Ernst Cassirer

First published Wed Jun 30, 2004; substantive revision Sun Feb 27, 2022

Ernst Cassirer occupies a unique place in twentieth-century philosophy. His work pays equal attention to foundational and epistemological issues in the philosophy of mathematics and natural science and to aesthetics, the philosophy of history, and other issues in the “cultural sciences” broadly conceived. More than any other German philosopher since Kant, Cassirer thus aims to devote equal philosophical attention both to the (mathematical and) natural sciences (Naturwissenschaften) and to the more humanistic disciplines (Geisteswissenschaften). In this way, Cassirer, more than any other twentieth-century philosopher, plays a fundamental mediating role between C. P. Snow’s famous “two cultures.” He also plays a similarly mediating role between the two major traditions in twentieth-century academic philosophy – the “analytic” and “continental” traditions – whose radically different (and often mutually uncomprehending) perspectives on the relationship between scientific and humanistic elements in their subject gave rise to a fundamental split or gulf between philosophy as it came to be practiced in the Anglo-American world, on the one side, and as it was practiced in most of the rest of the world, on the other. Cassirer, by contrast, had fruitful philosophical relations with leading members of both traditions – with Moritz Schlick, the founder and guiding spirit of the Vienna Circle of logical empiricists, whose work in logic and the philosophy of science had a decisive influence on the development of philosophy in the United States, and with Martin Heidegger, the creator of a radical “existential-hermeneutical” version of Husserlian phenomenology which quickly became dominant in continental Europe.

1. Biography

Cassirer was born on July 28, 1874 to a wealthy and cosmopolitan Jewish family,in the German city of Breslau (now Wroclaw, Poland). Part of the family lived in Berlin, including Cassirer’s cousin Bruno Cassirer, the distinguished publisher, who later published most of Cassirer’s writings. Cassirer entered the University of Berlin in 1892. In 1894 he took a course on Kant with Georg Simmel, who recommended Hermann Cohen’s writings on Kant in particular. Cohen, the first Jew to hold a professorship in Germany, was the founder of the so-called Marburg School of neo-Kantianism, famous for interpreting Kant’s transcendental method as beginning with the “fact of science” and then arguing regressively to the presuppositions or conditions of possibility of this “fact.” Kant was thus read as an “epistemologist [Erkenntniskritiker]” or methodologist of science rather than as a “metaphysician” in the tradition of post-Kantian German idealism. After learning of Cohen’s writings from Simmel, Cassirer (then nineteen years old) proceeded to devour them, whereupon he immediately resolved to study with Cohen at Marburg. He studied at Marburg from 1896 to 1899, when he completed his doctoral work with a dissertation on Descartes’s analysis of mathematical and natural scientific knowledge. This appeared, in turn, as the Introduction to Cassirer’s first published work, a treatment of Leibniz’s philosophy and its scientific basis [Cassirer 1902]. Upon returning to Berlin in 1903, Cassirer further developed these themes while working out his monumental interpretation of the development of modern philosophy and science from the Renaissance through Kant [Cassirer 1906, 1907a]. The first volume of this work served as his habilitation at the University of Berlin, where he taught as an instructor or Privatdozent from 1906 to 1919.

In 1919 Cassirer was finally offered professorships at two newly founded universities at Frankfurt and Hamburg under the auspices of the Weimar Republic. He taught at Hamburg from 1919 until emigrating from Germany in 1933. During these years Cassirer completed his three-volume Philosophy of Symbolic Forms [Cassirer 1923, 1925, 1929b], which broke fundamental new ground beyond the neo-Kantianism of the Marburg School and articulated his own original attempt to unite scientific and non-scientific modes of thought (“symbolic forms”) within a single philosophical vision. In 1928 Cassirer offered a defense of Weimar [Cassirer 1929a] at the University’s celebration of the tenth anniversary of the Republic, and in 1929–30 he served as the rector of the University, as the first Jew to hold such a position in Germany. In the Spring of 1929 Cassirer took part in a famous disputation with Martin Heidegger in Davos, Switzerland, where Heidegger explicitly took Cohen’s neo-Kantianism as a philosophical target and defended his radical new conception of an “existential analytic of Dasein” in the guise of a parallel interpretation of the philosophy of Kant [Heidegger 1929]. Cassirer, for his part, defended his own new understanding of Kant in the philosophy of symbolic forms – against Heidegger’s insistence on the ineluctability of human finitude – by appealing to genuinely objectively valid, necessary and eternal truths arising in both moral experience and mathematical natural science (see [Friedman 2000] [Gordon 2010]).

After his emigration Cassirer spent two years lecturing at Oxford and then six years at the University of Göteborg in Sweden. During this time he developed his most sustained discussion of morality and the philosophy of law as a study of the Swedish legal philosopher Axel Hägerström [Cassirer 1939a] (see [Krois 1987, chap. 4]). He also articulated his major statement on the relationship between the natural sciences and the “cultural sciences” [Cassirer 1942], which contained, among other things, an explicit rejection of Rudolf Carnap’s “physicalism” (see [Friedman 2000, chap. 7]). Cassirer, like so many German émigrés during this period (including Carnap) then finally settled in the United States. He taught at Yale from 1941 to 1944 and at Columbia in 1944–45. During these years he produced two books in English [Cassirer 1944, 1946], where the first, An Essay on Man, serves as a concise introduction to the philosophy of symbolic forms (and thus Cassirer’s distinctive philosophical perspective) as a whole and the second, The Myth of the State, offers an explanation of the rise of fascism on the basis of Cassirer’s conception of mythical thought. Two important American philosophers were substantially influenced by Cassirer during these years: Arthur Pap, whose work on the “functional a priori” in physical theory [Pap 1946] took shape under Cassirer’s guidance at Yale, and Susanne Langer, who promulgated Cassirer’s philosophy of symbolic forms in aesthetic and literary circles (see, e.g., [Langer 1942]). Cassirer’s American influence thus embraced both sides of his philosophical personality. One can only speculate on what this influence might have been if his life had not been cut short suddenly by a heart attack while walking on the streets of New York City on April 13, 1945.

2. Early Historical Writings

As indicated above, Cassirer’s first writings were largely historical in character – including a discussion of Leibniz’s philosophy in its scientific context [Cassirer 1902] and a large-scale work on the history of modern thought from the Renaissance through Kant, Das Erkenntnisproblem in der Philosophie und Wissenschaft der neueren Zeit [Cassirer 1906, 1907a]. The latter, in particular, is a magisterial and deeply original contribution to both the history of philosophy and the history of science. It is the first work, in fact, to develop a detailed reading of the scientific revolution as a whole in terms of the “Platonic” idea that the thoroughgoing application of mathematics to nature (the so-called mathematization of nature) is the central and overarching achievement of this revolution. And Cassirer’s insight was explicitly acknowledged by such seminal intellectual historians as E. A. Burtt, E. J. Dijksterhuis, and Alexandre Koyré, who developed this theme later in the century in the course of establishing the discipline of history of science as we know it today (see, e.g., [Burtt 1925], [Koyré 1939], [Dijksterhuis 1959]). Cassirer, for his part, simultaneously articulates an interpretation of the history of modern philosophy as the development and eventual triumph of what he calls “modern philosophical idealism.” This tradition takes its inspiration, according to Cassirer, from idealism in the Platonic sense, from an appreciation for the “ideal” formal structures paradigmatically studied in mathematics, and it is distinctively modern in recognizing the fundamental importance of the systematic application of such structures to empirically given nature in modern mathematical physics – a progressive and synthetic process wherein mathematical models of nature are successively refined and corrected without limit. For Cassirer, it is Galileo, above all, in opposition to both sterile Aristotelian-Scholastic formal logic and sterile Aristotelian-Scholastic empirical induction, who first grasped the essential structure of this synthetic process; and the development of “modern philosophical idealism” by such thinkers as Descartes, Spinoza, Gassendi, Hobbes, Leibniz, and Kant then consists in its increasingly self-conscious philosophical articulation and elaboration.

In both the Leibniz book and Das Erkenntnisproblem, then, Cassirer interprets the development of modern thought as a whole from the perspective of the basic philosophical principles of Marburg neo-Kantianism: the idea that philosophy as epistemology (Erkenntniskritik) has the articulation and elaboration of the structure of modern mathematical natural science as its primary task; the conviction that, accordingly, philosophy must take the “fact of science” as its starting point and ultimately given datum; and, most especially, the so-called “genetic” conception of scientific knowledge as an ongoing, never completed synthetic process (see below). From a contemporary point of view, Cassirer’s history may therefore appear as both “Whiggish” and “triumphalist,” but it cannot be denied that his work is, nevertheless, extraordinarily rich, extraordinarily clear, and extraordinarily illuminating. Cassirer examines an astonishing variety of textual sources (including both major and minor figures) carefully and in detail, and, without at all neglecting contrary tendencies within the skeptical and empiricist traditions, he develops a compelling portrayal of the evolution of “modern philosophical idealism” through Kant which, even today, reads as extremely compelling and acute.

Cassirer must thus be ranked as one of the very greatest intellectual historians of the twentieth-century – and, indeed, as one of the founders of this discipline as it came to be practiced after 1900. He continued to contribute to intellectual history broadly conceived throughout his career (most notably, perhaps, in his fundamental studies of the Renaissance and the Enlightenment [Cassirer 1927a, 1932]), and he had a major influence on intellectual history throughout the century. Aside from the history of science (see above), Cassirer also decisively influenced intellectual historians more generally, including, notably, the eminent intellectual and cultural historian Peter Gay and the distinguished art historian Erwin Panofsky (see, e.g., [Gay 1977], [Panofsky 1939]). As we shall see below, intellectual (and later cultural) history is an integral part of Cassirer’s distinctive philosophical methodology, so that, in his case, the standard distinction between “historical” and “systematic” work in philosophy ends up looking quite artificial.

3. Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural Science

It was noted above that Cassirer’s early historical works interpret the development of modern thought as a whole (embracing both philosophy and the sciences) from the perspective of the philosophical principles of Marburg neo-Kantianism, as initially articulated in [Cohen 1871]. On the “genetic” conception of scientific knowledge, in particular, the a priori synthetic activity of thought – the activity Kant himself had called “productive synthesis” – is understood as a temporal and historical developmental process in which the object of science is gradually and successively constituted as a never completed “X” towards which the developmental process is converging. For Cohen, this process is modelled on the methods of the infinitesimal calculus (in this connection, especially, see [Cohen 1883]). Beginning with the idea of a continuous series or function, our problem is to see how such a series can be a priori generated step-by-step. The mathematical concept of a differential shows us how this can be done, for the differential at a point in the domain of a given function indicates how it is to be continued on succeeding points. The differential therefore infinitesimally captures the rule of the series as a whole, and thus expresses, at any given point or moment of time, the general form of the series valid for all times,

Cassirer’s first “systematic” work, Substance and Function [Cassirer 1910], takes an essential philosophical step beyond Cohen by explicitly engaging with the late nineteenth-century developments in the foundations of mathematics and mathematical logic that exerted a profound influence on twentieth-century philosophy of mathematics and natural science. Cassirer begins by discussing the problem of concept formation, and by criticizing, in particular, the “abstractionist” theory characteristic of philosophical empiricism, according to which general concepts are arrived at by ascending inductively from sensory particulars. This theory, for Cassirer, is an artifact of traditional Aristotelian logic; and his main idea, accordingly, is that developments in modern formal logic (the mathematical theory of relations) allows us definitively to reject such abstractionism (and thus philosophical empiricism) on behalf of the genetic conception of knowledge. In particular, the modern axiomatic conception of mathematics, as exemplified especially in Richard Dedekind’s work on the foundations of arithmetic and David Hilbert’s work on the foundations of geometry, has shown that mathematics itself has a purely formal and ideal, and thus entirely non-sensible meaning. Pure mathematics describes abstract “systems of order” – what we would now call relational structures – whose concepts can in no way be accommodated within abstractionist or inductivist philosophical empiricism. Cassirer then employs this “formalist” conception of mathematics characteristic of the late nineteenth century to craft a new, and more abstract, version of the genetic conception of knowledge. We conceive the developmental process in question as a series or sequence of abstract formal structures (“systems of order”), which is itself ordered by the abstract mathematical relation of approximate backwards-directed inclusion (as, for example, the new non-Euclidean geometries contain the older geometry of Euclid as a continuously approximated limiting case). In this way, we can conceive all the structures in our sequence as continuously converging, as it were, on a final or limit structure, such that all previous structures in the sequence are approximate special or limiting cases of this final structure. The idea of such an endpoint of the sequence is only a regulative ideal in the Kantian sense – it is only progressively approximated but never in fact actually realized. Nevertheless, it still constitutes the a priori “general serial form” of our properly empirical mathematical theorizing, and, at the same time, it bestows on this theorizing its characteristic form of objectivity.

In explicitly embracing late nineteenth-century work on the foundations of mathematics, Cassirer comes into very close proximity with early twentieth-century analytic philosophy. Indeed, Cassirer takes the modern mathematical logic implicit in the work of Dedekind and Hilbert, and explicit in the work of Gottlob Frege and the early Bertrand Russell, as providing us with our primary tool for moving beyond the empiricist abstractionism due ultimately to Aristotelian syllogistic. The modern “theory of the concept,” accordingly, is based on the fundamental notions of function, series, and order (relational structure) – where these notions, from the point of view of pure mathematics and pure logic, are entirely formal and abstract, having no intuitive relation, in particular, to either space or time. Nevertheless, and here is where Cassirer diverges from most of the analytic tradition, this modern theory of the concept only provides us with a genuine and complete alternative to Aristotelian abstractionism and philosophical empiricism when it is embedded within the genetic conception of knowledge. What is primary is the generative historical process by which modern mathematical natural science successively develops or evolves, and pure mathematics and pure logic only have philosophical significance as elements of or abstractions from this more fundamental developmental process of “productive synthesis” aimed at the application of such pure formal structures in empirical knowledge (see especially [Cassirer 1907b]).

Cassirer’s next important contribution to scientific epistemology [Cassirer 1921] explores the relationship between Einstein’s general theory of relativity and the “critical” (Marburg neo-Kantian) conception of knowledge. Cassirer argues that Einstein’s theory in fact stands as a brilliant confirmation of this conception. On the one hand, the increasing use of abstract mathematical representations in Einstein’s theory entirely supports the attack on Aristotelian abstractionism and philosophical empiricism. On the other hand, however, Einstein’s use of non-Euclidean geometry presents no obstacle at all to our purified and generalized form of (neo-)Kantianism. For we no longer require that any particular mathematical structure be fixed for all time, but only that the historical-developmental sequence of such structures continuously converge. Einstein’s theory satisfies this requirement perfectly well, since the Euclidean geometry fundamental to Newtonian physics is indeed contained in the more general geometry (of variable curvature) employed by Einstein as an approximate special case (as the regions considered become infinitely small, for example). Moritz Schlick published a review of Cassirer’s book immediately after its first appearance [Schlick 1921], taking the occasion to argue (what later became a prominent theme in the philosophy of logical empiricism) that Einstein’s theory of relativity provides us with a decisive refutation of Kantianism in all of its forms. This review marked the beginnings of a respectful philosophical exchange between the two, as noted above, and it was continued, in the context of Cassirer’s later work on the philosophy of symbolic forms, in [Cassirer 1927b] (see [Friedman 2000, chap. 7]).

Cassirer’s assimilation of Einstein’s general theory of relativity marked a watershed in the development of his thought. It not only gave him an opportunity, as we have just seen, to reinterpret the Kantian theory of the a priori conditions of objective experience (especially as involving space and time) in terms of Cassirer’s own version of the genetic conception of knowledge, but it also provided him with an impetus to generalize and extend the original Marburg view in such a way that modern mathematical scientific knowledge in general is now seen as just one possible “symbolic form” among other equally valid and legitimate such forms. Indeed, [Cassirer 1921] first officially announces the project of a general “philosophy of symbolic forms,” conceived, in this context, as a philosophical extension of “the general postulate of relativity.” Just as, according to the general postulate of relativity, all possible reference frames and coordinate systems are viewed as equally good representations of physical reality, and, as a totality, are together interrelated and embraced by precisely this postulate, similarly the totality of “symbolic forms” – aesthetic, ethical, religious, scientific – are here envisioned by Cassirer as standing in a closely analogous relationship. So it is no wonder that, subsequent to taking up the professorship at Hamburg in 1919, Cassirer devotes the rest of his career to this new philosophy of symbolic forms. (Cassirer’s work in the philosophy of natural science in particular also continued, notably in [Cassirer 1936].)

4. The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms

At Hamburg Cassirer found a tremendous resource for the next stage in his philosophical development – the Library of the Cultural Sciences founded by Aby Warburg. Warburg was an eminent art historian with a particular interest in ancient cult, ritual, myth, and magic as sources of archetypal forms of emotional expression later manifested in Renaissance art, and the Library therefore contained abundant materials both on artistic and cultural history and on ancient myth and ritual. Cassirer’s earliest works on the philosophy of symbolic forms appeared as studies and lectures of the Warburg Library in the years 1922–1925, and the three-volume Philosophy of Symbolic Forms itself appeared, as noted above, in 1923, 1925, and 1929 respectively. Just as the genetic conception of knowledge is primarily oriented towards the “fact of science” and, accordingly, takes the historical development of scientific knowledge as its ultimate given datum, the philosophy of symbolic forms is oriented towards the much more general “fact of culture” and thus takes the history of human culture as a whole as its ultimate given datum. The conception of human beings as most fundamentally “symbolic animals,” interposing systems of signs or systems of expression between themselves and the world, then becomes the guiding philosophical motif for elucidating the corresponding conditions of possibility for the “fact of culture” in all of its richness and diversity.

Characteristic of the philosophy of symbolic forms is a concern for the more “primitive” forms of world-presentation underlying the “higher” and more sophisticated cultural forms – a concern for the ordinary perceptual awareness of the world expressed primarily in natural language, and, above all, for the mythical view of the world lying at the most primitive level of all. For Cassirer, these more primitive manifestations of “symbolic meaning” now have an independent status and foundational role that is quite incompatible with both Marburg neo-Kantianism and Kant’s original philosophical conception. In particular, they lie at a deeper, autonomous level of spiritual life which then gives rise to the more sophisticated forms by a dialectical developmental process. From mythical thought, religion and art develop; from natural language, theoretical science develops. It is precisely here that Cassirer appeals to “romantic” philosophical tendencies lying outside the Kantian and neo-Kantian tradition, deploys an historical dialectic self-consciously derived from Hegel, and comes to terms with the contemporary Lebensphilosophie of Wilhelm Dilthey, Henri Bergson, Max Scheler, and Georg Simmel – as well as with the closely related philosophy of Martin Heidegger.

The most basic and primitive type of symbolic meaning is expressive meaning, the product of what Cassirer calls the expressive function (Ausdrucksfunktion) of thought, which is concerned with the experience of events in the world around us as charged with affective and emotional significance, as desirable or hateful, comforting or threatening. It is this type of meaning that underlies mythical consciousness, for Cassirer, and which explains its most distinctive feature, namely, its total disregard for the distinction between appearance and reality. Since the mythical world does not consist of stable and enduring substances that manifest themselves from various points of view and on various occasions, but rather in a fleeting complex of events bound together by their affective and emotional “physiognomic” characters, it also exemplifies its own particular type of causality whereby each part literally contains the whole of which it is a part and can thereby exert all the causal efficacy of the whole. Similarly, there is no essential difference in efficacy between the living and the dead, between waking experiences and dreams, between the name of an object and the object itself, and so on. The fundamental Kantian “categories” of space, time, substance (or object), and causality thereby take on a distinctive configuration representing the formal a priori structure, as it were, of mythical thought.

What Cassirer calls representative symbolic meaning, a product of the representative function (Darstellungsfunktion) of thought, then has the task of precipitating out of the original mythical flux of “physiognomic” characters a world of stable and enduring substances, distinguishable and reidentifiable as such. Working together with the fundamentally pragmatic orientation towards the world exhibited in the technical and instrumental use of tools and artifacts, it is in natural language, according to Cassirer, that the representative function of thought is then most clearly visible. For it is primarily through the medium of natural language that we construct the “intuitive world” of ordinary sense perception on the basis of what Cassirer calls intuitive space and intuitive time. The demonstrative particles (later articles) and tenses of natural language specify the locations of perceived objects in relation to the changing spatio-temporal position of the speaker (relative to a “here-and-now”), and a unified spatio-temporal order thus arises in which each designated object has a determinate relation to the speaker, his/her point of view, and his/her potential range of pragmatic activities. We are now able to distinguish the enduring thing-substance, on the one side, from its variable manifestations from different points of view and on different occasions, on the other, and we thereby arrive at a new fundamental distinction between appearance and reality. This distinction is then expressed in its most developed form, for Cassirer, in the linguistic notion of propositional truth and thus in the propositional copula. Here the Kantian “categories” of space, time, substance, and causality take on a distinctively intuitive or “presentational” configuration.

The distinction between appearance and reality, as expressed in the propositional copula, then leads dialectically to a new task of thought, the task of theoretical science, of systematic inquiry into the realm of truths. Here we encounter the third and final function of symbolic meaning, the significative function (Bedeutungsfunktion), which is exhibited most clearly, according to Cassirer, in the “pure category of relation.” For it is precisely here, in the scientific view of the world, that the pure relational concepts characteristic of modern mathematics, logic, and mathematical physics are finally freed from the bounds of sensible intuition. For example, mathematical space and time arise from intuitive space and time when we abstract from all demonstrative relation to a “here-and-now” and consider instead the single system of relations in which all possible “here-and-now”-points are embedded; the mathematical system of the natural numbers arises when we abstract from all concrete applications of counting and consider instead the single potentially infinite progression wherein all possible applications of counting are comprehended; and so on. The eventual result is the world of modern mathematical physics described in Cassirer’s earlier scientific works – a pure system of formal relations where, in particular, the intuitive concept of substantial thing has finally been replaced by the relational-functional concept of universal law. So it is here, and only here, that the generalized and purified form of (neo-)Kantianism distinctive of the Marburg School gives an accurate characterization of human thought. This characterization is now seen as a one-sided abstraction from a much more comprehensive dialectical process which can no longer be adequately understood without paying equal attention to its more concrete and intuitive symbolic manifestations; and it is in precisely this way, in the end, that the Marburg “fact of science” is now firmly embedded within the much more general “fact of culture” as a whole.

5. Cassirer, Hegel and the Cultural Sciences

Cassirer emphasizes the kinship between his Philosophy of Symbolic Forms and Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit in the Prefaces to both the second (1925) and third (1929) volumes. Recent commentators ([Skidelsky 2008] [Moss 2015]) have illuminatingly built on this circumstance in further articulating the relationship between Cassirer and Hegel. Considerable light is shed on this relationship by Cassirer’s treatment of the problem of the Naturwissenschaften and Geisteswissenschaften in The Logic of the Cultural Sciences (1942). We shall return to this situation in the next section.

Hegel had conceived nature (Natur) and spirit (Geist) as two different expressions of a single divine infinite Reason, which manifests itself temporally from two different points of view. His project of an encyclopedia of philosophical sciences had three parts, the logic, the philosophy of nature, and the philosophy of spirit, where the logic had the task of depicting the dialectical conceptual structure of infinite divine Reason itself. But this Hegelian project for securing the ultimate logico-metaphysical identity of nature and spirit found ever fewer followers as the century progressed, as the rising tide of neo-Kantianism – aided by further developments within the natural sciences instigated by Hermann von Helmholtz – undermined the appeal of the original Naturphilosophie of Schelling and Hegel together with their Absolute Reason. The result was the problem of the Naturwissenschaften and Geisteswissenschaften as it presented itself to the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries. [Cassirer 1942] develops a characteristically methodological perspective on this problem by treating both disciplines as empirical rather than “speculative” sciences (in the sense of Schelling and Hegel) and elucidating their methodological relationship within the philosophy of symbolic forms.

[Cassirer 1942] argues that the empirical evidential basis for the cultural sciences starts from the same realm of perceived physical objects and processes distributed in space and time as do the natural sciences – in this case documents, artifacts, rituals, performances – but it goes on to imbue them with a symbolic “sense” or “meaning” that is not at issue in the natural sciences. We must distinguish, in particular, between the representative function (Darstellungsfunktion) and the expressive function (Ausdrucksfunktion) of thought, and only a prejudice privileging “thing perception [Dingwahrnehmen]” over “expressive perception [Ausdruckswahrnehmen]” can support the idea that the natural sciences have a more secure evidential basis than he cultural sciences. (It is precisely this prejudice which, according to Cassirer, lies behind Carnap’s “physicalism.”) For Cassirer, by contrast, both forms of perception are equally legitimate. While the natural sciences take their evidence from the sphere of thing perception, the cultural sciences take theirs from the sphere of expressive perception – and, in the first instance, from our lived experience in a human community sharing a common system of “cultural meanings.”

Yet we also have the capacity, in the cultural sciences, to extend such meanings beyond their originally local contexts. Whereas intersubjective validity in the natural sciences rests on universal laws of nature ranging over all (physical) places and times, an analogous type of intersubjective validity arises in the cultural sciences independently of such laws. Although every “cultural object” has its own individual place in (historical) time and (geographical-cultural) space, it can still continuously approach a universal cultural meaning (in history or ethnography) as it is continually interpreted and reinterpreted from the perspective of other times and places. Universal cultural meaning thereby emerges only asymptotically, in a way similar to the genetic conception of knowledge of the Marburg School (now seen as based on the significative function of thought). Rather than an abstract mathematical relation of backwards-directed inclusion, however, we are concerned, in the historical cultural sciences, with a hermeneutical relation of backwards-directed interpretation and reinterpretation – and, as a result, there is no possibility, in these sciences, of reliably predicting the future.

We can further illuminate Cassirer’s evolving attempt to situate himself between Kant and Hegel by considering his evolving relationship to Heidegger. In the 1929 Disputation at Davos Cassirer challenged Heidegger’s radical “finitism” by appealing to the presumed necessary and eternal validity found in both the mathematical sciences and morality. And after the Disputation Cassirer added five footnotes to Being and Time (1927) in The Phenomenology of Knowledge before its publication, where he suggested that his attempt to begin the Hegelian phenomenology with mythical thought rather than ordinary sense perception could also address Heidegger’s concerns. In 1931, however, Cassirer published a review of [Heidegger 1929], which took a different approach from his remarks at Davos. Instead of primarily emphasizing the “eternal” validity found in the mathematical sciences, Cassirer now placed his main emphasis on the ethical and aesthetic dimensions of Kant’s thought, as expressed in the Critique of Practical Reason (1788) and the Critique of the Power of Judgement (1790). His main point was that, whereas the Transcendental Analytic of the Critique of Pure Reason(1781/1787) may indeed be written from the perspective of human finitude, the rest of Kant’s system embeds this perspective within a wider conception of “the intelligible substrate of humanity.”

[Cassirer 1931] mirrors his just-completed attempt to embed the Marburg genetic conception of knowledge within a wider conception of the development of human culture as a whole. The way in which Cassirer situates his new philosophy of culture with respect to both Hegel and Heidegger then illuminates his fundamental divergence from Hegel – as it came to be expressed in Cassirer’s works on history and culture after he left Germany for good in 1933. By building the Marburg conception of knowledge, in his new philosophy of culture, on top of the more primitive forms of mythical thought [Ausdruckswahrnehmen] and ordinary language [Dingwahrnehmen], Cassirer takes himself to have done justice to the insights of both Hegel and Heidegger while avoiding both the infinite divine reason of the former and the radical human finitude of the latter. Yet he has now conceded to Heidegger that Kant’s theory of human cognition involves only the notion of potential rather than actual infinity. In particular, Kant’s treatment of the regulative use of the ideas of reason from a merely theoretical point of view leaves their actual content quite indeterminate. In the case of the idea of transcendental freedom, for example, we are only able to determine it negatively (from a theoretical point of view), as a species of causality that is not bound by the conditions of time-determination governing the phenomenal world.

In the Critique of Practical Reason, however, Kant asserts that transcendental freedom acquires a determinate content from pure practical reason, through our immediate awareness of the moral law as normatively binding on our will (as a fact of reason), and that the (practical) objective reality thereby conferred on this idea can then be transferred to the ideas of God and Immortality. This is because the moral law unconditionally commands us to seek the Highest Good – the realization of the Kingdom of Ends here on earth – which is an infinite task requiring infinite (practical) faith and hope. The resulting divergence from the indeterminate and merely potential infinity arising within theoretical reason is visible in the famous passage on the starry heavens above me and the moral law within me at the end of the Critique of Practical Reason, from which Cassirer quotes in his 1931 review of Heidegger. What the Critique of the Power of Judgement adds to this conception is then the further idea that rigorous mathematical scientific understanding of the phenomenal world (“mechanistic” understanding) runs out considerably before we arrive at the history of human culture, so that the future is in principle open to the possibility of our continuously approximating the Highest Good without limit. But Cassirer, as we have just seen, has now achieved a parallel result though his methodological distinction between the natural and the cultural sciences. He is thereby in a position to replace what he takes to be the oppressive (speculative) infinity of Hegel’s Absolute Reason with the liberating (practical) infinity of our human (practical) reason. It is in this way, for Cassirer, that our cultural future always lies open and is always up to us.

6. The Myth of the State

In the Preface to the third volume of The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, the Phenomenology of Knowledge (1929), Cassirer explains that his concept of phenomenology is precisely the Hegelian one [Cassirer (1929, vi–vii)]: “When I speak of a ‘Phenomenology of Knowledge,’ I do not align myself with modern usage, but I go back to the fundamental meaning of ‘phenomenology’ as Hegel established and systematically grounded and justified it. For Hegel phenomenology becomes the fundamental presupposition of philosophical knowledge, because he requires of the latter that it comprehend the totality of spiritual forms, and because this totality, according to him, can only be made visible in the transition from one form to another. [There follows a quote from the Preface to the effect that the individual has a right to demand that (philosophical) science provide a ladder by which to reach up to it.] It cannot be expressed more sharply that the end, the ‘telos’ of spirit cannot be grasped and expressed if one takes it as something self-subsistent, if one takes it as dissolved and separated from the beginning and the middle. Philosophical reflection does not set the end against the middle and the beginning in this way, but rather takes all three as integrating moments of a unitary total development.”

The Preface to the second volume, on Mythical Thought (1925), invokes Hegel in the same vein, while also indicating Cassirer’s remaining fundamental disagreement with him. For Hegel [Hegel (GW 9, 23)]: “Science for its part demands that self-consciousness raise itself into this ether, in order that it may live with and for science. Conversely, the individual has the right to demand that science shall at least provide him with a ladder by which to reach to this height, and show it to him in himself. This right is based on the absolute independence which he knows himself to possess in every form of knowledge; for in each form, whether it be recognized by science or not, and regardless of what its content may be, it is absolute form – that is, it is the immediate certainty of itself, and, if this term be preferred, it is therefore absolute being.”

Cassirer modifies Hegel in 1925 [Cassirer (1925, ix–x)]: “Seen in this way, the problem of myth bursts the bounds of psychology and psychologism and takes its place in that universal domain of problems which Hegel designated as ‘phenomenology of spirit.’ That myth stands to the universal task of the phenomenology of spirit in an internal and necessary relationship can be mediately derived from Hegel’s own conception and determination of this concept: ‘The spirit which … knows itself as developed spirit,’ he writes in the preface to the Phänomenologie des Geistes, ‘is science.’ [Thus begins a considerably longer quotation from (GW 9, 22–4), which concludes ‘Knowledge in its first phase, or immediate spirit, is non-spiritual, i.e., sensible consciousness.’] These propositions, in which Hegel characterizes the relationship of ‘science’ to sensible consciousness, are valid to the full extent and with full precision for the relationship of knowledge to mythical consciousness. For the proper point of departure for all becoming of science, its beginning in the immediate, lies not so much in the sphere of sensible intuition as in that of mythical [intuition]… If, therefore, in accordance with Hegel’s demand, ‘science’ is supposed to offer the ladder to natural consciousness that leads to itself, then it must set this ladder one more rung lower.”

In going beyond sensible consciousness to mythical consciousness, Cassirer emphasizes a non-rational symbolic form as the basis of all the rest. This emphasis had its most striking philosophical payoff in one of Cassirer’s last works, The Myth of the State, which appeared in the year after his death in 1945. Cassirer had written this work encouraged by his colleagues at Yale, as a way in which he could apply his philosophy of symbolic forms to the great calamity of the time – the rise of National Socialism in Germany and the resulting Second World War. Cassirer’s diagnosis of this situation is that it depended on the use of modern technologies of mass communication to awaken, manipulate, and exploit the essentially non-rational mythical functions of thought that are always still present in every human being. Cassirer singles out two German thinkers, Hegel and Spengler, as contributing especially to the Nazi glorification of the totalitarian state – the former less culpably as the most important political philosopher in the nineteenth century background to what Cassirer calls the “modern political myth,” the latter much more culpably as this myth was just coming into being in the twentieth.

Cassirer developed in Göteborg his characteristic perspective on the relationship between the natural and cultural sciences, which also appealed especially to the expressive function of thought. It was in connection with this work that he articulated a pithy defense of Kant’s regulative conception of infinitely distant practical ideals (e.g., the Kingdom of Ends) against what he takes to be the oppressive (speculative) infinity of Hegel’s Absolute Reason [Cassirer (1939, 28)]: “In his philosophy of history Hegel wanted to provide the definitive speculative demonstration that reason is substance and infinite power. For this, however, we must, according to him, above all attain the insight that reason is ‘not so powerless as to pass for a mere ideal, a mere ought.’ This form of proof has become shaky; the critique of the foundations of the Hegelian system has pulled the ground out from under it. If we turn back from the Hegelian meaning of idea to the Kantian, from the idea as ‘absolute power’ back to the idea as ‘infinite problem,’ we must of course give up the speculative optimism of the Hegelian view of history. But, at the same time, we thereby also avoid fatalistic pessimism with its prophecies and visions of decline [Untergangsprophezeiungen und Untergangsvisionen]. [Our] acting again has a free path to decide for itself out of its own force and responsibility, and it knows that the direction and future of culture will depend on the manner of this decision.”

Here one already sees, in the two penultimate sentences, the fateful juxtaposition of Hegel and Spengler: the former as philosopher of history and of right; the latter as the author of The Decline of the West (1918), which can only be called a totalitarian social technology.

Hegel’s historical and political writings should be distinguished from the earlier Phenomenology of Spirit. Hegel was then a creature of the Enlightenment – albeit at a time later than Kant’s when the aftermath of the French Revolution and the Napoleonic wars had begun in earnest along with the Industrial Revolution.

The first topic addressed in Hegel’s Phenomenology is consciousness, beginning with the well-known discussion of sense-certainty and the this. The next topic is self-consciousness, which begins with the famous discussion of mastery and servitude. It here becomes clear that the self-consciousness in question is that of what is sometimes called “modern subjectivity,” focusing on the first-person singular pronoun I – but equally, in this case, on the second-person singular you and the first-person plural we. Here Hegel follows in the footsteps of the Fichtean conception of recognition. But Hegel also adds an essential element of struggle, conflict, and competition depending on inequalities between I and you, or, more generally, among the members of any community of self-conscious human beings (we). This element is indebted to Rousseau’s Discourse on the Origin of Inequality (1755), to which Kant’s conception of “unsocial sociability,” introduced in Ideas towards a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Aim (1784), is also indebted. The difference between Kant and Hegel, in this respect, is that such ideas arise only in the context of Kant’s practical philosophy, while they arise at the beginning of the discussion of self-consciousness in Hegel’s Phenomenology. Or, to put it another way, while Kant distinguishes between theoretical and practical reason, only then to build a bridge between them in the Critique of the Power of Judgement, Hegel’s discussion of self-consciousness in the Phenomenology initiates the development of a unified conception of reason as such, at once both theoretical and practical.

What is at issue is the actualization or realization of rational concepts or ideas, as typified, for Kant, by the ideas of God, Freedom, and Immortality produced by pure practical reason. Kant holds that, as a matter of fact (the Fact of Reason), we have such a faculty, which produces these ideas and also gives them motivating force for us. But there is still always the question of whether we shall actually choose to follow this purely rational motivation, and so Kant develops an elaborate theory of how we can cultivate and develop the means for strengthening and supporting it at the expense of motivations to the contrary (always still present due to unsocial sociability).

For Hegel, by contrast, a rational idea is a normative conception or structure, which, to be normative at all, needs to function as a norm (as a law) within some actual human community. Rational ideas, as such, are actualized or realized in human history, so that the questions then becomes one of understanding the historical-conceptual processes that can lead us towards higher forms of consciousness through increasingly comprehensive and coherent normative structures. This leads to the pivotal section on spirit in the Phenomenology, where the historical part of the exposition reaches a culmination, of sorts, in the discussion of the Enlightenment and the French Revolution, the historical context wherein Hegel himself is located. And this sets the stage for the penultimate discussion of religion as the means for solving the remaining problem of fully internalizing the norms of morality by all members of a human community located within this same historical context.

The problem of internalization involves the need to unify the universal objective laws of morality with the particular individuals who make up the relevant community. These laws must be incorporated, that is, within the subjective consciousness of each individual, and Hegel interprets the doctrine of the incarnation thusly. In particular, it is within a philosophically enlightened Christianity, practiced within a philosophically enlightened religious community, that the divine is incarnated within the lives of human beings. As Hegel puts it at the end of the section on morality [Hegel (GW 9, 362)]: “[I]t is God manifested in the midst of those who know themselves in the form of pure knowledge.”

Kant develops an Enlightenment version of moral religion in his Religion within the Boundaries of Pure Reason (1793). Virtue, for Kant, is an enduring disposition to follow the moral law at the expense of motivation to the contrary, and it is this disposition, in particular, that needs to be cultivated and nurtured within our moral sentiments. However, since the problem of unsocial sociability is the primary obstacle to virtue, we need a social solution to the problem. This solution, for Kant, is an ethical community or “ethical state” (in contrast to a legal “juridical state”), in which mutual encouragement and support in the development of the required disposition (rather than fear of legal sanctions) is the primary means of achieving the desired result. Such an ethical community is what Kant calls a “church.” And he goes on to say that we must look to the history of religion to trace the development of such communities, asserts (not surprisingly) that Christianity (through the doctrine of Christ as the redeemer) is the best we have so far, and concludes, finally, that only the regulative ideal of a universal church embracing all of humanity – a church of reason – can fully serve the goal of developing perfect, and therefore universal virtue.

Kant and Hegel are not so very different in their Enlightenment ambitions. They are both concerned with universal normative principles and the actualization of these principles in existing human communities. Moreover, they both find a culmination of this process in what they take to be the best form of religion of the time – Christianity, and, in particular, Lutheranism – which only needs to be fully rationalized and universalized in accordance with Enlightenment demands. The difference between the two, once again, is that, while Kant attempts to meet these demands by sharply distinguishing among different faculties of the mind – in this case, theoretical and practical reason – between which he then builds a bridge, Hegel attempts to meet these same demands by articulating a unified conception of reason as such, at once both theoretical and practical.

In the case of Cassirer, by contrast, although he is certainly a follower and champion of the Enlightenment, he is by no means a thinker of the Enlightenment itself. He is instead a creature of the twentieth century, confronted with forms of science, and also of socio-political organization, technology, warfare, and much else, which could not have been envisaged by either Kant or Hegel. Moreover, the unprecedented horrors of the first half of the twentieth century put Cassirer in a very different moral universe in which no religious or cultural tradition could simply be taken for granted. This is clear in Cassirer’s discussion of religion at the end of Mythical Thought, which, in contrast to both Kant and Hegel, ranks art rather than religion as the highest development of the expressive function of symbolic meaning. We must, in the end, acknowledge that Cassirer’s discussion of myth sheds a bright light on one of the most important problems of his time, namely, the rise of the technologically driven totalitarian state – a problem that continues increasingly to threaten us even today.


Selected works by Cassirer

(Fuller bibliographies may be found in [Schilpp 1949], [Krois 1987]; many of Cassirer’s German writings are reprinted by the Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, Darmstadt.)

  • (1902) Leibniz’ System in seinen wissenschaftlichen Grundlagen. Marburg: Elwert.
  • (1906) Das Erkenntnisproblem in der Philosophie und Wissenschaft der neueren Zeit. Erster Band. Berlin: Bruno Cassirer.
  • (1907a) Das Erkenntnisproblem in der Philosophie und Wissenschaft der neueren Zeit. Zweiter Band. Berlin: Bruno Cassirer.
  • (1907b) “Kant und die moderne Mathematik.” Kant-Studien 12, 1–40.
  • (1910) Substanzbegriff und Funktionsbegriff: Untersuchungen über die Grundfragen der Erkenntniskritik. Berlin: Bruno Cassirer. Translated as Substance and Function. Chicago: Open Court, 1923.
  • (1921) Zur Einsteinschen Relativitätstheorie. Erkenntnistheoretische Betrachtungen. Berlin: Bruno Cassirer. Translated as Einstein’s Theory of Relativity. Chicago: Open Court, 1923.
  • (1923) Philosophie der symbolischen Formen. Erster Teil: Die Sprache. Berlin: Bruno Cassirer. Translated as The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms. Volume One: Language. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1955.
  • (1925a) Philosophie der symbolischen Formen. Zweiter Teil: Das mythische Denken. Berlin: Bruno Cassirer. Translated as The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms. Volume Two: Mythical Thought. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1955.
  • (1925b) Sprache und Mythos: Ein Beitrag zum Problem der Götternamen. Leipzig: Teubner. Translated as Language and Myth. New York: Harper, 1946.
  • (1927a) Individuum und Kosmos in der Philosophie der Renaissance. Leipzig: Teubner. Translated as The Individual and the Cosmos in Renaissance Philosophy. New York: Harper, 1964.
  • (1927b) “Erkenntnistheorie nebst den Grenzfragen der Logik und Denkpsychologie.” Jahrbücher der Philosophie 3, 31–92.
  • (1929a) Die Idee der republikanischen Verfassung. Hamburg: Friedrichsen.
  • (1929b) Philosophie der symbolischen Formen. Dritter Teil: Phänomenologie der Erkenntnis. Berlin: Bruno Cassirer. Translated as The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms. Volume Three: The Phenomenology of Knowledge. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1957.
  • (1931) “Kant und das Problem der Metaphysik. Bemerkungen zu Martin Heideggers Kantinterpretation.” Kant-Studien 36, 1–16. Translated as “Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics.” In M. Gram, ed. Kant: Disputed Questions. Chicago: Quadrangle, 1967.
  • (1932) Die Philosophie der Aufklärung. Tübingen: Morh. Translated as The Philosophy of the Enlightenment. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1951.
  • (1936) Determinismus und Indeterminismus in der modernen Physik. Göteborg: Göteborgs Högskolas Årsskrift 42. Translated as Determinism and Indeterminism in Modern Physics. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1956.
  • (1939a) Axel Hägerström: Eine Studie zur Schwedischen Philosophie der Gegenwart. Göteborg: Göteborgs Högskolas Årsskrift 45.
  • (1939b) “Naturalistische und humanistische Begründung der Kulturphilosophie.” Göteborg Kungl. Vetenskaps- och Vitterhets-Semhälles Handlingar. 5e Földjen, Ser. A, Band 7, Nr. 3. Translated as “Introduction: Naturalistic and Humanistic Philosophies of Culture” in (1942/1961) below.
  • (1942) Zur Logik der Kulturwissenschaften. Göteborg: Göteborgs Högskolas Årsskrift 47. Translated as The Logic of the Humanities. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1961. Translated as The Logic of the Cultural Sciences. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2000.
  • (1944) An Essay on Man. New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • (1946) The Myth of the State. New Haven: Yale University Press.

Note: Cassirer’s unpublished writings are now appearing in volumes edited by J. Krois and E. Schwemmer, Nachgelassene Manuskripte und Texte. Hamburg: Meiner.

Secondary and Other Relevant Literature

  • Aubenque, P., L. Ferry, E. Rudolf, J.-F. Courtine, F. Capeillières (1992) “Philosophie und Politik: Die Davoser Disputation zwischen Ernst Cassirer und Martin Heidegger in der Retrospektive.” Internationale Zeitschrift für Philosophie, 2: 290–312.
  • Burtt, E. (1925) The Metaphysical Foundations of Modern Physical Science. London: Paul, Trench, Trubner.
  • Cassirer, T. (1981) Mein Leben mit Ernst Cassirer. Hildesheim: Gerstenberg.
  • Cohen, H. (1871) Kants Theorie der Erfahrung. Berlin: Dümmler.
  • ––– (1883) Das Princip der Infinitesimal-Methode und seine Geschichte: ein Kapitel zur Grundlegung der Ekenntnißkritik. Berlin: Dümmler.
  • Dijksterhuis, E. (1959) De Mechanisering van get Wereldbeeld. Amsterdam: Uitgeverif Meulenhoff. Translated as The Mechanization of the World Picture. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1961.
  • Friedman, M. (2000) A Parting of the Ways: Carnap, Cassirer, and Heidegger. Chicago: Open Court.
  • Gay, P. (1977) The Enlightenment: An Interpretation, 2 vols. New York: Norton.
  • Gordon, P. (2010) Continental Divide: Heidegger, Cassirer, Davos. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • Hegel, G. W. F. (1807) Phänomenologie des Geistes. Gesammelte Werke [GW]. Bd. 9. Hamburg, 1980.
  • Heidegger, M. (1927) Sein und Zeit. Tübingen: Max Niemeyer. Translated as Being and Time. New York: Harper, 1962.
  • ––– (1928) “Ernst Cassirer: Philosophie der symbolischen Formen. 2. Teil: Das mythische Denken.” Deutsche Literaturzeitung, 21: 1000–1012. Translated as “Book Review of Ernst Cassirer’s Mythical Thought.” In The Piety of Thinking. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1976.
  • ––– (1929) Kant und das Problem der Metaphysik. Bonn: Friedrich Cohen. Translated (together with a protocol of the Davos disputation with Cassirer) as Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics. Bloomington: Indiana University Press: 1990.
  • Ihmig, K.-N. (2001) Grundzüge einer Philosophie der Wissenschaften bei Ernst Cassirer. Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft.
  • Kaegi, D. and E. Rudolph, eds. (2000)70 Jahre Davoser Disputation. Hamburg: Meiner.
  • Knoppe, T. (1992) Die theoretische Philosophie Ernst Cassirers: Zu den Grundlagen transzendentaler Wissenschafts- und Kulturtheorie. Hamburg: Meiner.
  • Koyré, A. (1939) Etudes galiléennes. 3 vols. Paris: Hermann. Translated as Galileo Studies. Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanities Press, 1978.
  • Krois, J. (1987) Cassirer: Symbolic Forms and History. New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Langer, S. (1942) Philosophy in a New Key: A Study in the Symbolism of Reason, Rite and Art. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • Luft, Sebastian. (2015) The Space of Culture. Towards a Neo-Kantian Philosophy of Culture (Cohen, Natorp & Cassirer). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Moss, G. S. (2015) Ernst Cassirer and the Autonomy of Language. Lanham, Md.: Lexington Books.
  • Matherne, S. (2021) Ernst Cassirer. Abingdon-on-Thames, Oxfordshire, UK: Routledge.
  • Paetzold, H. (1995) Ernst Cassirer – Von Marburg nach New York: eine philosophische Biographie. Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft.
  • Panofsky, E. (1939) Studies in Iconology: Humanistic Themes in the Art of the Renaissance. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Pap, A. (1946) The A Priori in Physical Theory. New York: King’s Cross Press.
  • Renz, U. (2002) Die Rationalität der Kultur: Zur Kulturphilosophie und ihrer transzendentalen Begründung bei Cohen, Natorp und Cassirer. Hamburg: Meiner.
  • Schilpp, P., ed. (1949) The Philosophy of Ernst Cassirer. La Salle: Open Court.
  • Schlick, M. (1921) “Kritizistische oder empiristische Deutung der neuen Physik?” Kant-Studien, 26: 96–111. Translated as “Critical or Empiricist Interpretation of Modern Physics?” In H. Mulder and B. van de Velde-Schlick, eds. Moritz Schlick: Philosophical Papers. Vol. 2. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1979.
  • Schwemmer, O. (1997) Ernst Cassirer. Ein Philosoph der europäischen Moderne. Berlin: Akademie.
  • Skidelsky, E. (2008) Ernst Cassirer: The Last Philosopher of Culture. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

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