori (Fitch 2004, pp. 110–13; LaPorte forthcoming; Hughes 2004, pp. 106–7; cf. Kripke 1980, pp. 20–1). If it is tenable to say that rigidity assures that some sentences or statements like this are necessarily true though a posteriori, further questions immediately impose themselves. Here is a salient question: Does the aposteriority that characterizes the necessarily true statements retain its epistemological significance and surprise, given that it is associated with statements rather than propositions? The question carries some importance in view of the popularity of Millianism, but it has not been discussed much in the literature, despite all of the debate about the correctness of Millianism.

Here is one challenge to the proposal that the relevant statements are necessarily true and a posteriori in any interesting respect. The proposal apparently amounts to this: the sentence ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is necessarily true as it is used by English speakers and it is an a posteriori matter to determine that it is. But if this is all that the a posteriori necessity of ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ amounts to, then all necessary statements are a posteriori in the relevant way. So, the necessary a posteriori loses its interest. To find out how English speakers use any sentence at all, one needs an empirical look at the world. Even ‘The circle cannot be squared’, which is generally regarded as a priori, seems to come out a posteriori on the account. It is an a posteriori matter to determine that ‘The circle cannot be squared’ is necessarily true as used by English speakers. The reader might determine whether the intended position lacks interest in this or other ways. There are niches to be filled hereabout in the literature.

3.2 The Contingent A Priori

According to Kripke, a proper understanding of rigidity also reveals that some contingent statements are a priori. Kripke considers the standard meter stick, which has been used to define the length of one meter. Someone decreed that the expression ‘one meter’ is to be used for the unit of length of that stick, perhaps at a certain time in the stick's existence. The stick, S, might not have been the length that it was at the time ‘one meter’ was coined: had it been heated or cooled it might have been longer or shorter. As things are, it was not heated or cooled. So the sentence ‘One meter = the length of S (at time t0)’ is true in the actual world but it is false in some possible worlds: it is contingently true. Yet S has been used to define ‘one meter’, in the sense that it fixes the reference (see §2.2), so the definers of ‘one meter’ know a priori the truth of the sentence ‘The length one meter is instantiated by S (at time t0)’. The reason that the sentence is contingently true is that ‘one meter’ is a rigid designator for the length one meter. ‘The length of S (at time t0)’ is, on the other hand, a non-rigid designator for one meter; in this world it designates one meter but in other worlds, those in which S is heated or cooled, ‘the length of S (at time t0)’ designates other lengths.

The contingent a priori has not been as widely discussed as the necessary a posteriori. The introduction of the contingent a priori is perhaps less surprising than the introduction of the necessary a posteriori, in view of the plausible contingency of a priori statements that philosophers all along recognized, like the plausible contingency of the statement, as uttered in a context, ‘I exist’. Further, Kripke's examples of the contingent a priori are perhaps more controversial than his examples of the necessary a posteriori. Many dispute that the examples really are examples of the contingent a priori (Plantinga 1974, pp. 8–9n.; Donnellan 1977; Hughes 2004, pp. 84–107). And if even if they are contingent and a priori, many feel they lack much significance. They are not “scary,” as Donnellan puts it (also Fitch 2004, p. 121). On the other hand, confusions are like loose threads: they sometimes work their way to apparently remote material. Confusion about the contingent a priori can and arguably does lead to confusion and apparent paradox in unsuspected areas of philosophy (an alleged example is discussed in LaPorte 2003). Kripke (1980, pp. 14–15) recalls that considerations about the contingent a priori led in his mind to a number of clarifications concerning designation, which again is hardly surprising given the interconnectedness of different issues in a fabric.

3.3 Essentialism

The statements of necessity associated with rigid designation are interesting from an epistemological standpoint, as I have stressed. Of course, they are also interesting from a metaphysical standpoint.

What first comes to mind in connection with rigid designation is traditional essences. Intuitively, rigid designation is needed on the part of both designators if there are to be true “theoretical identity statements”: statements in which a designator designates by way of expressing explicitly in some manner one of the designatum's theoretically interesting essences. The argument is not often put explicitly. I outline explicitly the line of reasoning in order to bring out more clearly what stands or falls with rigidity.

Not all identity statements widely accepted as necessary specify a theoretically interesting essence in the relevant respect. ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ or ‘Cicero = Tully’ do not; each sentence contains only names for an object. But take, on the other hand, ‘Cicero = the organism descended from sperm s and egg e’, where ‘s’ and ‘e’ are names for the right sperm and egg. Many regard this sentence as necessarily true and revealing of a theoretical essence of Cicero: roughly, a theoretically interesting property possessed by Cicero in all possible worlds and never possessed by anyone else.[10] In order for any identity statement to be true of necessity, both designators must be rigid if either is. And if ‘the organism descended from sperm s and egg e’ indeed expresses an essence of Cicero, it must designate just Cicero in all possible worlds, and hence rigidly: so, given that the statement at issue is necessarily true, ‘Cicero’ must be rigid, too. Alternatively, if ‘Cicero’ is rigid, as is widely acknowledged, then in order for the statement at issue to be necessarily true, ‘the organism descended from sperm s and egg e’ must be rigid and so express an essence of Cicero.

I have discussed a line of reasoning according to which rigid designation is needed for certain statements to come out necessarily true. Usually, rigidity is discussed with a view not to its being necessary for the completion of a job but rather with a view to its being sufficient for the completion of a job. The rigid designation of both designators flanking an identity sign in a true theoretical identity statement is sufficient to establish the necessity of the statement. If we acknowledge that ‘the organism descended from sperm s and egg e’ is rigid, and we acknowledge that ‘Cicero’ is rigid, then we are committed to the necessity, in case of truth, of ‘Cicero = the organism descended from sperm s and egg e’. The reasoning is parallel to that given for the case of ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ above.

‘Cicero = the organism descended from sperm s and egg e’ shows that statements about individuals can, in effect, be theoretical identity statements. The most commonly discussed theoretical identity statements concern kinds. They include ‘Gold = the element with atomic number 79’ and ‘Water = H2O’ (Kripke 1980, pp. 138–40, 148). Similar reasoning might apply. Here the reasoning is again nearly always left implicit; I am filling in gaps to present a general line of thought that seems to accord with a widely held, if not widely articulated, tradition. For that tradition, in order for it to be the case that ‘Water = H2O’ is necessarily true, both designators must be rigid if either is. So if the statement is necessarily true and either ‘water’ is rigid by virtue of being a name for a substance or else ‘H2O’ is rigid by virtue of expressing an essence, both designators need to be rigid. And again, the rigidity of designators in a true theoretical identity statement is sufficient for the statement's necessity. If ‘H2O’ is a rigid designator of a substance, and ‘water’ is a rigid designator of a substance, and ‘Water = H2O’ is true, then that statement is necessarily true.

Theoretical identity statements are of interest across the gamut of philosophy. Various writers appeal to rigid designation to support views about the essences not only of kinds from chemistry or biology but also kinds from philosophical subdisciplines apparently far removed from empirical science: ethics and aesthetics, for example (see, e.g., Carney 1982; Gampel 1997; Leddy 1987). The reader interested in pursuing any of these traditions should beware that applied philosophers who make use of rigidity in the various subdisciplines frequently confuse rigidity with other phenomena recognized by popular theories of reference: see clarifications above in §2.

By far, the most attention concerning theoretical identity statements has focused on the area of philosophy of mind. That is next on the agenda.

3.4 Mind

Kripke appeals to rigid designation in arguing against the identity theory of mind, which is really a constellation of theories. A broad division between identity theories can be drawn between type identity theories and token identity theories. Type identity would obtain if and only if every mental event type were identical to some physical event type or other. According to some accounts, the type pain, which can be exemplified in different bodies (I stub my toe, you feel a mild headache from stress), is identical to the type c-fiber firing, which is a type of brain event that can again be exemplified in different bodies. Token identity would obtain if and only if every particular mental event (this pain I feel now after stubbing my toe, that pain you feel now in your forehead), is identical to a particular brain event, which might be this firing of c-fibers in my head, that firing of c-fibers in yours.

Here I offer a standard Kripkean argument against token identity theories, which are often thought to be more compelling than type identity theories. Kripke is typically understood to put forward something like this argument.

The Argument Against Token Identity: Suppose that every particular mental event is identical to some particular brain event. Then we can take some pain and name it ‘P’, and we can do the same for the corresponding brain event, calling it ‘C’ (for “c-fiber firing,” assuming for the sake of argument that that is the corresponding brain event). According to the identity theory, P = C. But in reality, PC. C could have existed without P: that very c-fiber firing could have obtained even while there was no corresponding P. Your c-fibers could have been blasting away even as you felt nothing at all. In the same way, P could have existed without C. You could have felt that same dull, throbbing sensation in your forehead without the corresponding c-fibers having ever acted up. Now, merely showing that C could have existed without P and that P could have existed without C does not yet belie ‘P = C’. For this statement might be true necessarily or contingently. Since P and C could each exist without the other, the statement cannot be necessarily true. But there is still the possibility that the statement is contingently true. There are contingently true statements, as we have seen: e.g., ‘Hesperus = the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’. However, it cannot be that ‘P = C’ is contingently true, as ‘Hesperus = the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ is. ‘Hesperus = the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ is contingently true because ‘Hesperus’ is a rigid designator and ‘the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ is non-rigid. Because ‘Hesperus’ and ‘the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ designate the same object at the actual world, ‘Hesperus = the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ is true; because ‘Hesperus’ and ‘the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ designate different objects at some other worlds, ‘Hesperus = the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ is false at those other worlds. That is why ‘Hesperus = the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ is true but contingently so. ‘P = C’, on the other hand, contains two rigid designators. ‘P’ is a name for that very pain, and so rigidly designates it. ‘C’ is a name for that very brain event, and so rigidly designates it. Because ‘P’ and ‘C’ are both rigid designators, ‘P = C’ has to be true of necessity if it is true at all. Since it is not true of necessity, it is not true at all.

Some premises in this bare-bones argument are in obvious need of support, like the modal intuition that P and C could have existed each in the absence of the other. Support has been provided and rejected by different writers. Many philosophers who reject anti-materialist arguments along these lines nevertheless make use of rigid designation as a resource in order to frame materialist views that recognize a parallel between ‘P = C’ and ‘Water = H2O’.

Kripke's views concerning the philosophy of mind could hardly be called popular. But, as the introduction to an edited volume covering the topic says, “Even authors who disagree with Kripke's fundamental picture tend to present their arguments against an implicitly or explicitly Kripkean backdrop—including most of the authors in this volume” (Gendler and Hawthorne 2002, p. 26), the contributions to which provide a good start on the literature.

3.5 Rigidity at Work in Arguments from Two-Dimensionalism

High-profile two-dimensionalists often embrace the broad conclusions associated with rigidity, so that those conclusions are now often discussed in connection with two-dimensionalism. The relevant arguments from two-dimensionalists may concern the same identity statements as those at issue in simpler, familiar arguments from rigidity: when that is the case, rigidity can typically be seen to play a salient role similar to the one that it plays in the simpler, familiar arguments.[11] I illustrate below, by appeal to garden-variety two-dimensionalist arguments for the necessary a posteriori and the contingent a priori.

I discuss the contingent a priori first. According to the Kripkean argument from section (3.2), ‘One meter = the length of S (at time t0)’ is contingent but a priori. Recall that the length of S (at time t0) is determined by temperature, in part, and that in a hotter or colder world it would have differed. ‘One meter = the length of S (at time t0)’ is true at our temperate world, but false in counterfactual worlds that are hotter and colder, since ‘the length of S (at time t0)’ has a different value at those worlds but ‘one meter’ has the same value, being rigid for the length that, as it happens, the stick instantiates at time t0. The contingency of the statement can be represented in a one-dimensional diagram like that below: three worlds differing in truth value are represented horizontally and below them are the respective truth values (ignore the bottom two rows and the information at the far left).

Table 1

Considered as counterfactual
Considered as actual

But even if one is convinced by Kripke that the content of the sentence that Kripke discusses is contingent and a priori, one might have the sense that something is necessary, too. This suggests that there might be more than one semantic value for ‘one meter’ and the above sentence containing it. If there is more than one semantic value, then the diagram could be filled out to capture another value (or, potentially, more). One line of thinking according to which there are two values for an expression is the Dummettian line of reasoning from section (2.3.2). An enriched, two-dimensional diagram might capture this as well as any number of other suggestions for differentiating apparently distinct semantic values.

Here is a garden-variety way of developing the suggestion that the relevant sentence has more than one kind of semantic value. Take the horizontal row at the top of the diagram to represent worlds as we consider them counterfactually (or, in the case of the actual world, factually) from the actual world. Take the column on the far left to represent worlds that could, in some sense, “turn out” to be actual: when we consider any of these worlds w, we consider the value of the sentence at various counterfactual or factual worlds represented horizontally, given that our world turns out to be w. Thus, should the temperate world turn out to be actual, as it has, then the sentence ‘One meter = the length of S (at time t0)’ would be true in the temperate world, but false at the counterfactual hot world and cold world, where the temperature alters the length of the stick: the top row of ‘T’s and ‘F’s indicates this. The next row, which is not completely filled out, indicates that should the hot world turn out to be actual, the sentence ‘One meter = the length of S (at time t0)’ is true at that world. Here I assume that the ceremony is still performed on the stick in similar fashion: suppose that dubbers would not have chosen another stick to serve as a standard because the difference of length is so subtle that it could be detected only with technology that became available after the baptism. The final row indicates that should the cold world turn out to be actual, the sentence ‘One meter = the length of S (at time t0)’ is true at that world.

A little reflection indicates that the missing truth-value indicators in the diagram are all ‘F’s. For example, if the cold world turns out to be actual, then the sentence ‘One meter = the length of S (at time t0)’ is true at that world, as the diagram indicates. From the perspective of the cold world, or on the assumption that that world is actual, the expression ‘one meter’ rigidly designates some length l, which is the length of S at that world, but which is a little shorter than the length of S at the warmer worlds. Since at the warmer worlds, the length of S is longer than l, even though ‘one meter’ is rigid for l, again from the perspective of the cold world, the sentence is false at the warmer worlds, considered from the perspective of the cold world. So there should be a couple of ‘F’s to the left of the ‘T’ in the last row. Something similar can be said for the middle row.

The sentence has more than one intension, or function from worlds to truth values, given the two dimensions. There is not only the one-dimensional intension that Kripke recognizes (which corresponds to Chalmers’ secondary intension: 1996, p. 57; Jackson's C-intension: 1998, pp. 48-52; and otherwise-labeled intensions for others, e.g., Davies and Humberstone: 1980; see also Davies 2004, p. 87; Stalnaker 1978); there are other intensions, including that depicted in the diagonal string of ‘T’s (Chalmers’ primary intension; Jackson's A-intension, and again otherwise-labeled intensions for others). The diagonal string of ‘T’s indicates that something about the content of the relevant sentence is necessarily true. We might say that the sentence is “deeply necessary,” adapting similar use by Evans (1979), as Evans is famously interpreted by Davies and Humberstone (1980; for a more extended discussion that is clear, see Soames 2005, chap. 6). Correspondingly, we might say that the sentence is only “superficially contingent.” What is necessarily true might be the epistemic content, the thought, the “meaning” in some intuitive sense that differs from the semantic value captured by the horizontal dimension, or something else.

A similar diagram might make perspicuous the aposteriority of ‘Water = H2O’. We may compare that sentence with ‘Watery stuff = wet, drinkable … stuff’, where ‘watery stuff’ just means stuff that is wet, drinkable …. The relevant statements are assigned a truth value, which might be thought of as a statement's extension. The key designators are also assigned an extension, which may be understood here as that to which they apply, as ‘watery stuff’ applies to H2O in w1.

Table 2

Considered as counterfactual
Considered as actual
(the watery stuff is H2O)
(the watery stuff is XYZ)
(the watery stuff is H2O)
  1. ‘Water = H2O’ (T)
  2. ‘Watery stuff = wet, drinkable … stuff’ (T)
  3. ‘Water’, ‘watery stuff’, and ‘H2O’ all apply to H2O.
  1. ‘Water = H2O’ (T)
  2. ‘Watery stuff = wet, drinkable … stuff’ (T)
  3. ‘Water’ and ‘H2O’ apply to H2O.
  4. ‘Watery stuff’ applies to XYZ.
(the watery stuff is XYZ)
  1. ‘Water = H2O’ (F)
  2. ‘Watery stuff = wet, drinkable … stuff’ (T)
  3. ‘Water’ and ‘watery stuff’ apply to XYZ.
  4. ‘H2O’ applies to H2O.

The top horizontal row of ‘T’s indicates that ‘Water = H2O’ is necessary. The diagonal runs TF for ‘Water = H2O’. According to a standard version of two-dimensionalism, this indicates that the content of the statement is not a priori.[12] Compare ‘Watery stuff = wet, drinkable … stuff’. This is a priori, as well as necessary. ‘Watery stuff’ just is a designator for stuff that is wet, drinkable, and so on.

These two-dimensionalist arguments for the contingent a priori and the necessary a posteriori appear to make implicit use of rigidity. The horizontal intension of ‘water’, ‘one meter’, and the like plays a crucial role in the respective arguments for the status of sentences containing these terms as necessary a posteriori or contingent a priori. But the horizontal intension plays this crucial role by way of indicating rigidity or the lack thereof for the respective terms.[13] Thus, for example, every box along the relevant horizontal row in the diagram associates ‘water’ with H2O, which seems (as Chalmers observes: 1996, p. 132) to be a kind or property found at the different worlds. If, even so, ‘water’ fails to be a rigid designator for H2O because it does not apply to matter that is H2O with respect to some metaphysically possible worlds that are missing from the completed diagram, then the completed diagram can not be trusted, in the way that it is supposed to be trusted, to indicate the metaphysical necessity of ‘Water = H2O’: so the diagram can not be trusted, in the way that it is supposed to be trusted, to indicate that statement's status as necessary but a posteriori.

Further, two-dimensionalist arguments might make natural use of rigidity. We might recognize a “horizontal rigidity” and a “diagonal rigidity,” corresponding to the relevant intensions. Thus, one might say that ‘water’ is a horizontally rigid but not a diagonally rigid designator for H2O; ‘H2O’ is both a horizontally rigid and a diagonally rigid designator for H2O. Kripke would say that if both designators in an identity statement rigidly designate the same entity, then the statement is necessarily true, as ‘Water = H2O’ is. A two-dimensionalist naturally understands this claim as one that concerns horizontal rigidity: for her, if both designators in an identity statement rigidly designate the same entity horizontally, then the statement is necessarily true, as ‘Water = H2O’ is. A two-dimensionalist adds that if both designators rigidly designate the same entity diagonally, then the statement is a priori, as ‘Watery stuff = wet, drinkable … stuff’ is, or as ‘H2O = H2O’ is. However, if one designator in a true identity statement but not the other rigidly designates an entity like H2O diagonally, then the statement is a posteriori, as ‘Water = H2O’ is. In this way two-dimensionalist lines of thinking might be expressed naturally by appeal to rigidity.[14] 

These arguments, which address the necessary a posteriori status of ‘Water = H2O’ and the contingent a priori status of ‘One meter = the length of S (at time t0)’, concern identity statements. Neither Kripke nor anyone else discusses the importance of rigidity for other kinds of statements, which introduce complications. Although the Kripkean antimaterialist argument from section (3.4) addresses an identity statement, ‘P = C’, and accordingly uses rigidity to establish that statement's falsity, the famous two-dimensionalist arguments against materialism that have received so much attention since the publication of Chalmers' powerful The Conscious Mind (1996) address statements concerning supervenience or constitution, not identity. Accordingly, the work performed by rigidity is less clear. It would seem that rigidity is at work in securing various claims about the modal status of statements about constitution, and not just claims about the modal status of statements about identity. Thus, we might argue for the necessity of the statement, ‘If David exists, then David is constituted by the clay Lumpl’ (see section 4.1): but if ‘David’ and ‘Lumpl’ are nonrigid shorthand for descriptions like ‘the statue in the corner’ and ‘the clay that Kim bought last week’, then the alleged necessity cannot obtain, since ‘If the statue in the corner exists, then the statue in the corner is constituted by the clay that Kim bought last week’ is not true with respect to every possible world. I leave to the reader the task of determining how much work rigidity plays in well-known two-dimensionalist antimaterialist arguments concerning constitution. Two-dimensionalists frequently avoid making salient appeals to rigidity (Chalmers 1996, p. 149, p. 374, note 26; cf., by contrast, the two-dimensionalist argument discussed by Gendler and Hawthorne 2002, pp. 54–55), but of course rigidity may be doing work in the background. Because arguments in the style of Chalmers are so high profile, I discuss their relationship to the Kripkean antimaterialist argument from section (3.4) in the supplementary document

Two-Dimensionalism Against Materialism.

4. Objections to Rigidity

Various objections to the coherence or usefulness of rigidity have been put forward by specialists in the philosophy of language; but criticisms from this subdiscipline do not seem to have done much to damage the widespread appeal of rigidity. Rigid designation and the accompanying necessity, even with respect to terms for properties, which are the most controversial candidates for rigidity, are commonly taken for granted in mainstream literature from various areas of philosophy (see above, §3).

Whether philosophers are on the whole entitled to embrace rigidity is another matter, even if the criticisms derail. There is a case for saying, in particular, that rigidity and the necessity accompanying it stand or fall with a robust version of the analytic-synthetic distinction (LaPorte 2004, chap. 6, §II). If that case is solid, then either popular Quinean antagonism toward analyticity should prompt the rejection of rigidity or else the appeal of rigidity should prompt the rejection of the familiar antagonism toward analyticity.

In what follows, I address resistance to rigidity. I save for its own subsection (§4.2) treatment of objections specifically directed at the application of rigidity to terms for properties, which are more contentious candidates for rigidity than terms for concrete objects, like ‘Hesperus’.

4.1 Objections to Rigidity in General

There are various arguments against the coherence or applicability of rigidity with respect even to concrete object designators (for discussion, see Fitch 2004, pp. 102–10), but there is relative calm. As Hughes says, the position “that proper names are rigid, and that identity statements involving only proper names are accordingly necessarily true or necessarily false,” is “as close to uncontroversial as any interesting views in analytic philosophy” (2004, p. vii). Even so, one not altogether-sympathetic line of response to the usual understanding of rigidity, sometimes spun as a modification rather than a rejection, deserves discussion as a salient minority opinion. It appears to some (e.g., Gibbard 1975) that not all identity statements containing just names are necessarily true. Consider this scenario: you mold one chunk of clay into the top half of a statue, and another chunk of clay into the bottom half. You stick the halves together, thus bringing into existence both a statue, call it ‘David’, and a large lump of clay, call it ‘Lumpl’. Suppose, next, that you explode the statue: both David and Lumpl go out of existence. It is tempting to say that ‘David = Lumpl’ is true, but not necessarily true. It could have been that: David exists and Lumpl exists but ‘David ≠ Lumpl’ is true. This would have been the case had Lumpl survived David: e.g., had you squeezed the clay statue into a ball, thereby changing the shape of the relevant lump of clay, instead of exploding it, thereby bringing an end to the lump of clay.

If both ‘David’ and ‘Lumpl’ are rigid designators, then ‘David = Lumpl’ is necessarily true if it is true in any possible world at all. So, if it is even possible that David ≠ Lumpl, then David ≠ Lumpl. David and Lumpl are distinct, however intimately related, because they have different modal properties: Lumpl could instantiate ballhood, while David could not. The rigidity of ‘David’ and ‘Lumpl’ evidently requires as much. In order to say that ‘David = Lumpl’ is contingently true, Gibbard gives up the thesis that ‘David’ and ‘Lumpl’ are rigid designators in the usual respect. He maintains that designators are rigid only with respect to a sortal: ‘David’ is statue-rigid, always referring to the same statue, while ‘Lumpl’ is lump-rigid, always referring to the same lump. Accordingly, ‘Possibly, David is no statue’ is false, while ‘Possibly, Lumpl is no statue’ is true. What about the object that is, as a matter of fact, both a statue and a lump? For Gibbard, objects have no modal properties and it makes no sense to say that an object in some other possible world is identical to an object in the actual world. This is counterintuitive, but Gibbard does offer a non-standard semantics to accommodate modal talk.

David Lewis (1986, chap. 4) offers a similar strategy for maintaining that ‘Possibly, David is no statue’ is false, while ‘Possibly, Lumpl is no statue’ is true. For Lewis, what makes a sentence like the above true or false is whether counterparts in other possible worlds associated with ‘David’ or ‘Lumpl’ are all statues. The use, in discourse, of different names like ‘David’ and ‘Lumpl’ can create different contexts, thus altering the counterparts that come into play in determining the truth of sentences containing the names. The sentences ‘Possibly, David is no statue’ and ‘Possibly, Lumpl is no statue’ can vary in truth value because the counterparts relevant to the truth value of the former sentence are all statues but the counterparts relevant to the truth value of the latter sentence are not.

Rigidity proponents who distinguish between the referents of ‘David’ and ‘Lumpl’ say that there is more than one object at the same place and time where the statue stands. The intimate relationship between David and Lumpl is understood as one of constitution: David is constituted by Lumpl. Constitution has been championed by various philosophers to address a variety of related issues (see, e.g., Baker 2000 on personal identity).

Another possibility in conformity with maintaining the rigidity of names despite these kinds of considerations avoids commitment to constitution. This is to maintain an eliminativism about statues or clay lumps. One might maintain that there is no real entity to name “David,” in the way that the story above requires; there is only Lumpl in a statuesque form. Accordingly, the problem of accounting for the modal status of a sentence to which ‘David’ contributes, like ‘David = Lumpl’, never arises. (For an appeal to eliminativism to handle various candidates for constitution, see Fitch 2001, pp. 382–3, 391 note 5; Hershenov 2005; Merricks 2001.) In order to work as a general alternative approach, eliminativism would have to work for all of a wide variety of would-be cases of constitution.

Notice that the unintuitive idea that more than one object can exist in the same place at the same time is not necessarily removed if we accept contingent identity. Gibbard, for example, acknowledges that Lumpl and David are distinct objects in any world w in which David but not Lumpl comes to an end by being squeezed into a ball; but despite the failure of identity to hold between David and Lumpl in w, the two share one spatiotemporal location before David is destroyed because the material of the clay lump that is Lumpl is precisely the material of David.

For further discussion of these issues, see papers in Rea (1997), including a well-done “Introduction.”

4.2 Objections to the Application of Rigidity to Terms for Kinds and Properties

Both Kripke (1980) and Putnam (1975) famously extend the notion of rigidity to terms for natural kinds. Here controversy has ensued. Let us begin with a singular term as an example; general terms introduce additional complications (for discussion, see Linsky 1984; Soames 2002; Salmon 2003; 2005; see also note 14 of this entry). What is rigidly designated by a kind term like ‘Apis mellifera’? Apparently it can not rigidly designate particular honeybees, since those honeybees that presently go about their work might not have existed. Others that do not exist might have existed instead. To be rigid, a term has to designate the same thing in all possible worlds.

Some philosophers have proposed that ‘Apis mellifera’ rigidly designates an abstract object, a kind or property. One might say that ‘Apis mellifera’ designates the honeybee kind in every possible world: it never designates any other kind, like the bumblebee kind, say. That might be said to make the term rigid. Something similar could be said for ‘water’, ‘heat’, and ‘redness’. But a number of objections have been issued.

The most common objection to this proposal is that something similar can be said about singular terms for artificial kinds or properties: ‘soda pop’ or ‘bachelorhood’. These would seem to designate an abstract object rigidly if terms for natural kinds and natural properties do. It has even been claimed that on the above proposal for the rigidity of kind and property terms, rigidity is so indiscriminate that the account must reflect a confusion between sameness of meaning across possible worlds, which every meaningful expression enjoys, and sameness of designation, or rigid designation (Schwartz 2002, p. 272). The basic objection can be also lodged against the view that general terms like ‘watery’, ‘honeybee’, ‘hot’, and ‘red’ are rigid by virtue of designating the right property in every possible world: again, the alleged problem is that something similar can be said for general terms like ‘bachelor’. For contrasting views, compare Schwartz (2002) and Soames (2002, pp. 250–1, 260–1) with LaPorte (forthcoming).

A second group of objections centers around the idea that the proposal seems committed to substantive metaphysical positions about abstract objects like kinds or properties, concerning which a theory of language ought to remain neutral (Devitt forthcoming; Haukioja forthcoming; Marti 1998, p. 487). For example, the proposal seems committed to rejecting nominalism. Some defenders of property terms' rigidity are happy so to commit (Linsky 1984). Other defenders of property terms' rigidity seek ways of accommodating nominalism (Marti 1998). Even if we are happy to commit to properties, problems remain. Some authors maintain that there are so many properties that allegedly non-rigid designators for properties always end up rigidly designating some property or other in the plenum: for example, ‘the element most discussed in philosophy’, a candidate non-rigid designator for gold, may be said to designate rigidly the property of being the element most discussed in philosophy. For discussion, see Devitt (forthcoming); LaPorte (forthcoming); Linsky (forthcoming); Schwartz (2002); Soames (2002, pp. 261–2).

Yet another kind of objection, if it should be called that, is that rigidity does, in some respect, the work attributed to it; but rigidity is superfluous to the task of explaining that work because the work is the result of other, more fundamental phenomena (see Soames, e.g., pp. 310–11, for one approach along these lines). This objection has been discussed in the context of a treatment of property designators, but it might be raised with respect to the rigidity of any term at all.[15]

In what might be viewed as a compromise, some philosophers of language who abandon rigid designation for properties nevertheless hold that general terms like ‘honeybee’ are rigid because they rigidly apply to their extensions. What makes the application of a general term rigid is that any item to which the term applies, in any possible world, is part of the extension of that term in all worlds in which it exists (Cook 1980; Devitt forthcoming; Devitt and Sterelny 1999, pp. 85–6). The notion of rigid application might hold some attraction for someone bothered by the objections just mentioned against the view that terms rigidly designate properties. It would appear that terms for natural kinds come out rigid: thus, ‘honeybee’ is rigid because any particular honeybee is essentially a honeybee and could not have been something else like a dragonfly or a fir tree instead. But ‘lawyer’ does not apply rigidly. And the position appears to be open to nominalism: along with defenders of rigid application and everyone else, nominalists recognize the legitimate application of general terms.

However, even if rigid application evades the above difficulties, it has its limitations. In particular, consider identity statements like ‘Water = H2O’, or ‘Red light = light with wavelength 680 nm’. Rigidity is apparently supposed to guarantee the necessity, in case of truth, of identity statements like these. Typically, fans of rigid application rewrite identity statements to have this form: ‘Anything is (a) P if and only if it is (a) P′’. But many philosophers, including proponents of rigid application, have pointed out that it could be the case for two general terms P and P′ that, (i) ‘necessarily, every P is essentially P and every P′ is essentially P′’, is true, so that ‘P’ and ‘P′’ are rigid appliers and (ii) in the actual world, ‘Anything is P if and only if it is P′’ is true, even though (iii) ‘God might have created a P that is not a P′’ is also true. In that event, ‘Anything is P if and only if it is P′’ comes out true with respect to the actual world but not necessarily true.


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actualism | a priori justification and knowledge | descriptions | essential vs. accidental properties | God: and other necessary beings | identity | identity theory of mind | indexicals | individuals | names | natural kinds | physicalism | properties | propositions: structured | qualia | reference | truth: necessary vs. contingent


I am grateful to Jason Stanley for discerning comments on an earlier draft that brought about substantial changes for the better.