# Early Philosophical Interpretations of General Relativity

*First published Wed Nov 28, 2001; substantive revision Thu Apr 4, 2024*

Early philosophical interpretations of the general theory of relativity selected distinct aspects of that theory for praise or favored recognition. Positivist followers of Mach initially lauded Einstein’s attempt to implement a “relativization of inertia”—roughly, that the inertia of a body (inertial mass, local inertial behavior) is an effect due to presence of all other masses—in the general theory. But Machians were daunted by the theory’s unprecedented distance between mathematical construct and experimental test, ultimately proving more comfortable with Einstein’s operationalist treatment of the concept of distant simultaneity in the special theory. Kantians and neo-Kantians, if freed from strict fealty to the doctrines of the Transcendental Aesthetic and Transcendental Analytic, turned instead to the Transcendental Dialectic. They pointed (as did Einstein himself in later years) to the surpassing importance of certain “intellectual forms” in the general theory, above all, the principle of general covariance. Accordingly, this principle was viewed not as a mere formal principle of coordinate generality but as a “regulative idea”, a constraint on any fundamental physical theory (roughly intending that space and time are relational orderings of events in terms of co-existence and succession, and that the laws of physics must not depend on any particular coordinate system labeling spacetime events).

To an emerging logical empiricism, the philosophical significance of relativity theory was above all methodological, to the effect that conventions must first be stipulated in order to express the empirical content of a physical theory. In a more far reaching development, already by its completion in November 1915, an attempt was made by David Hilbert to incorporate Maxwellian electrodyamics (the only other known physical interaction at the time) into general relativity’s geometrization of gravitational attraction. Other attempts soon ensued of which that of Weyl, and shortly thereafter of Eddington, are distinguished from others, in particular from Einstein’s many subsequent proposals made over the next three decades. Weyl and Eddington sought to unify gravitation and electromagnetism within the confines of broader spacetime geometries than Einstein’s, situating geometric unifications of gravitation and electromagnetism within philosophical frameworks of transcendental idealism drawing, in Weyl’s case, from Husserlian transcendental phenomenology and in Eddington’s, from a quasi-Kantian structuralist viewpoint he would later term “selective subjectivism”.

- 1. The Search for Philosophical Novelty
- 2. Machian Positivism
- 3. Kantian and Neo-Kantian Interpretations
- 4. Logical Empiricism
- 5. “Geometrization of Physics”: Platonism, Transcendental Idealism, Structuralism
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. The Search for Philosophical Novelty

Extraordinary public clamor greeted an announcement of a joint meeting
of the Royal Society of London and the Royal Astronomical Society on
the sixth of November 1919. Astronomical observations made by a
British team five months earlier (during the solar eclipse on May 29)
comprised the first empirical test of Einstein’s general theory
of relativity. Lengthy data analysis over the summer of observations
made under non-ideal conditions had shown that within acceptable
margin of error, light from distant stars passing near the solar
surface had been displaced by the tiny amount (1.75 arcseconds,
corresponding to the angle of a right triangle of height 1 inch and
base nearly 2 miles in length) predicted by Einstein’s
gravitational theory of curved spacetime. By dint of having
“overthrown” such a permanent fixture of the intellectual
landscape as Newtonian gravitational theory, the general theory of
relativity immediately became a principal focus of philosophical
interest and inquiry. Although many traditionally-minded physicists
and philosophers would oppose it, the former mostly on non-physical
grounds such as its abstract mathematical method, the latter because
it overturned the familiar metaphysics of Newtonian space, surveyed
here are the interpretations of those who recognized the theory as a
revolutionary advance not only in physical knowledge but also, quite
possibly, in philosophy. Among them are assessments of the theory
understandingly based on the semi-popular writings of Einstein and
others by those lacking expertise in the theory’s technical
aspects. Further lack of clarity stemmed even from the scientific
*literati* who provided differing, and at times, conflicting
mathematical or physical accounts of the theory’s fundamental
principles. These are (see below): the principles of equivalence and
of what Einstein misleadingly termed “general relativity”
(i.e., general covariance), and a third principle baptized as
*Mach’s Principle*, that there can be no inertia with
respect to “Space” but only of masses to one another. In
one or another form, these controversies in significant respects have
continued into the present literature of physics and philosophy of
physics (see, e.g., Stachel 1980; Friedman 1983; Norton 1993; Barbour
& Pfister 1995; Ohanian 2008; Janssen 2014; Ryckman 2017). This is
not unusual: physical theories, if sufficiently robust, are rarely, if
ever, without ambiguous or problematic aspects, and are often taken to
say different things at different stages of development. But the very
fluidity of physical and mathematical meaning lent interpretative
latitude to inherently antagonistic philosophical viewpoints seeking
vindication, confirmation or illumination by the revolutionary new
theory. At the conclusion of the theory’s first decade, perhaps
semi-facetiously Bertrand Russell observed that

There has been a tendency, not uncommon in the case of a new scientific theory, for every philosopher to interpret the work of Einstein in accordance with his own metaphysical system, and to suggest that the outcome is a great accession of strength to the views which the philosopher in question previously held. This cannot be true in all cases; and it may be hoped that it is true in none. It would be disappointing if so fundamental a change as Einstein has introduced involved no philosophical novelty. (1926: 331)

General relativity proved a considerable stimulus to philosophical
novelty. But the question whether it particularly supported any one
line of philosophical interpretation over another must take into
account the fact that schools of interpretation in turn evolved to
accommodate what were regarded as general relativity’s
philosophically salient features. A classic instance is the assertion,
to become a cornerstone of logical empiricism, that relativity theory
had shown the untenability of any “philosophy of the synthetic
*a priori*”, despite the fact that early works on
relativity theory by both Hans Reichenbach and Rudolf Carnap were
written from within a broadly Kantian perspective. It will be seen
that, while proving ideologically useful, the claim by no means
follows from relativity theory although, as physicist Max von Laue
observed in his early text on general relativity (1921: 42),
“not every sentence of *The Critique of Pure
Reason*” might still be held intact. What does follow from
scrutiny of the various philosophical appropriations of general
relativity is a consummate illustration that, due to the evolution and
mutual interplay of physical, mathematical and philosophical
understandings of a revolutionary physical theory, philosophical
interpretations often are works in progress, extending over many
years.

## 2. Machian Positivism

### 2.1 In the Early Einstein

Most of Einstein’s early papers (1902–1911) prior to his
nearly exclusive concentration on a relativitistic theory of
gravitation (1909–1915) are devoted not to the theory of
relativity but with problems posed to classical physics by
Planck’s discovery of his eponymous energy constant in 1900.
These early works reveal Einstein to be a strong supporter of Ludwig
Boltzmann rather than Ernst Mach in the debate over atomism at the
turn of the century (Ryckman 2017: chapter 3). Yet in 1912,
Einstein’s name together with those of Göttingen
mathematicians David Hilbert and Felix Klein, was prominently
displayed (in the *Naturwissenschaftliche Rundschau* 27: 336)
among those joining Mach’s in a call for the formation of a
“Society for Positivist Philosophy”. Citing the pressing
need of science “but also of our age in general” for a
“comprehensive world view based on the material facts
accumulated in the individual sciences”, the appeal appears
above all to have been an orchestrated attempt to buttress
Mach’s positivist conception of science in the face of recent
criticisms by Max Planck, then Germany’s leading theoretical
physicist. More a declaration of allegiance than an act of scholarly
neutrality, it provides evidence of Einstein’s youthful
enthusiasm for at least certain of Mach’s writings. Late in life
(1949a: 21), Einstein wrote of the “profound influence”
that Mach’s *Science of Mechanics* (1883) exercised upon
him as a student as well as of the very great influence in his younger
years of “Mach’s epistemological position”. Already
in the special theory of relativity (1905), Einstein’s
operational definition of the “simultaneity” of distantly
separated events, whereby distant clocks are synchronized by sending
and receiving light signals, is closely modeled on the operational
definition of mass in Mach’s *Mechanics*. Moreover,
occasional epistemological and methodological pronouncements seem to
indicate agreement with core parts of positivist doctrines of
meaningfulness, e.g., “The concept does not exist for the
physicist until he has the possibility of discovering whether or not
it is fulfilled in an actual case” (1917a [1955: 22]). Thus the
general theory of relativity might be seen as fully compliant with
Mach’s characterization of theoretical concepts as merely
economical shorthand for concrete observations or operations.

### 2.2 A “Relativization of Inertia”?

Machian influences specific to the general theory of relativity
appeared even more extensive. Mach’s *idée fixe*,
that a body’s inertial mass and behavior result from the
influence of all other surrounding masses (thus eliminating the
“monstrous” Newtonian concept of absolute space), was
perhaps the strongest motivation guiding Einstein’s pursuit of a
relativistic theory of gravity. In papers leading up to the definitive
presentation of the general theory of relativity in 1916, Einstein
made no secret of the fact that Mach was the inspiration for an
epistemologically mandated attempt to generalize the principle of
relativity. Holding, with Mach, that no observable facts could be
associated with the notions of *absolute acceleration* or
*absolute inertia* (i.e., resistance to acceleration), the
generalization required that the laws of nature be completely
independent of the state of motion of any chosen reference system. In
fact, in striving to completely relativize inertia, Einstein conflated
a valid principle of form invariance of the laws of nature (general
covariance, see below) with a spurious “principle of general
relativity”, according to which accelerated motions like
rotations would be relative to an observer’s state of motion. In
a warm obituary of Mach written within a few days of completing the
definitive 1916 presentation of his theory, Einstein, quoting
extensively from the famous passages in Mach’s
*Mechanics* critical of Newton’s “absolute”
concepts of space, time and motion, generously avowed that
Mach’s understanding of the principles of mechanics had brought
him very close to demanding a general theory of relativity a
half-century earlier (1916b: 102–3). No doubt with this
reference in mind, physicist Phillip Frank, later to be associated
with the Vienna Circle, observed that

it is universally known today that Einstein’s general theory of relativity grew immediately out of the positivistic doctrine of space and motion. (1917 [1949: 68])

But, as noted above, there are both genuine and specious aspects connected with Einstein’s “principle of general relativity”, a mixture complicated by Einstein’s own puzzling remarks regarding the principle of general covariance.

### 2.3 Positivism and the “Hole Argument”

A passage from §3 of Einstein’s first complete exposition
of the general theory of relativity (1916a) appeared to provide
further grist for the mill of Machian positivism. There Einstein
grandiloquently declared the requirement of general covariance for the
gravitational field equations (i.e., that they remain unchanged in
form under arbitrary, but invertible and suitably continuous
transformation of the spacetime coordinates), “takes away from
space and time the last remnant of physical objectness”
(translating, with Darrigol (2022, p.354) Einstein’s term
*Gegenständlichkeit*). An accompanying heuristic reflection on
the reasoning behind this claim seemed nothing less than an
endorsement of Mach’s phenomenalism. “All our space-time
verifications”, Einstein wrote, “invariably amount to a
determination of space-time coincidences…”. This is
because, Einstein presumed, all results of physical measurement
ultimately amount to verifications of such coincidences, such as the
observation of the coincidence of the second hand of a clock with a
mark on its dial, or the intersection of the worldlines of two bodies.
Observing that such (topological) relations alone are preserved under
arbitrary coordinate transformation, Einstein concluded that
“all our physical experience can ultimately be reduced to such
coincidences”. To Mach’s followers, Einstein’s
illustrative reflection was nothing less than an explicit avowal of
the centerpiece of Mach’s phenomenalist epistemology, that
sensations (*Empfindungen*), directly experienced sensory
perceptions, alone are real and knowable. Thus Josef Petzoldt, a
Machian philosopher and editor of the 8^{th} edition of
Mach’s *Mechanics* , the first to appear after the
general theory of relativity, noted that Einstein’s remarks
meant that the theory “rests, in the end, on the perception of
the coincidence of sensations” and so “is fully in accord
with Mach’s world-view, which is best characterized as
relativistic positivism” (1921: 516).

However, contemporary scholarship has shown that Einstein’s remarks here were but elliptical references to an argument (the so-called “Hole Argument”) that has only fully been reconstructed from his private correspondence. Its conclusion is that, if a theory is generally covariant, the bare points of the spacetime manifold can have no inherent primitive identity (inherited say, from the manifold’s underlying topology), and so no reality independent of, in particular, the value of the metrical field associated with each point by a particular solution of the Einstein field equations (Stachel 1980; Norton 1984, 1993). Thus for a generally covariant theory, no physical reality accrues to “empty space” in the absence of any physical fields. In Einstein’s rhetorical embellishment, general covariance “takes away from space and time the last remnant of physical objectivity”; what he should have said is that spacetime has no intrinsic metrical structure given independently of the distribution of matter [see entry on the hole argument]. Hence this passage is not really an endorsement of positivist phenomenalism.

### 2.4 “Mach’s Principle”

For a number of years Einstein expressed the ambition of the general
theory of relativity to fully implement Mach’s program for the
relativization of all inertial effects, even appending the so-called
*cosmological constant* in an attempt to obtain a fully Machian
global solution to his field equations (1917b) for this purpose. This
genuine point of contact of Mach’s influence was clearly
identified only in 1918, when Einstein distinguished what he baptized
as *Mach’s Principle*—(too) strongly stated as the
requirement that the metric field (responsible for
gravitational-inertial properties of bodies) on the left hand side of
his field equation, is *completely determined* by the
energy-momentum tensor on the right hand side—from the principle
of general relativity which he misleadingly interpreted as the
principle of general covariance. Taken together with the principle of
the equivalence, Einstein asserted that the three principles, were
three pillars on which his theory rested, even if they could not be
thought completely independent of one another. Despite
Einstein’s intent, there is considerable disagreement about the
extent to which, if at all, the general theory of relativity could
conform to anything like Mach’s Principle. The Dutch astronomer
Willem De Sitter had immediately shown in 1917 that the Einstein field
equations, even as augmented with the new cosmological constant,
permitted matter-free solutions. Machians still have some room for
maneuver due to vagaries regarding just what such a principle actually
requires. On the other hand, it remains difficult to comprehend just
what physical process or mechanism might implement the principle,
however interpreted. How, for instance, might a given body’s
inertial mass be accounted due to the influence of all other masses in
the universe? (See the discussions in Barbour & Pfister 1995.)

### 2.5 Emerging Anti-Positivism

As Einstein’s principal research activity turned, after 1919, to
the pursuit of a geometrical theory unifying gravitation and
electromagnetism, his philosophical pronouncements increasingly took
on a more realist or at least anti-positivist coloration. Lecturing at
the Sorbonne in April 1922 (1922: 28), Einstein pronounced Mach
“*un bon mécanicien*” (probably a reference
to Mach’s views of the relativity of inertia) but “*un
déplorable philosophe*”. Increasingly,
Einstein’s retrospective portrayals of the genesis of general
relativity centered almost entirely on the success of a strategy
emphasizing mathematical aesthetics (see Norton 2000, Ryckman 2014,
and
§5).
Positivists and operationalists alike continued to point to the
Einstein analysis of simultaneity as relativity theory’s
fundamental methodological feature. One, ruefully noting the
difficulty of giving an operationalist analysis of the general theory,
even suggested that the requirement of general covariance
“conceals the possibility of disaster” (Bridgman 1949:
354). Finally there was, for Einstein, an understandable awkwardness
in learning of Mach’s surprising disavowal of any role as
forerunner to relativity theory in the *Preface*, dated 1913,
to Mach’s posthumous book (1921) on physical optics. Though
Einstein died without knowing differently, a recent investigation has
built a strong case that this statement was forged after Mach’s
death by his son Ludwig, under the influence of a rival guardian of
Mach’s legacy and opponent of relativity theory, the philosopher
Hugo Dingler (Wolters 1987).

## 3. Kantian and Neo-Kantian Interpretations

### 3.1 Neo-Kantians on Special Relativity

In the universities of Imperial and early Weimar Germany, the
philosophy of Kant, particularly the various neo-Kantian schools, held
pride of place. Of these, the Marburg School of Hermann Cohen and Paul
Natorp, including Cohen’s student Ernst Cassirer, exhibited a
special interest in the philosophy of the physical sciences and of
mathematics. Yet prior to the general theory of relativity
(1915–1916), Kantian philosophers accorded relativity theory
only cursory attention. This may be seen in two leading Marburg works
appearing in 1910, Cassirer’s *Substanzbegriff und
Funktionsbegriff* and Natorp’s *Die Logischen Grundlagen
der Exakten Wissenschaften*. Both books conform to the
characteristic Marburg modification that greatly extended the scope of
Kant’s Transcendental Logic, bringing under “pure
thought” or “intellectual forms” what Kant had
sharply separated in a distinction between the passive faculty of
sensibility and the active faculties of understanding and reason. Of
course, this revisionist tendency greatly transforms the meaning of
Kant’s Transcendental Aesthetic and with it Kant’s
conviction that space and time were forms of sensibility or pure
intuitions *a priori* and so as well, his accounts of
arithmetic and geometry. As will be seen, it enabled Cassirer, some
ten years later, to view even the general theory of relativity as a
striking confirmation of the fundamental tenets of transcendental
idealism. In 1910, however, Cassirer’s brief but diffuse
discussion of “the problem of relativity” mentions neither
the principle of relativity nor the light postulate nor the names of
Einstein, Lorentz or Minkowski. Rather it centers on the question of
whether space and time are aggregates of sense impressions or
“independent intellectual (*gedankliche*) forms”.
Having decided in favor of the latter, Cassirer goes on to argue how
and why these ideal mathematical presuppositions are necessarily
related to measurable, empirical notions of space, time, and motion
(1910: 228–9 [1923: 172–3]).

Natorp’s treatment, though scarcely six pages is more detailed
(1910: 399–404). In revisionist fashion, the “Minkowski
(*sic*) principle of relativity” was welcomed as a more
consistent (as avoiding Newtonian absolutism) carrying through of the
distinction between transcendentally ideal, purely mathematical,
*concepts* of space and time and the relative physical measures
of space and time. The relativization of time measurements, in
particular, showed that Kant, once shorn of the psychologistic error
of pure intuition, correctly maintained that time is not an object of
perception. Natorp further alleged that from this relativization it
followed that events are ordered, not in relation to an absolute time,
but only as lawfully determined phenomena in mutual temporal relation
to one another, a version of Leibnizian relationism. Similarly, the
light postulate had a two-fold significance within the Marburg
conception of natural science. On the one hand, the uniformity of the
velocity of light, deemed an *empirical* presupposition of all
space- and time-measurements, reminded that absolute determinations of
these measures, unattainable in empirical natural science, would
require a correspondingly absolute bound. Furthermore, as an upper
limiting velocity for physical processes, including gravitational
force, the light postulate eliminated the “mysterious
absolutism” of Newtonian action-at-a-distance. Natorp regarded
the requirement of invariance of laws of nature with respect to the
Lorentz transformations as “perhaps the most important result of
Minkowski’s investigation”. However, little more is said
about this, and there is some confusion regarding these
transformations and the Galilean ones they supersede; the former are
seen as a

broadening (

Erweiterung) of the old supposition of the invariance of Newtonian mechanics for a translatory orcircular(zirkuläre, emphasis added) motion of the world coordinates. (1910: 403)

He concluded with an observation that the appearance of non-Euclidean
and multi-dimensional geometries in physics and mathematics are to be
understood only as “valuable tools in the treatment of special
problems”. In themselves, they furnish no new insight into the
(transcendental) logical meaning and ground of the transcendental and
purely mathematically determined *concepts* of space and time;
still less do they require the abandonment of these concepts.

### 3.2 Immunizing Strategies

Following the experimental confirmation of the general theory in 1919,
few Kantians attempted to retain, unadulterated, all of the components
of Kant’s epistemological views. Several examples will suffice
to indicate characteristic “immunizing strategies”
(Hentschel 1990). The *Habilitationsschrift* of E. Sellien
(1919), read by Einstein in view of his criticism expressed in an
October 1919 letter to Moritz Schlick (Howard 1984: 625), declared
that Kant’s views on space and time pertained solely to
intuitive space; as such Kant’s views were impervious to the
measurable spaces and times of Einstein’s empirical theory. The
work of another young Kantian philosopher, Ilse Schneider, personally
known to Einstein, affirmed that Kant merely had held that the space
of three-dimensional Euclidean geometry is the space in which
Newton’s gravitational law is valid, thus no objections to Kant
could be marshalled from the four-dimensional variably curved
spacetimes of general relativity. Furthermore, Einstein’s
cosmology (1917b) of a finite but unbounded universe was regarded as
in complete accord with the “transcendental solution” to
the First Antinomy in the Second Book of the Transcendental Dialectic.
Her verdict was that apparent contradictions between relativity theory
and Kantian philosophy disappear on closer examination of both
doctrines (Schneider 1921: 71–75).

### 3.3 Rejecting or Refurbishing the Transcendental Aesthetic

In fact many Kantian philosophers did not attempt to immunize Kant from an apparent empirical refutation by the general theory. Rather, their concern was to establish how far-reaching the necessary modifications of Kant must be and whether, on implementation, anything distinctively Kantian remained. Certainly, most at risk appeared to be the claim, in the Transcendental Aesthetic, that all objects of outer intuition, and so all physical objects, conform to the space of Euclidean geometry. Since the general theory of relativity employed non-Euclidean (Riemannian) geometry for the characterization of physical phenomena, the conclusion seemed inevitable that any assertion of the necessarily Euclidean character of physical space in finite, if not infinitesimal, regions, is simply false.

Winternitz (1924), an example of this tendency, may be singled out on
the grounds that it was deemed significant enough to be the subject of
a rare book review by Einstein (1924). Winternitz argued that the
Transcendental Aesthetic is inextricably connected to the claim of the
necessarily Euclidean character of physical space and so stood in
direct conflict with Einstein’s theory. The Transcendental
Aesthetic accordingly must be totally jettisoned as a confusing and
unnecessary appendage of the more fundamental transcendental project
of establishing the *a priori* logical presuppositions of
physical knowledge. Indeed, these presuppositions have been confirmed
by the general theory: They are spatiality and temporality as
“unintuitive schema of order” in general (as distinct from
any particular chronometrical relations), the law of causality and
presupposition of continuity, the principle of sufficient reason, and
the conservation laws. Remarkably, the *necessity* of each of
these principles was, rightly or wrongly, was already challenged by
the developing quantum theory. (The ill-fated 1924 theory of Bohr,
Kramers, and Slater attempting to unify the classical electromagnetic
field with discontinuous quantum transitions in atoms is a period
challenge to the law of conservation of energy.) According to
Winternitz, the *ne plus ultra* of transcendental idealism lay
in the claim that the world “is not given but posed (*nicht
gegeben, sondern aufgegeben*) (as a problem)” out of the
given material of sensation. Significantly, Einstein, late in life,
returns to this formulation as comprising the fundamental Kantian
insight into the character of physical knowledge (1949b: 680; Ryckman
2017: chapter 10).

However, a number of neo-Kantian positions, of which that of Marburg
was only the best known, did not take the core doctrine of the
Transcendental Aesthetic *à la lettre*. Rather,
resources broadly within it were sought for preserving an updated
“critical idealism”. In this regard, Bollert (1921) merits
mention for its technically adroit presentation of both the special
and the general theory. Bollert argued that relativity theory had
clarified the Kantian position in the Transcendental Aesthetic by
demonstrating that not space and time, but spatiality (determinateness
in positional ordering) and temporality (in order of succession) are
*a priori* conditions of physical knowledge. In so doing,
general relativity theory with its variably curved spacetime, brought
a further advance in the steps or levels of
“objectivation” lying at the basis of physics. In this
process, corresponding with the growth of physical knowledge since
Galileo, each higher level is obtained from the previous through
elimination of subjective elements from the concept of physical
object. This ever-augmented revision of the conditions of objectivity
alone is central to critical idealism. For this reason, Bollert
claimed it is “an error” to believe that “a
contradiction exists between Kantian *a priorism* and
relativity theory” (1921: 64). As will be seen, these
conclusions are quite close to those of the much more widely known
monograph of Cassirer (1921). It is worth noting, however, that
Bollert’s interpretation of critical idealism was cited
favorably later by Gödel (1946/9-B2: 240, n.24) during the course
of research which led to his discovery of rotating universe solutions
to Einstein’s gravitational field equations (1949).
Gödel’s investigation had been prompted by curiosity
concerning the similar denials, in relativity theory and in Kant, of
an absolute time.

### 3.4 General Covariance: A Synthetic Principle of “Unity of Determination”

The most influential of all neo-Kantian interpretations of general
relativity was Ernst Cassirer’s *Zur Einsteinschen
Relativitätstheorie* (1921). Cassirer regarded the theory as
a crucial test for *Erkenntniskritik*, the preferred term for
the epistemology of the physical sciences of Marburg’s
transcendental idealism. The question, posed right at the beginning,
is whether the Transcendental Aesthetic offered a foundation
“broad enough and strong enough” to bear the general
theory of relativity. Recognizing the theory’s principal
epistemological significance to lie in the requirement of general
covariance (“that the general laws of nature are not changed in
form by arbitrary changes of the space-time variables”),
Cassirer directed his attention to Einstein’s remarks, cited in
§2.3
above, that general covariance “takes away from space and time
the last remnant of physical objectness ”. Cassirer correctly
construed the gist of this passage to mean that in the general theory
of relativity, space and time coordinates have no further importance
than to be mere labels of events (“coincidences”),
independent variables of the field functions characterizing physical
state magnitudes. Indeed, the requirement of general covariance had
significantly improved upon Kant by bringing out far more clearly the
exclusively methodological role of the transcendental conditions of
empirical cognition, a role Kant misleadingly assigned to pure
intuition. Not only does the requirement show that space and time are
not “things”, it has also clarified that the concepts of
space and time are but “ideal principles of order”
applying to the objects of the physical world as a necessary condition
of their possible experience. According to Cassirer, Kant’s
*intention* with regard to pure intuition was simply to express
the methodological presupposition that certain “intellectual
forms” (*Denkformen*), among which are the purely ideal
*concepts* of coexistence and succession, enter into all
physical knowledge. According to the development of physics since the
17^{th} century previously chronicled in *Substanzbegriff
und Funktionsbegriff*, these forms have progressively lost their
“fortuitous” (*zufälligen*) anthropomorphic
features while more and more taking on the character of
“systematic forms of unity”. From this vantage point,
general covariance is but the most recent manifestation of a
methodological tendency towards “unity of determination”
wherein constitution of objects of physical knowledge reveals a
growing but gradual transition from concepts of substance into
concepts of function. In accord with central tenets of the Marburg
Kant interpretation noted above, Cassirer maintained that the
requirement of generally covariant laws vindicates the transcendental
ideality of space and time, not, indeed, as “forms of
intuition” but as “objectifying conditions”further
“de-anthropomorphizing” the concept of object in physics.
As Cassirer will later argue, this de-anthropomorphizing tendency
ultimately renders the concept of object a “purely symbolic
form”. The fundamental concept of object in physics no longer
pertains to particular entities or processes propagating in space and
time but rather to “the invariance of relations among (physical
state) magnitudes” represented by generally covariant
mathematical objects (tensors). For this reason, Cassirer concluded,
the general theory of relativity exhibits “the most determinate
application and carrying through within empirical science of the
standpoint of critical idealism” (1921 [1957: 71; 1923:
412]).

## 4. Logical Empiricism

### 4.1 Lessons of Methodology?

Logical empiricism’s philosophy of science was conceived under
the guiding star of Einstein’s two theories of relativity, as
may be seen from the early writings of its founders, for purposes
here, Moritz Schlick, Rudolf Carnap, and Hans Reichenbach. A small
monograph of Schlick, *Space and Time in Contemporary Physics*,
appearing in 1917 initially in successive issues of the scientific
weekly *Die Naturwissenschaften*, served as prototype. One of
the first of a host of philosophical examinations of the general
theory of relativity, it was distinguished both by the lucidity of its
largely non-technical physical exposition and by Einstein’s
enthusiastic praise of its philosophical appraisal, favoring
conventionalism *à la* Poincaré over both
neo-Kantianism and Machian positivism. The transformation of the
concept of space within the general theory of relativity was the
subject of Rudolf Carnap’s dissertation at Jena in 1921.
Appearing as a monograph in 1922, it also evinced a broadly
conventionalist methodology combined with elements of Husserlian
transcendental phenomenology. Distinguishing clearly between
intuitive, physical and purely formal conceptions of space, Carnap
argued that, subject to the necessary constraints of certain *a
priori* phenomenological conditions of the topology of intuitive
space, the purely formal and the physical aspects of theories of
space, can be adjusted to one another so as to preserve any
conventionally chosen aspect. In turn, Hans Reichenbach was one of
five intrepid attendees of Einstein’s first seminar on general
relativity given at Berlin University in the tumultuous winter of
1918–1919; his detailed notebooks survive. The general theory of
relativity was the particular subject of Reichenbach’s
neo-Kantian first book (1920), which is dedicated to Albert Einstein,
as well as of his next two books (1924, 1928), and of numerous papers
in the 1920s.

But Einstein’s theories of relativity provided far more than the
subject matter for these philosophical examinations. Logical
empiricist philosophy of science *itself* was fashioned by
lessons allegedly drawn from relativity theory in correcting or
rebutting both neo-Kantian and Machian perspectives on general
methodological and epistemological questions of science. Several of
the most characteristic doctrines of logical empiricist philosophy of
science—the interpretation of *a priori* elements in
physical theories as conventions, the treatment of the necessary role
of conventions in linking theoretical concepts to observation, the
insistence on observational language definition of theoretical
terms—were taken to have been conclusively demonstrated by
Einstein in fashioning his two theories of relativity. As mentioned
above, Einstein’s 1905 analysis of the conventionality of
simultaneity in the special theory of relativity became a
methodological paradigm for logical empiricism; it prompted
Reichenbach’s own method of “logical analysis” of
physical theories into subjective (definitional, conventional) and
objective (empirical) components. An overriding concern in the logical
empiricist treatment of relativity theory was to draw broad lessons
for scientific methodology and philosophy of science generally,
although issues more specific to the philosophy of physics were also
addressed. Only the former are considered here; for a discussion of
the latter, see Ryckman 2007.

### 4.2 From the “Relativized A priori” to the “Relativity of Geometry”

A cornerstone of Reichenbach’s logical analysis of the theory of
general relativity is the thesis of “the relativity of
geometry”, that an arbitrary geometry may be ascribed to
spacetime (holding constant the underlying topology) if the laws of
physics are correspondingly modified through the introduction of
“universal forces”. This particular argument for metric
conventionalism has generated substantial controversy on its own, but
is better understood through an account of its genesis in
Reichenbach’s early neo-Kantianism. Independently of that
genesis, the thesis becomes the paradigmatic illustration of
Reichenbach’s broad methodological claim that conventional or
definitional elements—“coordinative definitions”
associating mathematical concepts of the physical theory with
“elements of physical reality”—are a necessary
condition for empirical cognition in the mathematical sciences of
nature. At the same time, Reichenbach’s thesis of metrical
conventionalism is part and parcel of an audacious program of
epistemological reductionism regarding spacetime structures. This was
first attempted in his “constructive axiomatization”
(1924) of the theory of relativity on the basis of “elementary
matters of fact” (*Elementartatbestande*) regarding the
observable behavior of lights rays, and rods and clocks. Here, and in
the more widely read treatment (1928), metrical properties of
spacetime are deemed less fundamental than topological ones, while the
latter are derived from the concept of time ordering. But time order
in turn is reduced to that of causal order and so the whole edifice of
structures of spacetime is considered epistemologically derivative,
resting upon ultimately basic empirical facts about causal order and a
prohibition against action-at-a-distance. The end point of
Reichenbach’s epistemological analysis of the foundations of
spacetime theory is then “the causal theory of time”, a
type of relational theory of time that assumes the validity of the
causal principle of action-by-contact
(*Nahewirkungsprinzip*).

However, Reichenbach’s first monograph on relativity (1920) was
written from within a neo-Kantian perspective. As Friedman (1994) and
others (Ryckman 2005) have discussed in detail Reichenbach’s
innovation, a modification of the Kantian conception of *synthetic
a priori* principles, rejecting the sense of “valid for all
time” while retaining that of “constitutive of the object
(of knowledge)”, led to the conception of a theory-specific
“relativized *a priori*”. According to Reichenbach,
any physical theory presupposes the validity of systems of certain,
quite general, principles which however may vary from theory to
theory. These *coordinating principles*, as they are then
termed, are indispensable for the ordering of perceptual data; they
define the objects of knowledge within the theory. The epistemological
significance of relativity theory, according to the early Reichenbach,
is to have shown, contrary to Kant, that these systems may contain
mutually inconsistent principles, and so require emendation to remove
contradictions. Thus a “relativization” of the Kantian
conception of *synthetic a priori* principles is the direct
epistemological result of the theory of relativity. But this finding
is also taken to signal a transformation in the method of
epistemological investigation of science. In place of Kant’s
“analysis of Reason”, “the method of analysis of
science” (*der wissenschaftsanalytische Methode*) is
proposed as “the only way that affords us an understanding of
the contribution of our reason to knowledge” (1920: 71 [1965:
74]). The method’s *raison d’être* is to
sharply distinguish between the subjective role of (coordinating)
principles—“the contribution of Reason”—and
the contribution of objective reality, represented by theory-specific
empirical laws and regularities (“axioms of connection”)
which in some sense have been “constituted” by the former.
Relativity theory itself is a shining exemplar of this method for it
has shown that the metric of spacetime describes an “objective
property” of the world, once the subjective freedom to make
coordinate transformations (the coordinating principle of general
covariance) is recognized (1920: 86–7 [1965: 90]). The thesis of
metric conventionalism had yet to appear.

But soon it did. Still in 1920, Schlick objected, both publicly and in
private correspondence with Reichenbach, that “principles of
coordination” were precisely statements of the kind that
Poincaré had termed “conventions” (see Coffa 1991:
201ff.). Moreover, Einstein, in a lecture of January 1921, entitled
“Geometry and Experience”, appeared to lend support to
this view. Einstein argued that the question concerning the nature of
spacetime geometry becomes an empirical question only on certain
*pro tem* stipulations regarding the “practically rigid
body” of measurement (*pro tem* in view of the
inadmissibility in relativity theory of the concept “actually
rigid body”). In any case, by 1922, the essential pieces of
Reichenbach’s mature conventionalist view had emerged. The
argument is canonically presented in §8 (entitled “The
Relativity of Geometry”) of *Der Philosophie der
Raum-Zeit-Lehre* (completed in 1926, published in 1928). In a move
superficially similar to the argument of Einstein’s
“Geometry and Experience”, Reichenbach maintained that
questions concerning the empirical determination of the metric of
spacetime must first confront the fact that only the whole theoretical
edifice comprising both geometry and physics admits of observational
test. Einstein’s gravitational theory is such a totality.
However, unlike Einstein, Reichenbach’s “method of
analysis of science”, later re-named “logical analysis of
science”, is directed to the epistemological problem of
factoring this totality into its conventional or definitional and its
empirical components.

This is done as follows. The empirical determination of the spacetime
metric by measurement requires choice of some “metrical
indicators”: this can only be done by laying down a
*coordinative definition* stipulating, e.g., that the metrical
notion of length is coordinated to some physical object or process. A
standard choice coordinates lengths with “infinitesimal
measuring rods” supposed rigid (e.g., Einstein’s
“practically rigid body”). This however is only a
convention, and other physical objects or processes might be chosen.
(In Schlick’s fanciful example, the Dali Lama’s heartbeat
could be chosen as the physical process to which units of time are
coordinated.) Of course, the chosen metrical indicators must be
corrected for certain distorting effects (temperature, magnetism,
etc.) due to the presence of physical forces. Such forces are termed
“differential forces” to indicate that they affect various
materials differently. However, Reichenbach argued, the choice of a
rigid rod as standard of length is tantamount to the claim that there
are no non-differential—“universal”—distorting
forces that affect all bodies in the same way and cannot be screened
off. In the absence of “universal forces” the coordinative
definition regarding rigid rods can be implemented and the nature of
the spacetime metric empirically determined, for example, finding that
paths of light rays through solar gravitational field are not
Euclidean straight lines. Thus, the theory of general relativity, on
adoption of the coordinative definition of rigid rods
(“universal forces = 0”), affirms that the geometry of
spacetime in a given region is of a non-euclidean kind. The point,
however, is that this conclusion rests on the convention governing
measuring rods. One could, alternately, maintain that the geometry of
spacetime was Euclidean by adopting a different coordinative
definition, for example, holding that measuring rods expanded or
contracted depending on their location in spacetime, a choice
tantamount to the supposition of “universal forces”. Then,
consistent with all empirical phenomena, it could be maintained that
Euclidean geometry was compatible with Einstein’s theory if only
one allowed the existence of such forces. Thus whether general
relativity affirms a Euclidean or a non-euclidean metric in the solar
gravitational field rests upon a conventional choice regarding the
existence of non-zero universal forces. Either hypothesis may be
adopted since they are empirically equivalent descriptions; their
joint possibility is referred to as “the relativity of
geometry”. Just as with the choice of standard synchrony in
Reichenbach’s analysis of the conventionality of simultaneity, a
choice also held to be “logically arbitrary”, Reichenbach
recommends the “descriptively simpler” alternative in
which universal forces do not exist. To be sure, “ descriptive
simplicity has nothing to do with truth”, i.e., has no bearing
on the question of whether the spacetime metric really has a
non-Euclidean structure (1928: 47 [1958: 35]).

### 4.3 Critique of Reichenbachian Metric Conventionalism

In retrospect, it is rather difficult to understand the significance that has been accorded this argument. Carnap, for example, in “Introductory Remarks” (Carnap 1956 [Reichenbach 1958: vii]) to the posthumous English translation of this work, singled it out on account of its “great interest for the methodology of physics”. Reichenbach himself deemed “the philosophical achievement of the theory of relativity” to lie in this methodological distinction between conventional and factual claims regarding spacetime geometry (1928: 24 [1958: 15]), and he boasted of his “philosophical theory of relativity” as an incontrovertible “philosophical result”:

the philosophical theory of relativity, i.e., the discovery of the definitional character of the metric in all its details, holds independently of experience.… a philosophical result not subject to the criticism of the individual sciences. (1928: 223 [1958: 177])

Yet this result is neither incontrovertible nor an untrammeled
consequence of Einstein’s theory of gravitation. There is, first
of all, the shadowy status accorded to universal forces. A sympathetic
reading (e.g., Dieks 1987) suggests that the notion serves usefully in
mediating between a traditional *a priori* commitment to
Euclidean geometry and the view of modern geometrodynamics, where
gravitational force is “geometrized away” (see
§5).
After all, as Reichenbach explicitly acknowledged, gravitation is
itself a universal force, coupling to all bodies and affecting them in
the same manner (1928: 294–6 [1958: 256–8]). Hence the
choice recommended by descriptive simplicity is merely a stipulation
that infinitesimal metrical appliances be considered as
“differentially at rest” in an inertial system (1924: 115
[1969: 147]). This is a stipulation that spacetime measurements always
take place in regions that are to be considered small Minkowski
spacetimes (arenas of gravitation-free physics). By the same token,
consistency then required an admission that “the transition from
the special theory to the general one represents merely a renunciation
of metrical characteristics” (1924: 115 [1969: 147]), or, even
more pointedly, that “all the metrical properties of the
spacetime continuum are destroyed by gravitational fields” where
only topological properties remain (1928: 308 [1958: 268–9]). To
be sure, these bizarre conclusions are supposed to be rendered more
palatable in connection with the epistemological reduction of
spacetime structures in the causal theory of time.

Despite the influence of this argument on the subsequent generation of philosophers of science, Reichenbach’s analysis of spacetime measurement is plainly inappropriate, manifesting a fallacious tendency to view the generically curved spacetimes of general relativity as stitched together from little bits of flat Minskowski spacetimes. Besides being mathematically inconsistent, this procedure offers no way of providing a non-metaphorical physical meaning for the fundamental metrical tensor \(g_{\mu\nu}\), the central theoretical concept of general relativity, nor to the series of curvature tensors derivable from it and its associated affine connection. Since these sectional curvatures at a point of spacetime are empirically manifested and the curvature components can be measured, e.g., as the tidal forces of gravity, they can hardly be accounted as due to conventionally adopted “universal forces”. Furthermore, the concept of an infinitesimal rigid rod in general relativity cannot really be other than the interim stopgap Einstein recognized it to be. For it cannot actually be rigid due to these tidal forces; in fact, the concept of a rigid body is already forbidden in special relativity as allowing instantaneous causal actions. Moreover, such a rod must indeed be infinitesimal, i.e., a freely falling body of negligible thickness and of sufficiently short extension, so as to not be stressed by gravitational field inhomogeneities; just how short depending on strength of local curvatures and on measurement error (Torretti 1983: 239). But then, as Reichenbach appeared to have recognized in his comments about the “destruction” of the metric by gravitational fields, it cannot serve as a coordinately defined general standard for metrical relations. In fact, as Weyl was the first to point out, precisely which physical objects or structures are most suitable as measuring instruments should be decided on the basis of gravitational theory itself. From this enlightened perspective, measuring rods and clocks are structures that are far too physically complex. Rather, the metric in the region surrounding any observer O can be empirically determined from freely falling ideally small neutral test masses together with the paths of light rays. More precisely stated, the spacetime metric results from the affine-projective structure of the behavior of neutral test particles of negligible mass and from the conformal structure of light rays received and issued by the observer (Weyl 1921). Any purely conventional stipulation regarding the behavior of measuring rods as physically constitutive of metrical relations in general relativity is then otiose (Weyl 1923a; Ehlers, Pirani and Schild 1973; Geroch 1978). Alas, since Reichenbach reckoned the affine structure of the gravitational-inertial field to be just as conventional as its metrical structure, he was not able to recognize this method as other than an equivalent, but by no means necessarily preferable, account of the empirical determination of the metric through the use of rods and clocks (Coffa 1979; Ryckman 2005: chs. 2 & 4; Giovanelli 2013b).

## 5. “Geometrization of Physics”: Platonism, Transcendental Idealism, Structuralism

### 5.1 Differing Motivations

In the decade or so following the appearance of the general theory of relativity, there was much talk of a reduction of physics to geometry (e.g., Hilbert 1917; Weyl 1918b, 1919; Haas 1920; Lodge 1921). While these discussions were largely, and understandably, confined to scientific circles, they nonetheless brought distinctly philosophical issues—of methodology, but also of epistemology and metaphysics—together with technical matters. Einstein’s mathematical representation of gravitational field potentials by the metric tensor \(g_{\mu\nu}\) of a variably curved spacetime geometry was quickly termed a “geometrization of gravitational force”. Weyl and others acclaimed Einstein as reviving a geometrizing tendency essentially dormant within physics since the 17th century. In so doing, Einstein supposedly opened up the prospect of a complete geometrization of physical theory, the possibility of finding a unifying representation of all of known physical interactions within the frame of a unique metrical theory of the four-dimensional spacetime continuum. Einstein himself, as will be seen, turned out to be highly critical of the idea of “geometrizing physics” even as the general theory of relativity was its inspiration. This was certainly the case for the Göttingen mathematician David Hilbert (1915, 1917). In the very week in late November 1915 when Einstein presented his completed gravitational theory to the Berlin Academy (on Thursday), Hilbert (the previous Monday) proposed to the Göttingen Academy a schematic generally covariant axiomatization coupling Einstein’s gravitational theory with a relativistic electromagnetic theory of matter due to German physicist Gustav Mie. Hilbert’s theory could not possibly succeed (however, that matter is not fundamentally electromagnetic in nature was only shown in the 1930s by the quantum physics of the atomic nucleus). It is remembered today mostly for the so-called “Einstein-Hilbert action” in the usual variational formulation of Einstein’s theory. But at the time Hilbert viewed his theory as a triumph of his “axiomatic method” as well as a demonstration that

physics is a four-dimensional pseudogeometry [i.e., a geometry distinguishing spatial and temporal dimensions] whose metric determination \(g_{\mu\nu}\) is bound, according to the fundamental equations … of my first [1915] contribution, to the electromagnetic quantities, that is, to matter. (1917: 63, translation by the author)

However, this implied reduction of physics to geometry was crucially obtained within the epistemological frame of what Hilbert termed “the axiomatic method”; its intended significance is that of a proposed solution to the 6th (“the axiomatization of physics”) of the famous 23 mathematical problems posed by Hilbert at the 1900 International Congress of Mathematicians in Paris (Brading & Ryckman 2008). Others pursued a different path, seeking the reduction of physics to geometry by generalizing beyond the pseudo-Riemannian geometry (a Riemannian geometry distinguishing between space and time dimensions) of general relativity (Hermann Weyl, Arthur Stanley Eddington) or by employing Riemannian geometry in five dimensions (Theodore Kaluza). Whatever may have been Kaluza’s philosophical motivations (van Dongen 2010: 132–5), neither mathematical realism nor Platonism played a role in Weyl’s (1918a,b), and following Weyl, Eddington’s (1921) generalizations of Riemannian geometry. Their proposals were above all explicit attempts to comprehend the nature of fundamental physical theory in the light of general relativity, from systematic epistemological standpoints neither positivist nor realist. As such they comprise early philosophical interpretations of that theory, although they intertwine philosophy, geometry and physics in a manner unprecedented since Descartes.

After completing general relativity, Einstein long entertained hopes that matter might be described in geometrical terms by a theory unifying gravitation and electromagnetism. But he stoutly and repeatedly resisted proclamations of any reduction of physics to geometry (e.g., 1928: 254; Giovanelli 2013a). Theoretical unification was overriding goal; no special significance would accrue to any successful unifying theory whose physical objects, motions, and interactions are described in geometrical terms (Lehmkuhl 2014). Einstein nonetheless followed both approaches to theoretical unification, that of generalizing Riemannian geometry and by adding extra dimensions. By 1923, Einstein was the recognized leader of the unification program (Vizgin 1985 [1994: 265]) and by 1925 had devised his first “homegrown” geometrical “unified field theories” (Sauer 2014). The first phase of the geometrical unification program essentially ended with Einstein’s “distant parallelism” theory of 1928–1931 (e.g., 1929), an inadvertent public sensation (Fölsing 1993 [1997: 605]). Needless to say, none of these efforts met with success. In a lecture at the University of Vienna on October 14, 1931, Einstein forlornly referred to his failed attempts, each conceived on a distinct differential geometrical basis, as a “graveyard of dead hopes” (Einstein 1932). By this time, certainly, the viable prospects for the geometrical unification program had considerably waned. A consensus emerged among nearly all leading theoretical physicists that while unification of the gravitation and electromagnetic fields might be attained in formally distinct ways, the problem of matter, treated with undeniable empirical success by the new quantum theory, was not to be resolved solely within the confines of classical fields and spacetime geometry. In any event, from the early 1930s, prospects of any type of unification program appeared greatly premature in view of the wealth of data produced by the new quantum mechanics of the nucleus.

Still, unsuccessful pursuit of the goal of geometrical unification absorbed Einstein and his various research assistants for more than three decades, up to Einstein’s death in 1955. In the course of it, Einstein’s research methodology underwent a dramatic change (Ryckman 2014; Ryckman 2017: chapters 9 and 10). In place of physically warranted principles to guide theoretical construction, such as the equivalence between inertial and gravitational mass that had set him on the path to his greatest success with general relativity, Einstein increasingly relied on considerations of mathematical aesthetics, of “logical simplicity”, and the inevitability of certain mathematical structures under various constraints, adopted essentially for philosophical reasons. In a talk entitled “On the Method of Theoretical Physics” at Oxford in 1933, the transformation was stated dramatically:

Experience remains, of course, the sole criterion of the physical utility of a mathematical construction. But the creative principle resides in mathematics. In a certain sense, therefore, I hold it true that pure thought can grasp reality, as the ancients dreamed. (1933: 274)

Even decades of accumulating empirical successes of the new quantum theory did not dislodge Einstein’s core metaphysical conception of physical reality of continuous field functions defined on a spacetime manifold (“total field”) where particles and the concept of motion are derived notions (e.g., 1950: 348).

### 5.2 The Initial Step: “Geometrizing” Gravity

The “geometrization of gravitational force” in 1915 gave
the geometrization program its first, partial, realization as well as
its subsequent impetus. In Einstein’s theory, the fundamental or
“metric” tensor \(g_{\mu\nu}\) of Riemannian geometry
appears in a dual role which thoroughly fuses its geometrical and its
physical meanings. As is apparent from the expression for the
differential interval between neighboring spacetime events,
\(\textit{ds}^{2}= g_{\mu\nu} \textit{dx}^{\mu} \textit{dx}^{\nu}\)
(here, and below there is an implicit summation over repeated upper
and lower indices), the metric tensor is at once the geometrical
quantity underlying measurable metrical relations of lengths and
times. In this role it ties a mathematical theory of events in
four-dimensional curved spacetime to observations and measurements in
space and time. But it is also the potential of the gravitational (or
“metrical”) field whose value, at any point of spacetime
arises as a solution of the Einstein Field Equations (see below) for
given physical quantities of mass-momentum-stress in the immediate
surrounding region. In the new view, the idea of strength of
gravitational force is replaced by that of degree of spacetime
curvature. This curvature is manifested, for example, by the tidal
force of the Earth’s gravitational field that occasions two
freely falling bodies, released at a certain height and at fixed
separation, to approach one another. A freely falling body (ideally,
an uncharged test particle of negligible mass) in a gravitational
field follows a geodesic path (that is, a curve of extremal length in
a generally curved pseudo-Riemannian spacetime). The body is no longer
to be regarded as moving through space according to the pull of an
attractive gravitational force, but simply as tracing out the laziest
(longest or slowest possible) four-dimensional trajectory between two
finitely separated spacetime events. In consequence, in general
relativity the equation of motion of a free body is a *geodesic
equation* according to which the body’s spacetime (four-)
acceleration vanishes identically and its free fall becomes
indistinguishable from inertial motion. According to this equation, a
free body moves on a geodesic path in both the *presence* and
*absence* of a gravitational field. This is possible because
the equation contains a multi-index term (not a tensor) called a
*connection* allowing either a gravitational field or an
inertial field according to a given choice of spacetime coordinates.
As a result, in general relativity there is no observer-independent
(coordinate-free) way to partition the combined inertial-gravitational
field into its separate components. The gross mechanical properties of
bodies, comprising all gravitational-inertial phenomena, can be
derived as the solution of a single linked system of ten generally
covariant partial differential equations, the Einstein equations.
According to these equations, spacetime and matter stand in dynamical
interaction. One abbreviate way of characterizing the dual role of the
\(g_{\mu\nu}\) is to say that in the general theory of relativity,
gravitation, which includes mechanics, has become
*geometrized*, i.e., incorporated into the geometry of
spacetime. Yet Einstein objected to claims that in general relativity
gravitation is *reduced* to geometry as that statement’s
natural interpretation severs the unification of inertia and
gravitation that to Einstein comprised the theory’s core
achievement.

### 5.3 Extending Geometrization

In making spacetime curvature dependent on distributions of mass and energy, general relativity is indeed capable of encompassing all (non-quantum) physical fields. However, in classical general relativity there remains a fundamental asymmetry between gravitational and non-gravitational fields, in particular, electromagnetism, the only other fundamental physical interaction definitely known until the 1930s. This shows up visibly in one form of the Einstein field equations in which, on the left-hand side, a geometrical object (\(G_{\mu\nu}\), the Einstein tensor) built up from the uniquely compatible linear symmetric (“Levi-Civita”) connection associated with the metric tensor \(g_{\mu\nu}\), and representing the curvature of spacetime, is set identical to a tensorial but non-geometrical phenomenological representation of matter on the right-hand side.

\[ G_{\mu\nu} = k T_{\mu\nu}, \textrm{ where } G_{\mu\nu} \equiv R_{\mu\nu} - \frac{1}{2} g_{\mu\nu} R \]
The expression on the right side, introduced by a coupling term that
contains Newton’s gravitational constant, mathematically
represents the non-gravitational sources of the gravitational field in
a region of spacetime in the form of a stress-energy-momentum tensor
(an “*omnium gatherum*” in Eddington’s (1919:
63) pithy phrase). As the geometry of spacetime principally resides on
the left-hand side, this situation seems unsatisfactory. Late in life,
Einstein likened his famous equation to a building, one wing of which
(the left) was built of “fine marble”, the other (the
right) of “low grade wood” (1936: 311). In its classical
form, general relativity accords only the gravitational field a direct
geometrical significance; the other physical fields reside *in*
spacetime; they are not *of* spacetime.

Einstein’s dissatisfaction with this asymmetrical state of affairs was palpable at an early stage and was expressed with increasing frequency beginning in the early 1920s. A particularly vivid declaration of the need for geometrical unification was made in his “Nobel lecture” of July 1923:

The mind striving after unification of the theory cannot be satisfied that two fields should exist which, by their nature, are quite independent. A mathematically unified field theory is sought in which the gravitational field and the electromagnetic field are interpreted as only different components or manifestations of the same uniform field,… The gravitational theory, considered in terms of mathematical formalism, i.e., Riemannian geometry, should be generalized so that it includes the laws of the electromagnetic field. (489)

It might be noted that the tacit assumption, evident here, that incorporation of electromagnetism into spacetime geometry requires a generalization of the Riemannian geometry of general relativity; though widely held at the time, it is not quite correct (Rainich 1925; Misner & Wheeler 1957; Geroch 1966).

### 5.4 “Pure Infinitesimal Geometry”

It wasn’t Einstein, but the mathematician Hermann Weyl who first
addressed the asymmetry in 1918 in the course of reconstructing
Einstein’s theory on the preferred epistemological basis of a
“pure infinitesimal geometry” (*Reine
Infinitesimalgeometrie*). Holding that
direct—*evident*, in the sense of the
*Wesensschau* of Husserlian phenomenoloy—comparisons of
length or duration could be made at near-by points of spacetime, but
not, as the Riemannian geometry of Einstein’s theory allowed,
“at a distance”, Weyl discovered an expanded geometry with
additional terms that, following Einstein’s example, he simply
formally identified with the potentials of the electromagnetic field.
From these, the electromagnetic field strengths can be immediately
derived. Choosing an action integral to obtain both the homogeneous
and the inhomogeneous Maxwell equations as well as Einstein’s
gravitational theory, Weyl could express electromagnetism as well as
gravitation solely within the confines of a spacetime geometry. As no
other interactions were definitely known to occur, Weyl proudly
declared that the concepts of geometry and physics were the same.
Hence, everything in the physical world was a manifestation of
spacetime geometry.

(The) distinction between geometry and physics is an error, physics extends not at all beyond geometry: the world is a \((3+1)\) dimensional metrical manifold, and all physical phenomena transpiring in it are only modes of expression of the metric field, …. (M)atter itself is dissolved in “metric” and is not something substantial that in addition exists “in” metric space. (1919: 115–116, translation by the author)

By the winter of 1919–1920, for both physical and philosophical
reasons (the latter having to do with his largely positive reaction to
Brouwer’s intuitionist views about the mathematical continuum,
in particular, the continuum of spacetime—see Mancosu &
Ryckman 2005), Weyl (1920) surrendered the belief, expressed here,
that matter, with its corpuscular structure, might be derived within
spacetime geometry. Thus he gave up the Holy Grail of the nascent
unified field theory program almost before it had begun. Nonetheless,
he actively defended his theory well into the 1920s, essentially on
the grounds of Husserlian transcendental phenomenology, that his
geometry and its central principle, “the epistemological
principle of relativity of magnitude” comprised a superior
epistemological framework for general relativity. Weyl’s
postulate of a “pure infinitesimal” non-Riemannian metric
for spacetime allowed the “gauge” (by which Weyl meant a
scale of length; the term has a different meaning today) to vary at
each spacetime point. But it met with intense criticism. No
observation spoke in favor of it; to the contrary, Einstein pointed
out that according to Weyl’s theory, the atomic spectra of the
chemical elements should not be stable, as indeed they are observed to
be. Although Weyl responded to this objection forcefully, and with
some subtlety (Weyl 1923a), he was able to persuade neither Einstein,
nor any other leading relativity physicist, with the exception of
Eddington. However, the idea of requiring *gauge invariance* of
fundamental physical laws was revived and vindicated by Weyl himself
in a different form later on (Weyl 1929; see Ryckman 2005: chs. 5
& 6; O’Raifeartaigh 1997; Scholz 2001, 2004; Afriat 2017,
Other Internet Resources). Weyl’s 1918 generalization of
Riemannian geometry witnessed a resurgence in the 1970s and its
framework continues to be a productive resource in theoretical physics
(Scholz, 2018).

### 5.5 Eddington’s World Geometry

Despite failure to win many friends for his theory, Weyl’s guiding example of unification launched the geometrical program of unified field theory, initiating a variety of efforts, all aimed at finding a suitable generalization of the Riemannian geometry of Einstein’s theory to encompass as well non-gravitational physics (Vizgin 1985 [1994: chapter 4]). In December 1921, the Berlin Academy published Theodore Kaluza’s novel proposal for unification of gravitation and electromagnetism upon the basis of a five-dimensional Riemannian geometry. But earlier that year, in February, came Arthur Stanley Eddington’s further generalization of Weyl’s four-dimensional geometry, wherein the sole primitive geometrical notion is the non-metrical comparison of direction or orientation at the same or neighboring points. In Weyl’s geometry the magnitude of vectors at the same point, but pointing in different directions, might be directly compared to one another; in Eddington’s, comparison was immediate only for vectors pointing in the same direction. His “theory of the affine field” encompassed both Weyl’s geometry and the semi-Riemannian geometry of Einstein’s general relativity as special cases. Little attention was paid however, to Eddington’s claim, prefacing his paper, that his objective had not been to “seek (the) unknown laws (of matter)” as befits a unified field theory. Rather it lay “in consolidating the known (field) laws” wherein “the whole scheme seems simplified, and new light is thrown on the origin of the fundamental laws of physics” (1921: 105).

Eddington was persuaded that Weyl’s “principle of
relativity of length” was “an essential part of the
relativistic conception”, a view he retained to the end of his
life (e.g., 1939: 28). But he was also convinced that the largely
antagonistic reception accorded Weyl’s theory was due to its
confusing formulation. The flaw lay in Weyl’s failure to make
transparently obvious that the locally scale invariant (“pure
infinitesimal”) “world geometry” was not the
physical geometry of actual spacetime, but an entirely mathematical
construct inherently serving to specify the ideal of an
observer-independent external world. To remedy this, Eddington devised
a general method of deductive presentation of field physics in which
“world geometry” is developed mathematically as
conceptually separate from physics. A “world geometry” is
a purely mathematical construction the derived objects of which
possess only structural properties requisite to the ideal of a
completely impersonal world; these are objects, as he wrote in
*Space, Time and Gravitation* (1920), a semi-popular
best-seller, represented “from the point of view of no one in
particular”. Naturally, this ideal had changed with the progress
of physical theory. In the light of relativity theory, such a world is
indifferent to specification of reference frame and, after Weyl, of
gauge of length (scale). A world geometry is not the physical theory
of such a world but a framework or “graphical
representation” within whose terms existing physical theory
might be displayed, essentially through a purely formal identification
of known tensors of the existing physical laws of gravitation and
electromagnetism with those derived within the world geometry. Such a
geometrical representation of physics cannot really be said to be
right or wrong, for it only implements, if it can, current ideas
governing the conception of objects and properties of an impersonal
objective external world. But when existing physics, in particular,
Einstein’s theory of gravitation, is set in the context of
Eddington’s world geometry, it yields a surprising consequence:
The Einstein law of gravitation appears as a definition! In the form
\(R_{\mu\nu} = 0\) it defines what in the “world geometry”
appears to the mind as “vacuum” while in the form of the
Einstein field equation noted above, it defines what is to be
encountered by the mind as “matter”. This result is what
is meant by Eddington’s stated claim of throwing “new
light on the origin of the fundamental laws of physics” (see
Ryckman 2005: chapters 7 & 8). Eddington’s notoriously
difficult and opaque later works (1936, 1946), carried his viewpoint
further in attempting to show that “the substratum of everything
is of mental character” (1928, p.281). In the aftermath of
quantum mechanics and Dirac’s relativistic theory of the
electron, Eddington pursued an algebraic, not geometric, program
seeking to derive fundamental physical laws, and in particular the
constants occurring in them, from *a priori* epistemological
principles. This philosophy, termed “selective
subjectivism” (1939), argued that fundamental physical theory is
not capable of revealing the world as it is in itself but merely
represents relations between subjectively selected observables and
hence reflect the interpretation the physicist imposes on the data of
observation.

### 5.6 Meyerson on “Pangeometrism”

Within physics the idealist currents lying behind the world geometries
of Weyl and Eddington were largely ignored, whereas within philosophy,
EÉmile Meyerson’s *La Déduction
Relativiste* (1925) was a notable exception in considering the
philosophical perspectives of both authors at considerable length.
Meyerson, who had no doubt concerning the basic realist impetus of
science, carefully distinguished Einstein’s “rational
deduction of the physical world” from the speculative
geometrical unifications of gravitation and electromagnetism of Weyl
and Eddington. These theories, as affirmations of a complete
*panmathematicism*, or rather of a *pangeometrism*
(1925: §§ 157–58), were compared to the rationalist
deductions of Hegel’s *Logic*. That general relativity
succeeded in partly realizing Descartes’ program of reducing the
physical to the spatial through geometric deduction, is due to the
fact that Einstein “followed in the footsteps” of
Descartes, not Hegel (1925: §133). But *pan-geometrism* is
also capable of overreaching itself and this is the transgression
committed by both Weyl and Eddington. Weyl in particular is singled
out for criticism for seemingly to have reverted to Hegel’s
monistic idealism, and so to be subject to its fatal flaw. In
regarding nature as completely intelligible, Weyl had abolished the
thing-in-itself and so promoted the identity of self and non-self, the
great error of the *Naturphilosophien*.

Though he had “all due respect to the writings of such distinguished scientists” as Weyl and Eddington, Meyerson took their overt affirmations of idealism to be misguided attempts “to associate themselves with a philosophical point of view that is in fact quite foreign to the relativistic doctrine” (1925: §150). That “point of view” is in fact two distinct species of transcendental idealism. It is above all “foreign” to relativity theory because Meyerson cannot see how it is possible to “reintegrate the four-dimensional world of relativity theory into the self”. After all, Kant’s own argument for Transcendental Idealism proceeded “in a single step”, in establishing the subjectivity of the space and time of “our naïve intuition”. But this still leaves “the four dimensional universe of relativity independent of the self”. Any attempt to “reintegrate” four-dimensional spacetime into the self would have to proceed at a “second stage” where, additionally, there would be no “solid foundation” such as spatial and temporal intuition furnished Kant at the first stage. Perhaps, Meyerson allowed, there is indeed “another intuition, purely mathematical in nature”, lying behind spatial and temporal intuition, and capable of “imagining the four-dimensional universe, to which, in turn, it makes reality conform”. This would make intuition a “two-stage mechanism”. While all of this is not “inconceivable”, it does appear, nonetheless, “rather complex and difficult if one reflects upon it”. In any case, this is likely to be unnecessary, for considering the matter “with an open mind”,

one would seem to be led to the position of those who believe that relativity theory tends to destroy the concept of Kantian intuition. (1925: §§ 151–2)

Meyerson had come right up to the threshold of grasping the
Weyl-Eddington geometric unification schemes in something like the
sense in which they were intended. The stumbling block for him, and
for others, is the conviction that transcendental idealism can be
supported only from an argument about the nature of intuition, and
intuitive representation. To be sure, the geometric framework for
Weyl’s construction of the objective four-dimensional world of
relativity is based upon the *Evidenz* available in
“essential insight”, which is limited to the simple linear
relations and mappings in what is basically the tangent vector space
\(T_P\) at a point *P* in a manifold. Thus in Weyl’s
differential geometry there is a fundamental divide between integrable
and non-integrable relations of comparison. The latter are primitive
and epistemologically privileged, but nonetheless not justified until
it is shown how the infinitesimal homogeneous spaces, corresponding to
the “essence of space as a form of intuition”, are
compatible with the large-scale inhomogeneous spaces (spacetimes) of
general relativity. And this required not a philosophical argument
about the nature of intuition, but one formulated in group-theoretic
*conceptual* form (Weyl 1923a,b). Eddington, on the other hand,
without the cultural context of Husserlian phenomenology or indeed of
philosophy generally, jettisoned the intuitional basis of
transcendental idealism altogether, as if unaware of its prominence.
Thus he sought a superior and completely general *conceptual*
basis for the objective four-dimensional world of relativity theory by
constituting that world within a geometry (its “world
structure” (1923)) based upon a non-metrical affine (i.e.,
linear and symmetric) connection. He was then free to find his own way
to the empirically confirmed integrable metric relations of
Einstein’s theory without being hampered by the conflict of a
“pure infinitesimal” metric with the observed facts about
atomic spectra.

### 5.7 “Structural Realism”?

It has been routinely assumed that all the attempts at a geometrization of physics in the early unified field theory program shared something of Einstein’s hubris concerning the ability of mathematics to grasp the fundamental structure of the external world. The geometrical unified field theory program thus appears to be inseparably stitched to a form of scientific realism, termed “structural realism”, with perhaps even an inspired turn toward Platonism. According to one (now termed “epistemic”) form of “structural realism”, whatever the intrinsic character or nature of the physical world, only its structure can be known, a structure of causal or other modal relations between events or other entities governed by the equations of the theory. The gist of this version of structural realism was first clearly articulated by Russell in his Tarner Lectures at Trinity College, Cambridge in 1926. As Russell admits, it was the general theory of relativity, particularly in the formulation given within Eddington’s world geometry, that led him to structuralism regarding cognition of physical reality (Russell 1927: 395). Russell, however, rested the epistemic limitation to knowledge of the structure of the physical world on the causal theory of perception. As such, structural features of relations between events not present in the percepts of these events could only be inferred according to general laws; hence, posits of unobserved structural features of the world are constrained by exigencies of inductive inference. Moreover, Russell’s structural realism quickly fell victim to a rather obvious objection lodged by the mathematical Max Newman (see entry on structural realism).

In its contemporary form, structural realism has both an epistemic and an “ontic” form, the latter holding essentially that current physical theories warrant that the structural features of the physical world alone are ontologically fundamental (Ladyman & Ross 2007). Both versions of structural realism subscribe to a view of theory change whereby the sole ontological continuity across changes in fundamental physical theory is continuity of structure, as in instances where the equations of an earlier theory can be derived, say as limiting cases, from those of the later. Geometrical unification theories seems tailored for this kind of realism. For if a geometrical theory is taken to give a true or approximately true representation of the physical world, it provides definite structure to relations posited as fundamental and presumably preserved in any subsequent geometrical generalization. It is therefore instructive to recall that for both Weyl and Eddington geometrical unification was not, nor could be, such a representation, for essentially the reasons articulated two decades before by Poincaré:

Does the harmony the human intelligence thinks it discovers in nature exist outside of this intelligence? No, beyond doubt, a reality completely independent of the mind which conceives it, sees or feels it, is an impossibility. A world as exterior as that, even if it existed, would for us be forever inaccessible. But what we call objective reality is, in the last analysis, what is common to many thinking beings, and could be common to all; this common part,…, can only be the harmony expressed by mathematical laws. It is this harmony then which is the sole objective reality…. (1906: 14)

In Weyl and Eddington, geometrical unification was an attempt to cast the harmony of the Einstein theory of gravitation into a new epistemological light, displaying the field laws of gravitation and electromagnetism within the common frame of a geometrically represented physical reality. Their unorthodox manner of philosophical argument, cloaked, perhaps necessarily, in the language of differential geometry, has tended to conceal or obscure conclusions about the significance of a geometrized physics that push in considerably different directions from either instrumentalism or scientific realism.

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