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Russell's Moral Philosophy

First published Mon Dec 17, 2007

Russell remains famous as a logician, a metaphysician, and a philosopher of mathematics, but was notorious in his own day for his social and political opinions. He wrote an immense amount about practical ethics — women's rights, marriage and morals, war and peace, and the vexed question of whether socialists should smoke good cigars. (They should.) And unlike present-day practical ethicists (with a few notable exceptions such as Peter Singer) he was widely read by the non-philosophical public. But though he was famous as a moralist and famous as a philosopher, Russell does not have much of a reputation as a moral philosopher in the more technical sense of the term. Until very recently, his contributions to what is nowadays known as ethical theory — meta-ethics (the nature and justification, if any, of moral judgments) and normative ethics (what makes right acts right etc) — were either unknown, disregarded or dismissed as unoriginal. Perhaps Russell would not have repined, since he professed himself dissatisfied with what he had said ’on the philosophical basis of ethics’ (RoE: 165/Papers 11: 310). But since he took an equally dim view of what he had read on that topic, the fact that he did not think much of his own contributions does not mean that he thought them any worse than anybody else's. In my view they are often rather better and deserve to be disinterred. But ‘disinterred’ is the word since some of his most original contributions were left unpublished in his own lifetime and what he did publish was often buried in publications ostensibly devoted to less theoretical topics. Thus his brilliant little paper ‘Is There an Absolute Good’, which anticipates Mackie's ‘The Refutation of Morals’ by over twenty years, was delivered to a meeting of the Apostles (an exclusive, prestigious but secret Cambridge discussion group of which Moore, Russell and Ramsey were all members) in 1922 and was not published until 1988, whilst his version of emotivism (which anticipates Ayer's Language, Truth and Logic (1936) by one year, and Stevenson's ‘The Emotive Meaning of Ethical Terms’ (1937) by two) appeared towards the end of a popular book, Religion and Science (1935), whose principal purpose was not to discuss the nature of moral judgments but to do down religion in the name of science. However, Russell's dissatisfaction with his writings on ethical theory did not extend to his writings on social and political topics. ‘I have no difficulty in practical moral judgments, which I find I make on a roughly hedonistic [i.e. utilitarian] basis, but, when it comes to the philosophy of moral judgments, I am impelled in two opposite directions and remain perplexed’ (RoE: 165-6/Papers 11: 311). His perplexity however was theoretical rather than practical. He was pretty clear about what we ought to do (work for world government, for example), but ‘perplexed’ about what he meant when he said that we ought to do it.

One point to stress, before we go on. Russell took a pride in his willingness to change his mind. Obstinacy in the face of counter-arguments was not, in his opinion, a virtue in a scientifically-minded philosopher. Unfortunately he overdid the open-mindedness, abandoning good theories for worse ones in the face of weak counter-arguments and sometimes forgetting some of his own best insights (a forgivable fault in given the fountain of good ideas that seemed to be continually erupting in his head). Russell's mental development, therefore, is not always a stirring tale of intellectual progress. His first thoughts are often better than his second thoughts and his second thoughts better than his third thoughts. Thus the emotivism that was his dominant view in the later part of his life is vulnerable to objections that he himself had raised in an earlier incarnation, as was the error theory which he briefly espoused in 1922. Nobody should be surprised, therefore, if I sometimes deploy an earlier Russell to criticize one of his later selves. Whitehead is reported to have said that Russell was a Platonic dialogue in himself, and in this temporally extended debate quite often it is one of the younger Russells who wins the argument.

1. Moore's Influence on Russell

Russell's destiny as an ethical thinker was dominated by one book — G.E. Moore's Principia Ethica (1903). Before 1903, Russell devoted some of the energy he could spare from German Social Democracy, the foundations of mathematics and the philosophy of Leibniz to working out a meta-ethic of his own. After 1903, he became an enthusiastic but critical convert to the doctrines of Principia Ethica (though there is some evidence that the conversion process may have begun as early as 1897). Moore is famous for the claim that there is a ‘non-natural’ property of goodness, not identical with or reducible to any other property or assemblage of properties, and that what we ought to do is to maximize the good and minimize the bad. Russell subscribed to this thesis — with certain important reservations — until 1913. Thereafter he continued to believe that if judgments about good and bad are to be objectively true, non-natural properties of goodness and badness are required to make them true. It is just that he ceased to believe that there are any such properties. Does this mean that judgments about good and evil are all false? Not necessarily (though Russell did subscribe to that view for a brief period during 1922). An alternative theory is that moral judgments are neither true nor false, since their role is not to state facts or to describe the way the world is, but to express emotions, desires or even commands. This (despite some waverings) was Russell's dominant view for the rest of his life, though it took him twenty-two years to develop a well worked-out version of the theory. He tended to call it subjectivism or ‘the subjectivity of moral values’ though it is nowadays known as non-cognitivism, expressivism or emotivism. He came to think that, despite their indicative appearance, moral judgments — at least judgments about what is good or bad in itself — are really in the optative mood. (A sentence is in the optative mood if it expresses a wish or a desire.) What ‘X is good’ means is ‘Would that everyone desired X!’. It therefore expresses, but does not describe, the speaker's state of mind, specifically his or her desires, and as such can be neither truth nor false, anymore than ‘Oh to be in England now that April's here!’ If I say ‘Oh to be in England now that April's here!’, you can infer that I desire to be in England now that April's here (since absent an intention to mislead, it is not the sort of thing I would say unless I desired to be in England and thought that April was here). But I am not stating that I desire to be in England, since I am not stating anything at all (except perhaps that April is here). (See RoE: 131-144/Religion and Science: ch. 9.) Although this was Russell's dominant view from 1913 until his death, he did not care for it very much. ‘I cannot see how to refute the arguments for the subjectivity of ethical values, but I find myself incapable of believing that all that is wrong with wanton cruelty is that I don't like it’ (RoE: 165/Papers 11: 310-11). It is not entirely clear what Russell took these overwhelming arguments to be. But one of them seems to have proceeded from a Moorean premise. Russell took Moore to have refuted naturalism, the view that although there are moral truths, nothing metaphysically out of the ordinary is required to make them true. Conversely Russell took Moore to have proved that if there were to be moral truths about which things were good or bad as ends rather than means, the truths in question would require spooky non-natural properties, of goodness, badness etc — quite unlike the ‘natural’ properties posited by science and commonsense - to make them true. In the supposed absence of such properties, he was driven to the conclusion that moral judgments (at least judgments about goodness and badness) were either all false or neither true nor false. Thus Russell remained a renegade Moorean even after he had ceased to believe in the Moorean good. But if Moore was a decisive influence on Russell, it seems that Russell was an important influence on Moore. For Moore may have been driven to invent his most famous argument for a non-natural property of goodness — the Open Question Argument - by the need to deal with a naturalistic theory of Russell's. But since this is rather speculative and concerns Moore as much as Russell, the discussion is in the

Supplement on the Open Question Argument

I now turn to another topic — absolute idealism and its rejection.

2. Sidgwick's Problem and the Rejection of Idealism

‘We called him “old Sidg” and regarded him as merely out of date’ (My Philosophical Development: 30). So said Russell of his teacher, the great Victorian moral philosopher, Henry Sidgwick (though he later thought that he and his contemporaries ‘did not give [Sidgwick] nearly as much respect as he deserved’). But though Russell may have regarded Sidgwick as an old fogey, he set the agenda for a lot of Russell's work on ethics in the 1890s. For Russell was much exercised by a problem that also bothered Sidgwick: the Dualism of Practical Reason. (See Sidgwick (1907): 496-516. See also Schulz (2004), ch. 4 in which it becomes abundantly clear how very preoccupied Sidgwick was with this problem.) According to Sidgwick, it is rational to do what is morally right (by maximizing pleasurable consciousness on the part of all sentient beings) and rational to do what is prudentially right (by maximizing pleasurable consciousness on the part of oneself), but, when the two come into conflict, the one does not seem to be any more rational than the other. If God exists, then He can ensure that it will pay in the long term to promote the public interest, by rewarding the righteous in the life to come. What is morally right will coincide with what is prudentially right, and that, consequently, is what Practical Reason will command. But if, as Sidgwick was reluctantly inclined to think, there is no God, what is morally right and what is prudentially right will sometimes come apart, and Practical Reason will speak with a divided voice. If it does not always pay to be good, then it is not clear that is more rational to be good than to be bad, a conclusion that Sidgwick found deeply disturbing. The rather priggish young Russell was bothered by the problem too (a solution, he said, would be ‘a real solid addition to my happiness’) because, like Sidgwick, he did not believe in God. But as a fashionable young philosopher of the 1890s he did believe in something that he thought would do nearly as well, namely, the Absolute. For at this time, Russell, like most of his philosophical contemporaries in the English-speaking world, was a neo-Hegelian or Absolute Idealist. Though we may seem to be living in a material world and to be material boys and girls, this is an Appearance only. Reality, the Absolute, is basically mental, a sort of timeless and harmonious group mind of which our separate selves are (perhaps delusory) aspects. As Bradley put it, ‘the Absolute is one system, and … its contents are nothing but sentient experience. It will hence be a single and all-inclusive experience, which embraces every partial diversity in concord. For it cannot be less than appearance, and hence no feeling or thought, of any kind, can fall outside its limits.’ (I should stress that it is hard to present this doctrine concisely without gross caricature.) But there was a crucial difference between McTaggart and Bradley, the two leading idealists of Russell's day. McTaggart believed in personal immortality and claimed the harmony that already exists timelessly (so to speak) ‘must some day become explicit’ (McTaggart (1996): 210-211). Bradley did not.

At first Russell was an adherent of McTaggart. This afforded him a neat solution to Sidgwick's problem. The happy day when the harmony becomes explicit can be promoted or retarded by human action. If I benefit myself at your expense not only am I doing down a self with whom I am, in Reality, intimately linked — I am putting off the day when the harmony that Really Is becomes apparent. And since this harmony will be supremely pleasurable I am harming myself into the bargain. Hence morality and self-interest coincide and Practical Reason is reunited with itself. (See Russell (1893) ‘On the Foundations of Ethics’, RoE: 37-40/Papers 1: 206-211.) This illustrates the point made by a number of unkind critics, that in the late 19th century Absolute Idealism functioned as a sort of methodone program for high-minded Victorian intellectuals, providing them with moral uplift as they struggled to get off the hard stuff of official Christianity. (See Stove (1991), chs. 5 & 6, Allard (2003) and, in more restrained language, Griffin (2003b), pp. 85-88.) Before long however, Russell moved over to Bradley's camp and ceased to believe that the timelessly existing harmony would become manifest in time. Nevertheless, since we are all aspects of the Absolute, a sort of timeless super-self, there is essentially the same objection to indulging my desires at your expense as there is to indulging one of my own passions at the expense of others which are inconsistent with it. I am hurting, if not myself, at least a larger whole of which we are both parts. (Russell (1894) ‘Cleopatra or Maggie Tulliver’, RoE: 57-67/Papers I: 92-8.) But before long even this solution ceased to satisfy. In a paper not published until 1957, ‘Seems Madam? Nay It Is’, Russell argued (as he put it to Moore) that ‘for all purposes that are not purely intellectual, the world of Appearance is the real world’. In particular, the hypothesis that there is a timeless and harmonious Reality provides no consolation for our present pains since it is a Reality that we never get to experience. If ‘the world of daily life remains wholly unaffected by [Reality], and goes on its way just as if there were no world of Reality at all ‘, and if this world of Reality is a world that we not only do not but cannot experience (since experience is necessarily temporal), how can its alleged existence afford us any consolation for what seems to be (and therefore is) evil in the world of Appearance? (Russell (1897) ‘Seems, Madam? Nay, It Is’, RoE: 79-86/Papers 1: 105-111/Why I am Not a Christian: 75-82.)

Now this argument has an interesting corollary which Russell does not explicitly draw. It may be that in Reality the pains I inflict on you affect me — or at least a larger mind-like thing in which we both participate — but if I never experience those effects, how can this give me a motive to do or forbear if my interests conflict with yours? How can the fact that you and I are in Reality one (or at least part of one) give me a reason to look out for you, if this oneness is something I never experience? If Absolute Idealism can provide no consolation for life's disasters — which is what Russell is explicitly arguing — then it seems that it cannot supply me with a reason not to visit those disasters on you, if doing so is likely to benefit me. It may be that I suffer in a metaphysical sort of way when I profit at your expence, but if this suffering is something I never feel (since I am effectively confined to the world of Appearance) why should this bother me? Thus the Dualism of Practical Reason reasserts itself. Sometimes what is morally right is at odds with what is prudentially right and when it is, there seems no reason to prefer the one to the other.

Whether Russell realized this is not entirely clear. What is clear is that ‘Seems, Madam? Nay, It Is’ marks the beginning of the end for Russell's Absolute Idealism. Once he realized that ‘for all purposes that are not purely intellectual [including perhaps the purpose of providing moral uplift] the world of Appearance is the real world’, Russell came to feel that the world of Reality was no use for purely intellectual purposes either and soon resolved to do without it. A big ‘R’ Reality, that could neither console us for life's troubles nor reconcile duty and interest, was a big ‘R’ Reality that might as well not exist. The methodone of Absolute Idealism having failed, Russell was forced to accept appearances at face value.

But what about the problem of the Dualism of Practical Reason? In later life, Russell ceased to worry about it perhaps because he realized that it is a problem that cannot be resolved. The Cosmos of Duty really is a Chaos (as Sidgwick rather colorfully put it). Duty and interest can come into conflict and when they do there is no decisive reason for preferring the one to the other. All you can do is to try to instill moral and altruistic motivations, which is what Russell tried to do with his children. But when they asked why they should care about other people (as his daughter Kate definitely did) his response was rather lame.

Kate: ‘I don't want to! Why should I?’
Russell: ‘Because more people will be happier if you do than if you don't.’
Kate: ‘So what? I don't care about other people.’
Russell: ‘You should.’
Kate: ‘But why?’
Russell: ‘Because more people will be happier if you do than if you don't.’
(RoE: 16, Tait (1975): 185.)

This isn't much of an answer, but since the Cosmos of Duty really is a Chaos, it is perhaps the best that Russell could do.

3. Russell versus Moore: Two Kinds of Consequentialism

Although Russell became a convert to the doctrines of Principia Ethica, he disagreed with Moore on two important points. Russell, like Moore was what is nowadays known as a consequentialist. He believed that the rightness or otherwise of an act is ‘in some way, dependent on consequences’. But for the young Moore, it is ‘demonstrably certain’ (!) that ‘I am morally bound to perform this action’ is identical [that is synonymous] with the assertion ‘This action will produce the greatest amount of possible good in the Universe’. (PE: ch. 5, §89.) Thus it is analytic that the right thing to do is the action that will, actually produce the best consequences. But in Russell's view this claim is neither analytic nor true. Moore's own Open Question Argument can be deployed to prove that it is not analytic and a little critical reflection reveals that it is not true. ‘It is held [by Moore] that what we ought to do is that action, among all that are possible, which will produce the best results on the whole; and this is regarded as constituting a definition of ought. I hold that this is not a definition, but a significant proposition, and in fact a false one.‘ (RoE: 101/Papers 4: 573.) It is a ‘significant’ or non-analytic proposition because a competent speaker can believe that X is the act that will produce the best consequences without believing that he ought to do it. If the two propositions ‘X is the act available to me that will produce the best consequences’ and ‘I ought to do X’ were really synonymous, then a competent speaker could not believe the one whilst remaining doubt about the other. Since this is perfectly possible (as is shown by the fact that ‘Ought I to do what will have the best results?’ is an obstinately open question for competent speakers of English) the two claims are not synonymous.

But the fact that these claims are not synonymous does not show that it is false that I ought to do that act which will, in fact, produce the best consequences. The latter claim could be synthetic (or, as Russell would have it, ‘significant’) but true. Why does Russell think it false? Russell raises the ad hominem objection that Moore's thesis is flatly inconsistent with the moral conservatism that he goes on to embrace. According to Moore, although ‘there are cases where [an established moral] rule should be broken’, since ‘in some cases the neglect of an established moral rule will be the best course of action possible’, nevertheless, ‘we can never know what those cases are, and ought, therefore, never to break it.’ (PE: §99.) ‘The individual, therefore, can be confidently recommended always to conform to rules which are generally useful and generally practiced.’ But if we ought to perform the best action possible, what this implies is that there are some cases (though we can never know which) where we ought to do what it is not the case that we ought to do. Moore could avoid this contradiction by adopting the view that what we ought to do is that action which we have reason to believe will, produce the best consequences. As Russell himself put it, Moore's moral conservatism ‘implies that we ought to do what we have reason to think will have the best results, rather than what really will have the best results’ [my italics] — since, in any given instance, we may have reason to think that the conventionally right act will have the best consequences even though we know that this won't always be the case.

But Russell did not reject Moore's brand of consequentialism because it was inconsistent with his moral conservatism since he also rejected Moore's moral conservatism. As he informed Moore by letter, he regarded his views on Practical Ethics as ‘unduly Conservative and anti-reforming’. However, anybody who thinks that there are some actions which we ought to do even though, as a matter of fact they won't have the best consequences must, reject Moore's view. And it is precisely because he believes this that Russell rejects Moore's brand of consequentialism. ‘Some people’, says Russell, ‘whom I refrain from naming, might with advantage to the world have been strangled in infancy; but we cannot blame the good women who brought them up for having omitted this precaution.’ So if Stalin's mother (say) did the right thing in not strangling him at birth, then it follows that the right thing to do is not always the act with the best actual consequences. Russell admits that his view is not without paradox, since if it sometimes right to do what is actually disastrous, it follows that it can sometimes be ‘a pity [that] a man did his duty’, a thesis which Moore regards as ‘a contradiction in terms’. But paradoxical as this may seem, it is only a contradiction on the assumption that ‘the right action’ simply means ‘the action with the best actual consequences’, an assumption which Moore's Open Question Argument proves to be false. Moore's view, by contrast, is contradictory however ‘right’ and ‘ought’ are to be defined, since it implies that we sometimes ought to perform acts which (since they are not optimific) it is not the case that we ought to perform.

Russell's criticisms can be summed up as follows:

  1. It is false that ‘I am morally bound/I ought/it is right for me to perform this action’ is synonymous with the assertion ‘This action will produce the greatest amount of possible good in the Universe’, since the Open Question Argument can be deployed mutatis mutandis to prove otherwise.
  2. Moore subscribes to three theses that are flat-out contradictory:

    1. We ought to perform those acts that will in fact produce the best consequences.

    2. Following established rules does not always result in acts that produce the best consequences.

    3. We ought to follow the established rules.

    These three theses jointly imply that we sometimes ought to do things that it is not the case that we ought to do. Russell gently points out this contradiction and suggests, in effect, that Moore could resolve it by modifying (1) to (1′).

    1′. We ought to perform those acts which it is reasonable to believe will produce the best consequences.
  3. The ‘good women’ who brought up the likes of Hitler and Stalin cannot be blamed for not strangling them in infancy. This suggests that it was right of them to refrain even though the actual consequences of their acts of forbearance turned out to be horrendous. Thus the right thing to do is not that act which will actually produce the best consequences but that act which it is reasonable to believe will produce the best consequences.

Moore accepted argument A (See his ‘Reply to My Critics’: 558), and in his later book Ethics (1912) he treats consequentialism as a synthetic thesis. ‘It is, I think, quite plain that the meaning of the two words [‘expedience’ and ‘duty’] is not the same; for if it were then it would be a mere tautology to say that it is always our duty to do what will have the best possible consequences. Our theory does not, therefore, do away with the distinction between the meaning of the two words “duty” and “expediency”; it only implies that both will always apply to the same actions.’ (Ethics: 89). He also seems to have accepted Russell's ad hominem argument B — that, given the fairly obvious fact that doing the done thing does not always produce the best results, his actualist brand of consequentialism is inconsistent with his moral conservatism. However, he did not resolve the problem by modifying thesis (1) as Russell, in effect, recommended — instead he resolved it by dropping thesis (3). In Principia, moral conservatism had been ‘confidently recommended’ to the conscientious ‘individual’. By the time Moore came to write Ethics in 1912 it had simply disappeared, leaving the puzzled ‘individual’ bereft of practical guidance. What ought the individual to do, when, as is usually the case, she cannot determine, which of the available acts will have the best total consequences? Moore does not say, thereby sacrificing helpfulness to theoretical consistency.

4. Politics, Consequentialism and the Need for Skepticism

Dry and abstract as these disputes may seem, they are not devoid of practical import. A common complaint against consequentialism is that it encourages the consequentialist to do evil that good may come. If the goods to be achieved or the evils to be averted are sufficiently large, it may be not only permissible but obligatory to torture prisoners, execute hostages or to massacre civilians — so long as there is no other, less costly, way to achieve the goods or avert the evils. This is not only objectionable in itself — it encourages ruthless types to commit horrors in the here and now for the sake of some imagined utopia, whilst pretending to themselves and others that they are actuated by the highest motives. Because in principle consequentialism licenses doing evil that good may come, in practice it encourages fanatics to do evil even when the good to come is highly unlikely. In his ‘Newly Discovered Maxims of la Rochefoucauld’, Russell remarks that ‘the purpose of morality is to allow people to inflict suffering without compunction’. (Fact and Fiction: 184.) And consequentialist moralities have enabled some of their devotees to inflict a great deal of suffering, not only without compunction, but often with an insufferable air of moral smugness.

By adopting expected utility as the criterion of right action Russell goes some way towards meeting these objections. In practice when people propose to perpetrate horrors for the sake of some greater good, the horrors are usually certain and the greater good is highly speculative. In weighing up the options, the good to be achieved by some tough course of action must be multiplied by the probability of achieving it, which is always a fraction of one, and often a rather small fraction at that. So although doing evil that good may come is not excluded in principle, the expected utility theorist is far less likely to do it in practice — at least if he or she is intellectually honest. The classless society (let us suppose) would be a very good thing, but I am probably not justified in shooting the hostages to bring it about. For I can be certain that if I shoot them, the hostages will be dead, whereas the probability that shooting them will bring about the classless society is very low. Moreover there is likely to be an as-good-or-better chance that I can bring about the classless society without shooting the hostages. Thus even if the classless society would be supremely good, the expected utility theorist will not be justified in shooting the hostages to bring it about. The expected utility theorist may be obliged to do evil that good may come, but only if the good is large, highly likely given the evil, and most unlikely without the evil. These conditions are seldom met.

Thus Russell could use the criterion of expected utility against warmongers and enthusiasts for revolutionary violence who employed utilitarian patterns of reasoning to inflict suffering without compunction. It was (for example) one of his chief weapons in his polemics against the Bolsheviks during the 1920s. As he wrote in a review of Bukharin's Historical Materialism, ‘we do not know enough about the laws of social phenomena to be able to predict the future with any certainty, even in its broadest outlines … For this reason, it is unwise to adopt any policy involving great immediate suffering for the sake of even a great gain in the distant future, because the gain may never be realized.’ (RoE: 203/Papers 9: 371. Thus despite the desirability of socialism (in Russell's eyes at any rate) the Bolshevik program had to be rejected for utilitarian or consequentialist reasons. (See also The Practice and Theory of Bolshevism, particularly Part II. ch.iv.) The Bolshevik ‘habit of militant certainty about doubtful matters’ (Practice and Theory: xi) was not only irrational, but dangerous, since it led to pointless suffering. Hence ‘The Need for Political Skepticism’, the title of one of Russell's essays, and a major theme in his moral and political writing. (Sceptical Essays: ch. 11.) Dogmatism leads to cruelty since it encourages people to overestimate the likelihood that their objectives will be realized and hence to exaggerate the expected utility of persecuting policies. Scepticism (or ‘fallibilism’ as we would nowadays tend to say) is the antidote. Hence the maxim that Russell puts into the mouth of la Rochefoucauld: ‘It does not matter what you believe, so long as you don't altogether believe it.’ (Fact and Fiction: 185.)

5. Consequentialism, Emotivism and Moral Reform

The criterion of expected utility had another advantage for Russell. It allowed him to recommend a less ‘conservative and anti-reforming’ version of Moore's principle that ‘the individual can be confidently recommended … to conform to rules which are generally useful and generally practiced.’ Russell was an act-consequentialist rather than a rule-consequentialist. An act is right if the expected consequences of performing it are as good or better than any other. It is not right because it conforms to some rule, even a rule that it is generally useful to obey. Nevertheless, rules are necessary because we do not have world enough and time to calculate the consequences of every act. ‘I think that, speaking philosophically, all acts ought to be judged by their effects; but as this is difficult and uncertain and takes time, it is desirable, in practice, that some kinds of acts should be condemned and others praised without waiting to investigate consequences. I should say, therefore, with the utilitarians, that the right act, in any given circumstances, is that which, on the data, will probably produce the greatest balance of good over evil of all the acts that are possible; but that the performance of such acts may be promoted by the existence of a moral code’. (RoE: 216/Power: 168.) Thus Russell believed that it is generally right to obey ‘generally useful’ rules, though these are ‘rules of thumb’ and there may be circumstances in which it is right (that is obligatory) to break them. ‘Even the best moral rules, however, will have some exceptions, since no class of actions always has bad [or good!] results.’ (RoE: 137/Religion and Science: 227-8.)

But though Russell thought it is generally right to obey generally useful rules, he also thought that many of the rules that are ‘generally practiced’ are not ‘generally useful’. Sometimes they derive from bygone superstitions and sometimes they foster the interests of the powerful at other peoples' expense. ‘Primitive ethics …select certain modes of behavior for censure [or praise] for reasons which are lost in anthropological obscurity.’ (Education and the Social Order: 23.) However, ‘one of the purposes — usually in large part unconscious — of a traditional morality is to make the existing social system work. It achieves this purpose, when it is successful, both more cheaply and more effectively than a police force does … The most obvious example … is the inculcation of obedience. It is (or rather was) the duty of children to submit to parents, wives to husbands, servants to masters, subjects to princes, and (in religious matters) laymen to priests.’ (RoE: 207/Power: 157.) Thus Russell was inclined to agree with Plato's Thrasymachus, at least to the extent that what passes for justice is often [to] the advantage of the stronger [that is the ruling caste, class or gender]. Russell was opposed both to power-moralities (codes designed to bolster the interests of exploitative elites) and to the senseless and often pernicious remnants of defunct superstitions. ‘An ethic not derived from superstition must decide first upon the kind of social effects which it desires to achieve and the social effects which it desires to avoid. It must then decide, as far as knowledge permits. What acts will promote the desired consequences: these acts it will praise, while those acts having a contrary tendency it will condemn.’ (Education and the Social Order: 73.) It was Russell's mission as a practical moralist, a social reformer and a popular sage to promote a humane and non-superstitious ethic. This was partly a matter of preaching and partly a matter of argument: preaching as regards ends and argument as regards means.

In the latter, and more preachy, part of his career, it was Russell's dominant view that judgments about what things are good or bad as ends do not have a truth-value. To say that it is a good thing ‘that the individual, like Leibniz's monads should mirror the world’ (Education and the Social Order: 10) is to say something like ‘Would that everyone desired that that the individual, like one of Leibniz's monads, should mirror the world!’ Since this is neither true nor false, it cannot be rationally argued for. The best we can do is to remove objections and present the end in a favorable light. Russell was perfectly clear about this. ‘Why [should the individual mirror the world]? I cannot say why, except that knowledge and comprehensiveness appear to me glorious attributes in virtue of which I prefer Newton to an oyster. The man who holds concentrated within his own mind, as within a camera obscura, the depths of space, the evolution of the sun and its planets, the geological ages of the earth, and the brief history of humanity, appears to me to be doing what is distinctively human and what adds most to the diversified spectacle of nature.’ This is eloquent stuff (and too me, at least, convincing) but it hardly constitutes an argument. And this Russell freely admitted. ‘Ultimate values are not matters as to which argument is possible. If a man maintains that misery is desirable and that it would be a good thing if everybody always had a violent toothache, we may disagree with him, and we may laugh at him if we catch him going to the dentist, but we cannot prove that he is mistaken as we could if he said that iron is lighter than water … As to ultimate values, men may agree or disagree, they may fight with guns or with ballot papers but they cannot reason logically.’ (Education and the Social Order: 136.) This is rather disconcerting, especially if we replace the comic examples that Russell employs in Education and the Social Order (he imagines a prophet ‘who advance[s] the theory that happiness should be confined to those whose first names begin with Z’) with the real-life moral elitists and chauvinists that he discusses in other works of the 1930s and 1940s. Nietzsche and the Nazis really did believe that the sufferings of some people were not significant evils (herd-men in the case of Nietzsche, Jews, Slavs and Gypsies in the case of the Nazis) and it was Russell's thesis that no rational argument could be advanced against them. ‘Let us consider two theories as to the good. One says, like Christianity, Kant, and democracy: whatever the good may be, any one man's enjoyment of it has the same value as any other man's. The other says: there is a certain sub-class of mankind — white men, Germans, gentiles, or what not — whose good or evil alone counts in an estimation of ends; other men are only to be considered as means … When [irrelevant] arguments are swept away, there remains, so far as I can see, nothing to be said except for each party to express moral disapproval of the other. Those who reject this conclusion advance no argument against it except that it is unpleasant.’ (‘Reply to Criticisms’ RoE: 146-147/Papers 11: 48-49.) But unpleasant as this conclusion may be, it does not imply that those with a humane and egalitarian conception of the good should give up preaching on its behalf. On the contrary, such preaching becomes imperative, especially for those with rhetorical gifts. Which is why Russell devoted so much time and effort to this activity. ‘According to me, the person who judges that A is good is wishing others to feel certain desires. He will therefore, if not hindered by other activities, try to rouse these desires in other people if he thinks he knows how to do so. This is the purpose of preaching, and it was my purpose in the various books in which I have expressed ethical opinions. The art of presenting one's desires persuasively is totally different from that of logical demonstration, but it is equally legitimate.’ ’(‘Reply to Criticisms’ RoE: 149/Papers 11: 51.) Persuasion as regards ends may be a non-rational process, but that does not mean that it is irrational, let alone wrong, to engage in it.

When it comes to means however, rational argument becomes a genuine possibility. It might seem otherwise since judgments about what is right or what ought to be done — which for Russell are essentially concerned with means — would appear to be as incapable of truth as judgments about what is good and bad. In Russell's view, ‘the right act, in any given circumstances, is that which, on the data, will probably produce the greatest balance of good over evil’ and the right rule or policy is likewise the one that can be expected to produce the best effects. That is, ‘X is right ‘ is assertible (roughly, a sensible thing to say) when X can be expected to lead to the best results. But if ‘Y is good’, is really in the optative mood, amounting to the exclamation ‘Would that everyone desired Y!’, then ‘X is right’ would appear to be optative too, since it comes down to something like ‘X leads to more of what [would that everyone desired!]’ . Here, the clause in square brackets, which is obviously in the optative mood, infects the entire sentence with its optative character. ‘X leads to more of what [would that everyone desired!]’ in so far as it can be made sense of, does not seem to be the kind of thing that could be true or false.

However, Russell believed that judgments about what is right or what ought to be done can be given an analysis which gives them a sort of ersatz objectivity and hence the possibility of truth. If Dmitri has a reasonably determinate conception of the good, that is, a coherent set of opinions about which things are good and which bad, then although Dmitri's opinions themselves are neither true nor false — since, despite appearances they are not really opinions at all but optative expressions of Dmitri's desires. — it can nevertheless be true or false that X is good in Dmitri's opinion, that is, good-according-to-Dmitri. ‘Oh to be in England, now that April's here!’ is neither true nor false, but if I say it sincerely, it will in fact be true that I desire to be in England. Similarly, if Dmitri says that ‘Bungy-jumping is good’ what he says won't be true, since really it is in the optative mood, but if he says it sincerely, it will be true that Bungy-jumping is good in Dmitri's opinion, or good-according-to-Dmitri. Thus although there are no facts of the matter about which things are good or bad, there are facts of the matter about which things are believed by this or that person to be good or bad. Furthermore — and this is the crucial point — there are facts of the matter about whether a given action or a given policy is likely to promote what somebody-or-other believes to be good. Since Hitler believed that victory over Britain would be good, there was a fact of the matter about whether bombing London as opposed to bombing the RAF's airfields would be likely bring about the states of affairs that he desired. As it turned out, the policy he pursued did not produce results that were best-according-to-Hitler. Hence if Hitler had adopted a consequentialist reading of ‘ought’, and had indexed it to his own requirements, ‘I ought to bomb London’, would have been false. And its truth or its falsehood would have been a factually arguable question.

Now, suppose we define the right act with respect to B, not as ‘that which, on the data, will probably produce the greatest balance of good over evil’ but as ‘that which, on the data, will probably produce the greatest balance of what B believes to be good over what B believes to be evil’. The right rule of policy with respect to B will correspondingly be defined as the rule or policy that will probably in the appropriate circumstances produce the greatest balance of what B believes to be good over what B believes to be evil. Then, so long as B has a reasonably coherent set of ideals, the claim that a given act or policy is right or wrong with respect to B will usually have a determinate truth-value. Claims of the form ‘X is right wrt to B’ will be either true or false, so long as the person or persons designated by B has or have a clear and consistent set of values. There will thus be a fact of the matter about whether X is right wrt to B which can be the subject of rational enquiry. And if ‘B’ stands in for us (whoever ‘we’ may be) and if we share a reasonably coherent set of ideals, then there will be a fact of the matter about whether X is right or wrong with respect to our ideals. Thus if there is agreement with respect to ideals and if we adopt a consequentialist conception of rightness, indexed not to what is good but to what we believe to be good, then we can have a rational debate — maybe even a scientific enquiry — about the rights and wrongs of actions, rules or policies, or at least about their rightness or wrongness with respect to us. ‘The framing of moral rules, so long as the ultimate Good is supposed known, [Russell should have said ‘supposed agreed’] is a matter for science. For example: should capital punishment be inflicted for theft, or only for murder, or not at all? Jeremy Bentham, who considered pleasure to be the Good, devoted himself to working out what criminal code would most promote pleasure, and concluded that it ought to be much less severe than that prevailing in his day. All this, except the proposition that pleasure is the Good, comes within the sphere of science.’ (RoE: 137-138/Religion and Science: 228-229.) Once the ends have been agreed, we can have a rational debate about the code most likely to promote those ends. In some cases, such questions can be resolved by scientific enquiry, or at any rate by statistics. But (with one or two exceptions) rational argument is only really possible when we take the ends as read and confine our attention to the means.

We are now in a position to understand Russell's general strategy as a polemicist for moral reform and its relation to his emotivist meta-ethic.

1. He dismisses supposed duties that cannot be given a consequentialist justification as the products of bygone superstitions or, in some cases, the ideological props to predatory elites.

2. He uses non-rational methods to preach the goodness of some ends — a life inspired by love and guided by knowledge, mirroring the cosmos like one of Leibniz's monads etc. — and the evil of others. This is essentially a process of getting his readers to share his desires.

3. He then argues for his revised code of conduct as likely to promote those ends. Here there can be truth and falsehood and consequently rational argument, but only because ‘ought’ and ‘right’ have been given a consequentialist reading and indexed to the ends that Russell desires to promote.

6. Objections to Emotivism and Relativism

Thus Russell's meta-ethic was closely connected to his to his program of moral reform. The idea was to advocate a set of humane and egalitarian ends, using non-rational methods of persuasion, and then to argue on the basis of psychology, social science, history and common sense that that these ends would be best achieved if, on the whole, people obeyed a reformed moral code. Judgments that this or that is good or bad were to be construed as disguised optatives (‘Would that everyone desired X!’ and ‘Would that everyone desired not Y!’ respectively). ‘Ought’ and ‘right’ were to be given a consequentialist reading and indexed to the ends that Russell hoped his audience could be persuaded to share. Thus Russell combined an emotivist analysis of ‘good’ and ‘bad’ with a consequentialist/relativist reading of ‘ought’ and ‘right’. But was he right to do so?

Although Russell and Santayana were toying with emotivism in the 1910s, it was not until the 1930s that the theory really hit the philosophical headlines. Since then it has taken a beating, and although it still finds favor with the semi-philosophical public, it is no longer widely believed by professional philosophers. Relativism likewise is generally regarded as a down-list option, though, as with emotivism, there are one or two distinguished philosophers who are prepared to stick up for it. Does Russell's meta-ethic stand up against the objections that have laid emotivism and relativism low?

6.1 The Vicious Circle Problem

According to Stevenson and Ayer the function of moral judgments is to express approval and disapproval. But to approve of X is to think or feel that X is good or right: to disapprove is to think or feel that it is bad or wrong. Thus the emotivist analysis of the moral terms is viciously circular. [Russell himself had developed a similar line of argument against theories which identify rightness with a tendency to arouse approval in his (1912) ‘The Elements of Ethics’.]

This objection leaves Russell untouched. To approve of X may be to think or feel that X is good, but for Russell to think X good is not to approve of it, but to desire that everyone should desire X. Implausible as this may be, there is no circle, vicious or otherwise.

6.2 The Problem of the Disappearing Dispute

If judgments about what is good or bad in itself merely express approval and disapproval ‘X is good’ said by me and ‘X is bad ‘ said by you do not contradict one another. After all, I am merely expressing my feelings whilst you are expressing yours, and there is nothing remotely inconsistent about the supposition that X arouses approval in me and disapproval in you. But plainly when I call X good and you call it bad we are contradicting one other. Hence emotivism, which seems to imply otherwise, is false.

Again, Russell's brand of emotivism is immune to this objection. According to Russell, ‘X is good’ and ‘X is bad’ are really in the optative mood despite their indicative appearances. As such, they express desires or wishes, and desires and wishes can, in a sense, be inconsistent with one other, namely when they are not (in Russell's phrase) ‘compossible‘, that is, when they cannot both be realized. ‘Would that I had all the ice-cream!’ said by me and ‘Would that I had all the ice-cream!’ said by you express contradictory desires since we cannot both have all the ice-cream. As such the two optatives contradict each other, not because they describe incompatible facts but because they prescribe incompatible states of affairs. Similarly ‘X is good’ said by me and ‘X is bad’ said by you express contradictory desires and hence contradict each other. For ‘X is good’ means ‘Would that everybody desired X!’ and ‘X is bad’ means ‘Would that everybody desired that not-X!’, and the desires expressed by these two optatives are not compossible, or at least, are only compossible on the condition that we all have inconsistent desires (both for X and for not-X).

But the situation is a little different when we come to judgments about what is right or what ought to be done. As we have seen, Russell is inclined to give such judgments a consequentialist reading and then to index them to some presumed set of projects. It is therefore true with respect to, say, Russell and myself that we ought to abolish the Death Penalty, since abolishing the Death Penalty is conducive to the ends that we happen to favor. But it is equally true with respect to some hardcore retributivist that we ought not to abolish the Death penalty, since it is not conducive to the eye-for-an-eye ends that she considers good. And this seems to be a problem. For when Russell and I say we ought to abolish the Death Penalty and the retributivist says we that we ought not it seems that we are contradicting each other. Yet if the two ‘oughts’ are indexed to different visions of the good, it seems they are quite compatible. What Russell and I are saying is that abolishing the Death Penalty can be rationally expected to maximize the things we consider good and to minimize the things that we consider evil. What the retributivist is saying (if she is a consequentialist) is that not abolishing the Death Penalty can be rationally expected to maximize the things she considers good (which include retributive punishment) and to minimize the things she considers evil (such as murderers not getting their just deserts). And these claims can both be true. Hence Russell's theory brings about a spurious appearance of semantic harmony where in fact there is conflict and contradiction. His theory suggests that the friends and foes of the Death Penalty are not contradicting each other, when in fact it is evident that they are. Genuine disagreement would only be possible between those who agreed about the ends but disagreed about the means. Thus if (in 1940) Hitler claimed that the Luftwaffe ought to bomb London rather than the RAF airfields whilst Goering claimed that the Luftwaffe ought to bomb the RAF airfields rather than bombing London, the two would be in contradiction since their ends were presumably the same. But their views would be quite compatible with those of a pacifist who claimed that nobody ought ever to bomb anything!

Russell himself had raised much the same objection against relativist definitions of ‘good’ and ‘bad’ in 1912: ‘If in asserting that A is good, X meant merely to assert that A had a certain relation to himself such as pleasing his taste in some way [or being conducive his ends] and Y, in saying that A is not good, meant merely to deny that A had a like relation to himself; then there would be no subject of debate between them’ (Philosophical Essays: 20-21/Papers 6: 222). But, as Russell plainly believes, there is a subject of debate between them, which means that relativistic readings of ‘good’ and ‘bad’ must (at least sometimes) be wrong. A similar problem afflicts his own subsequent analyses of ‘ought’ and ‘right’. Since their ‘oughts’ are indexed to different ends, it seems that when the Nazi says ‘We ought to bomb London’ and the pacifist says ‘Nobody ever ought to bomb anything’ they are not contradicting one another, though it is as clear as daylight that they are.

Russell might reply that his suggestion is not intended as an account about what ‘right’, ‘wrong’ and ‘ought’ actually mean, but as proposal about what they ought to mean. His theory is not intended as a description of our current semantic slum, but as a scheme for linguistic reform. It may be that at present we take those whose ‘ought's are indexed to different ends to be contradicting one other but Russell is hoping to change all that. Given current usage, when Hitler says ‘We ought to bomb London’ and the pacifist says ‘Nobody ever ought to bomb anything’, the two claims contradict each other, but once Russell's reform is has been implemented this disagreeable dispute will be smoothed into non-existence.

The problem with this is that Russell's ‘proposal’ is not a very attractive one. One of the things we want to do with moral language is express our disagreements. Russell's new-fangled ‘ought’ would be unable fulfill one of the most important linguistic functions of the old-fashioned ‘ought’, namely to express that fact that people with different ends disagree (as we would now put it) on what ought to be done. In depriving people with different ends of the means to contradict each other Russell would be doing them a disservice. Moreover, Russell would be left with a peculiarly ramshackle meta-ethic. He would have a descriptive account of what ‘good’ and ‘bad’ do mean and a prescriptive suggestion about the about what ‘right’, ‘wrong’ and ‘ought’ought to mean. There is no actual inconsistency in this but it does seem to be a bit anomalous. If the name of the game is to analyze the moral concepts, then it seems Russell's analysis of ‘right’ and ‘ought’ is wrong. But if the name of the game is to reform the moral concepts, then why not subject ‘good’ and ‘bad’ to the same treatment, giving them the kind objectivity that Russell would evidently have preferred them to have?

6.3 ‘Ought’ and the Open Question Argument

The later Russell's account of ‘ought’-judgments runs foul of Moore's Open Question Argument as his earlier self could have told him. To say that A ought to do X (with respect to B) is to say that on the available evidence A's doing X would be most likely to maximize what some contextually specified person or group B takes to be good and to minimize what B takes to be evil. But, construed as an account of what we actually mean, this is obviously incorrect. As Russell himself had nearly put it thirty years before: ‘It is held that what we ought to do is that action, among all that are possible, which [is likely on the available evidence] to produce the best results on the whole [according to some contextually specified standard of goodness]; and this is regarded as constituting a definition of ought. I hold that this is not a definition, but a significant proposition … It might be proved, in the course of moral exhortation, that such and such an action [is likely on the available evidence to] have the best results [according to some contextually specified standard of goodness]; and yet the person exhorted might inquire why he should perform the action. The exhorter would have to reply: “Because you ought to do what [is likely to] have the best results [according to some contextually specified standard of goodness].” And this reply distinctly adds something. The same arguments by which good was shown to be indefinable can be repeated here, mutatis mutandis, to show the indefinability of ought.’ (RoE: 101/Papers 4: 573, somewhat modified.) Thus Russell is making exactly the same mistake that he accused Moore of making in 1904! (See above, §4.)

Again Russell might reply that he is not attempting to describe how we actually use ‘ought’ but making a suggestion about ‘ought’ should be used. But if we are to ring out the old ‘ought’ and ring in the new, we need to be assured that this would be a good idea. And that requires something rather more solid in the way of a cost/benefit analysis than Russell manages to supply.

6.3 The Problem of Validity

It is a common complaint against emotivism that it precludes the possibility of moral arguments that are valid in a non-trivial sense. An argument is formally valid iff, however the non-logical vocabulary is interpreted, the premises cannot be true and the conclusion false. But if the premises of a moral argument are not truth-apt — if they are semantically incapable of truth or falsity — then all moral arguments, no matter how obviously ‘illogical’ they may appear, will be trivially valid, since the premises cannot be true! We can avoid this absurdity, by making explicit what the standard definition of validity presupposes — that an argument cannot be a candidate for validity unless the premises and the conclusions are both truth-apt. But if we do that, moral arguments cease to be candidates for validity, no matter how logically impeccable they may appear to be. Stevenson (1944): 154-159, accepts this conclusion as a consequence of his theory, but to the rest of us it seems a very large dead rat to swallow.

Russell is immune to this argument as regards ‘ought’, ‘right’ and ‘wrong’ since in his view ought-judgments are susceptible to truth and falsity. ‘It is wrong (wrt to B) to kill the innocent’ is a truth-apt expression. Hence the argument ‘It is wrong (wrt to B) to kill the innocent; to bomb the village would be to kill the innocent: therefore it is wrong (wrt to B) to bomb the village’, is a candidate for validity, and is in fact, valid. To argue from the same premises that it would be right (wrt B) to bomb the village would be obviously fallacious.

But what about this argument?

1. It is good to contemplate whatever is beautiful;

2. Michelangelo's David is beautiful;


3. It is good to contemplate Michelangelo's David.

Isn't it obviously valid? And wouldn't it be obviously invalid to conclude from the same premises that contemplating Michelangelo's David would be bad? Yet if arguments involving ‘good’ are not even candidates for validity, it appears that the two arguments are on a par!

This is a telling objection against some forms of emotivism which portray moral judgments as mere expressions of raw feeling, analogous to cries of ecstasy or groans of pain. But Russell is better placed to meet this difficulty, since in his view judgments about what is ultimately good and bad are disguised optatives, designed to express desires or wishes of a certain kind. And it is reasonably simple to construct a concept of logical consequence (and hence of validity) that applies to arguments in the optative mood. Sentences in the optative have fulfillment conditions just as sentences in the indicative have truth-conditions. To understand an optative sentence is a) to understand that it is in the optative and b) to understand what the world would have to be like to satisfy the desires or the wishes expressed. Just as indicative validity can be defined in terms of truth, optative validity can be defined in terms of fulfillment. (It would be nice to talk of ‘satisfaction’ rather than ‘fulfillment’ here, but the word ‘satisfaction’ has been preempted to stand for a different but related notion.) An optative sentence Q is the logical consequence of a set of optative sentences P and a (possibly empty) set of factual sentences C, if and only if, however the non-logical vocabulary is interpreted, the desires expressed in P cannot be fulfilled under the circumstances described in C unless the desire expressed by Q is fulfilled too. An optative argument is valid if the conclusion is an optative consequence of the premises; invalid otherwise. Hence there can be valid (and invalid!) arguments about goodness and logical relations between the relevant sentences. Thus our argument becomes:

1′. Would that everyone desired to contemplate whatever is beautiful!

2′. Michelangelo's David is beautiful.

3′. Would that everyone desired to contemplate Michelangelo's David!

This is not perhaps a very plausible reconstruction of the original argument, but it is logically valid in the sense defined. For the wish expressed at premise 1’) cannot be fulfilled under the factual conditions specified at premise 2’) without fulfilling the wish expressed at the conclusion 3’).

6.5 Geach's Problem

But there is another broadly logical objection to emotivism that is much more difficult for Russell to meet. The objection was first mooted by W.D.Ross (1939) but it was reinvented and refined by P.T. Geach (1960), (1965), who modestly attributes it to Frege. Consider the following obviously valid argument:

1. It is always good to contemplate beautiful works of art.

2. If it is always good to contemplate beautiful works of art, then it is good to contemplate Michelangelo's David.


3. It is good to contemplate Michelangelo's David.

In this argument, the sentence ‘It is always good to contemplate beautiful works of art’, occurs twice. In (1) it occurs by itself as an assertion; in (2) it occurs unasserted as part of a larger sentence. We know what the sentence is supposed to mean at its first occurrence — despite its indicative appearance it is really in the optative mood and expresses a wish: ‘Would that everyone always desired to desire to contemplate beautiful works of art!’. But what about its second occurrence where it appears as the antecedent to a conditional? Is it expressing that wish there? Surely not. For someone can subscribe to the conditional (2) whilst rejecting the relevant wish. For example, we can imagine somebody reasoning like this:

1′. It is not good to contemplate Michelangelo's David [perhaps because it arouses unhealthy sexual appetites for strapping fifteen-year-olds].

2. If it is always good to contemplate beautiful works of art, then it is good to contemplate Michelangelo's David.

3′. It is not always good to contemplate beautiful works of art.

The person who accepts this argument clearly does not wish that everyone should always desire to contemplate beautiful works of art. But she subscribes to premise (2) nonetheless. Thus the sentence ‘it is always good to contemplate beautiful works of art’, cannot generally be construed as an optative when it occurs in an embedded context (that is when it occurs as a sub-sentence within a larger, more complex sentence). This is already a very damaging objection to Russell's theory of how ‘good’ functions, since it shows that the theory is radically incomplete. Russell can only account for a very restricted class of cases, namely those in which sentences of the form ‘X is good ‘ are used by themselves to make an assertion, not the numerous cases in which such sentences occur, unasserted, as components of larger sentences. (It is, so to speak, a theory of the semantic atoms that cannot account for their role within semantic molecules.) But there is worse to come. Suppose Russell added one or more epicycles to his theory to explain how ‘X is good’ manages to be meaningful in unasserted contexts. The revised theory would have to distinguish between different uses of ‘good’, giving one account for asserted contexts and a different account (or set of accounts) for the unasserted contexts. Thus ‘X is good’ would sometimes be a disguised optative and sometimes something else. (Never mind what — it does not really matter.) Now, consider the following argument schema:

  1. X is good.
  2. If X is good then Q.


  1. Q

In this argument ‘X is good’ would have one meaning in premise (i) — in which it would be an optative — and another in premise (ii) — in which it would be a creature of some other semantic kind. (I have emphasized the point by putting the first occurrence in italics and the second in bold.) But an argument is only valid if the words involved retain the same meanings throughout the inference. If not, we have an instance of the fallacy of equivocation. So it looks as if any attempt to deal with Geach's first problem by explaining how ‘good’ works in unasserted contexts would have the unintended side-effect of converting obviously valid arguments such as the above into instances of equivocation. Not only is the theory radically incomplete — if it were completed, it would reduce a huge number of obviously valid arguments to invalidity by construing them as equivocal.

This is, perhaps, the leading problem for non-cognitivist or expressivist theories and a vast amount of ink has been spilt trying to solve it. (See, for instance, Miller (2003) An Introduction to Contemporary Meta-Ethics: 7, 40-2, 58-73,77, 79, 94, 96-107, 248, 292, 294.). It would take me too far afield to discuss the matter in detail. Suffice to say that Russell's theory faces ship-wreck unless this problem can be solved and, in my opinion, the problem is insoluble.

6.6 Commitment and Inconsistency

‘I am accused of inconsistency, perhaps justly, because, although I hold ultimate ethical valuations to be subjective, I nevertheless allow myself emphatic opinions on ethical questions.’ Thus wrote Russell in reply to critics who thought that his emotivism precluded him from being so relentlessly preachy. There was, they thought, some kind of pragmatic inconsistency between vehement moral opinions (frequently voiced) and meta-ethical emotivism (RoE: 145-150/Papers 11: 48-52.). Russell makes short work of this. In his view the function of the words ‘good’ and ‘bad’ is to express certain kinds of desires. Since he had the relevant desires there is no inconsistency in his using ‘good’ and ‘bad’ to express the desires they were designed to express. There is nothing inconsistent about using a piece of verbal machinery to do what you think it is designed to do. ‘I am quite at a loss to understand why any one should be surprised at my expressing vehement ethical judgments. By my own theory, I am, in doing so, expressing vehement desires as to the desires of mankind; I feel such desires, so why not express them?’ Nor (as he might have added) is there any inconsistency between Russell's meta-ethical emotivism and his moral and political activism. To think, for example, that nuclear war would be bad is to desire that everyone not desire it, a desire that presumably springs from a first-order desire that there should be no such thing. In trying to avert nuclear war, therefore, Russell was acting on a desire that for him had a high priority. Which looks like an eminently rational thing to do.

6.7 Russell's Feelings and the Duck Argument

But in defending himself against the charge of inconsistency, Russell makes a crucial concession. ‘But what are “good” desires? Are they anything more than desires that you share? Certainly there seems to be something more … In opposing the proposal [to introduce bull-fighting into America], I should feel, not only that I was expressing my desires, but that my desires in the matter are right, whatever that may mean.’ What exactly is it that Russell feels? That those who think bull-fighting is good (and therefore desire it) are making some kind of mistake and conversely that those think that bull-fighting is bad (and are therefore opposed to it) are in some sense getting it right. Thus the ‘something more’ that Russell could not help feeling was that his views about the badness of bullfighting were true and the views of the imaginary bull-fighting aficionados false. But how can that be if ‘bull-fighting is bad,’ really is in the optative? For a sentence to be true or false it must be semantically capable of truth and falsity or, as the current jargon has it, truth-apt. Thus in admitting that he could not help feeling that he would be right (that is, correct) to oppose bull-fighting in America, Russell, was admitting to feelings which suggest that his meta-ethic is false. Moreover the very fact that he had these feelings provides evidence for his theory's falsehood. Consider ‘Oh to be in England, now that April's here!’, a sentence that is clearly in the optative (except for the bit about April's being here). It is hard to see how anybody who understood this sentence could coherently feel or think it to be true or false. Its optative character is obvious (to those who understand English) and the fact that it is in the optative excludes the possibility of truth or falsehood. Since Russell was inclined to feel that ‘Bull-fighting is bad’ is true, and since this is not an incoherent thing to feel or think, this strongly suggests that ‘bull-fighting is bad’, unlike ‘Oh to be in England!’, is not in the optative mood.

Indeed there is something odd about the very idea of a disguised optative. Of course, it is possible to give orders or express wishes by means of sentences that are grammatically in the indicative mood. Henry IV's ‘You have good leave to leave us’, is grammatically in the indicative but it is merely a slightly less curt variant of the obviously imperative ‘Worcester, get thee gone’. But when we use indicatives to express wishes or convey commands we are engaging in communicative acts which would misfire badly if the people we were talking to failed to get the point. Even if King Henry had confined himself to ‘You have good leave to leave us’, omitting the explicitly imperative ‘Worcester, get thee gone’, Worcester would have had to be singularly obtuse not to realize that he was being ordered to leave. Competent speakers are usually well aware when a grammatically indicative sentence is being used to give a command or express a desire (indeed, this is one of the criteria of linguistic competence!). But it is Russell's hypothesis that, despite appearances, ‘X is good’ (in the sense of good as an end) is exclusively in the optative mood even though, for most people, it is neither intended nor interpreted as such. We have been good-ing and bad-ing things up and down for hundreds of years whilst radically misunderstanding the meanings of our own utterances. To suppose this is to suppose that meaning is independent of our collective intentions, which is a very large rat to swallow. Russell might reply that our usage belies our stated intentions, that we use ‘X is good’ as if it were in the optative, and that despite our protestations to the contrary, his theory provides the best explanation of our actual use. The problem with this reply is that it is based on an obviously false premise. We don't in fact use ‘X is good’ as if it were in the optative mood — we treat as if it were truth-apt. This brings me to the most obvious and perhaps the most compelling objection to emotivism — what I like to call the Duck Argument.

The main problem for most forms of non-cognitivism is that moral judgments look and behave like propositions — in this connection, the kinds of things that can be true or false. They have, as the jargon has it, a ‘propositional surface’. We claim that such sentences are true or false, we speak of knowing the difference between good and bad, right and wrong (where knowledge would appear to entail truth), we wonder whether our ethical opinions are right or wrong (in the sense of correct or incorrect) and believe that we or others are, or at least may be, mistaken in our moral beliefs (in the sense that they may be false). All this is difficult to make sense of except on the assumption that moral judgments are what they appear to be — statements which express beliefs, describe some purported facts and are therefore capable of truth and falsity. The argument does not show that there are such facts (after all much the same points could be made about theological discourse and a set of truth-apt sentences cannot conjure God into existence). It could be that there are no moral facts corresponding to our opinions and thus that they are predominately false, like the propositions of Greek mythology. But the way we talk strongly suggests that our moral pronouncements are in the true/false game, and thus that they are truth-apt or truth-valued. If something looks like a duck, swims like a duck and quacks like a duck, then the chances are that it is indeed a duck! Likewise, if something looks like a truth-apt expression (since on the surface it is in the indicative mood), if it behaves logically like a truth-apt expression (which again is what ‘X is good’ undoubtedly does), if it is treated by the people whose use sustains its meaning as if it were truth-apt, then, absent compelling arguments to the contrary, it probably is truth-apt.

6.8 Objections Concluded

Thus Russell's brand of emotivism is subject to devastating objections, some of which he was aware of. Moreover he was not that keen on it. Although he thought he could show that he was not ‘guilty of any logical inconsistency in holding to [emotivism] and at the same time expressing strong ethical preferences … in feeling [he was] not satisfied’ (RoE: 149/Papers 11: 51). In particular, he found himself ‘incapable of believing that all that is wrong with wanton cruelty is that [he did not] like it’. Why then was he an emotivist? Because he could not ‘see how to refute the arguments for the subjectivity of ethical values’ (RoE: 165/Papers 11: 310-311). What were these arguments and why did Russell find them so compelling?

7. Objections to Objectivism

‘When I was young,’ writes Russell, ‘I agreed with G.E. Moore in believing in the objectivity of good and evil. Santayana's criticism in a book called Winds of Doctrine, [which Russell read in 1913] caused me to abandon this view, though I have never been able to be as bland and comfortable about it as he was’ (Portraits from Memory: 91). As a piece of intellectual autobiography this is insufficient. Santayana's book abounds in mellifluous sneers, but arguments are conspicuous by their absence. Russell's reasons for rejecting a non-natural property of goodness have to be reconstructed from literary asides, delivered in passing in the course of his anti-War polemics.

7.1 Persecution, Punishment and the Subjectivity of Value

However, Santayana does give one reason, not for doubting the existence of the Moorean Good, but for wishing that nobody believed in it. The idea that there are objective moral facts breeds intolerance and fanaticism. Accordingly, the rejection of this idea ‘would tend to render people more truly social’, specifically, more tolerant. ‘Moral warfare would continue’, he writes, ‘but not with poisoned arrows.’ Russell came to agree, especially after the outbreak of World War I. ‘My H[erbert] S[pencer] lecture was partly inspired by disgust at the universal outburst of righteousness in all nations since the war began. It seems the essence of virtue is persecution, and it has given me a disgust of all ethical notions, which evidently are chiefly useful as an excuse for murder’ (letter to Samuel Alexander, 5/2/1915, RoE: 107/Papers 8: 56). There is something rather paradoxical about this, since Russell was firmly convinced of the rightness of his own anti-War activities: ‘When the War came, I felt as if I heard the voice of God. I knew it was my business to protest, however futile protest might be’ (Autobiography II: 18). If there are no objective moral properties there is no such thing as moral knowledge, which means that Russell cannot have literally known that he ought to protest. At best he could have known that he ought to protest given his values. But though he sometimes seems to talk as if it is objectively wrong to believe in objective values, Russell's position is (or can be made to be) coherent. It might just be a fact that moral realists tend to be more intolerant and cruel than moral relativists and anti-realists. Hence those who dislike intolerance and cruelty have a reason for running down objectivity. As Russell himself put it, ‘for my part, I should wish to see in the world less cruelty, persecution, punishment, and moral reprobation than exists at present; to this end, I believe that a recognition of the subjectivity of ethics might conduce.’ (RoE: 117/Papers 13: 326.) The word ‘recognition’ suggests that the ‘subjectivity of ethics ‘ is true, and thus that there is no such thing as a non-natural property of goodness. But setting the success-word to one side, it might be the case that we would be better off believing in the subjectivity of ethics since believing in objective values leads to persecution, punishment, cruelty and moral reprobation. It might pay in terms of peace, love and understanding if people came to believe Russell's brand of emotivism. But the fact that a belief pays, in some sense, does not make it true, as Russell himself was at pains to point out. (See Philosophical Essays, chs. iv & v.) So even if we would be better off believing that there were no objective values (a thesis Russell later came to doubt), this does not prove that there are no such things.

7.2 Bertrand Russell and the Argument from Relativity

So what were Russell's reasons for rejecting a non-natural property of goodness? One argument, subsequently popularized by J.L. Mackie as ‘the Argument from Relativity’, starts with the diversity of moral opinion and the supposed impossibility of proof when it comes to ultimate values. ‘If our views as to what ought to be done were to be truly rational, we ought to have a rational way of ascertaining what things are such as ought to exist on their own account [that is, what things are good] …. On [this] point, no argument is possible. There can be nothing beyond an appeal to individual tastes. If, for example, one man thinks vindictive punishment desirable in itself, apart from any reformatory or deterrent effects, while another man thinks it undesirable in itself, it is impossible to bring any arguments in support of either side.’ (RoE: 112/Papers 13: 186.) Now it is, of course, a consequence of Russell's later view both a) that it is impossible to have a rational argument about ‘what things are such as ought to exist on their own account’ and b) that in such disputes there can be nothing beyond ‘an appeal to individual tastes’. But though you can argue from emotivism and the non-existence of objective goodness to the truth of a) and b), can you argue from a) and b) to the non-existence of objective goodness?

The argument, I suggest, is best construed as an inference to the best explanation. The best explanation of a) that it is impossible to have a rational argument about what is good or bad in itself and b) that in such disputes there can be nothing beyond ‘an appeal to individual tastes’ is the hypothesis c) that there is nothing objective to disagree about since there is no such thing as goodness — rather our opinions on these topics are somehow dependent on, or expressive of, our disparate desires.

Is this a good argument? I think not. For it is not clear that theses a) and b) represent genuine facts. And even if a) and b) are true and do represent genuine facts, is c) the best explanation? Perhaps there is a property of goodness but it happens to be a property that it is difficult to discern. Some people are just better at seeing what is good or bad than others. As Russell himself put it in 1909 ‘the difficulty of discovering the truth does not prove that there is no truth to be discovered’ (Philosophical Essays: 20/Papers 6: 222).

Nevertheless, the anti-Moorean Russell of 1915 may have been onto something. Suppose a group of mediums all claim to have a Sixth Sense. They can use this sense to access a Spirit World which is invisible to ordinary people. Wild as such a claim might be, it cannot be ruled out a priori. After all, if most people were blind, and only a small minority were sighted, the blind would be wrong to discount the deliverances of this weird and wonderful Fifth Sense. (The deliverances would be weird and wonderful since it would be difficult to express the perceptions of the sighted in the vocabulary of the blind. The perceptual reports of the sighted would tend to the metaphorical.) Nevertheless we would have reason to be skeptical if the mediums disagreed radically about the nature of the Unseen. If their claims about the Unseen contradicted each other, then most of them would have to be wrong. Of course, some might really have a Sixth Sense whilst others were hallucinating. But we would have reason to doubt whether any of them had a genuine Sixth Sense if what they claimed to perceive was closely correlated with the stories they had been told in childhood or suggestions implanted by hypnotists. Despite all this an individual medium might yet convince us of her powers if she could make observations or predictions via her Sixth Sense which were impossible for us but which we could subsequently confirm. (Just as one of the sighted might convince the blind of his wonderful Fifth Sense by his ability to find lost items or stray sheep without having to laboriously feel his way across the fields.) But if the alleged mediums differed about the Unseen World, and if their differences could be put down to the tales they were told in childhood, and if none of them could use their supposed Sixth Sense to make verifiable predictions about the visible would, then we would have ample reason to doubt both the Sixth Sense and any entities ‘detected’ by it. Indeed we would have reason to doubt the Sixth Sense and its deliverances, even if we ourselves seemed to have one. (This is the initial attitude of Scrooge when he tells Marley's Ghost that ‘there's more of gravy than of grave about you, whatever you are!’ If the gravy can account for the ghostly manifestations, there is no need for Scrooge to posit an actual ghost even if he seems to see one.) Now with a substantial dollop of charity, Russell can be construed as arguing that a non-natural property of goodness perceived by ‘intuition’ is rather like the entities perceived by such a ‘Sixth Sense’. We differ wildly in our ‘perceptions’, our differences can be put down to our upbringing and other such mundane causes, and our perceptions of the good don't allow us to make any predictions about non-moral realities. So if the mediums have reason to be skeptical about the spiritual entities they seem to sense, we have reason to be skeptical about the moral properties we seem to perceive.

7.3 Bertrand Russell and Explanatory Impotence

But Russell had another argument which prefigures a famous argument of Gilbert Harman's. ‘I have been led to [the view that all ethics is subjective] by a number of reasons, some logical, some derived from observation. Occam's Razor … leads me to discard the notion of absolute good if ethics can be accounted for without it. Observation of ethical valuations leads me to think that all ethical valuations can be so accounted for, and that the claim of universality which men associate with their ethical judgments embodies merely the impulse to persecution or tyranny.’ (RoE: 117/Papers 13: 325-6.) The idea seems to be that our moral evaluations — our beliefs about what is good bad, wrong or right — can be explained without supposing that they correspond to facts involving a Moorean or ‘absolute’ property of goodness. And since our evaluations can be accounted for without supposing that there is such a property, we have no reason to suppose that it exists.

Why do I believe that there is a telegraph pole outside my window? Firstly because I seem to see it, and secondly because the best explanation of my telegraph-pole-perceptions is that they really are caused by a telegraph pole and not by a fancy hologram fabricated by mad scientists. If my telegraph-pole-perceptions could be explained away as due to some such cause or causes, then I would no longer have a compelling reason to retain the telegraph pole in my ontology. Now it is Russell's thesis that our alleged perceptions that this or that is good can be explained away by facts about our desires and about what we have been brought up to believe. Harman also argues that the badness that we seem to perceive when we see a gang of young hoodlums setting fire to a cat is not really needed to explain our alleged perceptions. We have been brought up (or perhaps evolved) to see acts of wanton cruelty as bad and since this is an act of wanton cruelty, that is how we tend to see it. (Harman (1977): 4-10.) A naturalist might reply that the cruelty of the hoodlums plus the sufferings of the cat are in some sense constitutive of the action's badness. Since these cause our reactions, its badness causes our reactions, and there is thus no call for moral skepticism. (This very roughly is line of Sturgeon (1985).) But this reply is not available to the people Russell was arguing against, namely G.E. Moore and his meta-ethical disciples, who took badness to be a non-natural property supervenient on, but not identical with, such qualities as cruelty and suffering.

Goodness and badness are not, for Moore, a-causal, properties. The configuration of matter in the physical world can affect the distribution and intensity of goodness. If a flower is born to blush unseen and waste its sweetness on the desert air, the goodness of the relevant patch of desert will be enhanced, since unperceived beauties are good. Conversely, if the blushing flower is consumed by cockroaches, the goodness of the desert will be diminished. But although alterations in the configuration of matter can affect the level and distribution of goodness, goodness can only affect the configuration of matter through the medium of rational minds. It is because (and only because) we perceive certain things as good and are thereby induced to promote them, that goodness has an effect on the physical world. Hence if these ‘perceptions’ can be explained without the aid of goodness, goodness is redundant and we have no reason to believe in it.

7.4 Explanatory Impotence and the Problem of Misperception

A Moorean might be tempted to deny that it really is possible to explain either our perceptions or our sensibilities without positing moral properties. It is because the goodness of friendship is there to be perceived that we seem to perceive it. But there is a problem with this reply — the problem of misperception. Even the most devout moral realist must admit that there are some people who get it wrong, namely the people who disagree with them about ultimate values. There are some who see badness in what is good or goodness in what is bad. How then are their ‘perceptions’ to be explained? If one person thinks lasciviousness is bad and retributive punishment is good and the other thinks that lasciviousness is good and retributive punishment bad, how can each explain the intuitions of the other? Moore did have a rather rudimentary theory of moral error which is implicit in Principia Ethica and explicit in Keynes' memoir ‘My Early Beliefs’ (Keynes (1972): 437-441). Some people give the wrong answer because they have not got the question clear in their minds. The ‘two parties [are] not really talking about the same thing; not bringing their intuitions to bear on precisely the same object, and by the principle of organic unity a very small difference in the object might make a big difference in the result’. (Keynes (1972): 437.) But this cannot account for clear-headed disagreement when the parties to the dispute are focused on the relevant ‘object’. In 1899 Moore was ‘sickened’ to discover that his fellow-Apostles did not regard ‘self-abuse’ as bad as an end, even though he had taken some pains to distinguish this from ‘the practical question’ (presumably whether or not one ought to do it) and to concentrate the attention of his audience on ‘the thing in itself’. (Levy (1981): 207-8.) If his fellow—Apostles were so benighted as not to see that the thing in itself was bad, despite the fact that their minds were concentrated on the ‘object’, what possible explanation could there be for their misperceptions? Temperament, upbringing, and, perhaps, a taste for self-abuse — precisely the kinds of causes that a moral skeptic would invoke to explain their reactions. But if their ‘perceptions’ could be - indeed had to be — explained in this way, could not the self-abuse party return the compliment and explain Moore's perceptions in terms of his Puritanical upbringing? Since the ‘perceptions’ of the self-abuse party could be - indeed had to be — explained without the aid of goodness, what reason was there to suppose that badness was required to explain the contrary ‘perceptions’ of G.E. Moore? Thus anyone who thinks that some people's moral perceptions can be explained without the aid of moral properties — which is what everyone thinks about the opinions of their opponents — is in a poor position to insist that moral properties are required to explain their own reactions. If natural causes suffice to explain the beliefs of those who ‘get it wrong’, why are non-natural properties required to explain the beliefs of those who (in their own eyes at any rate) ‘get it right’? It seems that the perceptions of Moore and his self-abusing opponents can both be explained in much the same way — without the aid of non-natural properties. But if moral properties play no part in the generation of our perceptions, then they are wholly redundant since the only reason to believe in them is that they account for our beliefs.

7.5 Emotivism or the Error Theory?

Russell's explicit arguments for the ‘subjectivity of value’ are objections to objectivism rather than arguments for a rival hypothesis Moore's theory is wrong since it presupposes non-existent non-natural properties of goodness and badness. But if naturalism is not an option, that still leaves two alternatives — some kind of non-cognitivism or an error-theory (see §1). Russell's dominant view was to be a form of emotivism, and hence of non-cognitivism. But though it is possible to argue for non-cogntivism from more-or-less Russellian premises, Russell himself constructed no such argument. Accordingly I have relegated discussion of this argument to the

Supplement on Two Arguments for Emotivism: Ayer, Russell & Moore

And although emotivism was Russell's dominant view, from 1913 onwards, there were two significant wobbles. In 1922 he proposed a version of the error theory, anticipating J. L. Mackie by over twenty years. And in 1954 in Human Society in Ethics and Politics, he endeavored to inject a little objectivity into ethics by developing a form of naturalism. The second wobble is of less interest than the first. There is little to be learned from the theory of HSEP and Russell soon abandoned it, reverting to emotivism within weeks of publication. Accordingly, I have relegated discussion to the

Supplement on Russell's Humean Wobble: Human Society in Ethics and Politics

Russell's error theory, however, is much more interesting and deserves extended treatment.

8. Russell's Error-Theoretic Wobble: There Is No Absolute Good

‘Is There an Absolute Good?’ was apparently delivered on the 14th of March 1922 at special meeting of the Apostles. (RoE: 122-124/Papers 9: 345-346.) Russell opens up in fine, flippant Apostolic style: ‘When the generation to which I belong were young, Moore persuaded us all that there is an absolute good. Most of us drew the inference that we were absolutely good, but this is not an essential part of Moore's position, though it is one of its most attractive parts.’ But he soon gets down to philosophical business in what must be one of the pithiest meta-ethical papers on record (it is a mere 809 words long). Moore is right, he says, in thinking that ‘when we say a thing is good we do not merely mean that we have towards it a certain feeling, of liking or approval or what not.’ Indeed ‘ethical judgments claim objectivity’; that is they purport to tell it like it is. However, this ‘claim [to] objectivity … makes them all false’. Since there is no property of goodness corresponding to the linguistic predicate ‘good’, nothing can ever possess it. Hence, any claim that friendship or anything else is good will be false, since there is no such thing as goodness for friendship or pleasure to be. The same goes for badness. Moreover, if there is no such thing as goodness or badness there is no such thing as rightness either, since for an action to be genuinely right it must be such that it can reasonably be expected to produce more good and less bad than any alternative. But if there is no such thing as goodness to be produced, no action can be expected to produce more of it than any other. Of course, an action can still be relatively right: more likely to produce more of what somebody believes to be good and less of what somebody believes to be evil than any alternative. But no action can be genuinely right or genuinely obligatory, since there are no such properties as goodness or badness for conscientious agents to maximize or minimize.

Thus far this is very like the error theory of J.L. Mackie. . (See ‘Mackie (1946) and Mackie (1977), ch. 1.) But there is a twist. For Mackie, as for Russell, ‘good’ is a meaningful predicate even though there is no property corresponding to the word. But Mackie, unlike Russell, is unfazed by this fact. So far as Mackie is concerned, meaningful predicates that refer to non-existent properties pose no particular problems. But for Russell, we can only talk meaningfully about non-existent things if they are defined in terms of things with which we are acquainted. This a consequence of his Fundamental Principle that ‘every proposition that we can understand must be composed wholly of constituents with which we are acquainted’ (Mysticism and Logic: 209/Papers 6: 154) or, as he was later to put it, ‘that sentences we can understand must be composed of words with whose meaning we are acquainted’ (Schilpp ed (1944): 692/Papers 11: 27).

According to Russell, it ‘seems natural to infer, as Moore did, that, since propositions in which the word “good” occurs have meaning, the word “good” [itself] has [a] meaning.’ This, however, is a ‘fallacy’. Even though ‘good’ can appear in meaningful sentences it does not have a meaning of its own. This is very puzzling. What does Russell mean when he says that ‘good’ has no meaning? And why is Moore's view dependent on the thesis that it does?

Let us start with Moore. As I understand it, Moore's Open Question Argument goes like this:

1. ‘Are X things good?’ is a significant or open question for any naturalistic or metaphysical predicate ‘X’; (whether simple or complex).

2. If two expressions (whether simple or complex) are synonymous this is evident on reflection to every competent speaker.

3. The meaning of a predicate or property word is the property for which it stands. Thus if two predicates or property words have distinct meanings they name distinct properties.

From (1) and (2) it follows that

4. ‘Good’ is not synonymous with any naturalistic or metaphysical predicate ‘X’ (or ‘goodness’ with any corresponding noun or noun-phrase ‘X-ness’).

From (3) and (4) it follows that

5. Goodness is not identical with any natural or metaphysical property of X-ness.

Premise (3) is crucial. Moore takes it for granted that the meaning of a predicate is the property for which it stands. Hence, if there were no property of goodness corresponding to the word ‘good’, ‘good’ would be meaningless. Since ‘good’ is quite obviously not meaningless, the corresponding property is guaranteed. Thus we move from an obvious semantic fact — that ‘good’ is plainly meaningful — to a much more contentious metaphysical claim — that there is a corresponding property of goodness. What greases the wheels of this transition is the apparently innocuous assumption that if a word like ‘good’ is to mean something, there must be some thing (or at least some property) that it means. If this doctrine were true, then the objections to objectivism discussed in the last section would fall to the ground. The very fact that we can talk meaningfully about goodness would show that there must indeed be such a property. It might be causally impotent and metaphysically queer, but the fact that we can discuss it would entail that we were stuck with it anyway.

To the end of his days Russell believed that ‘there are words which are only significant because there is something that they mean, and if there were not this something, they would be empty noises not words’. Russell (1959: 177). But when he was young he thought that most words were like this, which explains the swollen ontology of The Principles of Mathematics: ‘Homeric gods, relations chimeras and four-dimensional spaces all have being, for if they were not entities of a kind, we could make no propositions about them.’ Russell (The Principles of Mathematics: 449). The breakthrough came with his Theory of Definite Descriptions (1905). Phrases such as ‘the present King of France’ are incomplete symbols which can function meaningfully in the context of a sentence even though there may be nothing that they mean. They are incomplete because they have no meaning when taken in isolation and in the context of a sentence can be analyzed away. When ‘the King of France is bald’ is analyzed in accordance with Russell's formula — ‘There is something which is King of France such that if anything is King of France, it is identical with that thing, and that thing is bald’ — the phrase ‘the King of France’ simply disappears, though we are left with the predicate ‘is King of France’. ‘The King of France is bald’, is false because there is no King of France — nothing which satisfies the propositional function being king of France — and there is no need to suppose that the King of France must have some kind of being in order for this proposition to make sense.

This brings us back to the Open Question Argument. So far as I can see, Russell continued to accept premises (1) and (2) and thus — with reservations — sub-conclusion (4). ‘Good’ does not mean that same as any naturalistic predicate X — at least, it does not mean the same as any of the naturalistic predicates that have been suggested so far. But he also accepts something like premise (3), that the meaning of a predicate is the property for which it stands. It was because he believed that some predicates were among the words ‘which are only significant because there is something that they mean’, and which would be ‘empty noises not words’ in the absence of this something, that he continued to believe in properties, right up until 1959. How then can Russell fend off Moore's conclusion (5) that there is a property of goodness that is not identical to any naturalistic property of X-ness? By modifying premise (3):

3′. The meaning of a predicate or property word is the property for which it stands, so long as that predicate is a complete symbol.

Some predicates are not complete symbols, and these can function meaningfully in the absence of the properties that they might denote. Among these is the word ‘good’. ‘Without the theory of incomplete symbols, it seemed natural to infer, as Moore did, that, since propositions in which the word “good” occurs have meaning, therefore the word “good” has meaning [or as we might now say, a referent]; but this was a fallacy.’ ‘My point is that the word “good” does not stand for a predicate [by which Russell means a property] at all, but has a meaning only in the sense in which descriptive phrases have meaning, i.e. in use, not in isolation.’ Thus ‘good’ can be meaningful in the absence of a property of goodness and the error theory is safe from semantic refutation.

But Russell is not quite out of the woods. He continued to believe in his Fundamental Principle that to understand a proposition we must be acquainted with the referents of the words that remain once the proposition has been boiled down to its ultimate constituents. This means, in effect, that things which don't exist have to be defined in terms of things which do, indeed, that things which don't exist have to be defined terms of things (including universals) with which we are acquainted. How then is ‘good’ to be defined? More pedantically, how are sentences involving ‘good’ to be analyzed so that the word ‘good’ can be eliminated? According to Russell, ‘when we judge “M is good”, we mean: “M has that predicate [property] which is common to A, B, C, …[the things we approve of] but is absent in X, Y, Z, …[the things we disapprove of].”’ The emotions of approval and disapproval, Russell notes, ‘do not enter into the meaning of the proposition “M is good”, but only into its genesis’. That is, ‘good’ is defined in terms of the things that we approve (and disapprove) of, even though the fact that we approve (or disapprove) of them is not incorporated into the analysis. Now, in Russell's opinion, the proposition ‘M has that property which is common to A, B, C, … [the things we approve of] but is absent in X, Y, Z, … [the things we disapprove of]’, will be always be false since the things we approve of have nothing in common apart from the fact that we approve of them. That is why ‘all propositions in which the word “good” has a primary occurrence are false.’ But will such propositions in fact be false? Surely X, Y, Z etc do have a property in common, namely the property of being X or Y or Z or …! Perhaps Russell would reply that disjunctive properties are not real properties. He took a dim view of disjunctive facts in The Philosophy of Logical Atomism, and if disjunctive facts should be rejected, then disjunctive properties would appear to be equally suspect. (Papers 8: 185-6/The Philosophy of Logical Atomism: 71-72.) Even so, we cannot be sure that in every case the things that we approve of don't have something in common other than a) the fact that we approve of them and b) that they satisfy a disjunctive predicate. Nor is this the only problem. Though Russell defines ‘good’ in terms of the things that ‘we’ approve (and disapprove) of, what he seems to mean is that each person defines ‘good’ in terms of the things that he or she approves (or disapproves) of. Thus if you and I approve of different things, when I say ‘M is good’ and you say ‘M is not good’ what I mean is that M has the property shared by X,Y,Z … [the things that I approve of] whereas what you mean is that is that it does not have the property shared by A, B, C … [the things that you approve of]. But in that case the Problem of the Disappearing Dispute rears its ugly head. On Russell's theory my ‘M is good’ and your ‘M is not good’ may be quite consistent. But since they are obviously not consistent, there must be something wrong with Russell's theory. We can put the point by paraphrasing Russell's own criticisms of simple subjectivism: ‘If in asserting that A is good, [a person] X meant merely to assert that A had a certain relation to himself such as pleasing his taste in some way [or that A had a characteristic shared by the things of which he approved] and Y, in saying that A is not good, meant merely to deny that A had a like relation to himself [or to deny that A had the characteristic shared by the things of which he, Y, approved]; then there would be no subject of debate between them’ (Philosophical Essays: 20-21/Papers 6: 222).

Nor is this all. As we saw in §6.1, our moral sentiments are partly constituted by our moral beliefs. What distinguishes approval from a warm feeling of liking is not some difference in phenomenological flavor but the thought that the thing we approve of is good or right. Our moral sentiments are feelings that, where what follows the ‘that’ is a moral judgment. But if we can't have feelings of approval or disapproval without the corresponding moral beliefs, we can't explain the intellectual origins of the common conceptions of goodness and badness in terms of pre-existing sentiments of approval or disapproval. For prior to these conceptions there were no such sentiments. This is not the criticism that sank the emotivist theories of Ayer and Stevenson. The problem is not that Russell's analysis of ‘good’ is viciously circular because it presupposes the very concept that it purports to explicate. The problem is that his genealogy of ‘good’ is viciously circular (and therefore false) since it presupposes the concept it purports to explain. For in his capacity as an error-theorist Russell does not define ‘good’ and ‘bad’ in terms of approval and disapproval. Rather he gives a genealogy of these notions in which the feelings of approval and disapproval play a crucial part. As he himself puts it: ‘the emotions of approval and disapproval do not enter into the meaning of the proposition “M is good”, but only into its genesis’. But our concepts of ‘good’ and ‘bad’ cannot be caused by prior feelings of approval and disapproval if those feelings are partly constituted by the very beliefs they are supposed to cause. My belief that M is good cannot be caused by tendency to approve of M, if I cannot approve of M without believing that M is good.

However, the real difficulty with Russell's error theory and the one which probably weighed with Russell himself seems to be this. Given Russell's theory of meaning, he can make sense of non-existent properties but not non-natural predicates. At least, he cannot make sense of predicates that are not definable in terms of things with which we are acquainted. Thus on the assumption that we are not acquainted with goodness (which we obviously cannot be if there is really no such thing), and on the assumption that ‘good’ cannot defined in terms of the things with which we are acquainted (which seems pretty plausible if is not equivalent to any naturalistic predicate) then we cannot even understand the predicate ‘good’. At least, we cannot understand it, if it is construed as a descriptive predicate whose function it is to denote a property (whether real or non-existent).

After 1922, Russell abandoned the error theory and reverted to the emotivism that he had been flirting with since 1913. His reasons remain obscure. But perhaps it had something to do with the fact that his Fundamental Principle, when combined with the OQA, made it difficult, if not impossible, to make sense of ‘good’ as standing for a property that is both non-existent and non-natural. Since he retained his faith in the Fundamental Principle he had to give up the error theory. And since he had already rejected the objectivity of ethics — what we would nowadays describe as moral realism — this left him no alternative but some form of non-cognitivsm. In my opinion this was the wrong choice. He would have done better to give up the Fundamental Principle and stick with the error theory. But perhaps the thesis that moral judgments are mostly false was a bit too much for a dedicated moralist such as he. As he wrote to his brother, he would rather ‘be mad with truth than sane with lies’ and the idea that morality was largely composed of lies — or a best useful fictions - would have been too much to bear. (See ‘Pigden ed. (1999) pp. 20, 121-122, & 189-193.)

9. Conclusion

We started out with Russell's adverse verdict on his own meta-ethics: ‘I am not, myself, satisfied with what I have read or said on the philosophical basis of ethics. (RoE: 165/Papers 11: 310-11). And we can see in a sense that he was right. Every meta-ethic that he developed seems to be subject to insuperable, objections. But although Russell's writings on ethics are unsatisfactory, this does not mean that they are worthless. Meta-ethics is a difficult subject and it is hard to get right. And if we ever are to get it right, we must learn from those, like Russell, who got it interestingly and instructively wrong. In the course of his long philosophical career, Russell canvassed most of the meta-ethical options that have dominated debate in the Twentieth and Twenty-First Centuries — naturalism, non-naturalism, emotivism and the error-theory, even, to some extent, subjectivism and relativism. And though none of his theories quite worked out, there is much to be learned from his mistakes. Nor is this all. His arguments as well as his theories are often interesting and instructive. As we have seen, the ethical corollary to the argument of ‘Seems Madam? Nay, It Is,’ puts the kybosh on any attempt to resolve Sidgwick's Dualism of Practical Reason by arguing that although we are distinct beings with different interests in the world of Appearance, we are, in Reality, all one (§2). Russell's arguments against objectivism are often quite powerful, and one anticipates Gilbert Harman's, influential argument that objective values can be safely dismissed since they lack explanatory power (§7.3-7.4). Russell's damning critique of Moore's analytic consequentialism led Moore to abandon the view and perhaps to give up his ‘unduly anti-reforming’ moral conservatism. Moreover Russell's indirect influence on meta-ethics may have been profound since the Open Question Argument, was probably invented to deal with Russell's ideas. Finally, in the realm of normative ethics, Russell developed a sensible and humane version of consequentialism, which (despite its shaky meta-ethical foundations) is resistant, if not immune, to many of the standard criticisms, especially if combined — as Russell thought it should be combined — with a healthy dose of political skepticism. It provides a powerful tool for social and political criticism, a tool which Russell vigorously employed on a vast range of topics in his writings on practical ethics.

Indeed, I should emphasize that, lengthy as this entry is, I have said virtually nothing about the vast bulk of Russell's writings on moral and political topics. If we are to judge by his literary output, Russell was much more interested in social and political questions and the rights and wrongs of war and peace than in abstract questions of ethical theory. But, when it comes to Russell's popular writings, there is no need for an intermediary. His books are easy to get hold of, easy to read, often very funny, and, despite the now dated allusions, easy to understand. Read them yourself and make up your own mind.


Note: Many of Russell's books have been through several editions with different publishers and the consequence is that pagination is not always uniform. Page numbers cited above are from the editions listed below. For the original dates and places of publication, see the Bibliography attached to the entry on Bertrand Russell.

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Related Entries

analysis | Ayer, Alfred Jules | Bradley, Francis Herbert | cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism, moral | consequentialism | consequentialism: rule | descriptions | Hobbes, Thomas | Hume, David | Hume, David: moral philosophy | metaethics | Moore, George Edward | Moore, George Edward: moral philosophy | moral anti-realism | moral epistemology | moral relativism | motivation: moral | non-naturalism, moral | realism | Reid, Thomas | Russell, Bertrand | Sidgwick, Henry | skepticism: moral