Moritz Schlick

First published Tue May 28, 2013; substantive revision Fri Oct 13, 2017

Although Moritz Schlick (1882–1936) made a lasting mark in the philosophical memory by his role as the nominal leader of the Vienna Circle of Logical Positivists, his most lasting contribution includes a broad range of philosophical achievements. Indeed, Schlick’s reputation was established well before the Circle went public. In 1917, he published Space and Time in Contemporary Physics, a philosophical introduction to the new physics of Relativity which was highly acclaimed by Einstein himself as well as many others. The following year, the first edition of his influential General Theory of Knowledge appeared and, in 1922, he was appointed to the prestigious chair of Naturphilosophie at the University of Vienna. Upon his arrival at his new post, he immediately began to collaborate with the mathematician Hans Hahn, the sociologist and economist Otto Neurath, forming a discussion group known as the ‘Schlick Zirkel’. In the 1930s, the intellectual energy of the Circle was increased by newcomers like Rudolf Carnap and Kurt Gödel, as well as the outside influences of thinkers from America (Ernest Nagel, W. V. O. Quine), Britain (A. J. Ayer), Poland (Alfred Tarski), and Germany (Hans Reichenbach), put Schlick in the midst of a virtual whirlwind of philosophical activity which deepened, broadened, and matured his thinking. As his international fame grew, Schlick found himself lecturing in London, teaching at Stanford, and receiving offers to join the faculties of prestigious universities both at home and abroad. At the same time, he produced a number of essays which exerted a deep and lasting influence on contemporary thought. But Schlick’s life was cut short by an assassin’s bullets in 1936, much to the loss of the intellectual world.

1. Background

Moritz Schlick is primarily remembered as the leader of the Vienna Circle of Logical Positivists, which flourished in the early 1930s. Few philosophers of science today would deny that their views have been influenced – one way or the other – by the positions which emerged from the group of philosophers, mathematicians, and social scientists who gathered in between-wars Vienna. And while it cannot be denied that other Circle members were more prominent and influential over the long-term, none contributed more unity and cohesion to the Vienna group during its brief existence. Indeed, long before 1930, when the Circle’s Manifesto, “Wissenschaftliche Weltauffassung: Der Wiener Kreis”, appeared, Schlick had already made contributions to scientific epistemology which exerted a profound influence on subsequent generations of philosophers (Neurath 1973, Ch. 9). And while other Circle members quite deservedly continue to receive a great deal of attention, there has always been a steady interest in Schlick’s views on a range of issues, for there is much of lasting value to be discovered in them.

Schlick was born in Berlin in 1882 and grew up as the son of a middle-class factory manager. After gymnasium, he attended the University of Berlin, intent from the start to study physics. His ambition led him to work with Max Planck and he received his Ph.D. in 1904. After a year of experimental work at Göttingen, he eventually made his way to Zurich where he took up the study of Philosophy. In 1910, he secured a position at Rostock, moving on to Kiel before assuming the Chair of Naturphilosophie at Vienna in 1922. Through all these changes, as well as subsequent modifications of his thought, the evidence of Schlick’s training in Berlin remained just below the surface. Schlick was, after all, the heir apparent to the tradition of philosophical physicists, a tradition founded by Hermann von Helmholtz, the icon of 19th Century physics and an influential leader of the zurück zu Kant movement, and continued by his student and (later) colleague Planck (Coffa 1991, 179–183). Although few professional philosophers embraced the methods and problems of the philosophical physicists, they were highly influential throughout the community of professional physicists, largely due to their prestige.

2. The Philosophical Physicists: Helmholtz and Planck

Although Schlick was originally trained in Physics, it is important to remember that, in late 19th Century Germany, physicists were deeply interested in philosophical issues, especially at Berlin. Schlick was the intellectual heir of both Hermann von Helmholtz, a major figure among 19th Century physicists and a champion of the zurück zu Kant movement and Max Planck. In 1889, Planck succeeded Gustav Kirchhoff and became Helmholtz’ colleague. Both Helmholtz and Planck integrated Kantian themes in their philosophical thinking and there can be no doubt that, even though Schlick could never be considered much of a Kantian, he was deeply sympathetic with many of Kant’s ideas. To begin with, Kant’s interests in epistemological concerns arising from the advanced mathematical sciences attracted Schlick’s admiration and respect, much as it had drawn the interests of Helmholtz and Planck. And all three embraced the goal of developing a philosophical understanding of recent developments in physical science in the spirit, if not the letter, of Kant’s thought. For the most part, their departures from Kant’s original doctrines may be viewed as innovations or improvements of Kant’s insights, introduced without abandoning their own most fundamental philosophical commitments.

For instance, one of Helmholtz’ most well-known innovations is the study of perception in his monumental Handbook of Physiological Optics (1856–1867) (Helmholtz 1924–5). This work was the source of his so-called ‘sign-theory’, based on the idea that perceptions are signs or place-holders for what they signify, but do not resemble or copy them in any way. In his early writings, Helmholtz thought sensations are signs of their external causes, so the associations among sensations represent corresponding regularities among their sources. Consequently, it is the regular changes of signs, their serial structure, which reflects the order of their underlying causes. But this latter consequence implies a causal theory of perception which is fundamentally antithetical to Kant’s understanding of causality. After all, Kant had restricted the operations of causality to the realm of appearances, thus excluding unobservable causes lying behind and causing observable phenomena. But this departure from a basic tenet of Kant’s thought was compounded by the fact that Helmholtz’ account of the knowledge of the location of objects in space is thoroughly empiricist, and also rests on the principle of causality, understood as a causal realist would. But in his 1881 notes to his memoir, Helmholtz corrected himself, recalling that Kant’s views on causality were limited to lawfulness among appearances (Friedman 2010, 631; Friedman 1997, 30–1). What Helmholtz then asserted, in his classic essay “On the Facts of Perception,” is that the inference to a hypostasized reality lying behind the appearances goes beyond what is warranted by the lawfulness obtaining among appearances. Indeed, all localizations of objects in space are really nothing more than the discovery of the lawfulness of the connections obtaining among our motions and our perceptions. The difference between what is genuinely perceived and its realistic interpretation is just the difference between the regularities in our perceptions and the hypothesis of enduring, substantial sources of the perceived regularities (Helmholtz 1977, 138–140).

Although Helmholtz’ philosophical work was not particularly well-received by professional philosophers like Hermann Cohen, co-founder of the Marburg School of neo-Kantians, it exerted a powerful influence on physicists (Cohen 1885, 202–204). In particular, Max Planck was an early supporter of the sign-theory. But Planck never interpreted the sign-theory causally, like Helmholtz had in his earliest writings. Rather, Planck recognized that “our perceptions provide, not a representation of the external world” but, rather, “measurements furnish the physicist with a sign which he must interpret” (Planck 1960, 53; Planck 1933, 84). Furthermore, Planck generalized the sign-theory, arguing that it is not objects, in and of themselves, which are known, but the structural relations in which they stand to one another. His fundamental idea was that what is known are not the natures of ‘things’ but complex structures of relations connecting ‘things’ to one another (Planck 1933, 84ff. and 1960, 53). Thus, the ‘objects of knowledge’ are not objects at all but, rather, what is known are the relata of the structural networks of relations in which they stand to other relata. And, as recent developments have increased the level of abstraction of scientific thought, it has become further removed from its anthropomorphic origins. So the unification of the scientific world-picture is achieved through increasing abstraction which, in turn, drives structural representation, thus reducing the anthropomorphic elements in the scientific image of the world (Planck 1949, 105). The result of Planck’s effort is a theory of knowledge which is structuralist, generalized from Helmholtz’ sign-theory of perception, but which nonetheless preserves the themes of unification and objectivity derived from Kant.

These themes are particularly evident in Planck’s celebrated (1908) Leiden lecture on “The Unity of the Physical Universe”, directed at Ernst Mach’s phenomenalistic Naturphilosophie (Planck 1960, 1–26). Without going into details, Mach regarded physical objects as unnecessary hypostasizations, implying that the mechanical view underlying physics is little more than an elaborate myth. The physics of the matter were effectively settled when Planck secured the mechanical foundations of irreversibility in his Radiation Law of 1900 by relying on Ludwig Boltzmann’s statistical approach to thermodynamics which, in turn, implied atomism. Yet it remained to establish the philosophical implications of these achievements. In his Leiden lecture, Planck argued that this result presented an objective world-picture abstracted from its anthropomorphic origins to produce a synthetically unified image of the world (Planck 1960, 6). Such a view, Planck argued, can only be produced through the unification of the diverse fields of physical phenomena if they are synthesized by means of mathematical abstraction. Such abstraction generalizes the sign-theory to apply to theoretical as well as perceptual representations, resulting in a full-blown structuralist epistemology (Planck 1933, 84ff.; Planck 1949, 105). And it is this method of abstraction that produces the synthetic unity grounding scientific objectivity. The result is that physical entities are ‘objective’, in the Kantian sense, since they embody the lawfulness of appearances. Indeed, Planck insisted that what is ‘objective’ is precisely what the heroes of the history of science, from Copernicus to Faraday, would have regarded as ‘real’ (Planck 1970, 25–6). Despite the strident Kantian themes of Planck’s argument, his conclusion has always been regarded as a particularly virulent form of convergent realism (Stölzner 2010).

3. Early Epistemology

Emerging from the tradition of the philosophical physicists, Schlick’s early thought bears the marks of his intellectual legacy. After the completion of his graduate study in physics, Schlick soon turned his attention to philosophy (Schlick 2006a). Within a few short years he had written a youthfully enthusiastic ethical tract in 1908, called Lebensweisheit, a lucid analysis of concept-formation called “The Boundaries of Scientific and Philosophical Concept-Formation” (1910), as well as a substantial essay on “The Nature of Truth in Modern Logic” (1910) (Schlick 2006b; Schlick 1979a, 25–40, 41–103). In “The Boundaries…”, Schlick provided a broad sketch of his understanding of scientific thought, which identifies the aim of science as the reduction of phenomena to relationships governed by law, thus exhibiting individual events as special cases of universal, exceptionless regularities. Science is expressed mathematically, in spatio-temporal form to provide for exact measurement. And the individual sciences are demarcated by distinctive intensive qualities, as ‘mass’ distinguishes mechanics, ‘heat’ thermodynamics, etc. Although the methods of mathematico-scientific concept-formation reduces the entire natural world to purely quantitative relations, it is powerless in the face of irreducible pure qualities. This is the task of philosophy so that philosophy becomes the theory of qualities. Schlick’s work on “The Nature of Truth in Modern Logic” not only provides a broad survey of treatments of truth then current in German philosophy, but it also introduces an original view of truth as univocal designation. A judgment, as a structured complex of its constituents, is coordinated with the fact which consists of the entities signified by the judgment’s constituents, arranged in a way which is coordinated with the structure of the particular judgment. When the constituents are structured in a judgment so that the whole judgment univocally designates a situation in the world, then the judgment is true; otherwise, it is false. The conception of truth as univocal coordination figured prominently in Schlick’s pre-Positivist theory of knowledge.

The centerpiece of Schlick’s early epistemology is a deep cleavage between intuitive acquaintance and conceptual knowledge. Although Schlick’s distinction is reminiscent of Kant’s contrast between intuitions and concepts, Schlick regarded intuition as fully naturalized, much as Helmholtz had. When the elements of judgments are initially identified, they are grasped qualitatively, as sensory impressions, like the visual image of a particular dog or the memory image of a horse. These intuitions of acquaintance are spatially qualitative, since they are not only extended but situated with respect to one another in the space of the particular sensory modality through which they are perceived. They are also temporal, since they succeed one another in time. For an example, Schlick considered the visual image of something in the distance which, as it approaches, is identified, first of all, as an animal, then it is recognized as a dog and, when it comes close enough, it will be recognized as my dog ‘Fritz’. Each of these cases involves the recognition of one thing – the image of that which is approaching – as something else, an animal, a dog, and (finally) Fritz. Thus, each of these cases involves knowledge that the image is that of an instance of some class (Schlick 1979a, 119–121; Schlick 2009, Sec. 2). And the same process, in which one thing is recognized as another and therefore known, occurs in cases of scientific knowledge. For instance, the early explanations of light recognized that its behavior was much the same as the behavior of waves. Thus, in the work of Christian Huyghens, light came to be known as a wave phenomenon or, in other words, as the wave-like propagation of a state. Later, through the work of Heinrich Hertz, it was realized that light was unlike mechanical waves which traveled through a medium (such as water or air) but, rather, light behaved more like electrical waves. Accordingly, light became known as an electromagnetic wave phenomenon. In this case, as in the everyday case of the knowledge that the approaching animal is my dog Fritz, light was originally known as a wave phenomenon and only later did it become known as an undulatory disturbance in an electromagnetic field (Schlick 1979a, 121–2; Schlick 2009, Sec. 3).

In the early stages of everyday knowing, what is re-discovered or recognized when something is known is an intuitive idea. Intuitive ideas present images which are signs of their contents and are drawn from sensory experience. Of course, images are vague, blurred, and ill-defined so that when one conjures up an image, say, of one’s father, the expression on his face may not be clear and distinct, so that it may be impossible to tell whether he is frowning or merely looking puzzled (Schlick 1979a, 126–7; Schlick 2009, Sec. 4). And while intuitive ideas are sufficient for the purposes of everyday life, scientific inquiry naturally demands more rigorous methods for capturing and expressing ideas. For this reason, concepts – ideas with precisely delineated contents – are used. And while the meanings of terms used in everyday discourse are usually intuitive ideas, in science they are almost exclusively concepts. This provides scientific judgments with content which is accurately circumscribed, while at the same time eliminating their intuitive content. In his General Theory of Knowledge of 1918, Schlick explained that concepts are formed in clusters, just as the primitive concepts of a mathematical field are defined in terms of one another by the axioms of the discipline. But in his earlier epistemological writings, he explains concept-formation in a more traditional fashion, by reference to marks or characteristics (Merkmale) which belong to all the objects which fall under the concept. Concepts thus represent classes of objects, defined in terms of determinate traits, so that their scope is exactly demarcated. Thus they differ from intuitions, which are indistinct representations of what is presented to a particular sensory modality. So the intuition of a triangle in general or a man in general can only be a hazy, fuzzy-edged visual representation of some particular triangle or man. And while everyday knowing proceeds by comparisons of intuitions, scientific knowledge replaces intuitions in these comparisons with precisely delineated concepts. In short, it is through its reliance on concepts that scientific thinking takes knowledge to a higher level than everyday knowing.

Thus, in his earliest philosophical writings Schlick introduced an innovative conception of truth as univocal designation and affirmed a contrast between intuitions and concepts which was ultimately derived from Kant and naturalized by Helmholtz. Soon, Schlick was presented with an opportunity to display his scientific acumen, by explaining the philosophical import of Special Relativity.

4. Special Relativity

Schlick availed himself of the opportunity to elaborate his epistemological views in application to the new physics of Relativity in his 1915 essay on “The Philosophical Significance of the Principle of Relativity” (1979a, 153–189). This essay is particularly significant in Schlick’s development since it first presented certain philosophical tenets which would figure in all his subsequent work. Implicit in the general philosophical scheme in which Schlick discussed Relativity is an objective, logical distinction between the representational framework in which scientific claims may be formulated and those claims themselves. An intrinsic function of the representational scheme is the constitution of the very concepts in which the formulation of empirical claims is first made possible. Moreover, since the same empirical claims may be expressed in distinct representational schemes, the content which is expressed by all the differing conceptual frameworks comprises the common, objective content of scientific assertions. In contrast, what varies from one description to another reflects the features of the representational systems which distinguish them from one another.

Schlick applied these insights to the fact that no physical means suffice to distinguish inertial frames or, in other words, no (uniform, rectilinear) motion can be detected relative to the ether. There are two alternative responses to this situation. The first alternative, due to Lorentz and Fitzgerald, accommodates experimental findings through the postulation of compensating contractions of moving bodies in the direction of motion. Buttressed by additional auxiliary hypotheses, the Lorentz-Fitzgerald hypothesis preserves the absolute space and time of Euclid and Newton, as well as Galilean kinematics, while explicating experimental failures to detect the absolute rest of the ether by positing a real effect of absolute motion on length. The alternative presented by Einstein in the Special Theory was simply to deny the presupposition of an absolute time reference, allowing that two spatially separated events may be temporally ordered in one way for a given system of reference and may also be ordered differently for a distinct, yet equally legitimate system. Contractions of length are then a consequence of the relativity of reference frames: the length of a measuring rod depends on its velocity for a given frame of reference (Schlick 1979a, 160–1). Consequently, the facts of observation are accommodated equally well by the Principle of Special Relativity as they are by the Lorentz-Fitzgerald hypotheses. In other words, they are equivalent or “both theories do the same thing”. (Schlick 1979a, 162) The principal advantage of Einstein’s approach is that his solution is clearly the simplest. At this juncture, it should be noted that Schlick did not argue that the choice between the available alternatives is conventional because they are empirically equivalent, implying all the same observational consequences. Rather, Schlick repeatedly urged that there is an underlying physical equivalence from which the empirical or observational equivalence follows. And the fact that it is the physical rather than observational equivalence which serves as premise of his argument is especially evident from his use of his earlier analysis of the concept of truth to explicate the equivalence.

Schlick thought the situation in physics presented a thorough-going analogy with Poincaré’s treatment of the conventionality of geometry. Schlick noted, first of all, that Poincaré’s geometric conventionalism was founded on the Kantian insight that it is only the behavior of bodies in space that forms the object of study, so that the resulting physics is “the product of two factors, namely the spatial properties of bodies and their physical properties in the narrower sense” (Schlick 1979a, 169; Cf. also 1979a, 230–233). The point of Schlick’s reference to Poincaré is to illustrate the particular variety of conventionalism operative in Poincaré’s treatment of geometry, in order to apply it to the case of Special Relativity. And just as Poincaré isolated two factors in the treatment of the motion of rigid bodies, in general any true theory may be regarded as the product of a reference-system, or representational scheme, and the judgments formulated in that system. Since there are alternative ways of securing univocal coordination, the components with respect to which distinct but equivalent representations differ are artifices of the representational scheme. Parting from Poincaré, Schlick recognized that the representational framework that appears simplest when regarded in isolation may nonetheless require excessively complicated formulations for the description of reality. And he insisted – contra Poincaré – that it is the simplicity of these formulations that is the most compelling desideratum, not the simplicity of the representational scheme. Thus, the representational scheme that allows for the simplest description of reality is always to be preferred – so much the worse for Euclid, and Poincaré, too.

5. General Theory of Knowledge

Schlick’s earlier epistemological insights, as well as the conventionalist framework developed in his work on the Special Theory, set the stage for his thought in the two works which distinguish his pre-Positivist era: General Theory of Knowledge (largely composed in 1916, with its first edition appearing in 1918 and the second edition in 1925) and Space and Time in Contemporary Physics. (Engler 2009, 130 fn. 51) (Space and Time … appeared for the first time in 1917 as an extended essay in the prestigious journal, Die Naturwissenschaften; soon it was re-issued in three more editions and eventually translated into eleven languages). Before explaining how Schlick’s epistemology embraced the new physics, it is necessary, first of all, to consider how he further developed his earlier epistemological insights.

General Theory is notable for a key innovation in its treatment of concepts, for they are defined in terms of mathematical equations rather than reducing them to complexes of intuitive images (Schlick 2009, Sec. 5). In order to articulate his ideas about the nature of concepts and how they are formed, Schlick borrowed the idea of definition by axioms from recent work in the foundations of geometry by Moritz Pasch, David Hilbert, and Henri Poincaré. In their work on alternative geometries, these mathematicians came to regard the effects of altering the axioms of geometry as changing the meaning of their constituent terms, thus re-defining the primitive geometric concepts. The idea is ingenious in its simplicity, for it treats the geometric primitives as defined by the relations they bear to one another according to the axioms, so the meanings of the terms ‘point’, ‘lies between’, and ‘lies upon’ are fixed by the geometric axioms. The reason mathematicians adopted this method is to insure the certainty of geometry by insuring that it was invulnerable to the criticism that its primitive elements were defined by intuition.

Schlick claimed the method of definition by axioms was implicit because, unlike explicit definition, occurrences of the defined term cannot necessarily be replaced by a combination of the expressions which define it. And he praised the method for its specification of meanings independently of any intuitive content. Implicitly defined terms possess a clarity and precision of scope which cannot be achieved by concepts defined by abstraction from experience. Since, of course, axiomatic definitions stipulate the meanings of all their constituent concepts in terms of the remaining ones, the axioms effectively define concepts by their relations to one another. Thus implicit definitions are structural definitions, and their constituent terms are structurally defined (Schlick 2009, Sec. 7). The concepts thus defined are only related to the other elements of the axiom system and are not related to anything external to the axiom system until the definition is coordinated with extra-linguistic things. In Schlick’s earlier writings, he had stated that concepts themselves are functions which signify or designate the items with which they are coordinated or associated. Accordingly, even implicitly defined concepts must be coordinated with objects, elements of the class of things to which it applies (Schlick 1979a, 130; Schlick 2009, 23; Ryckman 1991, Sec. 3). Of course, these objects, like the concepts which designate them, are distinguished by possession of the properties in terms of which the designating concepts are defined. Such coordinations give empirical content to implicitly defined concepts, transforming them into full-blooded concepts rather than empty place-holders. Moreover, the concepts which dominate scientific thought at any given stage of its development must be modified, revised, and supplemented as science advances. Then a conceptual characterization of a given phenomena which was used at an earlier stage may not be at a later stage as, for instance, the judgment ‘A light-ray consists of a stream of moving particles’, drawn from Newtonian optics was later replaced by ‘A light-ray consists of electromagnetic waves’.

Schlick’s new understanding of concept-formation allows him to seriously address the question of how the respective intuitive spaces of each of the senses are coordinated in the construction of a general intuitive space, which is not specific to any particular sense modality. The intuitive images of experience are spatially ordered, since they exhibit relative locations as well as spatial extension. In addition, since experiences occur one after another, they also exhibit an intuitive temporal order. This results in a distinct spatio-temporal ordering for each of the sense modalities, so that an intuitive order of smells, as well as an intuitive order of tastes (and so forth) are given in experience. The first step in the advance from purely subjective experiences to the transcendent reality of scientific objects is to coordinate the spatio-temporal frameworks of the distinct sense modalities. Thus, when a sore spot on one’s leg is touched by one’s forefinger, the feeling of the touch is accompanied by a visual image of the finger touching the leg. The coincidence of these two separate and distinct types of sensory data contributes evidence to the overall coordination of the spatio-temporal orders of the different sense modalities. This is the method of point-coincidences which Schlick applied to characterize the advance to knowledge of the transcendent world from the purely subjective domain of qualitative images. Of course, the idea of point-coincidences also plays a central role in General Relativity and it has generally been assumed that Schlick picked up the idea from his work on the new physics. But recent scholarship has demonstrated that, in fact, Schlick worked on the notion long before Einstein published the General Theory and may well have been Einstein’s source of the notion (Engler 2009, 135ff). The important point in the present context is that the coordination of a single individual’s sense modalities is but the first step in the construction of the transcendent order. The next phase consists of the coordination of point-coincidences among different individuals. If an instructor wishes to draw attention to some feature of a triangle on a blackboard at the front of a class, he points to the feature, thus effecting a point-coincidence between the tip of his finger and the feature of the triangle. And even though everyone witnessing the demonstration has a different perspective, what they all share is their observation of the point-coincidence of finger-tip and the geometric feature. Further, it is to be noted that not every sensory point-coincidence is an objective one and it is generally true that not every objective point-coincidence is observed directly but is constructed or inferred from ones that are. Finally, all measurements, all determinations of space and time, are based on just such spatio-temporal point-coincidences (Schlick 2009, Sec. 31).

Earlier Schlick had argued that knowledge consists in the identification of that which is known with that as which it is known or, in other words, knowledge consists in the relation of one thing to some other thing, as which it is known. And this is only achieved when one of the objects which is known is, in turn, related to still others, as it is in the myriad spatio-temporal relations in which it stands to other objects. Ultimately, all these relations can be known quantitatively by specifying a number of magnitudes, thus reducing the relations of the objective spatio-temporal order to quantities. Of course, this cannot be achieved within the qualitative order since the different relations of position and temporal order are qualitatively different and cannot, for that very reason, be compared. But the entities populating the objective spatio-temporal order are wholly unlike the denizens of the subjective realm which are the intuitive objects of experience, the immediately given sensory data. Both may be univocally designated by implicitly defined concepts and both kinds of entities are, therefore, objects of possible knowledge. As such, intuitive contents are attributed full reality and, in addition, the objects populating the spatio-temporal order, the entities of advanced theoretical science, are just as real as the contents of consciousness with which they are correlated.

Schlick expended considerable effort discussing the differences between intuitive acquaintance and conceptual knowledge, insisting that, even though intuitive images are real, acquaintance with them does not constitute knowledge. This thesis directly confronts the idea, held by a number of philosophers, that acquaintance with intuitive contents is, indeed, a species of knowledge which is more direct and immediate than conceptual knowledge. By comparison, scientific knowledge is regarded as a poor substitute, lacking the intimacy of intuitive acquaintance. Two champions of this belief are Henri Bergson, who thought that direct access to intuitive contents could (somehow) ‘unite’ the knower with the object known, and Edmund Husserl, who proposed that a genuinely philosophical intuition could become the basis of a kind of scientific cognition in which the subject is in direct contact with its object, without any symbolism or mathematics, any inferences or proofs (Bergson 1955; Husserl 1965). Bergson called this intimate perception of objects ‘intuition’ and Husserl called it ‘wesenschau’. But the reason why intuition can never constitute knowledge is, of course, quite obvious to Schlick. On his view, knowledge requires two terms: that which is known and that, as which, it is known. But intuition, considered as an act of consciousness, involves only that which is intuited. In short, the attempt to identify intuition as a form of knowledge is simply a conflation of knowledge with acquaintance, of unelaborated, direct perception or sensation with conceptual knowledge, of kennen with erkennen (Schlick 2009, Sec. 12).

Schlick’s discussion of the differences between intuition and knowledge laid the groundwork for his treatment of realism. He cautioned, at the outset of his discussion, that the question of realism is not a philosophical problem, but an everyday one. And the view that guides the comings and goings of ordinary life is naïve realism, which assumes that reality consists simply of the objects of sense perception. Of course, the demands of day-to-day affairs seldom require any distinction between the perception of an object and the object perceived, until one encounters an illusion which demands the differentiation of, say, a mirage from a puddle or pond. Only then is a representation first distinguished from its object. It is at this point that the ordinary person realizes that the mirage was real but that the pond or puddle was not. Thus refined, the naïve criterion of reality is extended beyond the reach of the senses once it is realized that, even when an object is not perceived, its effects provide a sufficient condition of its reality, as when a hunter finds a ravaged animal in the forest and concludes that a predator is in the neighborhood. And it is in precisely this way that naïve realism is naturally extended to include, not just perceptions themselves as well as the objects perceived, but also the causal sources of observed effects. In this way, naïve realism naturally leads to classical causal realism.

Then it simply becomes useful to refer to those objects which are not given in sensory experience – or at least not presently given – as ‘things-in-themselves’ since they are, by the causal criterion, real. Things-in-themselves are just the transcendent entities of the objective, three-dimensional world of everyday material objects, as well as the unobservable, theoretical entities postulated by contemporary science. Unsurprisingly, the reality of these entities is contested by a variety of related views, which Schlick classifies as ‘immanence’ philosophies. The most prominent immanence view is the kind of phenomenalism found in thinkers from John Stuart Mill to contemporaries like Joseph Petzoldt, Ernst Mach, and (as Schlick added in the second edition of General Theory …), Bertrand Russell. More curious, perhaps, is that Schlick also indicted his intellectual forebear, Hermann von Helmholtz, as an immanence philosopher. Basically, these thinkers all restrict reality to the given, so that reality consists exclusively of colors, tastes, and smells, as well as other sensations, presented in constantly changing combinations with one another. This is, of course, just to deny the reality of transcendent objects, thus abjuring the causal realism implicit in everyday and scientific talk of transcendent objects which exist and endure beyond momentary sensations. Instead, the immanence thinkers claim that all talk of transcendent objects consists entirely of discourse about complexes of sensations which exhibit more stability and constancy than others. Mach stated the common view of immanence philosophies that material bodies do not produce sensations, because bodies are, at bottom, nothing more than complexes of sensations (Schlick 2009, Sec. 25). Of course, immanence views differ among themselves in their efforts to identify which particular complexes of sensation are identified with everyday material bodies and scientific entities, especially when the latter are not perceived.

The classic immanence view is one which identifies material bodies with the combinations of sensations which would appear, in a given situation, if a perceiver were present. Of course, this is just John Stuart Mill’s definition of bodies as ‘permanent possibilities of sensation’ – a treatment which persists in the writings of many of his followers, in one form or another. For instance, Bertrand Russell, in Our Knowledge of the External World, calls the stable combinations ‘aspects’, declaring that “Things are those series of aspects which obey the laws of physics” (Russell 1922, 110). Specifically, Russell argued that so-called ‘ideal aspects’ – ones which are not presently perceived – may be logically constructed from those which are. Their reality may then be readily assumed. But with this assumption, any grounds of distinguishing between given aspects and assumed ones vanishes, nor is there any means of recovering them, without complicating the system beyond all recognition. Schlick noted that, because of Russell’s sheer audacity in pushing his account to the limit, the result is not prone to the inconsistencies which plague other accounts. Indeed, it is undeniable that Russell’s “bold position” is one of the most successful efforts to carry out the immanence philosophy (Schlick 2009, 502). In a different vein, Joseph Petzoldt acknowledged that esse is not the same as percipi, though he then endeavored to identify the existence of objects with some limited group of sensations, a different group for each perceiver. Despite the countless problems this approach encountered, the critical point which Petzoldt missed is simply that it is impossible to simply identify any particular sensation or group of sensations with a material body, without further conditions relating the sensation or sensations (as, for instance, Russell provided) (Russell 1922, 106). And that is because it is the lawful regularity among sensations which warrants the collection of the series of changing sensations under a single material body. Mach very nearly realized this when, in The Analysis of Sensation, he abandoned Mill’s ‘possibilities’ and replaced them with the mathematical notion of a functional relation. But such a purely mathematical idea can never be substituted for an empirically-based concept of reality. Such efforts are, at bottom, attempts to conceptually embody a law, as epitomized in Helmholtz’ “The Conservation of Force: A Memoir” (Kahl 1977, pp. 49–50). Specifically, Helmholtz identified the objective power of a law with force, thus reducing the reality of material bodies and scientific entities to a conceptual substitute. But concepts, according to Schlick, can never possess the reality of the contents of consciousness or transcendent things-in-themselves (Schlick 2009, Sec. 25).

6. Relativity

In correspondence with Einstein, Schlick explained that his monograph on Space and Time in Contemporary Physics was “less a representation of the general theory itself than a thorough-going elucidation of the thesis that space and time have now forfeited all objectivity in physics” (Schlick 1917). Of course, Schlick is referring to Einstein’s remark in his 1916 paper on the General Theory, that the admission of arbitrary coordinative transformations “removes the last vestige of physical objectivity from space and time” (Einstein 1916, 117). In his monograph, Schlick first described the differences between the space of the older physics and the space postulated by Einstein. In Newtonian physics (as well as the physics of the Special Theory), all measurement was founded on the notion of a rigid rod and space was still regarded as Euclidean so long as measurements were made within the same coordinate system. Thus, in the older physics, space was conceived as complete with metrical properties, defined by rigid rods which possess the same length in any place at any time. It is particularly to be noted that the metrical properties of space were regarded as independent of the distribution of bodies in space and their gravitational fields. It is precisely these conditions that are changed in General Relativity. Rather, in the General Theory, the principle of general covariance implies that properties cannot be ascribed to space independently of any consideration of the things in it. Einstein showed that non-Euclidean methods of determining measurements must be used in the presence of a gravitational field and this follows from the insight that it is the things in space which give it a particular structure. The result is a complete relativization of space (Schlick 2006a, Sec. VII).

In classical mechanics, it was decided by convention (see above) that a rigid rod was the same length throughout space and this convention was modified in Special Relativity. But in General Relativity, the length of a rigid rod may also depend on its place and position in such a way that consistency with Special Relativity is maintained. Thus, to maintain the general postulate of relativity, it is necessary to reduce the objective spatial structure of the earlier physics to a non-intuitive topology. This is a radical departure from the objectivity of the spatial structure of these earlier systems, which was entirely an artifact of their fixed metrical structure. But in Relativity Theory, the resulting conceptual construction admits of distinct metrical structures in different regions depending on the gravitational field in that region. As Schlick reflects in the closing pages of Space and Time …, the very possibility of the objectivity of this conceptual construction depends entirely on the method of point-coincidences. Any features of the world-picture which do not contribute to the systematization of point-coincidences are not physically objective. And all world-pictures which contain laws governing point-coincidences are thoroughly equivalent. Furthermore, since any functional, single-valued deformation of the world-picture leaves all point-coincidences undisturbed, the equations of physics retain their form under such transformations, implying that they are covariant under all substitutions. These substitutions also leave the form of physical equations unchanged for coordinate-systems in motion, allowing for the relativity of space within such coordinate-systems, thus depriving space and time of the “last vestige of physical objectivity” (Schlick 2006a, Sec. VII).

Einstein was so impressed with Schlick’s presentation that, in a letter to Arnold Sommerfeld, Einstein described it as “masterly”, perhaps because Schlick was one of the first commentators to see that space and time have no existence or reality prior to the metric field.

Nor was it long before Space and Time … was succeeded by the first edition of Schlick’s General Theory of Knowledge. During the same period, Schlick spent a year engaged in war work at Aldershof airport outside Berlin followed, in 1921, by an appointment at Kiel. Since rumors were already spreading about a possible appointment at Vienna, Schlick’s family stayed in Rostock until 1922, when they moved to Vienna where he assumed the Chair of Naturphilosophie which had previously been occupied by Ernst Mach and Ludwig Boltzmann (v. d. Velde-Schlick 2008; Ferrari 2009). Schlick’s selection for the post was probably initiated by the mathematician Hans Hahn and the physicist Phillip Frank, with a strong recommendation from Einstein. When Schlick arrived in Vienna, he immediately became involved with Hahn and Frank, as well as the economist Otto Neurath, in their Thursday night discussion meetings in the Chemistry Building of the University of Vienna. Schlick was a welcome addition to the group, and together they formed the core of what would later become known as ‘the Vienna Circle’ (Uebel 2003). Philosophy would never be the same.

However, before arriving in Vienna, Schlick engaged the neo-Kantians, Hans Reichenbach and Ernst Cassirer, who had published their own philosophical understandings of the new physics of Relativity. In his Relativity Theory and Apriori Knowledge of 1920, Reichenbach had argued for a modified conception of Kant’s synthetic apriori, which challenged Schlick’s thought in a decisive way (Reichenbach 1920). At Einstein’s request, Schlick wrote to Reichenbach in the Fall of 1920, hoping to air the differences between them (Schlick 1920; Einstein 1920). In his own essays, Schlick had challenged Kantian apriorism principally by identifying the presuppositions of the new physics as conventions, in Poincaré’s sense. Since the presuppositions of Relativity were alien to classical physics, they were nothing like the self-evident, eternal verities that comprised the Kantian apriori. But while Schlick rejected Kant’s treatment of the apriori altogether, Reichenbach claimed to have preserved its most important element, its constitutive function (Reichenbach 1920, Ch. V; Friedman 1999, 59–70; Oberdan 2009). For Kant had attributed the apriori the far more philosophically significant function of constituting the object of experience or knowledge. Indeed, such principles are the general laws for ordering experience to produce knowledge. Since all empirical knowledge presupposes these ordering principles, they can never conflict with experience and are, in this sense, necessarily true. (Reichenbach 1920, pp. 55–56) Schlick first wrote Reichenbach in the Fall of 1920, acknowledging that he regarded the assumption of constitutive principles as self-evident; indeed, he feared that the matter was so obvious that he might not have discussed it sufficiently in his General Theory of Knowledge (Schlick 1920a, p. 1; Oberdan 1994, pp. 109–110). Nonetheless, it is precisely the principles which Reichenbach himself had identified as synthetic apriori that constitute an observation or measurement of an experience. Yet, Schlick confessed, he was unable to discover any characteristics of these alleged synthetic apriori principles that genuinely distinguish them from conventions. Of course, it then follows that the precepts Reichenbach called “synthetic apriori” were just what Schlick had identified as “conventions” and the differences between them were, at most, terminological (Schlick 1920b, 2). But this apparently terminological difference, Schlick thought, masked a far deeper difference separating them since, on Reichenbach’s understanding, the apriori constitutes the objects of experience and knowledge whereas, on Schlick’s, conventions only constitute concepts, which may be applied to experiences and objects, but do not constitute them. Thus Schlick insisted on distinguishing his own realist epistemology from Reichenbach’s modified Kantianism, because of the latter’s implicit anti-realism.

Schlick also contributed a critical essay on Ernst Cassirer’s 1921 work on Einstein’s Theory of Relativity to the prestigious journal Kant-Studien (Cassirer 1921; Schlick 1979a, 322–334). In “Critical or Empiricist Interpretation of Modern Physics?” of 1921, Schlick explained that Cassirer’s argument rested on a false dichotomy. On the one hand, Cassirer’s own Logical Idealism incorporates principles for the ordering and measuring of sensations to constitute physical objects. On the other hand, the only alternative Cassirer considered is a variety of phenomenalistic empiricism founded on “the sensualistic concept of experience”. In other words, Cassirer’s operative assumption is simply that the only possible philosophical frameworks for understanding contemporary science are a strict empiricism or one incorporating constitutive principles. Of course, Schlick regarded his own philosophical framework as a clear counterexample, since it is an empiricist epistemology distinguished by its inclusion of constitutive principles. Thus, Cassirer committed the same error as Reichenbach by blithely ignoring the possibility of constitutive principles which are not synthetic apriori judgments. Naturally, a combination of empiricism with constitutive principles would fall somewhere between the strict empiricism Cassirer refutes and the Logical Idealism Cassirer defends. At this point, Schlick first used what would eventually become a familiar complaint against Kant and the neo-Kantians among Logical Positivists, especially their characterization of the constitutive principles as synthetic judgments apriori. As Schlick understood constitutive principles, they are certainly not synthetic apriori principles, for they are conventions, which are neither apriori nor synthetic (Schlick 1979a, 322–334). The result of Schlick’s critique was, in Einstein’s words, “truly inspirational” (Einstein 1921).

7. Transition

Shortly after Schlick arrived in Vienna, he was invited by the mathematician Hans Hahn to participate in a seminar on Principia Mathematica by Alfred North Whitehead and Bertrand Russell. Upon its conclusion, Schlick organized (at the request of his students, Herbert Feigl and Friedrich Waismann) organized an extra-curricular discussion group, which came to be called the ‘Schlick Circle’ and (eventually) the ‘Vienna Circle’. Their first reading was Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, written by Russell’s student, Ludwig Wittgenstein (Wittgenstein 1961; Stadler 2001, Ch. 5). Soon, Schlick was writing Wittgenstein, seeking additional copies of his work, telling him about the study group in Vienna, and requesting personal meetings. After several failed attempts, Schlick finally arranged with Wittgenstein’s sister, Margarete Wittgenstein Stonborough, to visit him in early 1927 (McGuinness 1967, 14). The first clear evidence that Schlick had (at last!) obtained a copy of the Tractatus was in a letter to Einstein in June of 1927. (Schlick 1927a) The following month, Schlick effusively described the Tractatus as “the deepest” work of the new philosophy (Schlick 1927b). Over the next few years, Schlick and Wittgenstein met as time permitted, carrying on philosophical discussions ranging over a broad array of topics, from the idea of geometry as syntax, to verificationist and operationalist theories of meaning, topics in logic and mathematics, and even solipsism.

Of course, the discussions of verifiability in the late 1920s led to widespread disputes in later positivist thought. But even in the early years, Schlick and his students to wondered how ethical statements might be verifiable. In Problems of Ethics, Schlick attempted to interpret ethical statements as empirical claims about the means for maximizing happiness. Relying on relative judgments of values, Schlick argued that an empirical foundation of an ethical system based on maximum happiness. On Schlick’s account, happiness is not to be construed superficially but as the elated sense of fulfillment that accompanies actions carried out for their own sake. Hence, there are no apriori moral statements fixing absolute moral values.

Wittgenstein dictated some of his thoughts to Schlick, including a strident verificationist series of remarks, and shared several manuscripts with Schlick as well, including (perhaps) his so-called ‘Big Typescript’ of 1932–1933 (Iven 2009, Wittgenstein 2005). Several other documents survive the period, particularly notes taken by Schlick’s student, Friedrich Waismann, when he accompanied Schlick on his visits to Wittgenstein (McGuinness 1967). In addition, there were joint travels undertaken by Wittgenstein and Schlick during the period of their interaction (Iven 2009; Stadler 2001, Ch. 6). The principal effect of this influence on Schlick was the assimilation, into his already well-defined philosophical views, of insights stimulated by these conversations.

During the same period, Rudolf Carnap joined the faculty of the University of Vienna as well as the Schlick Zirkel. He brought a manuscript with him, which he called “Konstitutionstheorie”, and which was eventually published, with Schlick’s help, as The Logical Structure of the World (Carnap 1928). Schlick even assisted Carnap in locating a publisher for the work. It was at this time that Schlick penned the essay “Experience, Cognition, and Metaphysics” of 1926, which represents a particularly important juncture in his thinking. Schlick attempted to link current influences on his thought – Wittgenstein’s Tractatus and Carnap’s Aufbau – with his earlier ideas, especially the distinction between intuitions and concepts (Schlick 2008, pp. 33–56; Wittgenstein 1961; Carnap 1928; Schlick 2009, Sec. 7).

Within a few years, Schlick wrote the essays which are characteristic of his early Positivist thought. The first one, “The Turning Point in Philosophy,” appeared in 1930. It contains an early version of the thesis that the function of philosophy is the analysis of meaning (Schlick 1979b, 154–160). A more decisive article was the 1932 essay, “Positivism and Realism”, a classic piece which shaped some of the most characteristic philosophical work to emerge from the Positivist tradition (Schlick 1979b, 259–284). Schlick interprets the verifiability principle strictly, by spelling out verification in terms of sensible experience, but at the same time broadly, construed to admit any logically conceivable circumstances of verification (like the future verification of mountains on the far side of the moon). The basis of this principle, Schlick argues, is to be found in scientific practice. He cites Einstein’s analysis of “simultaneity” in Special Relativity as his primary example, an illustration which would become a staple of Positivist lore. Schlick also mentioned Planck, who acknowledged that experience was the source of scientific knowledge. Schlick called the philosophical view founded on this principle, “Logical Positivism”, using the designation introduced by A. E. Blumberg and Herbert Feigl (Blumberg and Feigl, 1931). As Schlick explained it, Logical Positivism is essentially a realist epistemology, like the one developed in Schlick’s General Theory of Knowledge, which shares little with the classical positivism of Auguste Comte, Ernst Mach, and Hans Vaihinger. Schlick’s principal conclusion was that Logical Positivism never denies the reality of material objects but, rather, equates physical reality with the lawfulness of experience. Unfortunately, Planck, who had always supported Schlick in the past, misunderstood the essay, interpreting it as a polemic for Machian positivism, and harshly condemning it (Planck 1932).

8. The Protocol Sentence Controversy

The celebrated ‘protocol sentence controversy’ in the Vienna Circle was initiated by Carnap’s syntactic analysis of observation sentences, or ‘protocols’ (Carnap 1932a). The salient feature of Carnap’s analysis was its ‘syntacticism’, the idea that meaning is wholly a function of the serial arrangements of symbols. Naturally, syntacticism precludes any effort to explain protocols by their relation to ‘experiences’, ‘sensory impressions’, or ‘observations’. Otto Neurath criticized Carnap’s analysis, arguing that protocols should be understood physicalistically, as sentences of the physical language, and their origins and grounds are to be explicated naturalistically, by means of behaviorist psychology (Uebel 2007, Ch. 8). But Schlick recoiled at the very idea that the relation between observation sentences and what they describe should be explicated by any means other than philosophical analysis. So, in his classic 1934 essay, “On the Foundations of Knowledge,” he introduced so-called ‘affirmations’ (Konstatierungen) in the effort to explicate the relation between physicalistic protocols and the experiences on which they are grounded (Schlick 1979b, 370–387). Otto Neurath responded, in his 1934 essay “Radical Physicalism and the ‘Real World’”, condemning Schlick’s view as just so much metaphysics, while Carnap regarded affirmations as protocols of a phenomenal language, along the lines of one of the alternatives he had outlined in his 1932 paper, “On Protocol Sentences” (Neurath 1983, 66; Carnap 1932b, 458–463). Still, Carnap objected that, unless Schlick could explain how affirmations might be translated into sentences of the physical language, then affirmations violated the thesis of physicalism. Schlick responded that affirmations, like “Here now white”, were the responses of investigators when asked about their personal experiences in experimental situations. Thus construed, the demonstrative character of affirmations ensures their incorrigibility (Schlick 2009, 661–674). Although their demonstrative character prevents them from being regarded as proper physicalistic sentences, they are obviously translatable into statements of the physical language. But then, even though they lose their distinctive epistemic character, for they are no longer incorrigible or indubitable, they still convey epistemic warrant to their physicalistic translations.

To Carnap, the deeper problem was that, by the lights of his 1934 work on The Logical Syntax of Language, affirmations are not well-formed expressions at all. Earlier, in his (1932a) contribution to the protocol sentence controversy, Carnap’s treatment of observation was based on the Thesis of Metalogic, the idea that all philosophical contentions (which are not nonsense) are metalinguistic claims about linguistic expressions and their logical (particularly syntactical) properties (Carnap 1932a, 435n). The function of the Metalogic Thesis was to isolate pseudo-theses or statements which seem to concern substantive matters but are really concerned with logical or linguistic matters. Of course, these pseudo-theses became known as ‘pseudo-object sentences’ and their analysis became a centerpiece of Carnap’s Logical Syntax-era philosophy (Carnap 1937, Sec. 74). And the Metalogic Thesis, together with the Principle of Tolerance (which asserts that the choice of any specific language is a conventional decision), formed the principal theses of Carnap’s philosophy of logic in the Thirties (Carnap 1937, 51–2). Otto Neurath, who endorsed the Metalogic Thesis and the Tolerance Principle, drew the obvious conclusion that Schlick’s defense of the correspondence conception of truth, explicated by his analysis of affirmations, committed him to the recognition of “the one, true reality” and “the real world” (Neurath 1983, pp. 106–8; Uebel 2007, Sec. 8.2). In short, Schlick’s foundations were spelled out in nothing more than philosophical pseudo-statements.

What Neurath and (presumably) Carnap both missed was that Schlick’s thinking about meaning and linguistic significance had come a long way since his 1926 essay on “Experience, Cognition, and Metaphysics”, in which he tried to link Wittgenstein’s remarks about internal relations in the Tractatus with his own doctrine of implicit definition (Wittgenstein 1921, 4.122, 4.125, 4.1251, 5.232). There the goal was to apply both these ideas to the distinction between intuitions and concepts. The result was something of a disaster. For it implied what Schlick called “The Incommunicability of Contents”, the idea that any effort to communicate non-formal contents, like the greenness of the color green or the distinctive smell of wood smoke, must forever remain ineffable (Oberdan 1996, Sec. 2). But it was not long before Schlick’s efforts to explain linguistic meaning and scientific knowledge in terms of their ‘form’ and ‘content’ were abandoned and by the 1934–1935 academic year, he was developing what might well be called ‘a semantic conception’, spelled out in terms of grammars and the rules which constitute them, and presenting his new vision of language in his lectures on “Logik und Erkenntnistheorie” (Schlick 1934–5).

9. Grammar and Meaning

In “Logik und Erkenntnistheorie,” Schlick thought the most important component of languages are grammatical rules, which are of two kinds. First of all, there are ‘internal rules’, which govern the use of expressions in relation to other expressions, much like the formation and transformation rules of formal logic. In addition, Schlick conceived of a second type of grammatical rule, which he called ‘application-rules’ (Anwendungsregeln), regulating the use of expressions in connection with, or application to, observable extra-linguistic situations. Of course, application-rules govern not only descriptions of observable situations, but the use of indexicals and demonstratives as well, thus legitimizing Schlick’s affirmations by grounding them in grammar. And Schlick conceived grammar with sufficient breadth to encompass the natural languages of everyday life as well as the technical and highly regimented languages of science. Concurring with Carnap’s Principle of Tolerance, Schlick regarded the choice of grammatical rules, the choice of a particular grammar rather than an alternative, as conventional and therefore independent of extra-linguistic matters. And his endorsement of grammatical conventionalism was specifically intended to accommodate choices between languages which differed radically, as demonstrated in his treatment of philosophical pseudo-problems (Oberdan 1996, Sec. 3).

Schlick presented his latest conception of grammar as well as its application to philosophical pseudo-problems in his 1936 essay on “Meaning and Verification” (Schlick 1979b, 456–481). In particular, he demonstrated that the criterion of verifiability is rooted in grammar and concerns any grammatically well-formed proposition which is neither analytic nor contradictory. He reiterated his conception of grammar as the collection of rules governing the formation and use of meaningful expressions, including the rules governing the use of language in connection with experience, rules which are introduced by acts of ostension (Schlick 1979b, 464–7). Although the result is an analysis of language which provides a powerful treatment of many ‘typical’ metaphysical theses, like Platonism, psychologism, and phenomenalism, in “Meaning and Verification” Schlick demonstrated its utility by applying it to solipsism. The upshot is that solipsism is a contingent truth which is treated by its defenders as unfalsifiable. But statements which are insulated from the possibility of falsification are object-language ‘mis-expressions’ of what are, at bottom, grammatical rules. The parallel with Carnap’s analysis of pseudo-object sentences as metalinguistic assertions rather than ‘real-object’ sentences could not be more striking. And just as Carnap regarded the formal mode translations of philosophical theses as proposals to adopt a certain language form, Schlick contended that the solipsist’s thesis was not a bona fide contingent claim but simply an attempt to introduce a particular mode of speech. Thus, by the time of “Meaning and Verification”, he had moved well beyond his ‘Form and Content’ stage, modulating the virulent Positivism of his earlier thinking, to arrive at a more mature and balanced conception of the issues at the focus of his philosophical concerns (Oberdan 1996, Sec. 5).

10. Death

As Schlick was leaving class on June 22, 1936, he was shot four times in the legs and abdomen by Johann Nelböck, a former philosophy student who had been threatening Schlick for several years. In fact, Nelböck had been confined in an asylum for observation and diagnosed as a paranoid schizophrenic. Eventually, other factors –both social and political- emerged which may also have influenced Nelböck. The number of possible motivations make it nearly impossible to fully understand what was in Nelböck’s mind at the time of his murderous actions. But the result of his misdeed is clear: with the death of Moritz Schlick, philosophy lost one of its most creative thinkers. See Stadler 2001 (Part 2, Sec. 3–3.2) for a comprehensive account of Schlick’s death.


Primary Literature

Note: The publication of the entire corpus of Schlick’s writings is appearing under the title Moritz Schlick Gesamtausgabe (Vienna: Springer), under the general editorship of Friedrich Stadler (Vienna) and Hans Jürgen Wendel (Rostock). The volumes which have appeared (Schlick 2006a, 2006b, 2008, 2009, and 2012) have already established new editorial standards for the eventual publication of the works of all the major figures of early Logical Positivism. At the same time, through the dedication of a small group of editors under the leadership of Stadler and Wendel, the Schlick collection is far more advanced than the collections of other early Positivists, which are also currently under way.

  • 1920a, Letter to Hans Reichenbach, September 25, 1920, Archives for Scientific Philosophy, No. 015–63–23. All rights reserved.
  • 1920b, Letter to Hans Reichenbach, November 26, 1920, Archives for Scientific Philosophy, No. 015–63–22. All rights reserved.
  • 1927a, Letter to Albert Einstein, June 5, 1927. Einstein Collection, Hebrew University (EC 21–596).
  • 1927b, Letter to Albert Einstein, July 14, 1927. Einstein Collection, Hebrew University (EC 21–599).
  • 1934–5, Logik und Erkenntnistheorie. Vorlesungen 1934–1935, The Vienna Circle Foundation, Haarlem: Rijksarchief voor Noord-Holland.
  • 1979a, Philosophical Papers (Volume I), H. L. Mulder and B. F. van de Velde-Schlick (eds.), Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
  • 1979b, Philosophical Papers (Volume II). H. L. Mulder and B. F. van de Velde-Schlick (eds.), Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
  • 2006a, Über die Reflexion des Lichtes in einer inhomogenen Schicht u. Raum und Zeit in den gegenwärtigen Physik, F.O. Engler, and M. Neuber (eds.), Abteilung I: Band 2, Vienna: Springer.
  • 2006b, Lebensweisheit: Versuch einer Glückseligkeitslehre u. Fragen der Ethik, M. Iven (ed.), Abteilung I: Band 3, Vienna: Springer.
  • 2008, Die Wiener Zeit: Aufsatze, Beitrage, Rezensionen 1926–1936, Johannes Friedl und Heiner Rutte (eds.), Vienna: Springer.
  • 2009, Allgemeine Erkenntnislehre, H.J. Wendel and F.O. Engler (eds.), Vienna: Springer.
  • 2012, Rostock, Kiel, Wien. Aufsätze, Beiträge, Rezensionen 1919–1925, E. Glassner, H. König-Porstner, K. Böger (eds.), Abteilung I: Band 5, Vienna: Springer.

Secondary Literature

  • Bergson, Henri, 1955, An Introduction to Metaphysics, second edition, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.
  • Blumberg, A. E. and Feigl, H., 1931, “Logical Positivism: A New Movement in European Philosophy,” Journal of Philosophy, 28: 281–296.
  • Carnap, Rudolf, 1928, Der logische Aufbau der Welt, Berlin: Bernary; R.A. George (trans.), The Logical Structure of the World, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1967.
  • –––, 1932a, “Die Physikalische Sprache als Universalsprache der Wissenschaft,” Erkenntnis, 2: 432–465; M. Black (trans.), The Unity of Science, London: Kegan Paul, 1934.
  • –––, 1932b, “Über Protokollsätze,” Erkenntnis, 3: 215–228; R. Creath and R. Nollan (trans.), “On Protocol Sentences,” Noûs, 1: 457–470.
  • –––, 1937, The Logical Syntax of Language, second edition, A. Smeaton (trans.), London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Cassirer, Ernst, 1910, Substanzbegriff und Funktionsbegriff: Untersuchungen über die Grundfragen der Erkenntniskritik, Berlin: Bruno Cassirer; W. & M. Swabey (trans.), Substance and Function, Chicago: Open Court, 1923.
  • –––, 1921, Zur Einsteinschen Relativitätstheorie. Erkenntnistheoretische Betrachtungen, Berlin: Bruno Cassirer; translated, Einstein’s Theory of Relativity, Chicago: Open Court, 1923.
  • Coffa, Alberto J., 1991, The Semantic Tradition from Kant to Carnap, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cohen, Hermann, 1885, Kants Theorie der Erfahrung, Berlin: Harwitz.
  • Einstein, Albert, 1916, “Die Grundlage der allgemeinen Relativitätstheorie,” Annalen der Physik, 49(7): 769–822; translated as “The Foundation of the General Theory of Relativity,” in The Principle of Relativity, Aventura, FL: BN Publishing, 2008, pp. 111–164.
  • –––, 1920, Letter to Moritz Schlick, April 19, 1920, Einstein Collection, Hebrew University, EC 21633.
  • Engler, Fynn Ole, 2009, “Über das erkenntnistheoretische Raumproblem,” in Stadler et al. 2009, 107–145.
  • Ferrari, Massimo, 2009, “1922: Moritz Schlick in Wien,” in Stadler et al. 2009, pp. 17–62.
  • Friedman, Michael, 1997, “Helmholtz’ Zeichentheorie and Schlick’s Allgemeine Erkenntnislehre: Early Logical Empiricism and its Nineteenth-Century Background,” Philosophical Topics, 25: 19–50.
  • –––, 1999, Reconsidering Logical Positivism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2010, “Synthetic History Re-Considered,” in M. Domski and M. Dickson (eds.), Discourse on a New Method, Chicago: Open Court, pp. 571–813.
  • Helmholtz, Hermann, 1924–5, Treatise on Physiological Optics (3 volumes), Milwaukee: Optical Society of America.
  • –––, 1977, Epistemological Writings, R.S. Cohen and Y. Elkana (eds.), Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
  • Husserl, Edmund, 1965, “Philosophy as Rigorous Science,” Q. Lauer (trans.), in Phenomenology and the Crisis of Philosophy, New York: Harper Torchbooks, pp. 71–147.
  • Iven, Matthias, 2009, “Wittgenstein und Schlick,” in Stadler et al. 2009, pp.63–80.
  • Kahl, Russell (ed.), 1971 Selected Writings of Hermann von Helmholtz, Middletown: Wesleyan University Press.
  • Kant, Immanuel, 1781, The Critique of Pure Reason, P. Guyer and A. Wood (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • McGuinness, B. F. (ed.), 1967, Wittgenstein und der Wiener Kreis, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Neurath, Otto, 1973, Empiricism and Sociology, Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
  • –––, 1983, “Radical Physicalism and ‘the Real World’,” in Philosophical Papers (Volume 1), R.S. Cohen and M. Neurath (trans. and eds.), Dordrecht: D. Reidel, pp. 100–114.
  • Oberdan, Thomas, 1994, “Einstein’s Disenchantment,” in W. Salmon and G. Wolters (eds.), Logic, Language, and the Structure of Scientific Theories, Pittsburgh/Konstanz: University of Pittsburgh Press/Universitätsverlag Konstanz, pp. 107–118.
  • –––, 1996, “Postscript to Protocols: Reflections on Empiricism,” in A. Anderson and R. Giere (eds.), Origins of Logical Empiricism (Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science: Vol. XVI), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 269–291.
  • –––, 2009, “Geometry, Convention, and the Relativized A priori: The Schlick-Reichenbach Correspondence,” in Stadler, et al. 2009, pp.186–211.
  • Parrini, P., with W. Salmon and M. Salmon (eds.), 2003, Logical Empiricism: Historical and Contemporary Perspectives, Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press.
  • Planck, Max, 1932, Letter to Moritz Schlick, November 15, 1932. The Vienna Circle Foundation, Haarlem: Rijksarchief voor Noord-Holland.
  • –––, 1933, Where is Science Going?, J. Murphy (trans.), London: George Allen and Unwin.
  • –––, 1949, Scientific Autobiography, F. Gaynor (trans.), New York: Philosophical Library.
  • –––, 1960, A Survey of Physical Theory, New York: Dover Publications.
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Thomas Oberdan

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