Walter Benjamin

First published Tue Jan 18, 2011; substantive revision Wed Oct 14, 2020

Walter Benjamin’s importance as a philosopher and critical theorist can be gauged by the diversity of his intellectual influence and the continuing productivity of his thought. Primarily regarded as a literary critic and essayist, the philosophical basis of Benjamin’s writings is increasingly acknowledged. They were a decisive influence upon Theodor W. Adorno’s conception of philosophy’s actuality or adequacy to the present (Adorno 1931). In the 1930s, Benjamin’s efforts to develop a politically oriented, materialist aesthetic theory proved an important stimulus for both the Frankfurt School of Critical Theory and the Marxist poet and dramatist Bertolt Brecht. 

The delayed appearance of Benjamin’s collected writings has determined and sustained the Anglophone reception of his work. (A two-volume selection was published in German in 1955, with a full edition not appearing until 1972–89, and a 21-volume critical edition has been in production since 2008; English anthologies first appeared in 1968 and 1978, and the four-volume Selected Writings between 1996 and 2003.) Originally received in the context of literary theory and aesthetics, only in the last decades of the 20th century did the philosophical depth and cultural breadth of Benjamin’s thought begin to be fully appreciated. Despite the voluminous size of the secondary literature that it has produced, his work remains a continuing source of productivity. An understanding of the intellectual context of his work has contributed to the philosophical revival of Early German Romanticism. His philosophy of language has played a seminal role in translation theory. His essay on ‘The Work of Art in the Age of Its Technical Reproducibility’ remains a major theoretical text for film theory. One-Way Street and the work arising from his unfinished research on nineteenth century Paris (The Arcades Project), provide a theoretical stimulus for cultural theory and philosophical concepts of the modern. Benjamin’s messianic understanding of history has been an enduring source of theoretical fascination and frustration for a diverse range of philosophical thinkers, including Jacques Derrida, Giorgio Agamben and, in a critical context, Jürgen Habermas. The ‘Critique of Violence’ and ‘On the Concept of History’ are important sources for Derrida’s discussion of messianicity, which has been influential, along with Paul de Man’s discussion of allegory, for the poststructuralist reception of Benjamin’s writings. Aspects of Benjamin’s thought have also been associated with a revival of political theology, although it is doubtful this reception is true to the tendencies of Benjamin’s own political thought. More recently, interest in Benjamin’s philosophy of education has been fueled by the translations of his Early Writings in 2011 and the transcripts of his radio broadcasts for children (Radio Benjamin) in 2014.

1. Biographical Sketch

Walter Bendix Schoenflies Benjamin was born on July 15, 1892, the eldest of three children in a prosperous Berlin family from an assimilated Jewish background. At the age of 13, after a prolonged period of sickness, Benjamin was sent to a progressive co-educational boarding school in Haubinda, Thuringia, where he formed an important intellectual kinship with the liberal educational reformer Gustav Wyneken. On his return to Berlin, he began contributing to Der Anfang (‘The Beginning’), a journal dedicated to Wyneken’s principles on the spiritual purity of youth, articles which contain in embryonic form important ideas on experience and history that continue to occupy his mature thought. As a student at the universities of Freiburg im Breisgau and Berlin, Benjamin attended lectures by the neo-Kantian philosopher Heinrich Rickert and the sociologist Georg Simmel, whilst continuing to be actively involved in the growing Youth Movement. In 1914, however, Benjamin denounced his mentor and withdrew from the movement in response to a public lecture in which Wyneken praised the ethical experience that the outbreak of war afforded the young. In 1915 a friendship began between Benjamin and Gerhard (later Gershom) Scholem, a fellow student at Berlin. This relationship would have a lifelong influence upon Benjamin’s relation to Judaism and Kabbalism, notably in his interpretations of Kafka in the early 1930s and in the messianic interpretation of the Paul Klee painting Angelus Novus in his later theses ‘On the Concept of History’. Scholem would prove instrumental in establishing and, in part, shaping the legacy of Benjamin’s works after his death (Raz-Krakotzkin 2013).

Benjamin’s doctoral dissertation, ‘The Concept of Art Criticism in German Romanticism’, was awarded, summa cum laude, by the University of Bern, Switzerland, in 1919. His celebrated essay on Goethe’s novella, The Elective Affinities, was begun shortly after and put into practice the theory of art criticism developed in his dissertation. Benjamin’s Habilitationsschrift on the Origin of the German Mourning-Play (Ursprung des deutschen Trauerspiels)—the thesis which would have enabled him to become a professional academic—had, he feared, with the death of his intellectual ally, the Protestant theologian Florens Christian Rang, lost its “proper reader” (GB 3:16). In 1925, he was forced to withdraw his submission from the University of Frankfurt am Main and with it the possibility of a future academic position. However, despite this academic failure, an excerpt from the work appeared in a literary journal two years later and the book was published the following year (1928), quickly receiving favourable attention in a number of well regarded newspapers and periodicals in Germany and further afield (Brodersen 1996, 154). In an ironic twist, Benjamin’s failed Habilitation study became the subject of a seminar course taught at Frankfurt University in 1932–3 by Theodor Wiesengrund (later Theodor W. Adorno).

Much of the writing for his thesis was completed in 1924 on the Italian island of Capri, where Benjamin had retreated for financial reasons. The stay would prove decisive, however, since it was here he met the Bolshevik Latvian theatre producer Asja Lacis, with whom he begun an erotically frustrated but intellectually productive relationship. ‘Naples’ was jointly written with Lacis in 1925, whilst One-Way Street, a quasi-constructivist collection of fragments written between 1923–1926 and dedicated to Lacis on its publication in 1928, and the unfinished Arcades Project, begun in the late 1920s, both exhibit a modernist experimentation with form that can in part be attributed to Lacis’ influence. His Marxist turn towards historical materialism was compounded by his enthusiastic study of Georg Lukács’ History and Class Consciousness whilst on Capri and a visit to Lacis in Soviet Moscow in the winter of 1926–7.

By the early 1930s Benjamin was closely involved in the plans for a left-wing periodical to be entitled ‘Crisis and Critique’, in collaboration with Ernst Bloch, Sigfried Kracauer and, among others, the Marxist poet, playwright and theatre director Bertolt Brecht (Wizisla 2009, 66–98). Benjamin had been introduced to Brecht by Lacis in 1929 and over the following decade developed a close personal friendship, in which their literary and political affinities had been cemented under the difficult conditions of political exile. Benjamin undertook a series of studies of Brecht’s “epic theatre” and modelled the radio broadcasts he wrote and presented during this period upon the latter’s experiments in theatrical didacticism (Brodersen 1996, 193). In 1933, Benjamin departed Nazi Germany for the last time, following Adorno, Brecht and many other Jewish friends into an exile he divided between Paris, Ibiza, San Remo and Brecht’s house near Svendborg, Denmark.

During the 1930s the Institute for Social Research, by this point under the directorship of Horkheimer and exiled from its base in the University of Frankfurt, provided Benjamin with important opportunities for publishing as well as an increasingly necessary financial stipend. Theodor W. Adorno, who had been introduced to Benjamin a decade earlier by a mutual friend, Siegfried Kracauer, was instrumental in securing this support. An important consequence of this dependence, however, was the editorial revisions to which key essays in which Benjamin developed his materialist theory of art were subjected, such as ‘The Work of Art in the Age of Its Technical Reproducibility’ and those on Baudelaire and Paris that grew out of The Arcades Project.

With the outbreak of war in 1939, Benjamin was temporarily interned in the French “concentration camps” established for German citizens. On his release a few months later he returned to Paris and there continued his work in the Bibliothèque Nationale on The Arcades Project. The notes for his unfinished research were left in the safekeeping of librarian and friend, the writer Georges Bataille, as Benjamin fled Paris before the advancing German army in the summer of 1940. The last few months of Benjamin’s life reflect the precarious experience of countless other Jewish Germans in Vichy France: a flight to the border and preparations for emigration by legal or illegal means. Lacking the necessary exit visa from France, he joined a guided party that crossed the Pyrenees in an attempt to enter Spain as illegal refugees. Turned back by customs officials, Benjamin took his life in the small, Spanish border town of Port Bou, on September 27, 1940.

2. Early Works: Kant and Experience

The importance of Benjamin’s early unpublished fragments for an understanding his wider philosophical project has been emphasised by a number of scholars (Wolfharth 1992; Caygill 1998; Rrenban 2005). Indeed, without them it becomes difficult to understand the intellectual context and historical tradition out of which Benjamin is writing and therefore nearly impossible to grasp the philosophical underpinnings of his works. Of Benjamin’s earliest published writing his attempt in the essay entitled ‘Experience’ (‘Erfahrung’, 1913/1914) to distinguish an alternative and superior concept of experience provides a useful introduction to a central and enduring preoccupation of his thought. Benjamin’s concern with delineating an immediate and metaphysical experience of spirit is valuable in providing a thematic description of a conceptual opposition working throughout his thought. Filtered here through the cultural ideals of the Youth Movement, this contrasts the empty, spiritless [Geistlosen] and unartistic “experiences” accumulated over a life merely lived-through [erlebt] with that privileged kind of experience which is filled with spiritual content through its enduring contact with the dreams of youth (SW 1, 3–6). The influence of Nietzsche in these earlier texts is discernible (McFarland 2013), particularly, in the importance the young Benjamin places upon aesthetic experience in overcoming the embittered nihilism of contemporary values (although he is unable to articulate this cultural transformation here beyond a vague appeal to the canon of German poets: Schiller, Goethe, Hölderlin, and Stefan George).

By 1918 the attempt at a more systematic and philosophically sophisticated understanding of a “higher concept of experience” (SW 1, 102) within what Benjamin now calls “the coming philosophy” is articulated in relation to Kant’s transcendental idealism. Benjamin argues that the value of Platonic and Kantian philosophy lies in its attempt to secure the scope and depth of knowledge through justification, exemplified in the way Kant conducts a critical inquiry into the transcendental conditions of knowledge. But this Kantian attempt to grasp a certain and timeless knowledge is in turn based upon an empirical concept of experience which is restricted, Benjamin argues, to that “naked, primitive, self evident” experience of the Enlightenment, whose paradigm is Newtonian physics (SW 1, 101). Despite Kant’s introduction of a transcendental subject, his system remains tied to a naïve empiricist understanding of experience, of the kind privileged in the positivist scientific tradition as the encounter between a distinct subject (conceived as a cognizing consciousness receiving sensible intuitions) and object (understood as a sensation-causing thing-in-itself).

In contrast, the pre-Enlightenment concept of experience invested the world with a deeper and more profound significance, because the Creation assumes a revelatory religious importance. This is apparent not only in the deeply Christian world-view of mediaeval Europe, but survives in secularized form in Renaissance and Baroque humanism, and in “Counter-Enlightenment” thinkers such as J. G. Hamann, Goethe, and the Romantics. Benjamin suggests that the “great transformation and correction which must be performed upon the concept of experience, oriented so one-sidedly along mathematical-mechanical lines, can be attained only by relating knowledge to language, as was attempted by Hamann during Kant’s lifetime” (SW 1, 107–8). In the essay ‘On Language as Such and the Language of Man’ (‘Über Sprache überhaupt und über die Sprache des Menschen’, c. 1916), Benjamin offers a theological conception of language which draws on Hamann’s discussion of Creation as the physical imprint of the divine Word of God, to claim that there “is no event or thing in either animate or inanimate nature that does not in some way partake of language” (SW 1, 62–3). This implies that all experience—including perception—is essentially linguistic, whilst all human language (including writing, typically associated with mere convention) is inherently expressive and creative. Language is privileged as a model of experience in these early essays precisely because it undermines and transgresses the neat divisions and limitations operating in the Kantian system, including that fundamental one that distinguishes between the subject and object of sensations. If both are constitutively linguistic, language serves as a medium of experience that binds the ostensible “subject” and “object” in a more profound, perhaps mystical, relationship of underlying kinship. More generally, Hamann’s metacritique provides Benjamin with a sense of the hypocrisy of the Kantian separation of understanding and sensibility on the basis of an empty and purely formal notion of pure reason, which can itself only be postulated according to the concrete, aesthetic content of language.

Whilst Benjamin is not interested in returning to the pre-critical project of a rationalist deduction of experience, nor to a directly religious conception of the world, he is interested in how the scientific concept of experience that Kant is utilising distorts the structure of Kant’s philosophical system, and how this might be corrected with the use of theological concepts. Epistemology must address not only “the question of the certainty of knowledge that is lasting”, but also the neglected question of “the integrity of an experience that is ephemeral” (SW 1, 100). Benjamin’s suggestion as to how this project might be formulated within the Kantian system is sketchy, but nonetheless indicates some of the preoccupying concerns of his later writings. In general, it involves the expansion of the limited spatio-temporal forms and essentially causal-mechanistic categories of Kant’s philosophy through the integration of, for example, religious, historical, artistic, linguistic and psychological experiences. Benjamin’s enduring concern with the new, the outmoded and the heteronomous reflect this attempt to integrate more speculative phenomenological possibilities of experience into the remit of philosophical knowledge. It resists privileging any single discipline of knowledge, preserving a multiplicity that implicates truth in the problem of aesthetic representation. This would lead Benjamin to attempt a radical rethinking of the philosophical concept of the Idea, away from its dualistic associations with a timeless and purely rational essence of things.

Benjamin also believes that a more speculative metaphysics would necessitate the abolishment of the sharp distinction between Nature and Freedom—or causal mechanism and moral willing—in Kant’s architectonic. Since it is a specific understanding of “dialectic” which mediates between these two spheres in Kant’s critical system, this entails a speculative rethinking of the Kantian dialectic. This suggests that new possibilities of syllogistic logical relations might themselves be opened up, including what he calls “a certain nonsynthesis of two concepts in another” (SW 1, 106; cf. Weber 2008, 48). The relation of nonsynthesis hinted at here can be seen to inform Benjamin’s understanding of the Idea as a constellation of extremes in the Origin of the German Mourning-Play and of the dialectical image in his mature writings. In this sense, Benjamin’s metacritique of Kant represents an attempt to construct an alternative post-Kantian tradition to that of Hegelian dialectics. It therefore required a new philosophy of history.

3. Romanticism, Goethe and Criticism

Benjamin initially sought to develop these ideas in the context of Kant’s philosophy of history, believing it was in this context that the problems of the Kantian system could be fully exposed and challenged (C, 98). A very early article, ‘The Life of Students’ (‘Das Leben der Studenten’, 1915), is useful for suggesting how these problems manifest themselves within the philosophy of history. It rejects a “a view of history that puts its faith in the infinite extent of time and thus concerns itself only with the speed, or lack of it, with which people and epochs advance along the path of progress” and contrasts this with a perspective “in which history appears to be concentrated on a single focal point, like those that had traditionally been found in the utopian images of the philosophers” (SW 1, 37). The latter, ‘messianic’ view of history has a distinct intention and methodology: it aims to grasp how elements of what Benjamin calls “the ultimate condition” and “highest metaphysical state” of history—which we might call the historical Absolute—appear not as the telos or end of history, but as an immanent state of perfection which has the potential to manifest itself in any particular moment (SW 1, 37). He claims that the necessary recognition of such metaphysical condition requires an act of criticism [Kritik] (SW 1, 38). Benjamin had initially proposed Kant’s philosophy of history as the topic of his doctoral dissertation, and while he felt it necessary to change this to the Early German Romantics’ philosophy of art, crucial features of the proposed project survive in the final work. Astute readers, he says, may still discern in it an “insight into the relationship of a truth to history” (C, 135–6). Specifically, the concept of art criticism operating in Romantic aesthetics rests upon epistemological presuppositions that reveal the ‘messianic’ essence of Romanticism (SW 1, 116–7; n.3, 185). The messianic conjunction between the highest metaphysical state of history and the ephemerality of each particular moment is here seen as theoretically determining the Romantic relationship between the artistic Absolute—or what Benjamin defines as the Idea of art—and each particular artwork.

In his doctoral dissertation, Benjamin argues that the philosophical relationship between the Idea of art and particular artworks posited in Romantic aesthetics must be understood in relation to Fichte’s theory of reflection. This sought to ground the possibility of a certain and immediate type of cognition without recourse to the problematic notion of an intellectual intuition. For Fichte, reflection indicates the free activity of consciousness taking itself as its own object of thought: its capacity for thinking of thinking. In doing so, the initial form of thinking is transformed into its content. In such reflection, thought seems capable of immediately grasping itself as a thinking subject and therefore of possessing a certain kind of immediate and foundational knowledge. Although Benjamin introduces a number of specific criticisms of Fichte’s philosophical position in his dissertation, he nonetheless values the Fichtean concept of reflection for providing the epistemological foundation of Friedrich Schlegel’s and Novalis’ understandings of the metaphysical function of art criticism. Some scholars have, however, questioned the accuracy of Benjamin’s interpretation of Fichte’s concept of reflection and the importance he accords to it in Romantic epistemology (Bullock 1987, 78–93; Menninghaus 2005, 29–44). 

Unlike in Fichte, here immediacy and infinitude are not mutually exclusive aspects of cognition. The uniqueness of the Romantic concept of the Absolute resides in the fact that the Romantic conception of infinitude regards it not as empty but “substantial and filled” (SW 1, 129). Benjamin argued that the Romantics specifically identified this structure of the Absolute with the Idea of art, and in particular with artistic form (SW 1, 135). Art criticism becomes central to this concept of infinite fulfilment because, like the epistemological relation between reflection and thought in Fichte, criticism both consummates the finite and particular work by raising it to a higher level—in which the form of the work is transformed into content as the object of criticism—and simultaneously connects the work’s particular artistic form with the continuity and unity of absolute form in the Idea of art. Criticism is, for the Romantics, the continuation and ongoing completion of the particular work through its infinite connection with other art works and works of criticism. By conceiving the Idea of art as a ‘medium of reflection’, the early Romantics dissolve the Enlightenment world-view of the positive sciences that Fichte inherited from Kant, and in doing so overcome the critical injunctions placed upon the experience of the infinite (SW 1, 132; 131). This conception of a fulfilled infinity constitutes the messianism that Benjamin claims is essential to Early Romantic epistemology.

In the version of the dissertation formally submitted to the university, Benjamin concludes by identifying the Romantic theory of art criticism with ‘the consummation of the work’ (SW 1, 177). The artwork provides the immanent criterion for critical reflection, which in turn completes the work by raising it into an autonomous and higher existence. This immanent criticism rejects both the dogmatic imposition of external rules (such as those of classical aesthetics) and the dissolution of aesthetic criteria (with the appeal to artistic genius). It provides, Benjamin thought, one of the fundamental legacies for a modern concept of art criticism. The version circulated amongst friends and colleagues does not conclude with a complete affirmation of Romanticism, however, but contains a critical afterword that renders explicit the critical objections that Benjamin had carefully inserted into the text. These suggest that the Romantic theory of art, and by implication the structure of the Absolute it is grounded upon, is problematically one-sided and incomplete with regard to (1) its formalism, (2) its positivity, and (3) its singularity. 

  1. Since the content of each, successive, level of reflection is supplied by the form of its object, the criticism unfolds the germ of immanent criticizability contained in each particular artwork’s form. This formalism precludes any serious discussion of the artwork’s specific content.

  2. Conversely, anything immanently uncriticizable cannot constitute a true work of art. As a consequence, Romantic criticism is unable to differentiate between good or bad artworks, since its only criterion is whether a work is or is not art. Such criticism is entirely positive in its evaluation, and lacks the important negative moment essential to judgement.

  3. Finally, Schlegel “committed the old error of confounding ‘abstract and ‘universal’ when he believed he had to make that [Absolute] ground [of art] into an individual”, Benjamin claims (SW 1, 166–7). He therefore gave a “false interpretation” of the unity of all works when he conceived this as pertaining to some mystical, singular and transcendental work.

The consequent need for what Benjamin presents as a Goethean modification of Early German Romanticism is laid out in the afterword. The relation between these criticisms of Romanticism and Goethe’s thought is suggested in the claim that, “Ultimately the mystical thesis that art itself is one work…stands in exact correlation with the principle which asserts the indestructibility of works that are purified in irony” (SW 1, 167). With its mistaken emphasis on the singularity of the Idea of art, Romantic fulfilment only coincides with the infinity of the unconditioned, meaning that fulfilment is an essentially non-historical category of the infinite. Such criticism cannot be described as judgement, since all authentic judgement involves an essential negative moment of completion in “self-annihilation” (SW 1, 152). Consequently, because ‘Romantic messianism is not at work in its full force’ here (SW 1, 168), the Romantics were increasingly forced to turn to the “accoutrements” of ethics, religion and politics to provide the content required to complete their theory of art. 

Goethe’s conception of aesthetic judgement and his principle of the ‘uncriticizability’ of great works provided Benjamin with a way of thinking the necessary modification to the Early German Romantic Idea of art. His explication of the implicit metaphysical structure of Goethe’s corresponding Ideal of art reveals the contrasting features of his structure of the Absolute: as a sphere of pure content, a medium of destructive refraction, and a plurality of discontinuous archetypes (Charles 2020, 53–67). Because finite, particular works can never be romanticized into the unity of an individual Absolute, they remains immanently incomplete and yet nonetheless incapable of higher consummation: a “torso”, dismembered in relation to the whole, corpse-like in its deadness. In this context, the true task of criticism becomes not the consummation of the living work, but that destructive completion of the dying one.

Benjamin’s essay on ‘Goethe’s Elective Affinities’ (1924–5) provides an exemplary piece of such criticism, whilst developing the concept further by situating it more explicitly within the context of history. Here, criticism is charged with the task of revealing what Benjamin calls the “truth content of a work of art”, which is intimately bound up with its “material content” at the beginning of the work’s history (SW 1, 297). In contrast to mere commentary—which proceeds no further than a consideration of these now historically anachronistic features of its material content—the aim of criticism is the destruction of this outer layer in order for the work’s inner truth content to be grasped. The fundamental philological error of commentary is merely to situate the work in relation to the “lived experience [Erlebnis]” of its author’s biographical life (exemplified in Friedrich Gundolf’s 1916 biography of Goethe), instead of the broader medium of historical reception through which it has passed down to the contemporary critic. Benjamin’s Romantic theory of immanent criticism insists that the work must contain its own inner criterion, such that the critic proceeds from the work itself and not from the life of the author (SW 1, 321). Beginning, therefore, with the odd and striking features of Goethe’s work that come to preoccupy later critics, Benjamin examines how these are derived from techniques borrowed from the distinct form of the novella. This novella-like construction grants the Elective Affinities its strange, fable-like quality, which differentiates it from the naturalism of a typical novel. It is this mythical layer, as the real material content of the work, which expresses the presence of a pantheistic and “daemonic” attitude toward nature in Goethe’s work.

Truth content, in contrast, is not to be sought in the conspicuous features of the work’s technique, but in the unity of its distinct form. The task of criticism is to make this truth content an object of experience. It concerns itself not with the life or intentions of the artist, but with that semblance or appearance of life that the work itself possesses by virtue of its mimetic capacity for representation: its linguistic expressiveness, which is described as a verging and bordering on life (SW 1, 350). What is essential to art, however, and what distinguishes it from the semblance of nature, is the “expressionless [Ausdruckslose]”: that critical violence within the work of art that “arrests this semblance, spellbinds the movement, and interrupts the harmony” (SW 1, 340). “Only the expressionless completes the work” as a work of art, Benjamin argues, and it does so by shattering the work’s semblance of unity, the false appearance of totality pertaining to it. Unlike the intensification of Romantic reflection, when this semblance itself becomes the object of a higher-level semblance, a refractive dissonance is opened up. Drawing on Hölderlin’s concept of the caesura to describe this moment, Benjamin calls it a “counter-rhythmic rupture” (SW 1, 341). In focusing its efforts on representing this caesura, genuine criticism in turn deepens the refractive violence, performing a destructive or mortuary act of self-annihilation upon the work.

Art, at the very limit of its mimetic capacity, draws attention to its construction and in doing so finds the resources to encapsulate a deeper truth. It is against what Benjamin calls the Christian-mystical certainty in future reconciliation (which Goethe inserts into the conclusion of the novella as an attempt to counter the mythical fatalism which holds sway elsewhere) that he instead endorses the paradoxical glimmer of hope identified with the image of a shooting star which appears in Goethe’s novella (SW 1, 354–5). If the image of the star retains its relationship to the symbolic here, it does so in accordance with Benjamin’s earlier description of the expressionless as “the torso of a symbol” (SW 1, 340). However, it might be better to understand the significance of the caesura here in the context of the theory of allegory. This is only properly formulated in Benjamin’s next major work, his thesis on the Origin of the German Mourning-Play (Ursprung des deutschen Trauerspiels, 1928).

4. Baroque Constellations

‘Mourning-play’ (Trauerspiel) is a term used to characterise a type of drama that emerges during the baroque period of art history in the late 16th and early 17th century. The principle examples discussed in Benjamin’s thesis come not from its great exponents, Pedro Calderón de la Barca and William Shakespeare, but the German dramatists Martin Opitz, Andreas Gryphius, Johann Christian Hallmann, Daniel Caspar von Lohenstein, and August Adolf von Haugwitz. Their plays are characterised by a simplicity of action which is comparable to the classicism of earlier Renaissance theatre, but also contain peculiarly baroque features. These include an exaggerated and violent bombast in their language (including a figurative tendency towards linguistic contraction), an absence of psychological depth in its characters, a preponderance of and dependency upon theatrical props and machinery, and a crude emphasis on violence, suffering and death (cf. Newman 2011; Ferber 2013).

Leaving aside for now the methodological introduction (referred to in English as the ‘Epistemo-Critical Prologue’), the first part of Benjamin’s thesis is concerned with repudiating the dogmatic attempt by later critics to impose onto these plays the external criteria of Aristotelian aesthetics, which are rooted in classical tragedy. Benjamin’s understanding of tragedy here (and his approach to the mourning-play in general) is partially influenced by Friedrich Nietzsche’s The Birth of Tragedy. Benjamin claims that The Birth of Tragedy substantiates the critical insight that the empathy of undirected modern feeling is unhelpful for properly grasping ancient tragedy (OGT, 93). Instead, Nietzsche undertook a metaphysical inquiry into the essence of tragedy as a dialectical interplay of the contrasting aesthetic impulses of Apollonian semblance and Dionysian truth. This dialectic is central to Benjamin’s own philosophical investigations, particularly his claim—derived from his discussion of Goethe’s Elective Affinities—that an expressionless moment is constitutive of art, in which the limits of semblance are broached precisely in order to illuminate an artistic truth.

But Benjamin is also critical of Nietzsche for restricting his approach to aesthetics, and therefore renouncing the understanding of tragedy in historical terms. Lacking a philosophy of history, Nietzsche’s study was unable to situate the political and ethical significance of the metaphysical and mythical features it isolates (OGT, 93). Influenced by ideas from Franz Rosenzweig and Florens Christian Rang (Asman 1992), Benjamin presents tragedy as expressing a perceived break between the prehistorical age of mythical gods and heroes and the emergence of a new ethical and political community. The historical limitations of Nietzsche’s theory of tragedy become acute when it comes to the question of the possibility of a recuperation of the tragic form in modern theatre. Whilst Nietzsche tends to simply denounce the weakness of modern drama against the strength of the Greeks (excepting, in his early work, the operas of Wagner), Benjamin is concerned with establishing whether the historical conditions of the tragic form are themselves a limit to its contemporary efficacy. 

In line with the principles of Romantic criticism discussed above, mourning-plays contain their own distinct form and should be criticised according to their own immanently discovered standards. The “content [Gehalt]” and “ true object” of the baroque mourning-play is not, as it is in tragedy, myth but rather historical life (OGT, 46). As with Goethe’s borrowing of the novella form, this content is in part derived from other aesthetic structures, principally the eschatological focus of mediaeval Christian literature: the Passion-Plays, Mystery-Plays and chronicles whose historiography portrayed “the whole of the course of history, world history as salvation history” (OGT, 65). But the Lutheran renunciation of the Catholic emphasis upon good works, and the secularizing tendency implicit in the naturalistic legal and political philosophies of the 16th and 17th century (discussed in relation to Carl Schmitt’s theory of sovereignty) resulted in the stripping bare of human value and significance from such history. This tense, antinomical combination of transcendence and immanence produces an uneasy hybrid, in which history—as a narrative of the human march towards redemption on the Day of Judgement—loses the eschatological certainty of its redemptive conclusion, and becomes secularized into a mere natural setting for the profane struggle over political power. 

Benjamin’s reflections on sovereign violence in the 17th century may be contrasted with his discussion of the revolutionary kind in his earlier ‘Critique of Violence’ (‘Zur Kritik der Gewalt’, 1921), itself a response to Georges Sorel’s Reflections on Violence (1908). These texts have provoked a number of responses in the context of political theology, most notably from Carl Schmitt, Jacques Derrida and Giorgio Agamben. Schmitt responded directly to Benjamin’s essay in Hamlet or Hecuba (1956). Derrida’s section on the ‘Critique of Violence’ in his Force of Law: The Mystical Foundation of Authority (1989) interrogates this evocation of a revolutionary kind of divine violence, a critical engagement which continues in Derrida’s discussion of the messianic in Spectres of Marx (1994) and ‘Marx and Sons’ (1999), and in relation to Schmitt in The Politics of Friendship (1994). These complex relations between Benjamin, Schmitt, and Derrida have become the subject of a number of studies, including Agamben’s State of Exception (2004) (Bredekamp 1999, 247–266; Liska 2009), although more careful studies have emphasized the clear divergences between Benjamin’s position and those of Derrida and of Schmitt (Tomba 2009, 131–132; Averlar 2005, 79–106; Weber 2008, 176–194). In this respect, it was not Schmitt’s political theology but the reactionary vitalism of Ludwig Klages that proved a more influential and enduring object of fascination for Benjamin (Fuld 1981; McCole 1993, 178–180, 236–246; Wolin 1994, xxxi–xxxviii; Wohlfarth 2002, 65–109; Lebovic 2013, 1–10, 79–110; Charles 2018, 52–62). 

In the second part of his thesis, Benjamin employs the concept of allegory to expose the implicit eschatological structure of these works. However, the first part utilises the distorting tension of this structure to distinguish the specific and historically conspicuous technique of the German baroque mourning-play. This concludes by identifying sorrow or mourning (Trauer) as the predominant mood inherent to its metaphysical structure, in contrast to the suffering of tragedy. With the “total secularization of the historical in the state of creation…History passes into the setting” to become natural history (OGT, 81), whose attendant cognition is a melancholic contemplation of things which derives enigmatic satisfaction from its very recognition of their transience and emptiness (OGT, 141). “For all wisdom of the melancholic hearkens to the deep”, Benjamin claims: “it is won from immersion in the life of creaturely things, and nothing of the voice of revelation reaches it. Everything to do with Saturn points into the depths of the earth…” (OGT, 157).

To grasp how the form of these works are determined by their truth content requires a reconstruction of the baroque concept of the allegorical which structures its mood of melancholic contemplativeness. Benjamin’s claim is that a genuine understanding of the allegorical as it emerged in its highest form in the 17th century has been obscured by, on the one hand, the later Romantic aestheticizing of the symbol and, on the other, by the tendency to conceive the allegorical negatively in its contrast with this devalued, aesthetic concept. It is only by first recovering a genuine theological concept of the symbol, therefore, that we are able in turn to distinguish an authentic concept of the allegorical. This it to be done by reasserting the profound but paradoxical theological unity between the material and the transcendental found in the symbolic. The fundamental distinction between theological concepts of symbol and the allegory will then be seen as concerning not their differing objects (Idea vs. abstract concept), but the differing ways in which they signify, express or represent this object. Benjamin will conclude that this difference is, specifically, a temporal one. 

Drawing on undeveloped insights found in the work of the mythographers Georg Friedrich Creuzer and Johann Joseph von Görres, Benjamin points out how “the temporal measure for the experience of the symbol[Symbolerfahrung] is the mystical instant [Nu]” (OGT, 173). We must understand the temporality of the allegorical, in contrast, as something dynamic, mobile, and fluid. This authentic concept of allegory arises in the 17th century baroque as a response to the antithesis between mediaeval religiosity and Renaissance secularization discussed earlier. The spatialization of the temporal structure of eschatology in the allegorical corresponds to the naturalization of the religious structure of history in the baroque: “Whereas in the symbol, with the sublimation of downfall, the transfigured countenance of nature reveals itself fleetingly in the light of salvation, in allegory there lies before the eyes of the observer the facies hippocratica [lit. ‘Hippocratic face’ = the sunken, hollow and pinched features exhibited by the dying] of history as petrified primal landscape. History, in everything untimely, sorrowful, and miscarried that belongs to it from the beginning, is inscribed in a face—no, in a death’s head [Totenkopfe]” (OGT, 174).

From the perspective of the allegorical, the instantaneous transformation within the symbolic becomes a natural history slowed to such an extreme that every sign appears frozen and—seemingly loosened from every other relationship—arbitrary. The concrete corporeality of the written script exemplifies this allegorical emphasis upon things. Allegory is not the conventional representation of some expression, as misunderstood by later critics, but an expression of convention [Ausdruck der Konvention] (OGT, 185). Allegorical expression includes as its object this very conventionality of the historical, this appearance of insignificance and indifference. That is, convention itself comes to be signified or expressed. What Benjamin rediscovers in the allegorical is, then, something akin to the concept of the expressionless, as the torso of a symbol, introduced in the essay on Goethe. Benjamin argues that this predominance of the allegorical viewpoint in the 17th century baroque finds it most dramatic expression in the mourning-play, and that consequently the Idea of the mourning-play must be grasped via the allegorical.

The Erkenntniskritische Vorrede or ‘Epistemo-Critical Prologue’ to the work may be understood as having  two central functions: it provides a direct methodological justification for the theory of criticism being utilised in the work, by way of a problematization of existing disciplinary approaches, and it implicitly recovers a concept of allegorical experience which is delineated  in the second part of the thesis in terms amenable for modernity. At the level of methodology, Benjamin advocates the necessity of a transdisciplinary approach (Osborne 2011, 24) to artworks, capable of critically overcoming the epistemological and historical limitations of the existing disciplines of the philosophy of art and the history of art (specifically, literary history). This transdisciplinary aspect of Benjamin’s thesis may partially account for the difficulties in its reception at the University of Frankfurt, where the thesis was rejected by the departments of both philosophy and literature. Much of the theoretical discussion in the Prologue is concerned with correcting the methodological one-sidedness of each existing approach by way of the positive features of the other. In general, the philosophy of art correctly attends to the problem of essences, but remains hampered by its lack of any adequate historical consideration. Conversely, the history of art is preoccupied with historical lineage but has no adequate concept of essence. Yet it is not simply an amalgamation of aesthetics and history that is required, but their radical rethinking in accordance with first a historical concept of essence and second a philosophical concept of history. 

Broadly speaking, Benjamin’s theory of Ideas transposes the philosophical problem of metaphysical realism into the context of aesthetics. That is, it asks about the reality of aesthetic genres such as ‘tragedy’ or of artistic epochs such as the ‘Renaissance’ that classify a group of particular works according to a set of common characteristics. The Prologue criticises existing traditions of aesthetic nominalism for their inadequate resolution of the problem. The uncritical use of inductive methods demonstrated by literary historians rejects the hypostatization of terms such as “Renaissance” on the grounds that it promotes a false identity between similar empirical features, which obscures their diversity. This aversion to any realism of constitutive Ideas is grounded on the positivist criterion of factual verification. A term like the “Renaissance” is consequently utilised by them only on the proviso that it is understood as merely an abstract general concept. This quickly leads to scepticism, however, since its still fails to address the problematic criteria by which this general concept is initially picked out and abstracted from the multiplicity of particulars or on what grounds these particulars are grouped together. Consequently, it fails to appreciate the necessity of the Platonic postulation of Ideas for the representation of essences: whilst concepts seek to make the similar identical, Ideas are necessary to effect a dialectical synthesis between phenomenal extremes (OGT, 18–19). In contrast, philosophers of art possess a concern with the essential that ends up renouncing any notion of generic forms, on the grounds that the singular originality of every single work entails the only possible essential genre must be the universal and individual one of art itself. The error—as Benjamin had previously charged the Early German Romantics, discussed above—is to dissolve real and important aesthetic structures or forms into an undifferentiated unity (of art), which denies their irreducible multiplicity (OGT, 21–23).

The theory of Ideas presented in the Prologue is truncated and difficult to understand outside the context of Benjamin’s earlier works, and the philosophical tradition that it engages with is further obscured in the first English translation. However, the critical aspects of Benjamin’s investigation advocate—against aesthetic versions of positivist empiricism—a metaphysical realism, and, against certain versions of philosophical idealism, a non-singular essentialism. That is, he does not restrict the possibility of metaphysical reality only to actual empirical particulars and he advocates the multiplicity and not singularity of the essence (understood, in Goethean terms, as a harmony and not a unity of truth). In doing so, he must address that  ‘theological’ paradox, mentioned in the discussion of symbol and allegory, of how the transcendental/supersensuous appears immanently within the material/sensuous. Benjamin is clear that the relation between Ideas and phenomenon is neither one of Aristotelian ‘containment’ nor one of Kantian lawfulness or hypothesis. Ideas are not given to some intellectual intuition, but they are capable of being sensuously represented. Such a sensuous representation of the truth remains the task of philosophy.

Benjamin’s theoretical elaboration proceeds by startling imagistic reconfigurations of pre-existing elements within the philosophical tradition. He offers a number of possibilities for thinking such Ideas in the Prologue, taken from the realm not only of philosophy but of aesthetics, theology and science. The first is the Platonic Idea, here divorced from its association with the scientific ascent to some purely rational, objective knowledge (such as appears in the account of dialectic in the Republic) and instead linked to the discussion of beautiful semblance in the Symposium (OGT, 6). The second is that of the Adamic Name, as developed in his earlier theory of language. In this context, he comments that the Early German Romantics were frustrated in their attempt to renew the theory of Ideas because truth took on the character of reflective consciousness for them, rather than that intentionless, linguistic character in which things were subsumed under essential Names by Adam’s primal-interrogation [urvernehmen] (OGT, 15). Naming is the primal history [Urgeschicte] of signifying, indicating a thing-like disinterest which contrasts with the directed, unifying intentionality of Husserlian phenomenology (OGT, 14). The third is the Goethean Ideal, which is recalled here in the context of the Faustian “Mothers” and which implicitly gestures towards his earlier discussions of Goethe (OGT, 11). Finally, and most famously, Benjamin compares the virtual objectivity of the Idea represented through the reconfiguring of actual phenomena to an astrological constellation, which simultaneously groups together and is revealed by the cluster of individual stars (OGT, 11). Truth is said to be “actualized in the round dance of presented Ideas [vergegenwärtigt im Reigen der dargestellen Ideen]” (OGT, 4). This concept of the constellation is taken up directly in Adorno’s inaugural lecture ‘The Actuality of Philosophy’, where he speaks of ‘the manipulation of conceptual material by philosophy…of grouping and trial arrangement, of constellation and construction’ (Adorno 1931, 131). It comes to inform Benjamin’s philosophical practice in his major writings from this point onwards, from One-Way Street (1928), via the methodological demand for the construction of history and the attendant theory of the dialectical image in his work related to the “Arcades Project” in the 1930s, through to the concept of history presented in his celebrated late essay, ‘On the Concept of History’ (1940). 

Benjamin’s concern to reincorporate the perspective of art’s temporal transformation demands an analogous radicalization. The “genetic and concrete classification” (OGT, 24) that Benedetto Croce called history (in order to distinguish it from that generalizing thought that abstracts away from change and development) must now be reconciled with Benjamin’s theory of Ideas. For the messianic philosophy of history that grounds Benjamin’s work problematizes existing formulations of the concepts of history and historical origin. In line with his discussion of the Idea, the concept of historical origin should not be reduced to the causality and actuality of the empirically factual, nor should it be regarded as a purely logical and timeless essence. It is not merely, Benjamin argues, “the coming-to-be of what has originated ” and cannot be recognized in “the naked, manifest existence of the factual” (OGT, 24). For the ‘historical’ sequence that permits the Idea to be represented must include not only that of the actual phenomena of a given period, but also that of their subsequent development in the understanding of later epochs. An investigation of the essence of the German mourning-play, for example, cannot restrict itself to contemporaneous events and actual plays as if these were ‘facts’ settled and decided once and for all, but must also investigate the changing understanding of this historical epoch and the varying reception of these plays, including the prior conditions of its own self-understanding. But nor is it a “purely logical” category, as if the Idea were some essence detached from and unrelated to history, to be grasped through an abstraction from all these particular historical developments (OGT, 25). Origin [Ursprung] is therefore distinguished from a merely genetic coming-into-being [Enstehung] and evolutionary development of ‘pure history’, to include the essential inner history of the “life of the works and forms” (OGT, 24–6). The “science of the Origin” is a philosophical history, a history of the essential, whose contemplation enlists a dialectical perspective to grasp the form of the “original phenomenon”: as something subject to a process of becoming and disappearing, and therefore only partial and incomplete. Benjamin once again resorts to an image: “The origin stands as eddy in the stream of becoming and vigorously draws the emerging material into its rhythm” (OGT, 24). Criticism attempts to virtually reassemble the fore- and after-history [Vor- und Nachgeschichte] of the phenomena into a historical constellation, in which the Idea is represented and the phenomena redeemed. This is its messianic function in relation to the historical Absolute. 

The Prologue also seeks to rescue the allegorical experience recognised in the mourning-plays for a modern theory of criticism. Allegorical contemplation aims at the ruination of things so that it can, in its redemptive moment, construct [baun] a new whole out of the elements of the old. The character of this construction distinguishes it from the creative invention of fantasy, since it manipulates and rearranges pre-existing material. To leave an imprint or impression of this construction [Konstruktion] is one of its aims. This dual emphasis upon destruction and construction has led a number of scholars to see an anticipation of Derridean deconstruction in Benjamin’s work (Fischer 1996, Section 1: Modernity/Postmodernity; Weber 2008, 122–128), although it should be noted that his consideration of the specific historicity of this concept of criticism and his insistence of the immanent truth content of artworks remains resolutely modernist, and cannot be easily assimilated into any ‘postmodernist’ position (cf. Weigel 1996, xiv). The underlying affinity between romanticism and the baroque lies in their shared modernist concern with correcting classicism in art and the quasi-mythical perspective of classicism in general (OGT, 230; 185). The Prologue reflects upon this ‘modernity’ of the baroque when it notes how the “Striking analogies to the current state of German literature have repeatedly given rise to …immersion in the Baroque” (OGT, 36). Although Benjamin is citing the similarities between Expressionism in modern literature and the Mannerist exaggeration of the baroque, his own reconstruction of allegorical experience and its value for aesthetic theory is experienced according to a historical conjunction between the baroque past and the modernity of Benjamin’s present: modernity both reveals and is revealed in the baroque. 

The book on mourning-plays concluded Benjamin’s German “cycle of production” (C, 322). At the beginning of the 1920s Benjamin became immersed in what was planned as a large-scale study of political thought, of which only a few fragments and the ‘Critique of Violence’ remain (Steiner 2001, 61). As Uwe Steiner notes, while Benjamin’s political thought may be situated in the milieu of Expressionist Nietzsche-reception, the centrality that the realization of happiness occupies in his definition of politics as “the satisfaction of unenhanced humanness” is constructed in direct opposition to Zarathustra’s tragic heroism (Steiner 2001, 49–50, 61–62). This marks both a continuity with and a break from what Irving Wohlfarth has called his earlier “politics of Youth” (Wohlfarth 1992, 164), which drew heavily on a philosophy of history and culture influenced by Nietzsche’s Untimely Meditations. Benjamin remarked that his break from the Youth Movement did not constitute the abandonment of this earlier thought, however, but its submergence into a ‘harder, purer, more invisible radicalism’ (C, 74). This in part accounts for what T. J. Clark describes as the “cryptic” character of - what Adorno termed (SW 4, 101-2) - the anthropological materialism of The Arcades Project, where, Clark comments, it is “as if such a politics were being actively aired and developed elsewhere” (Clark 2003, 45–46).

A new cycle was initiated with One-Way Street (Einbahnstraße), written 1923–6, published 1928), whose form and content puts into practice that speculative concept of experience, with its allegorical immersion into the depths of things, which was theoretically articulated in the works considered above. The city furnishes the sensuous, imagistic material for One-Way Street, whilst the genres of the leaflet, placard and advertisement provide the constructive principle by which it is rearranged as a constellation. This formal methodology resembles the technological media of photography and film, as well as the avant-garde practices of Russian Constructivism and French Surrealism. This entails what Adorno describes as a “philosophy directed against philosophy” (Adorno 1955, 235) or what Howard Caygill calls a “philosophizing beyond philosophy” (Caygill 1989, 119).

The presentation of contemporary capitalism as metropolitan modernity in One-Way Street also marks the turning point in Benjamin’s writings, away from what he retrospectively called “an archaic form of philosophizing naively caught up in nature” (BA, 88) towards the development of “a political view of the past” (SW 2, 210). The theory of experience outlined in his early writings is enlisted for revolutionary ends. In the essay, ‘Surrealism: The Last Snapshot of the European Intelligentsia’ (1929), Surrealist experience provides an example of a “profane illumination”, which in contrast to the sacred and moralistic kind found in religion was guided by a political and a “materialistic, anthropological inspiration” (SW 2, 209). The latent energy residing in the most destitute and outmoded of things is, through the construction of new political constellations, transformed into an intoxicating, revolutionary experience (SW 2, 210). The possibility of such a profane illumination of nineteenth century Paris, to be presented as the origin of modernity, preoccupied the remaining decade of Benjamin’s life, and his research for the monumental and unfinished “Arcades Project” provides the material from which all his remaining work is constructed.

5. The Arcades Project

The city was the seedbed of Benjamin’s ‘gothic’ Marxism (Cohen 1993); Paris its testing ground. All of Benjamin’s writings from the autumn of 1927 until his death in 1940 relate in one way or other to his great unfinished study ‘Paris—Capital of the Nineteenth Century’, otherwise known as The Arcades Project (Das Passagen-Werk), after its founding image, taken by Benjamin from the 1926 novel, Le Paysan de Paris, by the French surrealist Louis Aragon. This was a book of which Benjamin wrote: “I could never read more than two or three pages in bed at night before my heart started to beat so strongly that I had to lay the book aside.” (BA, 88) The arcades would become just one of five or six archetypal images of the psychosocial space of 19th-century Paris around which the project was organized—each paired with a particular, thematically representative individual. But it provided the model for the others, and its surrealist origin and liminal utopian impulse, neither quite inside nor out, established the wish-image and the dream-image—on the threshold of sleeping and waking—at the heart of a work that was initially conceived as a kind of ‘dialectical fairytale’. (The figure with whom ‘the arcades’ was paired was the utopian socialist Charles Fourier.) All of Benjamin’s major essays of the 1930s derived their impetus and orientation from his Arcades work, and served to defer its completion in the act of elaborating its elements. 

This deferral was also, in part, the result of a process of maturation—a kind of ripening—immanent to the work itself. The Arcades was a vast and ambitious project, not simply in terms of the mass and breadth of its archival sources (sought out by Benjamin in the Bibliothèque Nationale in Paris), but also—indeed, primarily—with respect to its philosophical and historical intent, and the methodological and representational challenges it posed. Its sprawling, yet minutely investigated historical object was to act as the point of entry into the philosophically comprehended experience of metropolitan capitalism—not some past experience, or the experience of a past phase of capitalist development, but the experience of the capitalist metropolis in Benjamin’s own day—through the construction of a specific series of relations between its elements ‘then’ and ‘now’. The practice of research, conceptual organization and presentation that it involved was self-consciously conceived as a working model for a new, philosophically oriented, materialist historiography with political intent. Its final, fragmentary and ‘ruined’ status has come to stand not simply as the sign of a failure of completion, but as a paradigm of a form of constitutive incompletion that is characteristic of all systematically oriented knowledge under the conditions of modernity. In this respect, in its very failure to be actualized, it confirmed the fundamental historical and philosophical truth of Benjamin’s earlier analysis of the Romantic fragment—extending the genre in a hitherto unimagined way.

In the ebb and flow of its changing rhythms—additions, revisions, reformulations and retrievals—Benjamin’s Arcades Project provides an extraordinary case study in the labour of conceptual construction via the configuration and reconfiguration of archival materials. The voluminous ‘Notes and Materials’ that make up the Arcades as it has come down to us remained unpublished until 1982, finally appearing in English only in 1999 (GS V; AP). Only since their publication has it been possible to get a clear sense of the overall trajectory of Benjamin’s thought during this period—rendering redundant, or at least displacing, many of the polemics associated with previous cycles of reception. The notes and materials are organized into twenty-six alphabetically designated ‘convolutes’ (literally ‘bundles’) or folders, thematically defined by various objects (arcades, catacombs, barricades, iron constructions, mirrors, modes of lighting…), topics (fashion, boredom, theory of knowledge, theory of progress, painting, conspiracies…), figures (the collector, the flaneur, the automaton…), authors (Baudelaire, Fourier, Jung, Marx, Saint-Simon…) and their combinations. The project as a whole received two ‘exposés’ or summaries, in 1935 and 1939 (the second, in French). However, its scope and theoretical ambition—nothing less than a philosophical construction of “the primal history of the nineteenth century” (BA, 90)—joined with the circumstances of Benjamin’s life in exile (the constant need to earn money by writing and the uncertainty of a publisher for the project) to frustrate its realization. The only lengthy segment of completed text derives from the part devoted to Baudelaire (one of five parts in the 1939 exposé, cut down from six in the initial 1935 version): the second of its three projected sections, ‘The Paris of the Second Empire in Baudelaire’—although even this was never published in Benjamin’s lifetime. However, the central chapter of this section, ‘The Flaneur’, was revised and expanded (in part, in response to an exchange of letters with Adorno) into the essay ‘Some Motifs in Baudelaire’, which was published in the Institute’s journal, Zeitschrift für Sozialforschung (Journal for Social Research) in January 1940. A powerful compressed draft of material corresponding to the final section, on the commodity as a poetic object, exists as ‘Central Park’ (SW 4, 161–199). As the project evolved, and in response to the barriers to its realization, Baudelaire thus became increasingly central to Benjamin’s thinking. (‘Convolute J’, on Baudelaire, is by far the longest of the convolutes.) Encouraged by Horkheimer, Benjamin planned to publish the material on Baudelaire as a separate book, to be entitled, Charles Baudelaire: A Lyric Poet in the Era of High Capitalism. The development of this process, whereby a primal history of the nineteenth century gradually morphed into a book on Baudelaire and ‘high capitalism’, may be represented, diagrammatically, as follows.

A. Fourier, or the Arcades
(+) [Daguerre, or the Panorama—only in the 1935 version]
B. Grandville, or the World Exhibitions
C. Louis Philippe, or the Interior
D. Baudelaire, or the Streets of Paris
Charles Baudelaire, A Lyric Poet in the Era of High Capitalism
1.[Baudelaire as Allegorist]
2.The Paris of the 2nd Empire in Baudelaire
i. The Bohème
ii. The Flaneur*
iii. The Modern
3.[The Commodity as Poetic Object]**
E. Haussmann, or the Barricades
* Expanded and published as ‘Some Motifs in Baudelaire’ (1940)
** In draft form as ‘Central Park’ (1938)

However, to reduce the project to its own, restricted de facto trajectory, rich as it is, does too much violence to the historical and philosophical framework it embodies, from which the material on Baudelaire gains its broader significance. The overarching historical framework is that of capitalist modernity as a ‘crisis of experience’. (The two terms, capitalism and modernity, are inextricable for Benjamin in the context of 19th- and early 20th-century Europe.) The founding problematic of Benjamin’s thought—the expansion of the Kantian concept of experience, to infinity—is thus here provided with a concretely historical context, in which the notion of infinity/absoluteness becomes associated with the concept of history itself. The problem: to dialectically redeem the concept of experience [Erfahrung] by finding an appropriate way of experiencing the crisis of experience itself. In classically ‘modern’ terms, the present is defined as a time of crisis and transition, and philosophical experience (truth) is associated with the glimpse within the present, via the past, of a utopian political future that would bring history to an end. More immediately, the crisis is given political meaning by two possible resolutions: the one destructive; the other constructive/ emancipatory—fascism and communism, respectively. In this respect, for all his theoretical heterodoxy as a ‘Marxist’ and his philosophical affinities with Adorno, Benjamin was in search of, and in solidarity with, new forms of collectivity connected to a communist future. Herein lay the basis of his friendship with Brecht. Unlike Brecht, however, he conceived them within the terms of a speculative cultural history (Caygill 2004).

Within this framework, three distinct strands of work (discussed in the next three sections) can be discerned: (1) investigation of the crisis of experience via the ‘crisis of the arts’ (SW  2, 212) through the interrelated terms of technology/technique [Technik], aura, reproducibility, and collectivity; (2) philosophical distillation of the formal structure of the experience of the new, and its historical and political contradictions, out of its social forms, and the examination of its relations to allegory and commodity-form; (3) construction of a new historiography and a new philosophical concept of history. The first may be traced through a linked series of essays of which ‘Surrealism: The Last Snapshot of the European Intelligentsia’ (1929), ‘Little History of Photography’ (1931), ‘The Work of Art in the Age of its Technical Reproducibility’ (1935–9) and ‘The Storyteller’ (1936) are the most important. The second is concentrated in readings of Baudelaire and related texts by Nietzsche and Blanqui. (The focusing-in on these three thinkers is a focusing-in on the relationship of capitalism to modernity in its purest, nihilistic form). The third is conjured from a reflective conjunction of Marx, Nietzsche and Surrealism. It takes methodological form in ‘Convolute N [On the Theory of Knowledge, Theory of Progress]’ in The Arcades Project and achieved its accidentally definitive presentation in Benjamin’s most frequently cited, but still fiercely interpretatively disputed text (Caygill 2004; Löwy 2005; Tiedemman 1989; Wohlfarth 1978): the fragments—known as theses—‘On the Concept of History’.

6. Art and Technology

That Benjamin approached the symptomatic significance of the ‘crisis of the arts’ for the ‘crisis of experience’ through the concept of Technik attests to the fundamentally Marxist character of his conception of historical development. It is the development of the forces of production that is the motor of history. However, Benjamin was no more orthodox a Marxist about technology than he was with regard to the concept of progress, the Marxist version of which the German Social Democratic Party (SPD) grounded upon it (see Section 8, below). Not only did he recognize the potential for a “bloodbath” in a technology subjected to “the lust for profit” (SW  1, 487)—amply demonstrated in the horrors of the First World War—but he came to distinguish between a ‘first’ and a ‘second’, potentially liberatory technology, the latter making possible “a highly productive use of the human being’s self-alienation” (SW 3, 107; 113). It appears, in places, as the basis for a kind of ‘technological cosmopolitics’ or politics of a ‘new collective technoid body’ (Caygill 2005, 225; Leslie 2000, 153, in Osborne 2005, II: 391).

The mastery of nature, so the imperialists teach, is the purpose of all technology [Technik]. But …technology is not the mastery of nature but of the relation between nature and humanity. …In technology a physis is being organized through which mankind’s contact with the cosmos takes a new and different form from that which it had in nations [Völkern] and families. (SW 1, 487, translation amended)

The collective is a body, too. And the physis that is being organized for it in technology can, through all its political and factual reality, only be produced in that image sphere to which profane illumination initiates us. Only when in technology body and image so interpenetrate that all revolutionary tension becomes bodily collective innervation, and all the bodily innervations of the collective become revolutionary discharge, has reality transcended itself to the extent demanded by the Communist Manifesto. (SW 2, 217–8)

These passages, from the concluding sections of One-Way Street and the ‘Surrealism’ essay, respectively, convey something of the ecstatic character of Benjamin’s political thought at the outset of the 1930s, in which technology appears on a political knife-edge between its possibilities as “a fetish of doom” and “a key to happiness” (SW 2, 321). Art—an art of the masses—appears within this scenario as the educative mechanism through which the body of the collective can begin to appropriate its own technological potential.

The first technology really sought to master nature, whereas the second aims rather at an interplay between nature and humanity. The primary social function of art today is to rehearse that interplay. This applies especially to film. The function of film is to train human beings in the apperception and reactions needed to deal with a vast apparatus whose role in their lives is expanding almost daily. Dealing with this apparatus also teaches them that technology will release them from their enslavement to the powers of the apparatus only when humanity’s whole constitution has adapted itself to the new productive forces which the second technology has set free. (SW 3, 107–8)

In his footnote to this passage from the second version of ‘The Work of Art in the Age of its Technical Reproducibility’ (‘Das Kunstwerk im Zeitalter seiner technischen Reproduzierbarkeit’, 1936), Benjamin refers us to the ‘phalansteries’, the “self-contained agrarian collectives” of Fourier’s socialist utopia. In the Fourier convolute of the Arcades Project, these are compared to the two main articles of Benjamin’s politics: “the idea of revolution as an innervation of the technical organs of the collective… and the idea of the ‘cracking open of natural teleology’” (AP, [W7, 4], 631). For Benjamin, art, in the form of film—the “unfolding <result> of all the forms of perception, the tempos and rhythms, which lie preformed in today’s machines”—thus harboured the possibility of becoming a kind of rehearsal of the revolution. “[A]ll problems of contemporary art”, Benjamin insisted, “find their definitive formulation only in the context of film” (AP, [K3, 3], 394). In this respect, it was the combination of the communist pedagogy and constructive devices of Brecht’s epic theatre that marked it out for him as a theatre for the age of film (UB, 1–25; Wizisla 2009).

Benjamin’s writings on film are justly renowned for their twin theses of the transformation of the concept of art by its ‘technical reproducibility’ and the new possibilities for collective experience this contains, in the wake of the historical decline of the ‘aura’ of the work of art, a process that film is presented as definitively concluding. Much ink has been spilt debating the thesis of the decline of the aura in Benjamin’s work. On the one hand, with regard to some of his writings, Benjamin’s concept of aura has been accused of fostering a nostalgic, purely negative sense of modernity as loss—loss of unity both with nature and in community (A. Benjamin 1989). On the other hand, in the work on film, Benjamin appears to adopt an affirmative technological modernism, which celebrates the consequences of the decline. Adorno, for one, felt betrayed by the latter position. He wrote to Benjamin on 18 March 1936:

In your earlier writings… you distinguished the idea of the work of art as a structure from the symbol of theology on the one hand, and from the taboo of magic on the other. I now find it somewhat disturbing —and here I can see a sublimated remnant of certain Brechtian themes—that you have now rather casually transferred the concept of the magical aura to the ‘autonomous work of work’ and flatly assigned a counter-revolutionary function to the latter. (BA, 128)

Brecht himself, meanwhile, was appalled by even the residually negative function of the aura, recording his response in his Workbook: “it is all mysticism mysticism, in a posture opposed to mysticism. … it is rather ghastly” (cited in Buck-Morss 1977, 149). Yet Adorno did not defend ‘auratic art’ as such. (His defence of autonomous art was grounded on the experience derived from following the ‘autonomous’ technical development of laws of form.)

Clearly, the concept of the aura plays a number of different roles in Benjamin’s writings, in his various attempts to grasp his historical present in terms of the possibilities for ‘experience’ afforded by its new cultural forms; which he increasingly came to identify (some say precipitously) with revolutionary political potential. Yet Adorno was wrong to see a simple change of position, rather than a complex series of inflections of what was a generally consistent historical account. Benjamin had written affirmatively of “the emancipation of object from aura” as early as 1931, in his ‘Little History of Photography’, in which he described Atget’s photographs as “suck[ing] the aura out of reality like water from a sinking ship” (SW 2, 518). It is here that we find the basic definition of aura: “A strange weave of space and time: the unique appearance or semblance of distance, no matter how close it may be.” Importantly, the examples given with this definition are from nature: mountains and a branch observed “at rest on a summer’s noon … until the moment or the hour become part of their appearance…”. The ‘destruction’ of the aura by transience and reproducibility is judged “a salutary estrangement” (SW 2, 518–9). Similarly, when ‘The Storyteller’ recounts the “dying out of the art of storytelling” and “the incomparable aura that surrounds the storyteller”, it is nonetheless maintained: “nothing could be more fatuous than to wish to see it as merely a ‘symptom of decay’, let alone a ‘modern symptom’. It is rather, only a concomitant of the secular productive forces of history…” (SW 3, 146; 162). ‘The Work of Art’ essay extends and enriches the earlier account of photography’s technological transformation of perception (“the optical unconscious”) with reference to film. The difference resides in the insistent political dimension of the later essay (after Hitler’s taking of power in 1933), and its determination to introduce concepts “that are completely useless for the purposes of fascism” (SW 3, 102). The main problem with the auratic (which is deemed historically residual, not eliminated, indeed is perhaps ineliminable [Didi-Huberman 2004]) was that, Benjamin believed, it was precisely “useful for fascism”. This context over-determines the essay throughout, with its almost Manichean oppositions between ritual and politics, cult value and exhibition value. Quite apart from the intervening technological and social developments, it makes it a very difficult text simply to ‘use’ today. For some, however, it is precisely the connection it draws between a certain kind of mass culture and fascism that provides its continuing relevance (Buck-Morss 1992).

7. Baudelaire and the Modern

Benjamin’s thinking of ‘the modern’ [die Moderne] is his most important theoretical contribution to the historical study of cultural forms. Frequently mistranslated in early English-language editions of his writings as ‘modernism’, and still often rendered as ‘modernity’ (although Benjamin tended to retain Baudelaire’s coinage, la modernité, when making that reference), die Moderne designates both a formal temporal structure and the diverse range of its historical instances—past and present. Baudelaire is the main writer through whom Benjamin thought ‘the modern’; not as might be expected, with reference to the canonical account of modernité in ‘The Painter of Modern Life’ (1859/60), but with regard to what Benjamin called the ‘theory’ of the modern first set down in ‘The Salon of 1845’: “the advent of the true new (die Heraufkunft des wahrhaft Neunen)” (SW 4, 45–6, translation amended; GS 1.2, 580). 

In Baudelaire’s ‘The Painter’ essay, modernité famously denotes ‘the ephemeral, the fugitive, the contingent’. It is associated with transitoriness as the generalized social instantiation of the temporality of the modern, in the capitalist metropolis. In contrast to transitoriness as such, however, Benjamin was first and foremost (politically and philosophically) interested in ‘the new’, in its ‘advent’ or historical becoming, and in its quality as newness or novelty (the newness of the new), in a way that was conceptually distinct from the conventional opposition of the ‘modern’ to the ‘ancient’—which Baudelaire notoriously retained. As a result, Benjamin was consequently also interested in what the German sociologist Max Weber would have called its ‘routinization’ (although Benjamin did not use this vocabulary): the routinization accompanying the generalization of the new as a mode of experience—in fashion and boredom, in particular—and the formal structure of sameness involved in its repetition. It is here that transitoriness enters the picture—as a result of the generalization of novelty. Baudelaire self-consciously embraced modernity with ‘heroic effort’, attempting, like the painter of modern life, to ‘extract its epic aspects’ and ‘distill the eternal from the transitory’; Benjamin, on the other hand, sought to understand it in order to find a way out of what he called its ‘hell’. He picked up on the relationship of the transitory to the eternal in Baudelaire’s account of modernity, but first, he de-classicized the notion of the ‘eternal’, refiguring it philosophically, and second, he rendered the relationship itself strictly dialectical: in the modern, it is transitoriness itself that is eternalized.

Thus, Benjamin did not so much take over and update Baudelaire’s portrayal of modernity as read it ‘symptomatically’ (in Louis Althusser’s sense), or more precisely, allegorically, in order to uncover beneath it the experience of the transformation of historical time by the commodity form. Baudelaire was able to grasp this experience, according to Benjamin, through the contradictory historical temporality that structured his work: at once resolutely modern yet, in its poetic form (lyric), already anachronistic. Benjamin similarly valued the disjunctive historical temporality of Kafka’s fables: their status as parables after the ‘end of storytelling’. But whereas Kafka was for Benjamin “the figure of a failure” (BS, 226)—the inevitable failure of an attempt to translate the experience [Erlebnis] of modernity into the language of tradition (Judaism)—Baudelaire’s poetry was able to convey the intensity of the experience of modernity through the very tension between that experience and his chosen, lyrical means; not merely negatively (like Kafka), but via the way in which modernity transformed those means. In particular, the lyric allowed Baudelaire to register the full effect of the temporality of the modern on the dissolution of subjectivity, and the fact that it consequently “takes a heroic constitution to live the modern [die Moderne]” (SW 4, 44, translation amended; GS 1.2, 577). The extraction of the metropolitan ‘motifs’ for which Benjamin’s reading of Baudelaire is justly famous—the bohemian, the flaneur, the prostitute, the gambler, the ragpicker—are the figures via which this structure of experience appears. Primary within Baudelaire, they are nonetheless methodologically secondary for Benjamin, as he explained to Adorno: “I only have to insert [them] in the appropriate place” (BA, 90). Baudelaire had found a method—what he called ‘correspondences’—which reflectively incorporated the anachronism of the lyric form into his work. Benjamin appropriated this method, with its dissociated ‘ritual elements’ (SW 4, 333), to read Baudelaire himself. In the essay ‘Some Motifs in Baudelaire’, correspondences of temporal structure, experienced as ‘shock’, link the machine, the film, the crowd, and the game of chance:

What determines the rhythm of production on a conveyor belt is the same thing that underlies the rhythm of reception in the film. … The shock experience [Chockerlebnis] which the passer-by has in the crowd corresponds to the isolated ‘experiences’ of the worker at his machine. … The jolt in the movement of a machine is like the so-called coup in a game of chance…. (SW 4, 328–30)

A single repetitive and dissociated formal temporal structure is detected beneath the rich array of phenomenological forms presented in Baudelaire’s poetry: “the price for which the sensation of the modern could be had: the disintegration of the aura in shock experience”. (SW 4, 343, translation amended; GS 1.2, 653)

Furthermore, this interpretative key, the experience of shock, is itself understood through a series of theoretical correspondences within Benjamin’s own present; primarily, that between Proust’s ‘involuntary memory’ and Freud’s theory of consciousness. This theoretical correspondence is read in the light of the ‘shell shock’ first diagnosed during the First World War, about which Benjamin had previously written in his reflections on Ernst Junger in his 1930 review essay, ‘Theories of German Fascism’ (SW 2, 312–321). The connection of the modern to fascism does not appear solely through the thematic of the false restoration of the aura, but also within the process of its disintegration by shock. (Structurally, the shock of the crowd is ‘like’ shell shock.) Baudelaire is thus not merely the privileged writer for the advent of the theory of the modern, but the one in whose work the nineteenth century appears most clearly as the fore-life of the present. However, if it was through Baudelaire that Benjamin grasped the structure of the temporality of the ‘modern’, it was through Nietzsche and Blanqui that he explored its ambiguous historical meaning, via the way in which their philosophies reflect the transformation of the new by the commodity into the ‘ever selfsame’. “Just as in the seventeenth century it is allegory that becomes the canon of dialectical images, in the nineteenth century it is novelty” (AP, 11):  “The commodity has taken the place of the allegorical mode of apprehension.” (SW 4, 188)

It is the fragment ‘Central Park’ that most clearly reveals the consequences of Benjamin’s reading of Baudelaire for his concept of history: the modern completely transforms the possibilities for the experience of history. On the one hand, it de-historicizes experience, wresting it away from the temporal continuities of tradition. On the other hand, a messianic structure—an opening of history to something outside of time—reasserts itself within the still life [nature mort] of modernity’s restless sameness. This is Benjamin’s famous ‘dialectics at a standstill’ (Tiedemann, 1982). It transforms the historical naturalism of the baroque, analyzed in the Origin of the German Mourning-Play (Section 4, above), in a futural direction. In particular, it involves a prioritization of the interruptive stasis of the image over the continuity of temporal succession. In fact, Benjamin maintained: “The concept of historical time forms an antithesis to the idea of a temporal continuum” (SW 4, 407).]

8. Image, History, Culture

Debate over Benjamin’s conception of history was for many years preoccupied with the question of whether it is essentially ‘theological’ or ‘materialist’ in character (or how it could possibly be both at once), occasioned by the conjunction of Benjamin’s self-identification with historical materialism and his continued use of explicitly messianic motifs (Wolhfarth 1978; Tiedemann 1983–4). This was in large part the polemical legacy of the competing influence of three friendships—with Gershom Scholem, Theodor W. Adorno and Bertolt Brecht—applied to the interpretation of Benjamin’s final text, the fragments ‘On the Concept of History’ (‘Über den Begriff der Geschichte’, popularly known as the ‘Theses on the Philosophy of History’). Scholem promoted a theological interpretation, Brecht inspired a materialist one, while Adorno attempted to forge some form of compatibility between the two. Yet the question is badly posed if it is framed within received concepts of ‘theology’ and ‘materialism’ (the paradox becomes self-sustaining), since it was Benjamin’s aim radically to rethink the meaning of these ideas, on the basis of a new philosophy of historical time. This new philosophy of historical time is the ultimate goal of Benjamin’s later writings. It appears most explicitly, under construction, in ‘Convolute N’ of The Arcades Project, ‘On the Theory of Knowledge, Theory of Progress’; it is applied to art history in the 1937 essay ‘Eduard Fuch, Collector and Historian’; and is manifest in a condensed, rhetorically political and problematic form in ‘On the Concept of History’. It derives from a dual critique of the ‘vulgar naturalism’ of historicism and the deferral of action involved in the associated Social Democratic concept of progress (Kittsteiner 1986). It gives rise to a conception of historical intelligibility based on ‘literary montage’ as the method of construction of ‘dialectical images’ (AP, 460–1). And it culminates in a quasi-messianic conception of revolution as an ‘interruption’ of history or an ‘arrest of happening’: “Classless society is not the final goal of historical progress but its frequently miscarried, ultimately achieved interruption” (SW 4, 402).

Benjamin took as one of the main ‘methodological objectives’ of his Arcades Project “to demonstrate a historical materialism which has annihilated within itself the idea of progress”, taking as its “founding concept… not progress but actualization”  (AP, [N2, 2], 460). He had both philosophical and political reasons for this. Philosophically, Benjamin saw the conventional idea of progress as projecting into the future a conception of time as ‘homogenous’ and ‘empty’ epitomized by the attempt of Ranke’s historicism to represent the past “the way it really was” (SW4, 395; 391). This is a conception of time based on the temporal continuity of past, present and future, ‘in’ which events occur and are understood as causally connected. It is naturalistic in so far as it acknowledges no fundamental temporal-ontological distinction between past, present and future time; it has no sense of time as the ongoing production of temporal differentiation. Time is differentiated solely by the differences between the events that occur within it. In particular, it fails to grasp that historical time (the time of human life) is constituted through such immanent differentiations, via the existential modes of memory, expectation and action. In this respect, there are affinities between Benjamin’s philosophy of time and Heidegger’s (Caygill, 1994).

The political consequence of the temporal naturalism underlying the idea of ‘progress’ is conformism. For Benjamin, paradoxically, this applied in particular to the German Social Democrats’ understanding of communism as an ideal, in the neo-Kantian ethical sense of the object of an ‘endless task’:

Once the classless society had been defined as an infinite task, the empty homogeneous time was transformed into an anteroom, so to speak, in which one could wait for the emergence of the revolutionary situation with more or less equanimity. (SW 4, 402)

In other words, the concept of progress is demobilizing; and Marxism had become infected by the ideology of progress. However, rather than positing an existential alternative, in the manner of Heidegger’s ‘resolute decision’, Benjamin set out to construct novel conceptions of historical time and historical intelligibility based on the relationship, not between the past and the present, but between the ‘then’ and the ‘now’, as brought together in images of the past. Each historically specific ‘now’ was understood to correspond to (in a Baudelairean sense), or to render legible, a particular ‘then’.

It is not that what is past casts its light on what is present, or what is present its light on what is past; rather, an image is that wherein what has been comes together in a flash with the now to form a constellation. In other words: image is dialectics at a standstill. For while the relation of the present to the past is purely temporal, the relation of what-has-been to the now is dialectical: not temporal in nature but figural [bildlich]. Only dialectical images are genuinely historical … (AP, [N3, 1], 463)

The experimental method of montage, borrowed from surrealism, was to be the means of production of historical intelligibility. Furthermore, the ‘static’ temporality of the image was understood to connect such an experience of historical meaning, directly, to a radical or ‘revolutionary’ concept of action, associated with the idea of the present as crisis. The passage above continues:

The image that is read—which is to say, the image in the now of its recognizability [das Bild im Jetzt der Erkennbarkeik]—bears to the highest degree the  imprint of the perilous critical moment on which all reading is founded. (AP, [N3, 1], 463)

Such “perilous critical moments” are both immanent to the temporality of modernity, at a structural level (the temporality of crisis), and, in each particular case, contingent and conjuncturally specific. In them, the past is understood “to bring the present into a critical state”. However, this critical state is not a crisis of the status quo, but rather of its destruction: the critical moment is that in which “the status quo threatens to be preserved” (AP, [N10, 2], 474). Dialectical images counter the threat of preservation (tradition) by virtue of the interruptive force they are understood to impart to experience as a consequence of the instantaneous temporality of the now, or what Benjamin famously called now-time [Jetztzeit]: “The dialectical image is an image that emerges suddenly, in a flash” (AP, [N9, 7], 473). It is this image of the image as a ‘flash’ [ein aufblitzendes] and the corresponding image of historical experience as the discharge of an explosive force—the explosive force of now-time, blasting open ‘the continuum of history’—for which Benjamin is probably best known. The philosophy of historical time which these images sum up was elaborated by him in two main contexts: the development of a new conception of cultural history and a political diagnosis of the historical crisis of Europe at the outset of the Second World War.

Benjamin did not see culture as threatened by ‘barbarism’, so much as itself being implicated in it:

Barbarism lurks in the very concept of culture—as the concept of a fund of values which is considered independent not, indeed, of the production process in which these values originated, but of the one in which they survive. In this way they serve the apotheosis of the latter, barbaric as it may be. (AP, [N5a, 7] 467–8)

The concept of culture as the values of a heritage was for Benjamin ‘fetishistic’: “Culture appears reified.” Only an understanding of “the crucial importance of reception… enables us to correct the process of reification which takes place in a work of art” (SW 3, 267; 269). For Benjamin, however, reception—or what he called the ‘afterlife’ [Nachleben] of the work—was not merely something that happened to the work, externally; it was as constitutive of the work itself as its ‘fore-life’ [Vorleben], or conditions of production—which are themselves rendered invisible by the idea of culture as value, and are themselves “involved in a constant process of change” as the work itself changes. A materialist cultural history would restore to the experience of works a sense of both of these changing sets of conditions (before and after), and the conflicts between them, in an engagement “originary for every present”, since “[i]t is the present that polarizes the event into fore- and after-history”  (SW 3, 261–2; AP, [N7a, 8], 471). It is here, in an ontological rethinking of reception, that the philosophical significance of Benjamin’s interest in technologies of reproduction lies. With these concepts of fore- and afterlife, Benjamin founded a new problematic for cultural study.

Benjamin was interested in ‘culture’ not as an autonomous realm of values (“the independent values of aesthetic, scientific, ethical… and even religious achievements”), but on the contrary, like the sociologist Georg Simmel, whose Philosophy of Money he cities in this regard, as “elements in the development of human nature” (Simmel, quoted in AP, [N14, 3], 480). In this respect, cultural study is situated within the field of a materialist philosophy of history. And the philosophy of history insists on a conception of history as a whole. It is here than the messianic structure of Benajmin’s concept of history confronts us as unavoidable; although not thereby necessarily ‘theological’, since it is the transition of a conceptual structure from one philosophical context into another that is at issue (Benjamin’s favorite surrealist method of ‘decontextualization’ and ‘defamiliarization’), not its meaning in its original theological context as such. In his search for a non-Hegelian, non-developmentalist conception of history as a whole, in ‘On the Concept of History’ Benjamin figured now-time, quasi-messianically, alternatively as a ‘model’ of messianic time and as “shot through with splinters of messianic time.” In the context of a diagnosis of the European crisis of 1939–40 as a world-historical crisis, the ‘critical state of the present’ thus came, in this text, to acquire a theological-political tenor. “A revolutionary chance in the fight for the oppressed past” is compared to “the sign of a messianic arrest of happening” (SW 4, 396–7). Benjamin was aware that this rhetoric would lead to misunderstanding. But the combination of perceived political urgency and isolation compelled him to extend his concept of history beyond the state of his philosophical research, experimentally, into an apparently definitive statement. It is as if Benjamin had hoped to overcome the aporia of action within his still essentially hermeneutical philosophy (Osborne 1995) through the force of language alone. Formally, however, ‘On the Concept of History’ should be read as a series of fragments, in the early Romantic sense. As such, it remains resolutely negative—and thereby importantly partial—in its evocation of the historical whole, which is acknowledged as unpresentable. In this respect, Benjamin’s final text recalls his earliest major publication, the 1919 thesis ‘The Concept of Art Criticism in German Romanticism’: as a gesture towards the philosophy of history needed to complete a modified and ‘modernized’ version of the early Romantic project.


Primary Literature

The current standard German edition of Benjamin’s work remains Suhrkamp’s seven volume Gesammelte Schriften, edited by Tiedemann and Schweppenhauser, although a new Kritish Gesamtausgabe is currently being edited, also by Suhrkamp and projected at twenty-one volumes over the next decade. The standard English edition is Harvard University Press’ recent four volume Selected Writings, Early Writings, and The Arcades Project.

A Walter Benjamin’s Archive: Images, Texts, Signs, trans. Esther Leslie, London: Verso, 2007.
AP The Arcades Project, trans. Howard Eiland & Kevin McLaughlin, Cambridge, MA. & London: Belknap Press, 1999.
BA Walter Benjamin and Theodor W. Adorno, The Complete Correspondences 1928–1940, ed. Henri  Lonitz, Cambridge: Polity Press, 1999.
BC Berlin Childhood Around 1900, trans. Howard Eiland, Cambridge, MA. & London: Belknap Press, 2006
BG Walter Benjamin and Gretel Adorno, Correspondence 1930–1940, trans. Wieland Hoban, Cambridge: Polity, 2008.
BS The Correspondence of Walter Benjamin and Gershom Scholem, ed. Gershom Scholem, Cambridge, MA.,: Harvard University Press, 1989.
C The Correspondence of Walter Benjamin: 1910–1940, eds. Gershom Scholem & Theodor W. Adorno, Chicago & London: University of Chicago Press, 1994.
EW Early Writings: 1910–1917, trans. Howard Eiland & Others, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2011.
GB Gesammelte Briefe, 6 vols., ed. Christoph Gödde and Henri Lonitz, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp Verlag, 1995–2000.
GS Gesammelte Schriften, 7 vols., eds. Rolf Tiedemann & Hermann Schweppenhauser, Frankfurt am  Main: Suhrkamp Verlag, Bd. I-VII, 1972-1989.
KG Werke und Nachlaß. Kritische Gesamtausgabe, Bd. 1–21, eds. Momme Brodersen et. al., Frankfurt am  Main: Suhrkamp Verlag, 2008–.
MD Walter Benjamin: Moscow Diary, ed. Gary Smith, Cambridge, MA. & London: Harvard University Press, 1986.
OGT Origin of the German Trauerspiel, trans. Howard Eiland, Cambridge, MA. & London: Harvard University Press, 2019.
OWS One-Way Street and Other Writings, trans. J. A. Underwood, Harmondsworth: Penguin, 2009.
RB Radio Benjamin, ed. Lecia Rosenthal, London: Verso, 2014.
SW Selected Writings, 4 vols., ed. Howard Eiland & Michael W. Jennings, Cambridge, MA., & London: Harvard University Press, 1991–1999.
UB Understanding Brecht, trans. Anna Bostock, London: Verso, 2003.

Biographies in English 

  • Eiland, H. and Jennings, M. W., Walter Benjamin: A Critical Life, Cambridge, MA. & London: Harvard University Press, 2014.
  • Leslie, E., 2007, Walter Benjamin: Critical Lives, London: Reaktion Books.
  • Brodersen, M., 1996, Walter Benjamin: A Biography, London & New York: Verso.
  • Scholem, G., 1981, Walter Benjamin: The Story of a Friendship, New York: Review Books.
  • Witte, B., 1991, Walter Benjamin: An Intellectual Biography, Detroit: Wayne University Press.
  • Wizisla, E., 2009, Walter Benjamin and Bertolt Brecht: the Story of a Friendship, London: Libris.

Selected English Anthologies

  • Benjamin, A. (ed.), 1989, The Problems of Modernity: Adorno and Benjamin, London: Routledge.
  • ––– (ed.), 2005a, Walter Benjamin and Art,  London & New York: Continuum.
  • ––– (ed.), 2005b, Walter Benjamin and History, London & New York: Continuum.
  • Benjamin, A. and Hanssen, B. (eds.), 2002, Walter Benjamin and Romanticism,  London & New York: Continuum.
  • Benjamin, A. and Osborne, P. (eds.), 1994/2000, Walter Benjamin’s Philosophy: Destruction and Experience, London & New York: Routledge/Manchester: Clinamen Press.
  • Ferris, D. S. (ed.), 2004, The Cambridge Companion to Walter Benjamin, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Fischer, G. (ed.), 1996, With The Sharpened Axe of Reason: Approaches to Walter Benjamin, Oxford: Berg.
  • Goebel, R. J. (ed.), 2009, A Companion to the Works of Walter Benjamin, Rochester & Woodbridge: Camden House.
  • Hanssen, B. (ed.), 2006, Walter Benjamin and the Arcades Project, London & New York: Continuum.
  • Hartoonian, G., (ed.), 2010, Walter Benjamin and Architecture, London & New York: Routledge.
  • Osborne, P. (ed.), 2005, Walter Benjamin: Critical Evaluations in Cultural Theory, Volume I: Philosophy, Volume II: Modernity, Volume III: Appropriations, London & New York: Routledge.
  • Smith, G. (ed.), 1988, On Walter Benjamin: Critical Essays and Recollections, Cambridge, MA. & London: MIT.
  • ––– (ed.), 1989, Walter Benjamin: Philosophy, Aesthetics, History, Chicago & London: University of Chicago Press.

Selected Secondary Literature

  • Adorno, T. W., 1955, ‘A Portrait of Walter Benjamin’, in Prisms, Cambridge, MA.: MIT., 1983, pp. 227–242.
  • –––, 1931, ‘The Actuality of Philosophy’, in Telos 31 (Spring 1977): 120–133.
  • Agamben, G., 2005, State of Exception, trans. K. Attell, Chicago & London: University of Chicago Press.
  • Ariella, A., 2007, ‘The Tradition of the Oppressed’, Qui Parle, 16 (2): 73–96.
  • Asman, C. L., 1992, ‘Theatre and Agon/Agon and Theatre: Walter Benjamin and Florens Christian Rang’, MLN, 107(3): 606–624.
  • Avelar, I., 2004, The Letter of Violence: Essays on Narrative, Ethics, and Politics, New York & Basingstoke, England: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Benjamin, A., 1989, ‘Tradition and Experience: Walter Benjamin’s Some Motifs in Baudelaire’, in Benjamin, A. (ed.), 1989, pp. 122–140. 
  • –––, 2013, Working with Walter Benjamin: Recovering a Political Philosophy, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • Bernsaïd, D., 1990, Walter Benjamin sentinelle messianique: À la gauche du possible, Paris: Plon.
  • Bolle, W., 2009, ‘Paris on the Amazon? Postcolonial Interrogations of Benjamin’s European Modernism’, in Goebel 2009, pp. 216–245.
  • Brederkamp, H., 1999, ‘From Walter Benjamin to Carl Schmitt, via Thomas Hobbes’, Critical Inquiry, 25(2): 247–266.
  • Buck-Morss, S., 1977, The Origins of Negative Dialectics: Theodor W. Adorno, Walter Benjamin and the Frankfurt Institute, Hassocks: Harvester Press.
  • –––, 1989, The Dialectics of Seeing, Cambridge, MA. & London: MIT Press.
  • –––, 1992, ‘Aesthetics and Anaesthetics: Walter Benjamin’s Artwork Essay Reconsidered’, October, 62: 3–41, reprinted in Osborne 2005, I: 291–331.
  • Bullock, M. P., 1987, Romanticism and Marxism: The Philosophical Development of Literary Theory and Literary History in Walter Benjamin & Friedrich Schlegel, New York, Bern & Frankfurt am Main: Peter Lang.
  • Caygill, H., 1994, ‘Benjamin, Heidegger and the Destruction of Tradition’, in Benjamin and Osborne 1994/2000, pp. 1–31.
  • –––, 1998, Walter Benjamin: The Colour of Experience, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2004, ‘Walter Benjamin’s Concept of Cultural History,’ in Ferris 2004, pp. 73–96.
  • –––, 2005, ‘Non-Messianic Political Theology in Benjamin’s “On the Concept of History”’, in Benjamin, A. 2005b, pp. 215–226.
  • Charles, M., 2018, ‘Secret Signals from Another World: Walter Benjamin’s Theory of Innervation’, New German Critique, 45(3): 39–72.
  • –––, M. 2020, Modernism Between Benjamin and Goethe, London: Bloomsbury.
  • Chisholm, D., 2009, ‘Benjamin’s Gender, Sex, and Eros’, in Goebel 2009, pp. 246–272.
  • –––, 2005, Queer constellations: subcultural space in the wake of the city, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Chow, R., 1989, ‘Walter Benjamin’s Love Affair with Death’, New German Critique, 48: 63–86.
  • Clark, T. J, 2003, ‘Should Benjamin Have Read Marx’, Boundary 2 30(1): 31–49; reprinted in Osborne 2005, III: 81–96.
  • Cohen, M., 1993, Profane Illumination: Walter Benjamin and the Paris of Surrealist Revolution, Berkeley & Los Angeles: University of California Press.
  • Cowan, B., 1981, ‘Walter Benjamin’s Theory of Allegory’, New German Critique, 22: 109–122.
  • Derrida, J., 1989–90, ‘Force of Law: The “Mystical Foundations of Authority”’, trans. Mary Quaintance, Cardozo Law Review, 11: 973–1045, reprinted in Osborne 2005, 1: 398–432.
  • –––, 1994, Spectres of Marx: the state of the debt, the work of mourning, and the New International, trans. P. Kamuf, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 1997, The Politics of Friendship, trans. G. Collins, London & New York: Verso.
  • –––, 1999, ‘Marx and Sons’, in Ghostly demarcations: a symposium on Jacques Derrida’s Spectres of Marx, ed. M. Sprinker, London & New York: Verso, pp. 213–269.
  • Didi-Huberman, G., 2005, ‘The Supposition of the Aura: The Now, the Then and Modernity’, in Benjamin, A., 2005b, pp. 2–18.
  • Eagleton, T., 1981, Walter Benjamin, Or, Towards a Revolutionary Criticism, London: NLB.
  • Eiland, H., 2011, ‘Translator’s Introduction’, in EW, pp. 1–13.
  • Ferber, I., 2013, Philosophy and Melancholy: Benjamin’s Early Reflections on Theater and Language, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • Friedlander, E., 2012, Walter Benjamin: A Philosophical Portrait, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Frisby, D., 1996, ‘Walter Benjamin’s Prehistory of Modernity as Anticipation of Postmodernity? Some Methodological Reflections’, in Fischer 1996, pp. 15–32.
  • Fuld, W., 1981, ‘Walter Benjamins Beziehung zu Ludwig Klages’, Akzente 28(3): 274–287.
  • Gilloch, G., 2000, Walter Benjamin: Critical Constellations, Cambridge: Polity.
  • Goebel, R. J., 2001, Benjamin heute. Großstadtdiskurs, Postkolonialität und Flanerie zwischen den Kulturen, Munich: Iudicium.
  • Habermas, J., 1983, ‘Walter Benjamin: Consciousness-raising or rescuing critique’, in Philosophical-Political Profiles, trans. Frederick G. Lawrence, Cambridge, MA. & London: MIT Press, pp. 129–163, reprinted in Osborne 2005, I: 107–136.
  • Hamacher, W., 2002, ‘Guilt History: Benjamin’s Sketch “Capitalism as Religion”’, Diacritics, 32(3/4): 81–106.
  • Hansen, M., 1987, ‘Benjamin, Cinema and Experience: “The Blue Flower in the Land of Technology”’, New German Critique, 40: 179–224; reprinted in Osborne 2005, II: 253–290.
  • –––, 2011, Cinema and Experience: Siegfried Kracauer, Walter Benjamin, and Theodor W. Adorno, Los Angeles & London: University of California Press.
  • Hanssen, B., 1995, ‘Philosophy at Its Origin: Walter Benjamin’s Prologue to the Ursprung des deutschen Trauerspiels’, MLN, 110(4): 809–833.
  • –––, 1998, Walter Benjamin’s Other History: Of Stones, Animals, Human Beings, and Angels, Berkeley, Los Angeles & London: University of California Press.
  • Hodge, J., 2005, ‘The Timing of Elective Affinity: Walter Benjamin’s Strong Aesthetics’, in Benjamin, A., 2005a, pp. 14–31.
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  • Lacoue-Labarthe, P., 1992, ‘Introduction to Walter Benjamin’s The Concept of Art Criticism in German Romanticism’, Studies in Romanticism,  31(4): 421–432, reprinted in Hanssen and Benjamin, A. 2002, pp. 9–18.
  • Lambrianou, N., 2005, ‘Neo-Kantianism and Messianism: Origin and Interruption in Hermann Cohen and Walter Benjamin’, in Osborne 2005, I: 82–104.
  • Lebovic, N., 2013, The Philosophy of Life and Death: Ludwig Klages and the Rise of Nazi Biopolitics, New York & Basingstoke: Palgrave Macmillan.
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  • –––, 2008, ‘Revolutionary Potential and Walter Benjamin: A Postwar Reception History’, in Critical Companion to Contemporary Marxism , eds. Jacques Bidet and Stavis Kouvelakis, Leiden: Brill, pp. 549–566.
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  • Löwy, M., 2005, Fire Alarm: Reading Walter Benjamin’s ‘On the Concept of History’, trans. Chris Turner, London & New York: Verso.
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  • Menninghaus, W., 2002, ‘Walter Benjamin’s Exposition of the Romantic Theory of Reflection’, trans. Robert J. Kiss, in Hanssen and Benjamin, A. 2002, pp. 19–50, reprinted in Osborne 2005, I: 25–62.
  • Newman, J. O., 2011, Benjamin’s Library: Modernity, Nation, and the Baroque, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Osborne, P., 1995, The Politics of Time: Modernity and Avant-Garde, London & New York: Verso.
  • –––, 2011, ‘Philosophy after Theory: Transdisciplinarity and the New’, in Theory After ‘Theory’, eds. Jane Elliott and Derek Attridge, Abingdon: Routledge, pp. 19–33.
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  • Roff, S. L., 2004, ‘Benjamin and Psychoanalysis’, in Ferris 2004, pp. 115–133.
  • Schmitt, C., 1956, Hamlet or Hecuba: the intrusion of time into the play, trans. D. Pan & J. Rust, New York: Telos Press, 2009.
  • Steiner, U., 2001, ‘The True Politician: Walter Benjamin’s Concept of the Political’, trans. C. Sample, New German Critique, 83: 43–88.
  • Tiedemann, R., 1983–4, ‘Historical Materialism or Political Messianism? An Interpretation of the Theses “On the Concept of History”’, in Smith 1989, pp. 175–209, reprinted in Osborne 2005, I: 137–168.
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  • –––, 2006, La vera politica. Kant e Benjamin: la possibilità della giustizia, Macerata: Quodlibet.
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  • Wohlfarth, I., 1978, ‘On the Messianic Structure of Benjamin’s Last Reflections’, Glyph 3: 148–212, reprinted in Osborne 2005, I: 169–231.
  • –––, 1992, ‘The Politics of Youth: Walter Benjamin’s Reading of The Idiot’, Diacritics 22 (3/4): 160–172.
  • –––, 2002, ‘Walter Benjamin and the Idea of Technological Eros: A Tentative Reading of Zum Planetarium’, Benjamin Studies/Studien 1: 65–109.
  • –––, 2008–9, ‘Walter Benjamin and the Red Army Faction’, Parts, 1–3, Radical Philosophy 142–144, Nov/Dec 2008, Jan/Feb 2009, March/April 2009, 7–19, 13–26, 9–24. 
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