Georg [György] Lukács

First published Mon Nov 4, 2013; substantive revision Thu Jun 8, 2023

Georg (György) Lukács (1885–1971) was a literary theorist and philosopher who is widely viewed as one of the founders of “Western Marxism” and as a forerunner of 20th-century critical theory. Lukács is best known for his Theory of the Novel (1916) and History and Class Consciousness (1923). In History and Class Consciousness, he laid out a wide-ranging critique of the phenomenon of “reification” in capitalism and formulated a vision of Marxism as a self-conscious transformation of society. This text became a reference point both for critical social theory and for many currents of countercultural thought. Even though his later work did not capture the imagination of the intellectual public to the same extent as his earlier writings, Lukács remained a prolific writer and an influential theorist in his later career and published hundreds of articles on literary theory and aesthetics, not to mention numerous books, including two massive works on aesthetics and ontology. He was also active as a politician in Hungary in both the revolution of 1919 and during the events of 1956. Today, his work remains of philosophical interest not only because it contains the promise of an undogmatic, non-reductionist reformulation of Marxism, but also because it combines a philosophical approach that draws on Neo-Kantianism, Hegel, and Marx with an acute cultural sensitivity and a powerful critique of modern life inspired by Weber’s and Simmel’s sociological analyses of modern rationalization.

1. Life and Career

Lukács was born Bernát György Löwinger on April 13, 1885, in Budapest. He received a Ph.D. in Political Science from the University of Kolozsvár in 1906 and a doctorate from the University of Budapest in 1909. In the following years, Lukács made a name for himself as a literary and aesthetic theorist, working in Budapest, Berlin (where he was influenced by Georg Simmel), Florence, and Heidelberg. In 1910 and 1911, Lukács published his essay collection Soul and Form and, together with Lajos Fülep, founded the short-lived avant-garde journal A Szellem (The Spirit). Lukács’s world was sent into turmoil at that time by the death of his close friend Leo Popper and by the suicide of Irma Seidler, who had been his lover. He felt responsible for Seidler’s death, and it proved to have an enormous impact on him, as reflected in his 1911 essay “On Poverty of Spirit.”

During the same period, Lukács developed a close connection with Max and Marianne Weber in Heidelberg, with Ernst Bloch, and with the Neo-Kantian philosophers Heinrich Rickert and Emil Lask. Between 1912 and 1914 he worked on a first attempt to formulate a systematic approach to art, which remained unpublished during his lifetime (GW 16). In the First World War, Lukács was exempted from frontline military service. In 1914, he married the Russian political activist (and convicted terrorist) Jelena Grabenko.

In 1913, Lukács began participating in the influential “Sunday circle” of Budapest intellectuals, which included Karl Mannheim. After returning from wartime service in the Hungarian censor’s office, he published The Theory of the Novel (1916). In 1917, despite Weber’s support, he failed to receive a Habilitation (teaching qualification) at the University of Heidelberg. Between 1916 and 1918, he also resumed his work on aesthetics, which resulted in the unpublished manuscript of the so-called “Heidelberg Aesthetics” (GW 17). To the surprise of many of his friends, Lukács joined the Hungarian Communist Party in 1918, although, as his essay on “Bolshevism as a Moral Problem” attests, not without reservations.

Following his rapid ascent as one of the leading thinkers of the Communist Party, Lukács became more involved in day-to-day politics. After the revolution in 1919, he first served as a deputy commissar and then as commissar of public education in Béla Kun’s government. Later, when war broke out, he served as a political commissar in the Hungarian Red Army (in which role he ordered the execution of several soldiers; see Kadarkay 1991: 223). After the communist government was defeated, Lukács fled to Vienna at the end of 1919, where he married his second wife, Gertrud Bortstieber. Charged with coordinating the clandestine activities of the exiled Communist Party, he remained under constant threat of expulsion to Hungary.

In 1923, Lukács published his most famous work, the essay collection History and Class Consciousness. In these essays, Lukács argues forcefully for a philosophically self-reflective version of Marxism as a solution to the problems that vexed modern philosophy, develops the idea of capitalist society as a “totality” that is totally integrated as the value-form, sketches a distinctive Marxist epistemology, and identifies structural unfreedom (rather than exploitation or inequality) as the fundamental problem of capitalism. In these essays, Lukács draws not only on Marxist classics but also on sociological insights into the character of modern societies that he acquired through Weber and Simmel. His reformulation of the philosophical premises of Marxism entails a rejection of the then contemporary forms of materialism and scientism endorsed by many Soviet party intellectuals. Unsurprisingly, the party orthodoxy condemned the book as an expression of ultra-leftism (in spite of Lukács’s pro-Leninist revisions to the articles in the volume that had already appeared previously; see Löwy 1979: 172–179).

Nevertheless, the book had a decisive influence on the early Frankfurt School. Lukács participated in the 1923 “Marxist Work Week,” which laid the foundation for the founding of the Institute for Social Research, and there is evidence that the major critical theorists of the time were all deeply impressed by the reification essay in particular (Stahl 2018). Overall, History and Class Consciousness cemented Lukács’s position as a leading scholar of Marxism, putting him at the forefront of the debates of the time (an example being his quickly written study on Lenin on the occasion of the Soviet leader’s death in 1924). In 1928, however, Lukács had to give up his political activities after he presented the so-called “Blum Theses” (see 1928). In this draft of a party platform for Hungary, which was named after his party alias, he argued for a broad, democratic dictatorship of workers and peasants. These theses were condemned as a right-wing deviation by the party (which denounced him as both a left-wing and a right-wing dissident within a span of five years).

Following another arrest by the Austrian authorities, Lukács left Vienna in 1929, first for Berlin and then for Budapest, where he went underground for three months. He was eventually summoned by the Soviet party leadership to Moscow, where he stayed from 1930 on, leaving only for Comintern missions in Berlin and for Tashkent during the war. In Moscow, Lukács held a position at the Marx-Engels Institute. During this time, he first came into contact with early works by Marx that had previously remained unpublished. As Lukács became (at least outwardly) increasingly subservient to the Stalinist orthodoxy, he publicly retracted the views espoused in History and Class Consciousness (see 1933b). The degree of Lukács’s agreement with Stalinism is disputed to this day (see Lichtheim 1970; Deutscher 1972; Kolakowski 1978; Pike 1988). However, it is clear from his writings that while he publicly defended Stalinist dogmas in both aesthetics and politics during the 1930s, 1940s, and 1950s (1933a, 1938, 1951), he later repeatedly criticized Stalin and Stalinism (see 1957, 1962).

In 1944, Lukács returned to Budapest and became a professor at the local university. In 1948, he published his two-volume study The Young Hegel (written partly during the 1930s in Moscow). In 1949, he also traveled to Paris to engage in a debate about existentialism and Marxism with Sartre. The works of this period reflect both his allegiance to orthodox Soviet Marxism and his uneasiness with the Stalinist post-war situation. A widely criticized writing from this time is The Destruction of Reason, published in 1954. It denounced much of the German philosophical and literary tradition after Marx as an outgrowth of “irrationalism” and as bearing responsibility for the ascent of National Socialism. During this time, Lukács also continued to defend a conservative ideal of realism in aesthetics (see 1951).

After again being subjected to criticism from the party and virtually excluded from public life in the mid-1950s, Lukács was able to embark on a new chapter following the Hungarian uprising against Soviet rule in 1956. Following Stalin’s death, not only did it become increasingly possible for him to publicly criticize Stalinism and to again voice his vision of the future of Marxism (for the first time since 1928), arguing that the Communist Party should regain public trust by competing with other leftist forces within a multi-party democracy, but he also served in the short-lived Nagy government as minister for public education. After the subsequent Soviet invasion, he was arrested and imprisoned in Romania. Unlike other members of the government, he was not executed but merely expelled from the Communist Party, which he did not rejoin until 1969. From the 1960s on, Lukács—having had to retire from all academic positions—worked on his two-volume Specificity of the Aesthetic and on a Marxist ethics that would later partly become the Ontology of Social Being, which remained unfinished in his lifetime. He also continued to publish extensively on literature and art. Lukács passed away on June 4, 1971, in Budapest.

2. Early Writings

Lukács’s early writings—before his turn to Marxism in 1918—are animated by concerns that are also present, albeit transformed, in his later political thought. In this period, Lukács formulates a sophisticated aesthetic theory and critique of modern culture, which he diagnoses as being characterized by an insurmountable abyss between objective cultural forms and the richness of “genuine life.”

He takes up the issue of the relationship between “form” and “life” in three different but closely interconnected discussions. First, there is the question of how the element of “form” distinguishes art as a separate sphere of value. This is most explicitly discussed in his two attempts at a systematic philosophy of art. Second, there is the sociological-historical question about the relation between (individual and collective) life and aesthetic and ethical forms in modern bourgeois society. This topic is dominant both in the History of the Modern Drama (1909) and in the Theory of the Novel (1916). A third strand concerns existential and ethical questions, most explicitly discussed in Soul and Form and in the essay “On Poverty of Spirit.”

Alongside “form”, two central concepts in Lukács’s early thought are “totality” and “life.” By “totality” Lukács means a whole set of elements that are meaningfully interrelated in such a way that the essence of each element can only be understood in relation to the others. “Life” denotes the intrinsic richness and potentiality of experiences and actions. Both individual and social life are in principle capable of forming an integrated totality. However, this is only the case if the essential properties of life’s elements are intelligible in terms of their relations to other particulars of life. Lukács claims that this was the case in Homeric Greece, where a totality of meaning was immanent to life itself. This immanence of meaning and the totality it constituted were lost in subsequent historical developments, however, as form became external to life.

In regard to the relation between form and life, we can distinguish between forms that are forms of life itself, produced by that life, and abstract forms which are imposed onto life from the outside. When a form is imposed on life that is not a form of that specific mode of life (or if the form in question cannot be realized in empirical life), such an imposition always runs the risk of distorting the meanings of the particular actions or persons. But at the same time, form is necessary for life to become intelligible and unified (see Bernstein 1984: 77–80). Within the sphere of individual agency, persons face this dilemma in regard to the choice of either authentically expressing the particular meanings of their own life, risking the loss of form and, consequently, the loss of intelligible access to these meanings, or of imposing an external form as a normative demand on their life, risking distortion, inauthenticity and even the denial of life itself.

2.1 Life and Form

Except for the History of the Modern Drama (1909), Lukács’s earliest work is self-consciously essayistic in form. As Lukács explains in “On the Nature and Form of the Essay” (1911a), this is because the essay addresses life through the medium of form (1911a: 8) and takes form (in particular, the form of a work of art) seriously as a subject. Essayistic writing is not only writing about form, however; it must always examine the conditions under which life can be given form in the first place. Modernity has made this problem more virulent insofar as the existing means by which life can give itself form have become problematic, such that we now experience them as abstractions.

Following Weber, Lukács characterizes the bourgeois form of life in terms of the primacy of an ethics of work and inner strength. Corresponding to this form of life, Lukács claims, there was once a form of art that was capable of expressing an unproblematic relationship between life and form (for example, in Theodor Storm’s case, the insight that the bourgeois citizen must concentrate on work and entrust the formation of life to fate; see 1910a: 60). However, when that bourgeois life-form disappeared, the remaining bourgeois “way of life” was transformed into a kind of asceticism that grew hostile to life itself. The same holds for the corresponding movement, within art, of rejecting life in favor of “art for its own sake,” that is, a form of artistic production that self-consciously (and with justification) refuses to express life because it has no foundation in a corresponding life form.

Lukács thus argues that modern art is caught in the dilemma of having to achieve harmony between life and form, either at the expense of life’s intensity or at a purely symbolic and imaginary level—by effectively withdrawing from life (an idea he discusses in reference to Novalis; see 1908: 50; see also Butler 2010: 9). In both cases, art turns against life. By contrast, a genuine attempt to give “real” or “absolute life” (that is, genuinely meaningful life as opposed to the chaos of “empirical life”; see Kavoulakos 2014: 22–26; Márkus 1983: 11; Löwy 1979: 104) a distinct form necessarily involves the rejection of the meaningless necessities of ordinary life. In “The Metaphysics of Tragedy” (1910b), Lukács ascribes this task to modern tragedy. When nature and fate have become “terrifyingly soulless” (1910b: 154) and any hope for a “friendly order” (ibid.) has disappeared, the tragic becomes a task—that of rejecting ordinary life in favor of the opportunity to “live within the periphery of tragedy” (1910b: 173).

The ethical dimension of the relation between life and form is made most explicit in Lukács’s essay on Kierkegaard and in “On Poverty of Spirit.” Kierkegaard’s rejection of Regine Olsen’s love is lauded for its expression of the need to give one’s own empirical life a definite, unambiguous form, thereby transforming it into absolute life—in Kierkegaard’s case, by attempting to perform an authentic gesture (1910c: 28). Yet Kierkegaard’s ethical position suffered from a defect: he attempted to reconcile ordinary life with a form that was only appropriate for genuine, “absolute” life. Due to its inherent ambiguity and foreignness to form, ordinary life cannot ever be successfully lived in such a way (1910c: 40). Thus, Kierkegaard’s attempt to live a genuine life was doomed from the start.

The conclusion of this line of thought seems to point towards an insoluble dilemma. But the 1911 essay “On Poverty of Spirit”—a fusion of an autobiographical reflection on Lukács’s role in Irma Seidler’s suicide and an examination of theoretical issues—points to a different conclusion: the rejection of an “ethics of duty.” Lukács argues that our adherence to a formal, rule-based ethics is to be blamed for our alienation from life. Even though the submission to “form” that is implicit in adopting a formalist ethics is the basis from which social life becomes possible in the first place, it prevents people from forming “human relationships.” As Lukács writes, “[f]orm […] is like a bridge that separates” (1911b: 44). Lukács contrasts such an ethics with the ideal of “goodness,” which represents “real life.” “Goodness” involves a rejection of rules and duties towards others in favor of pure actions that may be sinful, chaotic, and futile. The soul of the good person, Lukács claims, “is a pure white slate, upon which fate writes its absurd command” (1911b: 48). This anti-consequentialist and anti-deontological ethics of pure action ultimately culminates in a conception of “works.” Only by sacrificing themselves for the sake of works can people (or, as Lukács’s narrator claims, “men”) empty themselves of the psychological content of everyday life and prepare themselves for the grace of goodness. This final line of thought points towards a social utopia: by overcoming the alienated world of “mechanical forces” (1911b: 45) through works that transform life, we may recover a genuine community with and a direct knowledge of others wherein “subject and object collapse into each other” (1911b: 46). This vision of a final overcoming of alienation seems to offer a way out of the theoretical impasse of Lukács’s earlier position, but at the cost of endorsing ethical decisionism.

2.2 Neo-Kantian Aesthetics

While Lukács’s cultural criticism seeks to capture distinctively modern phenomena, its claims are backed up by an aesthetic theory that aims to discover transcendental conditions of the aesthetic that are immune to historical variability. Even though Lukács’s early work draws on Georg Simmel’s theory of culture and on the Nietzschean idea of an intrinsic tension between life and form, its central anchoring point is a Neo-Kantian framework (for a detailed discussion of the influence of Emil Lask in particular, see Kavoulakos 2014). This framework is most clearly evident in his two systematic attempts to produce a philosophy of art in Heidelberg (GW 16 and 17). Here, Lukács seeks to provide a philosophical explanation of the conditions of the possibility of art that takes the work of art as the fundamental locus of aesthetic meaning, rather than deriving this meaning from either artistic creation or aesthetic experience.

In his early aesthetic thought, Lukács distinguishes—taking up Neo-Kantian terminology—between different spheres of reality. The most immediate sphere is the “reality of experience,” in which everything appears as an object of qualitative experience, or (in the 1916 version) as having a given object character (Gegenständlichkeit) that is fundamentally heterogeneous. Lukács envisages two arguments concerning the role that art can play in relation to this sphere: in the 1912 Philosophy of Art, he argues that any adequate communication of meaning between people must appear impossible from within the experiential sphere, since the infinite qualitative particulars of experience cannot ever be successfully communicated. However, the desire to communicate meaning drives people to adopt different means of communication that, although inadequate for expressing the reality of experience, enable them to overcome their separateness by relating to each other in terms of other spheres of reality (for example, the sphere of logical validity). While logic and ethics constitute “pure” spheres of communicable meaning, however, the categories of the aesthetic cannot be fully separated from experience.

In the 1916 Aesthetics, Lukács adopts a more radical version of this Neo-Kantian argument: whereas the reality of everyday life is characterized by a heterogeneity of forms of objects, the aesthetic sphere of validity is characterized by a distinct form of objectivity that is legislated as a norm by experience itself. Thus, the contrast between everyday life and art is not one between experience and validity but one between the heterogeneity of everyday life and the homogeneous form that is appropriate to the autonomy of experience (GW 17: 36). Consequently, in comparison to the logical and ethical spheres of validity, aesthetics has a distinct status. While in these other spheres of validity objective norms and subjective attitudes are fully separable, the autonomy of experience legislates a normative standard that involves a specific relationship between subjective experience and objective norm.

The value that defines the aesthetic sphere, Lukács claims, can only be derived from the concept of the work of art since this concept is presupposed by all descriptions of artistic production or aesthetic experience. Even though neither production nor reception is constitutive of the value of works of art, they can still serve as a basis for reconstructing the independent normative status of aesthetics. The result of this analysis is a conception of the work of art as an ideal homogeneous unity of form and material. In the 1912 Philosophy of Art, this unity is characterized in terms of the experiential content’s becoming completely communicable and containing all possible aspects of a possible experience, thus forming a “concrete totality” (GW 16: 83, 91, 112 and GW 17: 110) of its own world within itself. By contrast, in the 1916 Aesthetics, it is brought about through a process in which the constitutive function of experience becomes completely autonomous, determining both form and content. Such an ideal work of art is, in virtue of this harmony, a Utopian fulfillment of the attitudes that are already operative in the ordinary world of experience (GW 16: 82).

Works of art therefore present us with an “immanent utopia” of experience, that is, with the vision of a form of experience that is ordered and unified by a constitutive “standpoint” (GW 16: 82) such that form and content are completely appropriate for each other. Because of these features, such an experience embodies a maximum of objectivity in the subject’s relation to an object that is completely appropriate to its subjectivity (GW 17: 100). This finally answers the question regarding the a priori conditions of art: as an ideal of a particular kind of possible experience, the work of art is always historically specific. However, both the potential to become a totality in virtue of their form and the normative demand to do so are timeless, a priori conditions of the possibility of works of art in the Neo-Kantian sense (GW 16: 168).

2.3 Modernity and the Loss of Totality

Another aspect of Lukács’s early work concerns the historical changes undergone by our relation to form. In his early analysis of the history and sociology of drama (History of the Modern Drama, 1909), Lukács develops an account of the connection between aesthetic genres and historical changes. He argues that drama is connected to specific historical circumstances: for drama to exist, there needs to be a prevailing Weltanschauung (GW 15: 44) that seeks drama as its preferred mode of expression. This tragic Weltanschauung only exists in periods of societal disintegration, when individual emotions and objective facts are so mismatched as to elicit heroic forms of denial of social reality.

In The Theory of the Novel (1916), Lukács turns towards the philosophy of history in order to clarify the relationship between the historical changes undergone by transcendental standpoints and the “pure forms” of aesthetic genres. The primary object of his discussion is the epic: Lukács claims that works of art that belong to this genre—for example Homeric epic poetry and the modern novel—must always express the objective reality of social and individual human life as it is (1916: 46). However, because of the distinctive “metaphysical conditions” of different epochs, they express this objective reality in radically different ways. Homeric epic poetry takes as its starting point a world that constitutes a closed totality (1916: 33), that is, a world in which life, culture, meaning, actions, and social institutions form a harmonious whole. In particular, Lukács claims that in Ancient Greece the “essence” of being was immanent to life rather than having to be sought out in a transcendent realm. Furthermore, there was no gap between individual consciousness and objectified meaning in the world that would have required the individual to project meaning onto the world. Individuals in Ancient Greece only had to accept the totality of meaning within their world, even if they were, in some particular situation or another, unable to understand it. By contrast, modern society is constitutively alienated: merely conventional social institutions devoid of meaning are disconnected from individuals and their highly individualized self-understandings. Therefore, in modern society meaning can only be found within the inner life of the individual (1916: 61).

Starting from this description of a closed totality, Lukács claims that the intellectual history of the modern world was prefigured in the cultural history of Ancient Greece, in the movement from epic poetry to tragedy and then ultimately to philosophy. In the course of this movement, the sources of meaning became increasingly more external to immediate life. As a consequence, Lukács argues that these three genres inhabit three different “transcendental loci” (1916: 36). Tragedy and philosophy reflect the loss of a meaningful totality, whereas the possibility of epic poetry depends on its immanence. As Lukács claims, this is why “art forms become subject to a historico-philosophical dialectic” (1916: 39).

The cause of this development is a loss of totality through historical changes that transform the objective institutions of social life into mere conventions and into a purely external “second nature” (1916: 62f., 112). This alienation of the individual from the world leads to a situation of “transcendental homelessness” (1916: 40, 60) in which individuals must take up a purely normative “should be” (1916: 47) stance toward the world. The novel is always related to the development of such individuals. This development can take the form of a subjective-idealist illusion (e.g., as in Don Quixote) or of a disillusion, that is, of individuals understanding the impossibility of finding meaning in the world. Lukács consequently argues that the novel is the form of epic writing that is appropriate to a specific moment in history. In modernity, epic writing no longer has a distinct form that can express a particular relation between life and essence within a totality. Rather, the form of the novel is an attempt to deal with the absence of this relation (1916: 59; see Jameson 1971: 172).

Lukács’s understanding of alienation as a historical loss of totality and the consequent problem of form allows him to formulate the kernel of a Utopian vision: the very form of the novel points to the possibility of a renewed relation between the individual and the world in which meaning can again be found.

3. History and Class Consciousness

Not only did Lukács’s 1918 conversion to communism and his subsequent engagement with philosophical Marxism confound his friends, but even today’s readers can find it difficult to track the many shifts in Lukács’s theoretical commitments between 1918 and 1923.

In the December 1918 article “Bolshevism as an Ethical Problem,” Lukács draws a connection between his newfound Marxist convictions and his previous ethical views: whereas the historical necessity of class struggle is only a descriptive claim in Marxism, the normative, ethical requirement to establish a classless society must be separated from issues of truth and recognized as a utopian form of ethical idealism, appropriate for the expression of a pure will. In 1918, Lukács still thought that this insight led to a paradox: In order for the proletarian “messianic class” (1918: 218) to overcome class society, it must first seize power by creating the most extreme form of class dominance, i.e., a dictatorship. Bolshevism thus presupposes that evil actions can produce good outcomes, or, as Lukács puts it in the essay “Tactics and Ethics,” that tragedy cannot be avoided in revolutionary politics (1919a: 10). By the time History and Class Consciousness appeared, however, Lukács seems to have thought of himself as having found another conception of revolutionary action that paved the way for a new approach to political practice.

3.1 Reification Theory

At the foundation of this new conception lies the theory of reification that Lukács introduces in the essay “Reification and the Consciousness of the Proletariat.” This essay is credited not only with being one of the foundational texts of “Western Marxism” (Anderson 1976), but also with spelling out the paradigmatic “central problem” (Brunkhorst 1998) of critical theory.

Lukács frames his argument as an extension of Marx’s analysis of the “fetishism of the commodity form” in Capital I (Marx [1867] 1992: 163–176), where Marx refers to the fact that social relations between producers of commodities appear in capitalism under the guise of objective, calculable, properties of things (“value”).

While in Marx the form that social relations acquire due to this fetishism (i.e., a form that furnishes commodities with features that make taking an instrumental, quantifying attitude towards them—and ultimately towards social relations themselves—appropriate) is analyzed mainly with regard to how it distorts the relationship between subjects and their economic circumstances, Lukács adopts a far more radical claim. The commodity form, he argues, has gradually become the “universal category of society as a whole” (1923a: 86). In capitalist societies, the commodity form even becomes the dominant form of objectivity itself (Gegenständlichkeitsform). Drawing on debates in contemporary Neo-Kantian thought (see Lotz 2020: 27–31; Feenberg 2017: 113; Kavoulakos 2018), Lukács remains committed to the Kantian idea that the condition of the possibility of synthesizing our experience into an experience of objects depends on our having access to “forms,” which thus have a transcendental status. In contrast to Kant, however, Lukács understands these forms as both socially shared and historically variable. In capitalist societies in particular, the commodity form thus becomes the transcendental determining factor of both objectivity and subjectivity.

Both the objective and the subjective dimension of the emergence of the commodity form are analyzed by Lukács as emerging from concrete changes to the economic structure. On the objective side, when industrial work processes become rationalized as a result of their subsumption under the dominance of commodity exchange, these processes no longer display the typical “unity” of intentionally integrated human work. As each individual labor effort can in principle constitute an input to many products, each operation is related to a “set of heterogeneous use-values” (1923a: 89) and thus no longer forms part of a unique, unified work process. On the subjective side, reification entails the fragmentation of human experience, leading to an attitude of “contemplation” in which one passively adapts to a law-like system of social “second nature” and to an objectifying stance towards one’s own mental states and capacities.

As Lukács writes concerning the commodity form:

[it] stamps its imprint upon the whole consciousness of man; his qualities and abilities are no longer an organic part of his personality, they are things which he can “own” or “dispose of” like the various objects of the external world. And there is no natural form in which human relations can be cast, no way in which man can bring his physical and psychic “qualities” into play without their being subjected increasingly to this reifying process. (1923a: 100)

Lukács calls this development “reification.” It is a process that primarily affects the objective way in which human beings relate to the totality of social relationships that is constitutive of the meaning of their actions, separating this totality (and thus the meaning of their actions) from their self-understanding and establishing it as a form of objective reality. Derivatively, the socially created features of objects (primarily their features as commodities), relations between individual people, and their relations to themselves also acquire the character of a subject-independent, alien objectivity (Stahl 2011). The objective and subjective dimensions of the dominance of the commodity form constitute a complex of reification because the properties of objects, subjects, and social relations become “thing-like” in this particular way. These properties become independent, quantifiable, non-relational features that must remain alien to any subjective meaning that one could attach to them.

With this description of the way in which the dynamics of capitalist society affect not only people materially but the very form of objectivity by which they can relate to the world, Lukács combines Weber’s theory of rationalization, Simmel’s theory of modern culture, and his own idea of a modern contradiction between “form” and “life” (see Dannemann 1987) with Marx’s theory of value. The resulting theory of reification as a socially induced pathology not only had considerable influence on the Frankfurt School (Stahl 2018; on Lukács’s influence on Adorno, see Schiller 2011 and Braunstein/Duckheim 2015; on the engagement of the later generations of Frankfurt School criticism with Lukács, see Habermas 1984: 355–365; Honneth 2008; cf. also Chari 2010, Kavoulakos 2017) but also led Lucien Goldmann to speculate that Heidegger’s Being and Time should be read as an answer to Lukács (Goldmann 1977).

The theory of social rationalization on which Lukács’s argument rests goes beyond a mere description of economic relations, towards a theory of cultural change. The core of this argument is the claim that the dominance of the commodity form in the economic sphere must necessarily lead to the dominance of rational calculation and formal reason in society as a whole and will consequently involve a break with the organic unity and totality of previous forms of human existence. By forcing politics and law to adapt to the demands of capitalist exchange, the commodity form transforms these spheres into a mode of rational calculability (a line of thought that clearly stems from Weber)—which helps to explain the rise of the bureaucratic state and the dominance of formal, positive law that continues to alienate individuals from society and encourages their passivity in the face of objectified, mechanical rules (1923a: 98).

This development leads to a contradictory situation on both the practical and the theoretical level: because the process of rationalization precludes grasping society as a totality, it cannot ever succeed in making society subject to rational calculation in its entirety, for it must exclude all irrational, qualitative dimensions from such calculation. Here, Lukács rephrases his earlier argument regarding the tension between form and life in Marxist terms (López 2019: 72), as an inability of theories that express a reified perspective to grasp the concrete, material content of history. One example, Lukács alleges, is the inability of economics as a science to explain the movements of the economy (1923a: 105–107). The same holds for formalist models of law, which cannot theoretically acknowledge the interdependence of their principles and their social content and must therefore treat this content as an extra-legal, irrational foundation (1923a: 107–110).

This analysis of the social and cultural features of reification allows Lukács, in a third step, to present an analysis of the “antinomies of bourgeois thought” (1923a: 110)—defending the radical claim that the unsolved epistemological problems of the entirety of modern philosophy are rooted in its failure to break through capitalist reification. In attempting to achieve a rational system of principles, Lukács claims, modern philosophy is always confronted with the issue of there being a “content” necessary for the application of its formal principles of knowledge, a content which cannot be integrated into a formal philosophical system—a prime example of which is Kant’s “thing in itself” (see Bernstein 1984: 15–22). Kantian dualism is nothing other than the most self-conscious expression of this “hiatus” between subject (the source of rational unity) and object (the source of non-rational content). This dualism between subject and object—and, in ethics, between norms and facts—haunts modern philosophy. As Fichte and Hegel partly recognize, Lukács argues, this problem arises only because modern thought takes the contemplative subject of reified self-world relations as its paradigm, ignoring the alternative of an active subject that is engaged in the production of the content. Fichte’s proposal to postulate an “identical subject-object” (that is, a subject that produces objectivity by positing objective reality as distinct from itself) is also the key to Lukács’ answer. But Fichte’s solution still suffers from an inadequacy in that he conceives of the constitutive activity still as the act of an individual subject confronted with an external, alien reality (1923a: 124).

An alternative is to be found in the idealist conception of art as an activity directed at the creation of a meaningful totality and in Schiller’s view of artistic activity, which is not an application of external, given laws but a form of play (1923a: 138). However, the conceptualization of practice from the standpoint of aesthetics obscures its historical dimension. Lukács acknowledges Hegel as the thinker who came nearest to finding a solution to this problem by recognizing that it is the totality of concrete history, understood as the expression of a subject, of a “we”, which is the only standpoint from which the antinomies between form and content can be overcome (1923a: 146f.). But Hegel adopts a mythologizing view of this subjectivity in terms of a “World Spirit” that lies beyond any concrete historical agency. The subject Hegel desperately tried to find could only be discovered by Marx—it is the proletariat to which Lukács assigns the role of the “subject-object” of history (1923a: 149).

3.2 Standpoint Theory and Revolution

In the “Reification” essay, Lukács is one of the first authors defending what has later come to be called a “standpoint theory” and thereby has become an important forerunner especially of models in feminist epistemology (Jameson 2009).

In particular, Lukács argues that the position of the proletariat is one of epistemic advantage concerning the acquisition of knowledge about society. Both the proletariat and the bourgeoisie are confronted, Lukács argues, with a reified social reality (1923a: 164). They will therefore form correct beliefs about this reality, but only insofar as they understand it in the form in which it is immediately (“unvermittelt”) given to them. This is contrasted by Lukács to a different understanding which realizes that the nature of all the individual elements of social reality is ultimately to be explained in terms of their role and relationships within the totality of society, which is governed by the commodity form as its structuring principle. Although the “empiricist” beliefs that are immediately accessible to all members of society are thus not strictly speaking false, they are incomplete, insofar as they are insufficient to comprehend the ultimate nature of social phenomena, and they are misleading, insofar as theorists will tend, on the basis of these beliefs, to adopt further, false beliefs about that nature. Lukács emphatically does not state, however, that the proletariat, merely in virtue of its social position, has access to this superior understanding, but that the proletariat is capable of achieving it. While the bourgeoisie must remain “imprisoned within this immediacy” (1923a, 147), the proletariat is “forced” to go beyond it.

Which feature of the proletariat’s existence gives rise to this advantage is a matter of interpretive disagreement. While many later forms of feminist standpoint theories assume that social positions give rise to epistemic opportunities in virtue of the distinctive experiences they make available that are positively contributing to acquiring knowledge (see, for example, Jaggar 1983, 371, Smith 1974, 7), other feminist authors, such as Hartsock (1983), draw on the idea that the distinctive proletarian standpoint might be one that is closer to use-value than exchange value, since workers have to interact more directly with material objects, rather than just exchanging them. While some authors (such as Jameson 2009) also read Lukács as endorsing the claim that it is the distinctive experience that members of the proletariat have which gives rise to a higher probability of forming correct beliefs, more recent interpretations (see Teixeira 2020, Feinberg 2020) emphasize that Lukács characterizes the experience of workers as identical to that of members of the bourgeoisie. However, whereas the latter can integrate that experience into a consistent self-understanding, in the case of workers, the experience of society as something alien and objective includes understanding themselves and their own activities. In Lukács’s words, the worker “appears to himself immediately as an object and not as the active part of the social process of labour” (1923a, 167). The epistemic privilege of the proletariat is not rooted in the fact that this experience would make some truth accessible to them, but rather in the fact that this necessitates workers to acquire a “bifurcated consciousness” of themselves as subject and as pure objects which is inconsistent and thus drives them beyond accepting reality as it appears immediately. Therefore, the distinctive epistemic position of the proletariat is not that it is uniquely situated in a way that is conducive to forming correct beliefs, but that it is uniquely situated in a way that makes it increasingly difficult to continue to hold a set of true beliefs that restrict themselves to immediate appearances.

The epistemic possibility of gaining insight into the mediated nature of social phenomena, however, cannot be realized merely by individual proletarians revising their beliefs. Ultimately, the epistemically superior perspective is one in which the proletariat not merely discovers this nature, but also discovers itself, as the collective author of the structures of social reality. By realizing that it is the “subject-object of history”, the proletariat discovers itself to be the subject of the process of social reproduction (see 1923a: 181; Jay 1984: 107f). As Lukács writes, this “act of consciousness overthrows the objective form of its object” (1923a: 178). The proletariat can thus overcome reification only through a practical engagement with totality—by consciously transforming reality into the product of the proletariat’s collective action—which this totality in its essence has always already been. This process is, in Lukács’ mind, nothing other than the communist revolution. As many critics of Lukács have remarked (Adorno 1973: 190f., Bewes 2002; Jay 1984; Rose 2009), this seems to commit Lukács to the view that there can be a complete overcoming of reification resulting in a totally transparent society. However, this interpretation downplays Lukács’ insistence that the resistance against reification must be understood as a never-ending struggle (see 1923a: 199, 206; Feenberg 2011; Feenberg 2014: 116; López 2019).

As Lukács’ essay on the “Problem of Organisation” (1923b, written shortly before the reification essay) shows, the distinction between “empirical” and “imputed” class consciousness had not entirely been resolved by the introduction of a dialectics of consciousness that is supposed to ground the spontaneous process that is to lead the proletariat beyond immediacy. Non-reified consciousness remains only an objective possibility, always threatened by the seductions of the immediate consciousness.

This has political consequences, as it seems to establish that the communist party has the function of expressing and disciplining the already achieved forms of consciousness. This does not lead Lukács to endorse the Leninist party conception, however, mainly because Lenin’s vision of politics is incompatible with his radical criticism of bureaucracy in the reification essay (Arato and Breines 1979: 154). In his political writings immediately preceding History and Class Consciousness, Lukács rather seems to endorse at different points either a qualified Luxemburgian view of proletarian spontaneity (for example in 1920b) or an elitist conception of party vanguardism (a “party myth”, Arato and Breines 1979: 145), not arriving at an overall consistent position on this question.

3.3 Methodology and Social Ontology in History and Class Consciousness

It is easy to see that the resulting conception of society that Lukács articulates owes as much to Hegel as to Marx. This inheritance commits Lukács to a number of methodological claims which put him into stark opposition not only to social democrats like Eduard Bernstein but also, perhaps unintentionally, to the orthodoxy of the Soviet party.

In his essay “What is Orthodox Marxism?” (1919b), Lukács contrasts his method with social democratic economic determinism. He describes Marxism as a purely methodological commitment to Marx’s dialectics rather than as depending on any belief regarding the truth of Marx’s economic theory. In his essay on Luxemburg, Lukács even goes so far as to claim that “it is not the primacy of economic motives in historical explanation that constitutes the decisive difference between Marxism and bourgeois thought, but the point of view of totality” (1921: 27).

This primacy of the social totality not only affects the Marxist method, but also the conception of practice and the underlying social ontology: by insisting on a foundational role of practice in the social totality, Lukács makes political action rather than labor into the foundation for overcoming reification (Feenberg 1998). Within his social ontology, Lukács is finally committed to the claim that the totality of historical processes, rather than individual facts, are the foundation of objective reality (1923a: 184; for the resulting view of history, see Merleau-Ponty 1973), leading him to a rejection of all “contemplative” epistemologies (such as Lenin’s) which rely on the idea of a simple correspondence between thoughts and facts (1923a: 199ff; see also Lichtheim 1970: 62–65; in addition, it follows from the premise that only the perspective of the social totality solves the epistemological problems of classical philosophy that Lukács must reject Engels’ claim that the experimental method is a model for the type of defetishizing praxis that can overcome the subject-object divide, see 1923a: 131–133). This ontology of pure processuality finally entails a normative conception of society that is critical towards all forms of institutional rationalization which are rejected as forms of alienation across the board. At the same time, in insisting that the emancipated society must be capable of presenting itself as a totality for its subjects, Lukács is unable to discover any resources for progress in the differentiation of social spheres (Arato and Breines 1979: 155).

4. The later Lukács: Praxis, Totality, and Freedom

4.1 The Critique of History and Class Consciousness

By many of those who were looking for a sophisticated Marxist philosophy, History and Class Consciousness was judged to be a supremely important book (as for example by Karl Korsch and Ernst Bloch, see Bloch 1923). The party orthodoxy, was not quite so enamored with Lukács, however. In Germany and Hungary, party intellectuals disapproved of the book because of its idealist tendencies, culminating in its condemnation by Grigory Zinoviev in his opening address to the June 1924 World Congress of the Third International (see Arato and Breines 1979: 180). Lukács’s hastily composed study on Lenin (1924) ultimately resolved the tension between a Luxemburgian view of revolutionary politics as an expression of the spontaneity of the proletariat and a Leninist conception of the party as a vanguard agent—a tension that characterizes History and Class Consciousness (see Feenberg 1988)—in favor of the latter. This anticipated a theoretical development towards a more traditional form of Marxism to which he subscribed for the remainder of his life (see also the unpublished defense of History and Class Consciousness in 1925a and Löwy 2011).

While the condemnation of Lukács’s work by party intellectuals and Lukács’s reaction may have been motivated by political expediency, the conception of society and of political practice contained in History and Class Consciousness had real shortcomings. Jay (1984: 106–115) argues that the idea of the proletariat as the “subject-object” of history seems to entail a Fichtean conception of the self-constitutive capacities of the revolutionary agent, unlimited by historical circumstances, and, correspondingly, of a self-constitutive practice that is hostile to all objectivity, an objection that is echoed by many of his more recent interpreters (e.g., Rose 2009: 30–1; for a criticism of this interpretation, see López 2019: 134).

That the reification essay is characterized by a problematic insistence that it is the very objectivity of social relations that is to be rejected is bolstered by Lukács’s own evaluation in the 1967 preface to the new edition of History and Class-Consciousness. Here, Lukács claims (alongside a number of exercises in self-criticism, which appear both unjustified and externally motivated) that his earlier arguments involved a confusion between objectification (Vergegenständlichung), externalization (Entäußerung), and alienation (Entfremdung). Lukács argues that Hegel was essentially correct to view objectification (that is, the fact that the objects of our labor and the institutions of society are independent of our consciousness) not as a deficiency but as a necessary stage in the development of self-consciousness. Extending this argument, he claims that the fact that social relationships appear external is not problematic in itself. Rather, it is alienation (the causes of which Marx uncovered) that should be the object of the critique of reification: “Only when the objectified forms in society acquire functions that bring the essence of man into conflict with his existence […]. This duality was not acknowledged in History and Class Consciousness” (1967, xxiv; see also Pitkin 1987; see López 2019 for an argument that this self-critique was unjustified).

The distinction between objectification and alienation entails i) the possibility of a critique of reification that does not require a complete reappropriation of objective social forms by a collective subject and ii) a conception of political praxis that acknowledges the mutual dialectical dependence of subject and object (an insight that, according to Feenberg 2014 and López 2019, is already present in History and Class Consciousness).

4.2 Re-reading the Philosophical Tradition: Hegel and the Struggle against “Irrationalism”

These problems motivated Lukács’s turn to another model of practice—a model of political and social practice that he attempted to work out up until the end of his life. While the critique of Fichteanism in his writings between 1923 and 1928—for example in his review of an edition of Lasalle’s letters (1925b) and in a piece on Moses Hess (1926)—constituted a significant step towards such a model, it was impossible for him to write anything controversial on contemporary Marxism after the hostile reception of his 1928 “Blum Theses.” Instead, he tackled the philosophical foundations of these problems in the context of a new reading of the philosophical tradition, especially of Hegel.

In the reification essay, Lukács describes Hegel’s philosophy as the only “bourgeois” theory of history and freedom that comes close to solving the problem of reification due to its insight that the abyss between subject and object can only be overcome by seeing both as elements within a process that actively produces the very distinction between them. Thus, Lukács remains committed to the claim that Marxist social theory must be read as a critical completion—rather than a rejection—of Hegel. This means, however, that he must show that the Hegelian idealist metaphysics that Marx rejects does not exhaust Hegel’s philosophy. His writings on Hegel, most prominently The Young Hegel (1948) and the relevant sections of the Ontology of Social Being, can be read as a defense of this commitment. In the former work, Lukács argues that Hegel’s development of dialectics was informed by his reading of the British economists Steuart and Smith. According to Lukács, this empirical grounding enabled Hegel’s dialectics to draw on the idea of objective, social-historical progress and to understand modern society and economy as a processual totality that is structured by contradictions. Hegel’s view of an ontological dialectics must therefore be read as reflecting the structure of objective social reality. The resulting “objectivism” allowed Hegel to avoid the subjectivist conception of dialectics to which (as Lukács alleges) Kant and Fichte still subscribed. Hegel, however, subordinated this objectivist ontology to logic in the course of the development of his system. It is this “logicism,” i.e., the primacy of categories over being, that led Hegel to postulate the idealist conception of the “subject-object” that is needed to explain the identity of logical categories and ontological determinations. This split between a “genuine” dialectics that reflects the objective contradictions of society (even if in an idealist manner) and a “logicist” system is the main argument in Lukács’s discussion of Hegel in the Ontology (see GW 13: 489f., 506, 520–523).

A second, much more problematic set of commitments was made explicit in Lukács’s writings between the 1930s and the 1950s. This concerns his conviction that, after Hegel, modern thought had become sharply divided into two opposing tendencies: “Marxist dialectics” and “bourgeois irrationalism.” Lukács’s view that virtually all non-Marxist theorists after Hegel—including Schelling, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and Heidegger—can be subsumed under the label of irrationalism (a blanket term which, depending on the context, refers to everything from theories of “intellectual intuition,” ontological subjectivism, and “aristocratic” epistemological positions to the denial of progress in history) was perhaps motivated by an earnest desire to apply the method of immanent critique (see Aronowitz 2005) to developments within philosophy that had facilitated the rise of National Socialism. Some of his arguments against Heidegger also resemble Adorno’s critique (see also Adorno 1997). Overall, however, his philosophical arguments for the simplistic distinction between progressive materialism and irrationalism—in particular those that he presents in The Destruction of Reason (according to George Lichtheim, “the worst book he ever wrote”; Lichtheim 1970: 68)—are dogmatic and superficial. A number of particularly problematic claims are made in the postscript to the Destruction, where Lukács not only defends the Soviet Union under Stalin but also accuses Bertrand Russell of being secretly religious (1954: 808) and Wittgenstein and the pragmatists of being proponents of a form of subjectivism that had facilitated the rise of a new form of fascism (1954: 782ff.; for other examples, see the unpublished 1933a).

4.3 The Ontology of Social Being

The most fundamental level on which Lukács develops his revised model of Hegelian Marxism is that of ontology, or, more specifically, an “ontology of social being.” Lukács claims that, as far as ontology is concerned, we can distinguish three levels of being in the world: material or inorganic being, organic life, and social reality (GW 13: 22). All three levels are distinguished by a division between the genuine essence of entities and their appearance. While on all three levels entities appear as fixed objects, their real essence is always that of interrelated, irreversible processes (GW 13: 240). This entails that the basic form of all being is temporality and historicity (GW 13: 228).

While this general ontology remains underdeveloped and is not informed by much knowledge of concurrent philosophical developments, Lukács’s theory of social reality has contemporary relevance. Social reality, Lukács claims, differs from the other levels of reality not only insofar as it is governed by causal, non-teleological laws but also insofar as it contains an element of teleology as a result of “teleological positing” (GW 13: 20; 1971c: 12ff.). Due to their ability to perform labor, humans can “posit” functions or goals that are to govern the natural, causal processes they manipulate. By choosing one of the potential results of the employment of their natural and technological capacities as the correct one, individuals can draw a distinction between successful and unsuccessful executions of their intended actions in labor. This, Lukács argues, introduces normative distinctions or values into the world (see 1971b: 75f and 153–156; 1968: 140). In particular, Lukács claims that the objectification of human intentions in institutions enables us to understand the existence of objective values as products of social-historical developments without sliding into historical relativism. However, as some of his own students noted, this explanation remains too unclear to solve the problem of normativity for Marxism (see Fehér et al., 1976). The same doubts remain with regard to Lukács’s further claim that there is one fundamental, immanent value of social history, namely the unfettered development of human capacities (GW 14: 153).

Because Lukács sees the process of labor as the foundation of all social and normative phenomena (see also 1971c: 65; Thompson 2011), the totality of society can be described as the totality of all relations between the teleological acts of “positing” conditions of success in labor. However, even though Lukács thus acknowledges intentional consciousness as an irreducible factor in these acts (see Lukács 1968: 138), their meaning is ultimately determined by the objective, historical development of social relations.

From these ontological commitments it follows that intentionality, which guides individual acts of labor, is a condition for the existence of the totality of social facts, and vice versa (see Tertullian 1988). In particular, he describes language and institutions as media of “indirect” teleological positing because they enable forms of action that do not directly modify nature but that indirectly aspire to bring others to do so (GW 14: 172; 1968: 142). Although he remains committed to the primacy of labor, Lukács allows that these linguistic and institutional mediations acquire a dynamic of their own over time, becoming independent of the goal of dominating nature, in particular because they allow for a generalization of the cognitive grasping of particular phenomena (see GW 13: 47; GW 14: 165ff, 342–357) and for greater distance between subject and object (1971c: 100).

Lukács’s conception of individuality as a product of the choice between alternatives within a socially determined totality ultimately led to a theory of alienation that partially replaced the theory of reification of his younger years. Whereas the latter theory was closely connected to the ideal of the collective reappropriation of society, Lukács describes alienation in the Ontology as primarily the result of social conditions that turn individuals into merely “particular” personalities (GW 14: 530) instead of allowing them to develop their capacities to the degree that the present development of productive forces could make possible. This means that alienation (for instance the alienation brought about by excessive professional specialization) must be understood as the socially induced incapacity of individuals to participate in “species being” or the social totality. The overcoming of alienation thus always demands—along with social changes—subjective transformation, i.e., individual change (GW 14: 551). This points towards the ethical dimension of the Ontology. Lukács claims that there is a normative ideal immanent in society as such, namely, the ideal of social relations that allow all to fully participate in the social totality with their whole personality, thereby realizing their universal nature. This suggests a conception of political praxis that amounts to a form of democratic politics.

4.4 Aesthetics: Realism and the Work of Art as a Closed Totality

While Lukács made his ontological commitments explicit only towards the end of his life, they informed the development of his aesthetics from the 1930s on. From the general materialist premises of his ontology and from his rejection of the epistemology of History and Class Consciousness in favor of the Leninist alternative (see 1938), it follows that cultural and mental phenomena must always be seen as reflections (or “mirroring,” Widerspiegelungen) of an objective reality (GW 11: 22, 55).

Like science and ethics, art breaks with the immediacy of our everyday practical engagements that dominates more common forms of reflection (GW 11: 207, 214). Yet aesthetic reflections on reality differ from science (or more generally from conceptual and theoretical reflections) in three respects: First, while scientific knowledge presupposes the “deanthropomorphization” of the subject matter (meaning that reality is presented as independent of human desires or subjectivity), the aesthetic subject matter remains anthropomorphized insofar as art presents reality in the form of inner experience. Thus, aesthetic representation always remains connected to a possible “evocation” of a human subject’s reactions (GW 11: 438). Second, while science is always conceptually mediated, art breaks with the immediacy of everyday life in favor of a new immediacy of experience (GW 11: 237, 509, 513). And third, while science reflects reality in the form of general laws, aesthetic representation is always bound to represent universal aspects of the essence of reality in the form of the individuality (or specificity) of the work of art (Lukács’s term for individuality is Besonderheit, a concept which he takes from Hegel’s Science of Logic, where it describes the dialectical sublation of both generality and particularity within the “notion”).

According to this conception of art as a mode of reflection, the function of a work of art is to present humans with the totality of the objective, historical reality within an “homogeneous medium” (such as pure visibility in painting or poetic language in poetry; see GW 11: 642). The employment of such a medium makes it possible for art to single out and represent the universal aspects of a given form of human reality as a “closed world-in-itself” or as an “intensive totality” (GW 11: 238, 461, 774; GW 12: 232). As Lukács argues (GW 11: 660), the medium of each specific form of art establishes strict laws that allow the work of art to adequately present the world of humanity from a specific standpoint. For this reason, such works of art allow us to comprehend the universal aspects of our existence and to consciously participate in the collective life of humanity (GW 11: 519–530). Lukács describes this effect as “defetishization” (GW 11: ch. 9), anticipating the ethical call to overcome alienation formulated in the Ontology. A successful work of art can thus have the effect of “catharsis” (GW 11: 811), transforming the “whole person” of everyday life (the person who is entangled in their diverse relationships) into a “person as a whole” (the person who realizes their humanity by acquiring a sense of self-consciousness regarding the richness of the human relations that constitute the historical development of humankind).

Even though they represent objective reality, works of art are, in virtue of this mode of reflection, subject-dependent because their character is constituted by their capacity to evoke a subjective reaction: i.e., an understanding of how and why the world revealed in art is appropriate to the comprehending subject in its universal nature (GW 11: 305). This reaction is not only one of passive acknowledgment; it also actively transforms the subject by facilitating consciousness of that very universal nature. Thus, in the work of art, subjectivity and objectivity are mutually constitutive of each other. In a transformed sense—as Lukács explicitly acknowledges (GW 11: 582; GW 12: 217)—the subject-object of idealism is an appropriate concept for works of art (which, one might add, fulfills Lukács’s aspirations for the socialist revolution he had to renounce, both politically and philosophically). Of course, in this new sense the term “subject-object” no longer signifies a privileged agent becoming self-conscious, but only the interdependence of subjectivity and objectivity in a specific sphere of experience.

Lukács makes a similar conceptual move by endorsing the claim that all consciousness is a reflection of reality. On the one hand, this signals a revision of the epistemological position he defended in History and Class Consciousness (where he criticized the distinction between a seemingly objective reality and purely subjective forms of perception) in favor of Lenin’s theory of consciousness. On the other hand, Lukács is keen to make room—at least within the boundaries of the aesthetic—for the idea that some insights can be had only in relation to a totality that encompasses subjectivity and objectivity.

At this point, Lukács no longer derives his aesthetic commitments from purely philosophical premises—as he did in his early Heidelberg writings—instead building on anthropological premises (especially concerning the concept of everyday life, in regard to which he notes the similarity between his analysis and Heidegger’s notion of practical engagement; see GW 11: 68–71; for related points on the Ontology see Joós 1982), psychological theorizing (proposing an extension of Pavlov’s behaviorist classification of signal systems; see GW 12: 11–191), and a speculative notion of world history. The most important concept binding these premises together is the idea of mimesis. Mimetic behavior, Lukács argues, is a fundamental way of coping with the world and a source of both magic and art. Through the mimetic imitation of natural processes, humans acquire the ability to represent the salient aspects of the world in a closed and totalizing manner, gradually learning to separate such imitations from the necessity of immediate reaction. In contrast to magic, which does not separate reflection and objective causation, mimesis in art is consciously taken as reflection and has an aesthetic effect on its audience specifically in virtue of this feature (GW 11: 382). In other words, while both art and science overcome the superstition of magic, only art can retain the mimetic dimension of representation.

Lukács’s commitment to a conception of the work of art as a closed totality structured by the strict laws of its medium and objectively reflecting the development of humanity in the mode of mimetic evocation had considerable implications for his own judgments as an aesthetic theorist. His writings on literary realism published from the 1930s to the 1950s—especially “Realism in the Balance” (1938), The Historical Novel (1955), and The Meaning of Contemporary Realism (1955)—display to various degrees a mixture of philosophical insight and Stalinist orthodoxy. In any case, they are animated by a strong commitment to the superiority of realism, as exemplified by Balzac, Tolstoy, Gorky (see GW 5), and Thomas Mann (see 1949), which he contrasts with the “decadent” avant-garde literature of his time. This position drew sharp criticism, for example from Seghers, Brecht, and Adorno (see Lukács 1981; Brecht 1977; Adorno [1958] 1977; on the Lukács-Brecht debate, see Pike 1985).

However, to the extent that Lukács’s commitment to realism reflects a commitment to the notion that works of art should present a totality of meaning that is not alien to the life of individuals but rather overcomes the alienation they suffer in everyday life, it expresses (even in its most distorted versions) an intuition that sustained his work from the beginning: a desire to overcome the tension between human life and the objective social forms that constitute modern society.



The only English-language biography of Lukács is Kadarkay, A., 1991, Georg Lukács. Life, Thought, and Politics, Cambridge, MA: Blackwell. In German, there is an extended autobiographical interview in Lukács, Georg, 1980, Gelebtes Denken, Frankfurt a.M.: Suhrkamp, and a collection of photographs and original sources in Raddatz, F., 1972, Georg Lukács in Selbstzeugnissen und Bilddokumenten, Reinbek: Rowohlt, 1972.

Primary Sources

Collected Works

There is no complete edition of Lukács’s works in English. The most accessible collection is the (incomplete) German edition of his works:

Lukács, Georg, 1968–1981, Gesammelte Werke, Darmstadt: Luchterhand (cited as GW).

Cited Primary Sources

This list comprises the bibliographical entries for the works by Lukács that are cited in the main article. English translations are cited where available. If no translation is available, the Gesammelte Werke are cited. In the remaining cases, the original publication is cited. Sources are listed by original publication date.

  • 1908, “On the Romantic Philosophy of Life. Novalis,” in Soul and Form, A. Bostock (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1971, pp. 42–54.
  • 1909, The Sociology of Modern Drama, Oshkosh, WI: Green Mountain Editions, 1965 (A chapter from Lukács’ dissertation which is published in its entirety in GW 15).
  • 1910a, “The Bourgeois Way of Life and Art for Art’s Sake. Theodor Storm,” in Soul and Form, A. Bostock (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1971, pp. 55–78.
  • 1910b, “The Metaphysics of Tragedy. Paul Ernst,” in Soul and Form, A. Bostock (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1971, pp. 152–174.
  • 1910c, “The Foundering of Form against Life. Sören Kierkegaard and Regine Olsen,” in Soul and Form, A. Bostock (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1971, pp. 28–41.
  • 1911a, “On the Nature and Form of the Essay,” in Soul and Form, A. Bostock (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1971, pp. 1–18.
  • 1911b, “On Poverty of Spirit,” in The Lukács Reader, A. Kadarkay (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Blackwell, 1995, pp. 42–56.
  • 1916, The Theory of the Novel, A. Bostock (trans.), London: Merlin, 1971.
  • 1918, “Bolshevism as an Ethical Problem,” in The Lukács Reader, A. Kadarkay (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Blackwell, 1995, pp. 216–221.
  • 1919a, “Tactics and Ethics,” in Tactics and Ethics, Political Writings 1919–1929, R. Livingstone (ed.), London: NLB, 1972, pp. 3–11.
  • 1919b, “What is Orthodox Marxism?,” in History and Class Consciousness, R. Livingstone (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1971, pp. 1–26.
  • 1920a, “Class Consciousness,” in History and Class Consciousness, R. Livingstone (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1971, pp. 46–82.
  • 1920b, “The Moral Mission of the Communist Party,” in Tactics and Ethics, Political Writings 1919–1929, R. Livingstone (ed.), London: NLB, 1972, pp. 64–70.
  • 1921, “The Marxism of Rosa Luxemburg,” in History and Class Consciousness, R. Livingstone (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1971, pp. 27–45.
  • 1923a, “Reification and the Consciousness of the Proletariat,” in History and Class Consciousness, Rodney Livingstone (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1971, pp. 83–222.
  • 1923b, “Towards a Methodology of the Problem of Organisation,” in History and Class Consciousness, R. Livingstone (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1971, pp. 294–342.
  • 1924, Lenin: A Study on the Unity of his Thought, Nicholas Jacobs (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1971.
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